Philosophy of Systems and Synthetic Biology

First published Thu Jun 8, 2017

This entry aims to clarify how systems and synthetic biology contribute to and extend discussions within philosophy of science. Unlike fields such as developmental biology or molecular biology, systems and synthetic biology are not easily demarcated by a focus on a specific subject area or level of organization. Rather, they are characterized by the development and application of mathematical, computational, and synthetic modeling strategies in response to complex problems and challenges within the life sciences. Proponents of systems and synthetic biology often stress the necessity of a perspective that goes beyond the scope of molecular biology and genetic engineering, respectively. With the emphasis on systems and interaction networks, the approaches explicitly engage in one of the oldest philosophical discussions on the relationship between parts and wholes, or between reductionism and holism. Such questions are, however, reframed in the new light of strategies for large-scale data production and dynamic modeling that are inspired by non-biological disciplines such as engineering. Systems and synthetic biology thus shed new light on important discussions in philosophy of biology, but they are also philosophically interesting for their own sake. By pursuing ambitious aims such as the development of multiscale computational models and synthetic life forms, they uncover new ground for philosophical analysis. Systems and synthetic biology raise fundamental questions about how far research can be taken through computational approaches, about the relation between living and artificial systems, and about the implications of interdisciplinary research for science and society.

1. Introduction

Systems biology and synthetic biology are relatively recent interdisciplinary approaches that aim to improve our ability to understand, predict, and control living systems. They both capitalize on large-scale data production in genomics and related fields and explore new paths of cross-fertilization between biology and non-biological disciplines such as physics, computer science, mathematics, chemistry, and engineering. Systems and synthetic biology are often described as ‘sister-disciplines’ or ‘cousins’, focusing on the complementary and interrelated aims of understanding (systems biology) and designing (synthetic biology) living systems. Accordingly, they have been associated with knowledge-driven versus application-driven epistemologies, or with the aims of analysis versus synthesis. Philosophers of science examining the research practice have, however, argued that understanding and design are often interdependent, and that no simple distinction between basic and applied science can be made in this context (O’Malley 2009; Kastenhofer 2013a,b; Knuuttila & Loettgers 2013a). Moreover, the notions of systems and synthetic biology cover broad and highly diverse spectra of interdisciplinary hybrids (Calvert & Fujimura 2011; Gramelsberger et al. 2013). This entry will therefore aim to reach a balance between displaying the methodological flexibility and variability within these fields and highlighting common themes.

1.1 Research Practices in Systems Biology

Systems biology can be interpreted as a response to limitations of research strategies investigating molecules and pathways in isolation. To clarify the significance of their approach, systems biologists often stress the need to complement or go beyond what is perceived as reductionist strategies in molecular biology (cf., De Backer et al. 2004; van Regenmortel 2004; Wolkenhauer & Green 2013). The contrast between systems biology and molecular biology should not be overstated (see also Section 4.1). However, the often cited comparison reveals how systems biology is motivated by the need for mathematical and computational modeling frameworks that are better suited for studying the dynamics and organization of many interconnected components (Boogerd et al. 2007; Kitano 2001).

Molecular biology has been extremely successful in generating knowledge on biological mechanisms through the twin strategies of decomposition and localization of component parts and molecular operations (Bechtel & Richardson 1993 [2010]). But the very success of the detailed study of molecular pathways has also revealed dynamic interfaces and crosslinks between processes and components that were previously assigned to distinct mechanisms or subsystems. To account for a vast number of interacting components and multiple feedback loops dynamic modeling is needed (Bechtel & Abrahamsen 2012). Network modeling and computational simulations in systems biology allow for the study of larger integrated systems and thus provide strategies for recomposing the findings in the context of larger systems (Bechtel 2016; Gross & Green forthcoming). Systems in this context thus generally refer to large networks of integrated components exhibiting non-linear dynamics. However, there is no unified view of what constitutes a systems-approach (Calvert 2010; Calvert & Fujimura 2011). As clarified below, systems biology comprises different research practices with different ties to molecular biology, genomics, as well as to non-biological disciplines (see also Krohs & Callebaut 2007).

Systems biology research is sometimes divided into a systems-theoretical and a pragmatic stream (O’Malley and Dupré 2005). The former is historically related to the initial use of the term ‘systems biology’ in 1968, denoting the merging of systems theory and biology (Mesarović 1968).[1] This definition has been taken up as providing a theoretical vision and reorientation also for modern systems biology (Wolkenhauer & Mesarović 2005; Drack & Wolkenhauer 2011). Systems-theoretical proponents view systems biology as an opportunity to revive important theoretical questions that for half a century stood in the shade of the success of experimental biology. Examples of such questions are what characterizes living systems and whether generic organizational principles can be identified (see Section 3.2). In contrast, the pragmatic stream views systems biology as a successor of genomics and as a powerful extension of molecular biology. This stream is sometimes referred to as molecular systems biology (De Backer et al. 2010), and practitioners within this field relate the emergence of systems biology to the production of data within genomics and other high-throughput technologies from the late 1990s and onwards.

Krohs and Callebaut (2007) consider omics-disciplines a third dimension or root of systems biology due to the impact of data-rich modeling strategies on the development of the approach.[2] Omics fields allowed for large-scale measurements of co-expression between vast number of genes or associated protein concentrations. Since modeling tools in molecular biology were considered limited for handling large quantitative datasets, researchers turned to the exploration and further development of mathematical and computational strategies developed in engineering and physics (Alberghina & Westerhoff 2005). Although not all systems biologists put equal emphasis on the prospects of big data, they share the view that mathematical and computational approaches are required to account for biological complexity.

The first international conference on systems biology was held in 2000 (at the first Systems Biology Institute in Tokyo), and thematic journal issues and dedicated journals quickly followed (Kitano 2002a,b). Since then, many systems biology research institutions have emerged, and large-scale international collaborations have been initiated.

1.1.1 Network Approaches in Systems Biology

Research practices in systems biology can in part be understood through an examination of characteristics and implications of different styles of representation. Whereas textbooks and research papers in molecular and cell biology typically contain mechanistic diagrams tracking interactions between specific genes and proteins, representations in systems biology often display interactions between a vast number of molecular components as abstract networks of interconnected nodes and links. This difference in representational style is epistemically significant, because it highlights an increasing focus on the organizational structure of the system as a whole.

By conducting correlation-based studies of how multiple genes and proteins are associated with each other, and how these are connected to specific biological processes, systems biology research has revealed common patterns in biological networks such as scale-free network architectures and multi-level hierarchies (Ravasz et al. 2002). Systems biologists often distinguish between two major classes of networks based on their connectivity distribution (how components, or nodes, in the network are connected to other nodes). Exponential and scale-free network structures are illustrated on Figure 1 (for details on the differences, see Albert et al. 2000). An exponential network is largely homogeneous with approximately the same number of links per node, and it is unlikely to find nodes with many links. In contrast, scale-free networks are inhomogeneous. Most nodes have only a few links but some nodes (called hubs) have a large number of connections.[3]

[subfigre a labeled 'Exponential' and subfigure b labeled 'Scale-free']

Figure 1: An example of a network representation in systems biology, showing the difference between an exponential network and a scale-free network. Red nodes are the five nodes with most links, green nodes are the first neighbors of red nodes (from Albert et al. 2000: 379, reprinted by permission from Macmillan Publishers Ltd: Nature, copyright 2000).

