1. Systems theory is the study of generic properties of complex systems through mathematical or formal representations. The aim to identify principles shared by a class of systems with a similar organization is also important to some modern systems biologists. For an analysis of the connection between systems theory and modern systems biology, see e.g. (Drack 2015; Drack & Wolkenhauer 2011; Green & Wolkenhauer 2013; Mekios 2016; Wolkenhauer & Mesarović 2005).
2. They also emphasize the differences between bottom-up and top-down strategies. The former is commonly understood as model construction based on detailed experimental analysis, akin to strategies in molecular biology. In contrast, top-down strategies are often understood as pattern-detection and functional inference based on larger, but also coarser-grained, datasets (see also MacLeod & Nersessian 2013a,b, 2015).
3. The term scale-free signifies that the connectivity pattern—described mathematically as a power law distribution—is invariant across the scale (or size) of the network (Barabási & Albert 1999).
4. Another candidate of artificial life with a different “design” than living systems, as we know them, is a type of protocells whose metabolic processes operate at the cell surface (Fellerman et al. forthcoming; Rasmussen et al. 2008).
5. Among the important precursors is the classical Miller-Urey experiment showing that organic compounds (amino acids) can originate from inorganic substrates under prebiotic conditions (Miller 1953).
6. A related example shows that the cellular context may play adaptive roles in ensuring robustness. A synthetic model of a dual-feedback oscillator surprisingly outperformed the mathematical model by exhibiting robust oscillations for wider range of parameters than predicted (Stricker et al. 2008; Knuuttila & Loettgers 2013a).
7. Note also that some approaches are compatible with a form of modular reductionism, e.g., the aim to design simpler synthetic systems allowing for assembly of modular parts (Endy 2005; Güttinger 2013).
8. A related aspect is the focus on quantitative features, including concentration, that may require an extension of traditional mechanistic accounts (Love & Nathan 2015).
9. Leroy Hood and colleagues from the Systems Biology Institute in Seattle have promoted a specific type of systems medicine called P4 medicine where the four Ps stand for Personalized, Predictive, Preventive, and Participatory (cf. Hood & Flores 2012; Green & Vogt 2016).