Interestingly, many real-world networks such as social networks, the World Wide Web, and regulatory networks in biology display scale-free architectures. This raises important questions about whether real-world networks can be related to more generic structural types with characteristic functional capacities. The scale-free structure makes the average path length between any two nodes in the network small, and this structure has therefore been associated with capacities for coordinated regulation throughout the network (Albert et al. 2000). Moreover, scale-free networks exhibit a high error tolerance, understood as robustness against failure of random nodes and links (e.g., random gene deletion). These functional properties are not shared by exponential networks. However, the functional importance of hubs in scale-free networks at the same time results in fragility to attacks on central notes (Albert et al. 2000; Barabási & Oltvai 2004). Similarly, a multi-layered network structure called a bow-tie network connects many inputs and outputs through a central core (the knot of the bow-tie) that consists of a small number of elements (Kitano & Oda 2006). This structure has been associated with efficient information flow, but also with fragility towards perturbations of the intermediate nodes in the core of the network.

Some systems biologists examine network architectures in the hope that smaller functional units or patterns can be identified that are akin to modules in electronic networks (Hartwell et al. 1999). One example of pattern-detection within large datasets has received special attention from philosophers of science, namely research on so-called network motifs.

Network motifs are defined as “patterns of interaction that recurs in a network in many contexts” (Alon 2007: 268). By comparing the gene regulatory network of the bacterium E. coli to random networks, it was discovered that a few circuit patterns occurred more frequently than expected by chance (Shen-Orr et al. 2002). Statistically significant circuits were defined as network motifs. Two examples of network motifs are shown in Figure 2, called coherent and incoherent feedforward loops (cFFL and iFFL).

[two diagrams. The top one is labeled 'Coherent FFL' and has an X with an arrow to the right pointing to a Y another arrow to the right goes from Y to a Z; this arrow is labeled 'Indirect'. The Z has a (+) to its left and also below. A third arrow goes from X down then to the right before going up to the Z; this arrow is labeled 'Direct'. The bottom diagram is the same except the overall label is 'Incoherent FFL', the (+) to the left of Z is replaced by (-), and the line from Y to Z is not an arrow but rather ends in vertical bar]

Figure 2: Two examples of network motifs, the coherent and incoherent feedforward loop (cFFL and iFFL). The diagrams represent the regulation of a gene Z, via a direct path between a transcription factor X to Z, and an indirect connection from X via another gene or transcription factor Y to Z. Arrows represent gene activation (+) and a vertical bar inactivation (-). In a coherent feedforward loop (cFFL), all connections are activating. In the incoherent feedforward loop (iFFL), the path from Y to Z inhibites gene expression. (Adapted from Alon 2007: 47).

Akin to common circuit types in electronic networks, it was hypothesized that the recurring wiring patterns may indicate generalizable functional behaviors. Mathematical analysis suggested that the cFFL may function as a sign-sensitive delay element that filters out noisy inputs for gene activation (e.g., sporadic levels of nutrients in the environment). In contrast, the regulatory function of the iFFL was hypothesized to be an accelerator that creates a rapid pulse of gene expression in response to an activation signal. These predicted functions have been experimentally demonstrated in living bacteria (Mangan et al. 2003). Moreover, similar and additional network motifs have been found in other species and in other regulatory networks important to cell-signaling, metabolism, and developmental processes (Alves & Sorribas 2011; Peter & Davidson 2015; Tyson & Novák 2010). Such results have sparked interesting debates on whether network motifs could be seen as design principles, whose functions are generalizable across different biological contexts (see Section 2.3).

Philosophers and scientists alike have debated the implications of research focusing on generic properties of biological networks, rather than the properties of specific molecular components (e.g., Barabási 2002; Bechtel 2015a,b; Craver 2016). Among the controversial issues is how the enhanced focus on topological properties relates to more traditional mechanistic explanations in biology (Section 4.2). A related issue is whether functional capacities can be derived from an analysis of network architectures alone. Some systems biologists and philosophers have pointed to the limitations and possible biases associated with inferences of functions from automated pattern-detection in datasets (Calvert 2012; Keller 2005; Krohs 2012; see also Prill et al. 2010). Specifically, some have called for a more dynamic approach that can account for the context of the whole network and how it changes over time.

Network approaches have recently been extended to also study temporal aspects of coordinated protein-protein interactions in cell cycles and evolutionary dynamics (de Lichtenberg et al. 2005; Hogeweg 2012; Knight & Pinney 2009). Of scientific as well as philosophical relevance is whether and how these approaches can extend mechanistic strategies in molecular biology by identifying how multiple biological processes are organized and coordinated in time (Green et al. forthcoming), and how network analysis can inform evolutionary biology (Section 3.3).

1.1.2 Research Objectives and Recent Developments

Whereas engineering-inspired systems biologists search for functional units or modules in biological networks, another line of research emphasizes the need for a ‘global’ approach inspired by dynamical systems theory (Huang et al. 2009; Jaeger & Crombach 2012). Drawing on Waddington’s idea of the epigenetic landscape of cell differentiation, the global approach represents dynamical states in a network through vectors, attractors, and trajectories in a state space (Huang 2012; for a philosophical analysis, see Fagan 2012). The framework explores how inherent mathematical properties of the network architectures may constrain developmental and evolutionary processes, in a way analogous to how laws of motion constrain the possible planetary movements (Goodwin et al. 1993). The global approach is sometimes highlighted as being in opposition to mechanistic or “modular” engineering approaches (Huang 2011; Fagan 2016). Controversies of this kind can reveal interesting differences in research aims as well as different standards for models and explanation present in systems biology (Section 5.1).

Systems biologists often describe their approach as one occupied with functional, rather than evolutionary questions (Boogerd et al. 2007; Hofmeyr 2007). By stressing the autonomy of functional biology, philosophy of systems biology can help balance the extensive emphasis on evolutionary biology in philosophy of biology (Pradeu 2016). At the same time, evolutionary systems biology has recently emerged as a new research approach aiming to extend both systems biology and evolutionary biology (Section 3.3).

Another recent extension of systems biology is the emergence of systems medicine, the medical application of systems biology. Systems biology has from the outset been associated with ambitiouns to solve grand societal challenges.Examples are the aims to provide a better understanding of complex diseases like cancer, and the vision of developing patient-specific models that will allow for individualized disease prediction and prevention (Section 5.3).

The aforementioned aims are often pursued through large-scale international collaborations where many research teams provide data and models to be integrated in complex models of whole cells (e.g., The Virtual Cell Project), whole organs (e.g., the Virtual Liver Project), and even the whole human body (e.g., The Virtual Physiological Human and the Physiome Project). Such projects raise new exciting questions for philosophy of science concerning strategies for model building and model validation (Carusi 2014). Moreover, they provide new sources for philosophical discussions on reduction and explanation (Section 4) and on the societal applications of big data biology (Section 5).

1.2 Research Practices in Synthetic Biology

The term synthetic biology was used already in the 1970s and 1980s, but the development of synthetic biology in its modern context is also connected to genomics (Morange 2009; O’Malley 2009; Gelfert 2013). In the wake of big data production around year 2000, comprehensive gene regulatory networks could be constructed that allowed for more systematic and ambitious design projects. Just like systems biologists commonly define their approach in opposition to the focus on isolated molecules or pathways in molecular biology, so is synthetic biology sometimes framed as a system-oriented approach that moves beyond isolationist approaches in genetic engineering (O’Malley et al. 2008). Also in this context, however, the ties to precursors are diverse, and there are different views on whether modular approaches are compatible with biological complexity (see below).

The term synthetic biology became an official label with the first Synthetic Biology Conference in 2004, organized by Drew Endy and Tom Knight at MIT (Bensaude-Vincent 2013). Drew Endy’s BioBrickTM standard has become a paradigm example of the aim to realize an engineering program by designing and assembling modular parts (Endy 2005). But the relation to engineering is complex, and synthetic biology displays a plurality of epistemic aims, visions and methodological frameworks.

1.2.1 Aims and Visions

A central research aim in synthetic biology is to modify metabolic pathways so as to control biochemical reactions and produce chemicals of societal value. Examples are biofuels, oils, rubber, biomedical compounds, and flavoring substances such as vanillin (Jensen & Keasling 2015). Synthetic organisms may also be designed for bioremediation. Genetically modified microorganisms can for instance work as biosensors that detect toxic chemicals or help clean up contaminated soil and water by metabolizing toxic compounds (Khalil & Collins 2010). Many efforts are also directed towards improvements of biomedical research and clinical practices, e.g., through synthetic vaccines, diagnostic tools, and personalized cancer treatments (Christiansen 2016b).

Much of synthetic biology research can be characterized as application-oriented innovations that utilize and modify biological structures. But not all practices fit this description. Some synthetic biologists pursue a basic science approach to understand the origin of life or the conditions for minimal life (Section 3.2). Others are driven by the wish to create artificial life in the lab, inspired by von Neumann’s (1966) vision of a self-reproducing automaton. This aim may be achieved through the design of macroscale ‘living technology’ (Bedau 2009). Examples are 3D printers that can print biological tissue structures and perhaps—with time—also replicate themselves.[4] Thus, synthetic biology is an umbrella term covering very diverse research practices.

1.2.2 Knowledge-Making Practices in Synthetic Biology

Examining the diversity of knowledge-making practices in synthetic biology, O’Malley et al. (2008) suggest a distinction between DNA-based device construction, genome-driven cell engineering, and protocell creation.

DNA-based device construction, or what Benner and Sismour (2005) characterize more broadly as the engineering trend, explores the extent to which interchangeable and functionally distinct components can be designed and implemented in a modular fashion. The BioBrick Foundation is a paradigmatic example of this approach ( The guiding principles for this approach are standardization, decoupling, and abstraction of parts and functional descriptions (Endy 2005). Examples of DNA-based devices are the repressilator (Elowitz & Leibler 2000, see Section 2.1), the synthetic toggle switch (Gardner et al. 2000; see Section 2.3), as well as production of synthetic artemisinin for antimalarial drugs (Keasling 2010). The orientation towards functional devices and machine-like control is also explicit in the so-called iGEM competition (Genetically Engineered Machine) where student teams compete in the task of constructing genetically engineered biological systems to address societal problems. Whether the ideal of constructing standardized and replaceable parts is compatible with biological complexity is an ongoing topic of debate (Sections 2 and 3).

Genome-driven cell engineering in synthetic biology departs from the modularity assumption held by practitioners of DNA-based device construction by focusing on the functioning of whole genomes or whole cells (O’Malley et al. 2008). This practice includes transplantation of foreign or modified genomes into empty ‘chassis cells’ to acquire new functions (Chan et al. 2005), and synthesizing minimal genomes (Andrianantoandro et al. 2006). The notion of a minimal genome highlights the idea that existing organisms may have genomes more complex than necessary for the basic functions of survival and reproduction. The human parasite Mycoplasma genitalium has been considered a model organism for the exploration of such questions due to its small genome, and it has also been the target for the first whole-cell model in systems biology (Karr et al. 2012). In 2010, scientists at the J. Craig Venter Institute (JCVI) created a synthetic genome of another bacterial species of the same genus, Mycoplasma mycoides (Gibson et al. 2010). From the synthetic DNA sequence, the researchers could partly control the production of new Mycoplasma mycoides cells. This genome was recently further reduced to a working approximation for the simplest synthetic minimal genome (JCVI-syn 3.0), allowing cells to function and reproduce with only 473 genes (Hutchison et al. 2016; see also Sung et al. 2016). At the same time as lower boundaries for biological complexity are explored, other synthetic biologists aim to manipulate and control the functions of genomes of more complex species, such as yeast and algae (Calvert & Frow 2015; Georgianna & Mayfield 2012).

The third category of synthetic biology, protocell creation, takes on the ambitious aim to construct simple approximations of living cells de novo (O’Malley et al. 2008). Researchers within this stream are often interested in the fundamental question of what life is, and the notion of applied science may not be an appropriate description of this research approach (see Section 3.2). Historically, the theoretical discussion of what life is has often been coupled to wet-lab synthesis of compounds associated with early or minimal life.[5] Synthetic biology takes this approach further through synthesis and manipulation of vesicles resembling primitive cells, as well as through advanced computational simulations of gene regulatory networks (Luisi 2006; Kauffman 2015). This research practice connects to projects within genome-driven cell engineering investigating the minimal requirements for a living system to function, survive, and reproduce. Research on protocells may focus primarily on understanding the origin of life as we know it, or aim to create synthetic life forms in other and simpler ways (Rasmussen et al. 2008).

Deplazes (2009) has suggested the following extended classification of practices within synthetic biology: i) bioengineering, ii) synthetic genomics, iii) protocell synthetic biology, iv) unnatural molecular biology, and v) in silico approaches (see Figure 3). While the categories of work on protocells and synthetic genomes overlap with the categorization by O’Malley et al. (2008), DNA-based device construction is here further divided into bioengineering (exemplified by assembly standards like BioBricksTM) and unnatural molecular biology. Unnatural molecular biology aims to create systems with different components, e.g., artificial nucleic acids based on a different coding system. Philosophers have debated whether the term ‘unnatural’ distinguishes practices in synthetic biology from other bioengineering approaches (Lewens 2013; Preston 2013). But the emphasis on synthetic artifacts underscores the affinity to synthetic chemistry and perhaps also to the ‘chemist style of thinking’, emphasizing synthesis and invention in addition to analysis and discovery (Bensaude-Vincent 2009, 2013, 2015).

[5 circles arranged in a pentagon each connected to all the others by lines. The circles in clockwise order are labeled 'Bioengineering', 'In silico synthetic biology', 'Synthetic genomics', 'Unnatural molecular biology', and 'Protocell synthetic biology'. The In slico... circle has labeled arrows on all the lines to the others: To all the arrows are labeled 'Computer design' {for Bioengineering there is also a reverse arrow 'New metabolic pathways'}. Bioengineering also has another arrow pointing to Protocell... with the label 'New metabolic pathways'. The Synthetic ... circle has an arrow to Bioengineering labeled 'Minimal chassis organisms' and to Protocell... labeled 'Synthetic genomes'; it has an arrow to and from Unnatural... labeled 'Unnatural genome fragments'. Unnatural has arrows to Bioengineering and Protocell labeled 'Unnatural genome fragments'. ]

Figure 3: Schematic representation of the five categories of synthetic biology and their connections. (From Deplazes 2009: 431, Copyright 2009 by John Wiley & Sons, Inc. reprinted by permission of John Wiley & Sons, Inc.).

Deplazes’ fifth category, in silico synthetic biology, focuses on the development and practical implementation of computer simulations. Deplazes argues that in silico synthetic modeling should be a distinct category because many of the computational models have “little or no direct reference to living organisms” (Deplazes 2009: 430). As Figure 3 illustrates, computer simulations are central to all research practices in synthetic biology. But the characteristics of various roles of simulations can shed new light on philosophical discussions of the relation between models and target systems, and between modeling, experimentation, and synthesis (Knuuttila & Loettgers 2013a,b; Carusi et al. 2012).

Abstracting from the variety of research practices, a distinctive feature of synthetic biology is that it aims “to go beyond mere modeling and to treat biological systems as fully constructible objects” (O’Malley 2009: 381; see also Schyfter 2013). Thus, synthetic biology opens new philosophical questions concerning the relation between synthesis and analysis, between artificial and natural target systems, and between machine and organism (Holm & Powell 2013; Nordman 2015).

2. Design Approaches in Biology

2.1 Designing and Understanding Life

Systems and synthetic biology offer new opportunities to reconsider the relative prospects and limitations of engineering approaches for biological research (Braillard 2015; Calcott et al. 2015). Engineering approaches are often considered inadequate to grasp biological complexity. Specifically, design thinking has often been associated with adaptationism, i.e., the assumption that biological traits are optimally “designed” by natural selection (Orzack & Forber 2010). Accordingly, critics have argued that the engineering approach may lead to a simplified understanding of evolution as driven solely by natural selection (Lynch 2007). But whereas some approaches in systems biology can be described as adaptationist (Green 2014), it cannot be assumed that design approaches always entail adaptationist implications. It has been argued that systems biologists typically adopt a ‘thin’ notion of design focusing primarily on the relations between structures and functions (Green et al. 2015b). Because research in systems and synthetic biology often is often dissociated from evolutionary considerations, these research practices may force philosophers to reexamine the concepts of biological function and design beyond traditional aetiological accounts (Holm 2012; Preston 2008).

It is, however, still debatable whether the thin notion of design is compatible with biological complexity. Some scholars have raised concerns that the machine-view of organisms may lead to a neglect of distinct biological features such as autonomy, evolvability, and intrinsic purposiveness (Nicholson 2013: 669; see also Jacob 1977; Kogge & Richter 2013). Design approaches may implicitly enforce the view that operations and outputs of specific parts are stable and predictable across different contexts. In biology, context-sensitivity and degeneracy between genotype-phenotype-relations provide severe limitations to the utility of this heuristic (Boudry & Pigliucci 2013; Güttinger 2013; see also Section 3.1). Yet, as outlined in the following sections, the ties to engineering are multi-faceted in both systems and synthetic biology.

2.2 Reverse and Forward Engineering

Feynman’s ‘last blackboard’ statement in 1988 that “what I cannot create, I do not understand” is often cited in the context of synthetic biology and has sparked philosophical reflections on the relation between understanding and design (O’Malley 2009; Holm 2012; Calvert & Frow 2013). Although synthetic biology is distinct from systems biology in the explicit aim to design synthetic systems, it is often described as a practice relying on systems biology as a theoretical foundation for design (Barrett et al. 2006).

Synthetic and systems biology are sometimes described through the complementary aims of forward and reverse engineering. Forward engineering refers to the design of systems with novel functions, often by drawing on an existing high-level model (e.g., an existing code or living cell). Forward engineering, or re-engineering, can lead to more complex systems, but simplicity may also be pursued through implementation of a more abstract coding language or through reduction or rewiring of (genetic) circuits. Reverse engineering refers to the aim to understand the functioning of a system ‘backwards’ by examining an existing system in contexts where consulting a design protocol is not an option. The search for recurring network motifs (Section 1.1.1) is an example of how systems biologists may reverse engineer the structure of a system to understand its functional capacities. Because functional features such as robustness are not only important to the survival oforganisms but also to design problems in engineering, reverse engineering of organizational features that underpin such capacities is an important aim in both fields (Hartwell et al. 1999; Csete & Doyle 2002; Kitano 2004; Stelling et al. 2004).

In engineering, the notion of reverse engineering is often associated with the aim to identify generic features of system design, or design principles, that can be reused in new systems. Similarly, the notion of reverse engineering is often used in research contexts in systems biology where the aim is to identify biological design principles that can increase the understanding of structure-function relations across different systems (Csete & Doyle 2002; Doyle & Stelling 2006; Voit 2003).

2.3 Design Principles in Biology

Systems and synthetic biology not only adopt mathematical tools from electronic and control engineering but also a conceptual framework in which biological functions are understood in terms of control principles and generic representations such as feedback control (Gramelsberger 2013; MacLeod & Nersessian 2013a,b). The search for functional principles, with applications to different systems in biology and engineering, dates back to the ideals of cybernetics and biochemical systems theory (Wiener 1948; Savageau 1976). Negative feedback control has long been a central principle in mechanical and electronic engineering to maintain stable concentrations and minimize fluctuations. An important insight from cybernetics is that the same formalization can also describe biological processes, e.g., where a reaction is inhibited as a result of accumulation of the product of the same reaction. An abstract model of negative feedback can therefore denote a functional principle that holds for a larger class of systems (Green & Wolkenhauer 2013).

Characteristic of the search for design principles in modern systems biology is that the strategy is enforced through automated pattern-detection in network models based on large biological datasets, as exemplified by the search for network motifs (Section 1.1.1). The hope is that simple control principles, using e.g., positive and negative feedback, can make up basic building blocks of biological functioning such as filters, switches, oscillators, amplifiers, detectors etc. (Alon 2007; Tyson et al. 2003). One such example is the so-called toggle-switch, a simple regulatory circuit that is considered a design principle in both systems and synthetic biology.

Like a toggle-switch that turns an electrical device ON or OFF, genetic toggle-switches have been found to regulate many biological processes such as the cell cycle of budding yeast and developmental processes in fruit flies (Tyson et al. 2003; Jaeger & Crombach 2012). A genetic toggle-switch is a double-negative feedback loop that shifts the system between two distinct stable states of gene expression—allowing synthesis of one protein while another is repressed. Synthetic biologists have succeeded in constructing a synthetic toggle switch in E. coli (Gardner et al. 2000), and the toggle switch is now considered part of the design composites or ‘computational templates’ for building new synthetic systems (Choffnes et al. 2011; Humphreys 2004). The dynamic behavior of genetic toggle-switches have also been investigated in studies of parameter spaces for robust functioning of network motifs (Tyson & Novák 2010), and in approaches combining the modeling framework of dynamical systems theory with reverse engineering of gene regulatory networks from experimental data (Huang et al. 2009; Jaeger & Crombach 2012).

Because of the abstract nature of proposed design principles, an interesting philosophical question is how such strategies relate to discussions about the possibilities of laws in biology. Biological systems are often taken to be too contingent, diverse, and context-dependent to allow for derivation of laws or general principles akin to those found in physics (Burian et al. 1996). The quest for design principles in biology is therefore an interesting test case to explore whether more abstract descriptions of generic features of functional organization can be formulated also in the context of biology (Green 2015b). A related question is how the enhanced focus on generic principles and topological features of biological networks relates to mechanistic accounts of biological explanation (Section 4.2).

An important question for such debates is whether generalizable functions can be inferred from organizational structures, relatively independently of cellular, organismal, and environmental contexts. Commenting on the proposal of network motifs as design principles, some systems biologists have questioned whether functional ‘units’ can be meaningfully isolated from the workings of the network as a whole (Huang 2011; Isalan et al. 2008). The search for network motifs and other functional units make apparent that systems biology research does not necessarily give up assumptions of modularity. Rather, than departing from strategies of decomposition (Bechtel & Richardson 1993 [2010]; see Section 1), the notion of modularity may be reconfigured via strategies for structural decomposition of larger networks (Alon 2007). Whether systems biology presents more holistic approach to biological complexity is therefore an issue of debate in both philosophy of science and systems biology itself.

3. Revisiting Biological Complexity

Engineering is often promoted through the idea of rational design. Some synthetic biologists have adopted a similar vision of synthetic organisms as structures that can be assembled via replaceable and standardized components, akin to Lego-bricks (front cover of Science, 2 September 2011 [333(6047)]). Yet, philosophers have argued that the actual research practices in synthetic and systems biology paint a different picture (Knuuttila & Loettgers 2013a, 2014).

3.1 Reverse and Forward Tinkering?

Rather than following a fixed design protocol, research in synthetic biology often progresses through what is taken to be the opposite of rational design, namely kludging: a solution that is klumsy, lame, ugly, dumb but good enough (O’Malley 2009, 2011b). The research process can perhaps be described as reverse and forward tinkering, in which opportunities for modular decomposition and recomposition are explored in iterative cycles to arrive at piecemeal solutions. Some have argued that synthetic biology exhibits a reflexive double bind to engineering, because the design assumptions guiding the construction of the synthetic systems are continuously reevaluated (Knuuttila & Loettgers 2013a). That is, synthetic biology does not only progress through similarities between biology and engineering. Through the exploration of engineering approaches, important differences (or negative analogies) between biological and engineered systems are discovered (Knuuttila & Loettgers 2014)

An example of a possible negative analogy discussed in this context is the role of noise in biological versus engineered systems. In engineering, oscillations are often associated with noise and lack of precision, but oscillatory dynamics are characteristic of many biological processes including metabolism and day and night rhythms (Knuuttila & Loettgers 2013a; see also Bechtel 2016). To study oscillations in gene expression, synthetic biologists at the Elowitz lab constructed a synthetic genetic circuit called the repressilator (Elowitz & Leibler 2000). The repressilator was designed to test whether the oscillatory dynamics of gene expression could be mathematically described via connected feedback loops in a simple regulatory circuit and implemented in a synthetic model.

Interestingly, important insights resulted from the repressilator because it failed to produce regular oscillations as predicted by the underlying mathematical model. The mismatch between the mathematical and synthetic model led to a reevaluation of the assumptions underlying the deterministic mathematical model (Knuuttila & Loettgers 2013a, 2014). Subsequent investigation of the dynamics of a stochastic version of the same model suggested that noise may be an inherent feature of oscillations in gene expression in living cells. The exploration of the functional role of noise and the potentials for stochastic modeling has since developed into an important research program of interest to biologists and engineers alike (Briat et al. 2016; Munsky et al. 2009; O’Malley 2011b). The repressilator and similar examples also sparked debates on whether design procedures in synthetic biology need to account for cellular contexts, distributed organization of functions, and other features that are unlike modular machines (Güttinger 2013).[6]

To what extent the ideal of precision engineering is pursued in synthetic biology is therefore debatable. Some have stressed the centrality of the engineering perspective because the construction of synthetic models is guided by knowledge on which design principles can be expected to create specific dynamic behaviors (e.g., Gramelsberger 2013). Others have emphasized that synthetic modeling, as a kind of material recomposition strategy, offer material constraints that always involve open-ended aspects (Knuuttila & Loettgers 2013b). The latter view highlights exploratory features of the triangulation of mathematical, computational, and synthetic approaches. The notion of exploratory experimentation has also been used to characterize research processes in systems biology where scholars search for structural and functional patterns in biological networks without being driven by a specific biological hypothesis (O’Malley & Soyer 2012; Steinle 1997). Research on network motifs (Section 1.1.1) is one example where engineering approaches were applied in an exploratory fashion to guide the generation of hypotheses on biological functions (Alon 2007). Also in this context, the analysis may lead to a reevaluation of design assumptions, e.g., whether the functions of network motifs are independent of the network context they are embedded in (Isalan et al. 2008).

It should also be noted that synthetic biologists often aim to produce biological technology that is more machine-like than natural organisms (Kastenhofer 2013a,b; O’Malley 2011b). An alternative response to biological complexity may therefore be to make the designed system simpler, for instance through genetic rewiring that ensures a higher degree of modularity (Knuuttila & Loettgers 2013a). The explicit aim to simplify synthetic models has been interpreted as a sign of the acknowledgment of biological complexity, and it is therefore debated whether thecriticism of the machine-view in synthetic biology is misguided (cf., Holm 2015; Nicholson 2013). The heuristic value of design approaches is, however, an ongoing topic of debate in both systems and synthetic biology.

3.2 Defining and Creating Minimal Life

Unlike DNA-based device construction and genome-driven cell engineering, synthetic biologists in the practice of protocell creation engage in classical theoretical discussions on what life is, and how it originated and evolved (O’Malley et al. 2008; Luisi 2006). This research stream connects to discussions of the fundamental properties of life in systems biology (Cornish-Bowden 2006; Letelier et al. 2011; Wolkenhauer and Hofmeyr 2007) and philosophy (Bich 2010; Bich & Damiano 2007; Bedau & Cleland 2010; Moreno & Mossio 2015).

One strand of research attempts to design minimal cells resembling early cellular life-forms. Inspired by Maturana and Varela’s (1972/1980) formulation of autopoiesis, some synthetic biologists experiment on conditions for minimal cells through chemical models that combine the continuous formation and destruction of the compartment (the cell membrane) with metabolic processes inside the cell (e.g., Zepik et al. 2001). This research program specializes in synthesis of lipid compartments, such as vesicles, to study coordinated processes that possibly resemble self-maintenance in the pre-biotic world (Luisi 2006). Moreover, vesicles have been used to experiment on how catalytic molecules such as ribozymes and peptides could become entrapped in lipid compartments and create precursors for metabolic circuits (de Souza et al. 2014).

An important research goal is to provide a model for the fundamental features that distinguish living systems from the non-living. So far, however, there is no consensus on the defining features of life (Tirard et al. 2010). Whether this should be seen as a disappointment, indicating the uselessness of attempts to define life, is an ongoing issue of philosophical debate (Cleland 2012; Ruiz-Mirazo et al. 2010). Different views on this question may depend on different interpretations of what the project of defining life entails in philosophy and science, e.g., whether the aim is to establish demarcate a natural kind (Cleland 2012) or to provide operational definitions of practical use in model and theory construction (Bich & Green 2017; Luisi 1998). More specific topics of debate are whether definitions of life must include Darwinian evolution, how evolution and units of selection should be defined, and whether it is fruitful to attempt to categorize all the varieties of life forms under one definition (Dupré & O’Malley 2009; Laland et al. 2009; Szostak et al. 2001)

Systems biologists engaging in debates on the properties of life often stress the relevance of insights from classical philosophers. Examples are references to Aristotle or Kant in discussions on whether our current notion of causation can adequately capture how parts and wholes in living systems stand in reciprocal causes and effect relationships (Drack & Wolkenhauer 2011; Hofmeyr 2017). Other important sources of inspiration are Rosen’s formalization of metabolism-repair systems, (mathematical) general systems theory, and category theory (e.g., Drack 2015; Rosen 1991; Mesarović et al. 2004; Letelier et al. 2011). The systems-theoretical stream is also influenced by mathematical biophysics (Rashevsky 1961), Waddington’s theoretical biology (Fagan 2012), Biochemical Systems Theory (Savageau 1976; Hofmeyr 2007), and classical systems-oriented physiology (Noble 2008).

Systems-theoretical and organizational accounts often highlight the functional roles of constraints, autonomy, and causal closure of the processes of self-maintenance (Moreno & Mossio 2015; Wolkenhauer & Hofmeyr 2007). While also stressing the utility of the search for general principles, some prefer the term organizing principles instead of design principles (Mesarović et al. 2004; Green & Wolkenhauer 2013). This choice of terminology signals the view that understanding living systems requires a systems-theoretical approach in a broader sense than cybernetics. An intriguing question in this context is whether a different kind of formal or mathematical framework is required—one that is adapted to biology rather than to engineering or physics (Bich & Damiano 2008; Gramelsberger 2017; Rosen 1991).

Another debated issue in discussions about the fundamental properties of life is the relative priority of autonomy, openness and collaboration. Whereas much research in philosophy and origin of life has focused on individual organisms, recent insights from microbiology have extended the focus on individual cells to also include the collaborative interactions of cell colonies (Dupré & O’Malley 2009; Bich & Green 2017). A recent experiment in synthetic biology investigated the dynamics of colonies of giant oleate-based vesicles under hypothesized prebiotic conditions (Carrara et al. 2012). The experiment showed that that the permeability of the vesicles to catalysts and macromolecules were much higher for the colonies, compared to individual vesicles. In some cases, the colonies also attracted each other and exchanged material. The results raise important questions about whether life has arisen from ‘cooperative mechanisms’ between prebiotic systems, and whether we need to rethink ontological assumptions about what constitutes a ‘unity of life’.

3.3 Evolutionary Systems Biology

Systems biology is often defined as an approach primarily concerned with functional questions (Boogerd et al. 2007). Evolutionary systems biology (ESB) explicitly seeks to expand this focus through investigations of the evolutionary dynamics of interacting networks (Soyer 2012). ESB aims to put the results of systems biology in a proper evolutionary context and also to enhance and extend current evolutionary biology. Specifically, ESB aims to develop more detailed models of genotype-phenotype maps to study causal changes over evolutionary time-scales and to enhance the predictive potential of evolutionary models. These aims are pursued by combining methods from molecular and evolutionary biology with in silico evolution, comparative genomic analysis, as well as with dynamical modeling of network architectures that are reverse engineered from large experimental datasets (Soyer & O’Malley 2013).

ESB can be considered a meeting ground not only for systems biology and evolutionary biology but also for the integrated study of developmental phenomena in an evolutionary perspective (O’Malley et al. 2015). Systems biology complements statistical sequence analysis in population genetics and studies of constraints on evolutionary pathways in EvoDevo through in silico modelling of large data-sets (Jaeger & Crombach 2012; Kim et al. 2011; Knight & Pinney 2009). Recently, ESB also draws on synthetic modelling of intracellular networks to investigate how the evolutionary potential of a lineage is affected by specific combinations of mutations (Palmer & Kishony 2013).

An important line of investigation in ESB examines the evolutionary background for global network architectures, modular structures, and recurring network motifs (Section 1.1.1; see also Krohs 2009). The structures may have arisen due to natural selection, but ESB also takes seriously the possibilities that patterns can arise as side-effects of genomic evolution and drift, or from a combination of selective and non-selective factors (Knight & Pinney 2009; Steinacher & Soyer 2012). An example of an insight from simulations of evolving yeast networks is that hierarchical structures with an overabundance of network motifs (feedforward loops) can emerge by non-selective tinkering with promoter regions (Cordero & Hogeweg 2006). In extended models, the integrated effects of selective and non-selective factors can be studied at multiple levels (Hogeweg 2012). With the emphasis on pattern-generation and the potential for future evolutionary change, ESB takes up Hugo de Vries’ challenge to explain not only the survival of the fittest but also the arrival of the fittest (Wagner 2012, 2014). The hope is that evolutionary simulations can extend evolutionary biology by providing a forward-looking account.

Evolutionary biology has traditionally been considered as a historical discipline that provides explanations without giving predictions. ESB offers an opportunity to develop more detailed models of evolving genotype-phenotype relations and to explore whether some evolutionary pathways are predictable given enough information about the network structures, dynamic states, and environmental conditions. Unlike forward engineering in synthetic biology, the aim is not to shape new designs but to understand the possible trajectories of change under different conditions. That is, ESB goes beyond historical accounts in exploring the potential for evolvability or innovation—what some have called the ‘tinkering potential’ of system evolution (Koonin & Wolf 2010). Research on evolvability can, however, also inform and inspire functional analysis and design in synthetic biology (Calvert & Frow 2015; Lewens 2013). Thus, the relation between biology and engineering must also be reexamined in this context.

The need to account for tinkering and contingency in evolution is often taken to highlight the limitations of engineering approaches in biology (Jacob 1977; Lynch 2007). Interestingly, however, some systems biologists and philosophers emphasize that a non-adaptationist framework can be reached through further cross-fertilization of biology and engineering (Calcott et al. 2015). ESB opens for an extended view on engineering by considering engineering fields with focus on modification of existing systems. For instance, there are interesting similarities between evolvability in biology and a diachronic engineering goal in software engineering, where the aim is to design systems that can be adapted to future functional requests without having to rewrite the code from scratch (Calcott 2014).

The ambition to predict evolutionary trajectories, even for simple organisms, may turn out to be extremely difficult. But ESB provides new ways to investigate whether evolutionary pathways follow some recognizable dynamical patterns. Simulations of how gene regulatory networks change over evolutionary time-scales can be coupled to experimental evolution in bacteria or insects. For instance, the development of bacterial antibiotic resistance has been shown to be constrained by interactions between different mutations (Weinreich et al. 2006). Such insights are expected to make evolutionary biology informative also for the development and combination of antibiotics used in medical treatment (Toprak et al. 2012; Palmer & Krishony 2013).

Some proponents expect that ESB will uncover regularities or stable evolutionary patterns across various types of networks and species. Such regularities may not resemble universal laws, but the hope is that some general principles underlying evolutionary dynamics can be identified, referred to as “laws of evolution” (Koonin 2011), “evolutionary design principles” (Steinacher & Soyer 2012) or “generic principles” of evolution (Jaeger & Monk 2013). ESB thus offers excellent cases for debating the possibility of turning evolutionary biology into a more predictive field with generalizable principles (Lobkovsky & Koonin 2012; Papp et al. 2011). Moreover, it is a rich field for discussing the implications of an ‘extended modern synthesis’ that combines molecular, mathematical, computational, synthetic, and population genetic approaches to evolution (Pigliucci 2007; O’Malley et al. 2015).

4. Revisiting Classical Philosophical Questions

With the emphasis on systems and interacting networks, both systems and synthetic biology explicitly engage in one of the oldest philosophical discussions on the relationship between the whole and its parts, or between holism and reductionism. This section examines how classical questions are reframed in the new light of strategies for large-scale data production and dynamic modeling.

4.1 Reductionism and the Sum of the Parts

As mentioned in the introduction, proponents of systems biology often explicitly define their approach in contrast to reductionist strategies in molecular biology. Molecular biology is depicted as a field studying molecular components and pathways in isolation, whereas systems biology integrates the pieces of the puzzle in the context of the system as a whole (van Regenmortel 2004; Keller 2005; Kitano 2002a,b). The contrast between molecular biology and systems biology is often overstated, and much of systems biology research is also focused on specific molecular difference-makers (De Backer et al. 2010; Gross 2017; O’Malley & Dupré 2005). However, systems biology may give a novel interpretation of Aristotle’s dictum that the whole is more than the sum of the parts by specifying what more means in the context of contemporary biology.

4.1.1. Modular and Bottom-Up Reductionism

When systems biologists criticize reduction in molecular biology, the issue at stake is typically the limitations of studying biological parts or modules in isolation. Because the target of the criticism often differs from the more traditional philosophical focus on reduction of higher-level to lower-level explanations (Brigandt & Love 2017, the notion of modular reductionism has been suggested (Gross & Green forthcoming). An anti-reductionist stance towards modular reductionism needs not reject the idea that living systems can be modelled and explained bottom up. For instance, while global approaches within these fields reject the modularity assumption, some keep the focus on genomes and molecular networks as the primary determinants of biological functions (O’Malley et al. 2008).[7]

Many systems biologists have, however, also argued against reduction of higher-level models and explanations, and there is an ongoing debate about how far genomics, proteomics, etc. will take us in solving complex problems like understanding cancer (cf., Barabási et al. 2011; Hood et al. 2015; Wolkenhauer & Green 2013). Similarly, researchers involved in projects aiming to simulate multiscale structures like the human heart emphasize the need to include macroscale parameters as they provide functionally important constraints on the behavior of microscale processes (Bassingthwaighte et al. 2009; Kohl & Noble 2009). An interesting reframing of Aristotle’s dictum in this discussion is that living systems at the same time are more and less than the sum of the parts (see Hofmeyr 2017; Noble 2012). In other words, the system as a whole constrains the degree of freedom of lower-level parts and provides a functional organization of these that are required for some system capacities (see below).

Given the increasing emphasis on comprehensive multiscale models, systems biology research may have a unique potential for philosophical insights considering the explanatory role of macroscale properties and top-down effects. Systems biologists for instance point to how enzyme activity is constrained by the chemical environment and the cellular context (Hofmeyr 2017), or how the biophysical properties of muscle fibers and cell membranes provide functional constraints on ionic oscillations central to the generation of heart rhythms (Noble 2012). Interpreting top-down effects as constraining relations may exemplify what philosophers of science have called ‘medium downward causation’ (Emmeche et al. 2000), which interprets downward causation as boundary conditions. Noble (2012) explicitly endorses such a view when arguing that downward causation is necessary by pointing out how equations describing the kinetics of ion channels in cardiac modeling cannot be solved without defining the boundary conditions (e.g., the cell voltage). Multi-scale modeling may thus help to give a more concrete mathematical reinterpretation of the controversial notion of downwards causation (see also Ellis et al. 2011; Gross & Green forthcoming). Moreover, discussions of downward causation in systems biology have practical as well as theoretical implications for cancer research as some proponents disagree on whether cancer is a genetic or tissue-based disease (Bertolaso 2011; Soto et al. 2008; see also Section 5.3).

4.1.2 Emergence and Predictability

Discussions of downward causation are often connected to debates about whether biological systems exhibit emergent properties. Emergence in the context of systems biology typically means that systems properties are explanatorily irreducible to the properties of parts (also called synchronic emergence). However, it is debatable which sense of emergence (weak or strong) systems biology supports (cf., Alberghina & Westerhoff 2005; Boogerd et al. 2005, 2007; Emmeche et al. 2000; Kolodkin et al. 2011). Moreover, systems biologists have different views on whether biological systems also exhibit diachronic emergence, i.e., system properties that are inherently unpredictable (Ellis et al. 2011).

Some systems biologists stress that biological complexity forces life scientists to draw on abstract and idealized models, and that there are practical and in principle limitations to our ability to fully predict and control living systems (Noble 2012; Bassingthwaighte et al. 2009). Others are more optimistic that the limitations can be overcome by upscaling computational models. Some even argue that systems biology breaks with the methodological principle of Ockham’s razor (Kolodkin & Westerhoff 2011; see also Hofmeyr 2017; Gross 2017). These debates center on fundamental questions about how far biological research can be taken by integrating more parameters and data points (Kolodkin et al. 2012), and how far we can ‘extend ourselves’ through computational approaches (Humphreys 2004; Vermeulen 2011).

Large-scale modeling projects such as the Vitual Cell, the Physiome Project, and the Virtual Physiological Human offer exciting cases for philosophical analysis of the prospects and challenges associated with parameterizing and validating complex models (Carusi et al. 2012; Carusi 2014; Hunter et al. 2013). Ultimately, such projects may push the boundaries for prediction and control in the life science, or may reveal deeper challenges of biological complexity.

4.2 Explanatory Pluralism

Systems biology also brings new insights to discussions of scientific explanation. The integration of different disciplinary inputs and emphasis on mathematical modeling make systems biology a particularly interesting case for discussions of whether the mechanistic account can fully capture the diversity of explanatory practices in contemporary biology.

Mechanistic accounts initially emphasized the differences between the explanatory ideal of covering laws in physics and explanations in molecular biology (Craver & Tabery 2015). Mechanistic explanations cite how biological functions arise from the interactions and organization of component parts or entities (Bechtel & Richardson 1993; Machamer et al. 2000; Glennan 2002). Since research in systems biology is often integrated with research in molecular and cell biology, some have argued that many cases in systems biology can readily be seen as an extension of mechanistic research (Boogerd et al. 2013; Richardson & Stephan 2007). However, the increasingly important role of mathematical and computational modeling for understanding non-linear dynamics, cyclic organization, and complex feedback relations have led some proponents to argue for a modified account of dynamic mechanistic explanations (Bechtel & Abrahamsen 2011, 2012; Brigandt 2013).[8]

Inspired by network analysis in systems biology, proponents of the dynamical mechanistic account have further argued for increased attention to strategies of abstraction used to identify organizational features and generalizable aspects of mechanisms (Bechtel 2015b; Levy & Bechtel 2013). The emphasis on spatial organization and mutual relations between components may possibly be better described as constitutive rather than causal aspects (Fagan 2015). Whereas causal relations are often prioritized in mechanistic accounts (or the two aspects conflated), distinguishing between these can help identify the distinct contributions of causal mechanistic modeling and mathematical analysis of network dynamics. To account for case examples from systems biology, Fagan (2015) suggests a joint account of collaborative explanations in which diverse perspectives are combined to account for the mutual relations of spatial organization and binding among components as well as the causal relations in the system.

Whereas the aforementioned accounts emphasize the importance of mathematical modeling for an updated mechanistic account, others view the emphasis on quantitative and dynamic aspects as a departure from mechanistic explanations. The interpretation of network models is often conducted in an abstract mathematical or engineering-inspired framework, and it has been stressed that it is hard or perhaps impossible to reconstruct a causal story from these models (Issad & Malaterre 2015; Gross 2015). Insofar as mathematical models are primarily used as inputs to or heuristics for mechanistic explanations, e.g., as mechanistic schemas, the reliance on these modeling strategies do not provide a challenge for mechanistic accounts (Darden 2002; Matthiessen 2015). Yet, although abstract modeling is compatible with mechanistic research, an important contested issue is whether abstract models are developed towards research aims that are distinct from mechanistic explanations.

Some have pointed to examples where the modeling process does not proceed from abstract to more detailed models but in the opposite direction, suggesting that mechanistic details may be vehicles for more generic explanations rather than the other way around (Braillard 2010; Green & Jones 2016). It has been argued that systems biologists sometimes aim for non-causal explanations. One candidate of non-causal explanations, called topological explanations, emphasizes how networks architectures generically determine dynamic behaviors, independently of the causal details of the network (Huneman 2010). Mathematical analysis of network structures underlying biological robustness has been argued to exemplify this explanatory goal (Jones 2014).

Another candidate is what Wouters (2007) in the context of comparative physiology calls design explanations. Design explanations do not describe how a biological function is causally produced but clarify why a given design (and not an alternative design) is present. They do so by pointing to constraints on the possible designs that make some designs good, some suboptimal, and others impossible (see Shinar & Feinberg 2011 for a candidate example from systems biology). The relevance of design explanations for systems biology lies in the interest to specify relations between functional capacities (e.g., robustness) and system organization (e.g., integral feedback control) via design principles that are independent of specific contexts of implementation (Braillard 2010; Boogerd 2017).

Others have discussed whether explanations in systems biology are mergers of mathematical explanations and mechanistic explanations (Baker 2005; Brigandt 2013; Mekios 2015) or introduce a new explanatory category called Causally Interpreted Model Explanations (Issad & Malaterre 2015). These proposals are not considered as alternatives to mechanistic accounts but are proposed as ingredients in a pluralistic approach to biological explanation (Brigandt et al. forthcoming; Mekios 2015). There is, however, currently no consensus on whether the differences are sufficiently significant to support an explanatory pluralism involving non-mechanistic explanations.

Although much, or perhaps most, of the philosophical work on systems biology has focused on explanation, one cannot assume that explanation is the sole aim of systems biology research (MacLeod & Nersessian 2015; Kastenhofer 2013a,b). Philosophers have debated whether research on the relation between biological robustness and integral feedback control should be considered as a stepping-stone for mechanistic explanations, or whether the perspective from control engineering constitute a non-mechanistic explanatory framework (Braillard 2010; Brigandt et al. forthcoming; Matthiessen 2015; Green & Jones 2016). But another important reason why some systems biologists seek generality and simplicity of their models may be that they—like synthetic biologists—wish to explore whether the same function could be realized in other or simpler ways (Briat et al. 2016). Thus, mathematical and computational modeling in synthetic and systems biology also call for philosophers to examine other epistemic aims than explanation. Examples are prediction, control, and design, and well as theoretical and practical interests in understanding the minimal requirements for biological functions and life itself.

5. Social and Societal Implications

5.1 Interdisciplinary Integration, Collaboration and Education

Large-scale interdisciplinary collaboration is increasingly highlighted as a necessary requirement for addressing the grand challenges of modern science and society (Vermeulen 2010; Calvert 2010; Andersen 2016). Since interdisciplinarity is a hallmark of systems and synthetic biology, both approaches offer rich sources for philosophical analysis of the epistemic features of interdisciplinary integration (O’Malley & Soyer 2012), interdisciplinary identities (Calvert 2012), and of large-scale collaboration across different universities (Calvert & Frow 2015; for examples of large-scale projects see the list of internet resources below).

Studying the prospects and challenges of interdisciplinary integration also offers a window to the cognitive processes involved in interdisciplinary problem-solving, where research cannot rely on a single theoretical framework (MacLeod & Nersessian 2013a,b). Through this process, different epistemic ideals operating in contemporary science often become apparent. While combining different conceptual frameworks can lead to innovation and scientific progress, the existence of different epistemic standards and values can also pose challenges for interdisciplinary collaboration (Calvert & Fujimura 2011; Carusi 2011; Kastenhofer 2007; Rowbottom 2011). Philosophical analysis has been proposed to help facilitate collaboration in situations where epistemic standards clash. Philosophy of science can help explicate the differences and the backgrounds for these, and uncover ‘blind spots’ considering the aims, values, constraints, and challenges of other disciplines (Nersessian 2017).

One divide that is commonly highlighted is the gap between experimental biologists and modelers with a background in engineering, mathematics, or physics. Empirical analyses of collaborations between modelers and experimentalists in systems biology show that these two groups often have different views on what kinds of data and models are most relevant (Nersessian 2017; Rowbottom 2011). For instance, modelers may not be interested in studying biological systems at the same level of detail as experimental biologists, and experimentalists may find highly abstract and idealized models inspired by physics or engineering misleading. From the perspective of engineers or physicists, the preoccupation with molecular details involves a risk of missing out on dynamic patterns that could be captured with more generic models (Lazebnik 2002). Experimentalists, in contrast, may find that such generic models often lack specificity or merely reproduce current biological knowledge (Fagan 2016). These differences may in part be grounded in different explanatory standards. It has been suggested that experimentalists typically aim for mechanistic explanations, whereas modelers often aim for more generic models or formulation of law-like principles and explanations (Fagan 2016; Green et al. 2015a).

Making explanatory standards and values more explicit, and clarifying the relative prospects and limitations of different research strategies, are ways in which philosophy of science could contribute to science and science education. At the same time, collaborative practices in synthetic and systems biology may call for an extension of the scope of philosophical analysis. Whereas philosophers traditionally have focused on logical and argumentative relations in scientific texts, understanding collaborative practices in systems and synthetic biology may further require the exploration of the aesthetic, cognitive, and creative dimensions of scientific practice (Carusi 2011; Ginsberg et al. 2015). Important questions are which aspects underlie choices of visualization strategies, and how the representation of biological data through diagrams, heat maps, network models, or state spaces influence biological reasoning and collaboration (Abrahamsen & Bechtel 2015; Carusi 2012; Jones & Wolkenhauer 2012).

5.2 Biology in the Digital Age

The emergence of systems biology and synthetic biology in the 21th century is to a large extent driven by the development of techniques and strategies for producing, digitalizing, collecting, disseminating, and standardizing data. A first step in these research practices is often to consult online databases or bio-ontologies that are used for data sharing, data integration, annotation, and curation of experimental datasets (Leonelli 2016). For instance, the search for network motifs (Section 1.1.1) started with the development of network models based on data downloaded from the database RegulonDB as well as other sources (Shen-Orr et al. 2002). Numerous databases, bio-ontologies, and software tools have been developed, emphasizing the ideals of Open Data and large-scale collaborative efforts (Leonelli 2013). These practices raise questions as to whether some projects within systems and synthetic biology may be described as ‘big science’ (Vermeulen 2010), and about the epistemic and social implications of data-intensive research practices and collaborations.

A highly debated issue is the extent to which big data will radically change or even revolutionize scientific methods, shifting the focus from hypothesis-driven inquiry to data-driven discoveries (e.g., Allen 2001; Kell & Olivier 2004; Mazzocchi 2015). The massive data-production and investments in collection and curation of data make possible the development of more comprehensive models which some expect to be more predictive (Hood et al. 2015). Data-intensive strategies are sometimes application-oriented, e.g., the use of Genome-Wide Association Studies (GWAS) to identify biomarkers for genomic risk profiling (Maher 2008; Hey 2015). Yet, data are often produced and compiled without specific aims in mind and are used and reused for multiple purposes (Leonelli 2016). Data-intensive systems biology research thus highlights the need to reconsider the relation between data and evidence, and between basic and applied science.

Whereas some have seen data-intensive strategies as a more bias-free approach, others have criticized the idea that data can speak for themselves and pointed to problematic aspects of top-down pattern inference from large datasets (Kell & Olivier 2004; Krohs 2012). Important philosophical questions are therefore whether new insights can result from data-intensive strategies, and how choices concerning collection, sampling, standardization, visualization, and interpretation of data affect the result of the analysis. Specifically, the results of correlation-based methods such as GWAS are sensitive to sampling procedures and specific statistical thresholds, and the clinical validity and utility of genetic biomarkers is a debated issue (e.g., Hey 2015; Maher 2008; McPherson and Tybjaerg-Hansen 2016).

Since the aim of bio-ontologies is to provide a standardized language and repository for shared information, choices concerning vocabulary and categorizations become important philosophical topics. Since the call for standardization may be compromised by context-dependencies of data production and use, data-curation and the creation of data infrastructures are gaining currency as topics within philosophy of science and social science (Leonelli 2016). Data-intensive practices also have implications for the institutional organization of science, as exemplified by the push for open access on one hand and commercial interests in big data on the other (Calvert & Frow 2015; Kastenhofer 2013a,b; Leonelli 2013, 2014; Royal Society 2012; Vermeulen 2011). As contexts for ownership of data change, also reward-systems in terms of authorship and credits may need to be reconsidered (Ankeny & Leonelli 2015).

5.3 Applications and Ethical Issues

Systems biology and synthetic biology are expected to help address societal challenges with payoffs for biomedical research, health care, and environmental resource management. While offering new exciting potentials, concerns have also been raised about the social and ethical implications of the new techno-scientific strategies.

Systems medicine, the medical application of systems biology, aims for major breakthroughs towards understanding of complex diseases such as cancer and heart conditions (Voit & Brigham 2008; Wolkenhauer et al. 2013). Ambitious projects within systems biology such as the Virtual Physiological Human raise intriguing questions about how computational modeling will influence future biomedical research (Kohl & Noble 2009; Kolodkin et al. 2011; Hunter et al. 2013). Multi-scale cardiac models are already being developed with important implications for the potential to address physiological variability, and for philosophical discussions of model validation and the relation between experiment and simulation (Carusi et al. 2012; Carusi 2014).

One of the important problems in contemporary medicine is how to account for patient-specific variation. Systems medicine is sometimes highlighted as a route to so-called personalized medicine (Hood & Flores 2012)[9] or digitalized medicine (Topol 2012). Proponents are optimistic that large-scale modeling of patient-specific data can result in a paradigm-shift from a one-size-fits-all model in traditional medicine, toward a more efficient systemic approach that can tailor disease prevention, diagnosis, and treatment to individual patients. The aim to personalize medicine is as old as the medical profession itself, but it is now promoted through data-intensive computational strategies with exciting new potentials (Tutton 2014). Moreover, the potential combination of systems medicine and synthetic biology opens for a constructive personalized medicine, where predictive modeling and synthetic interventions could be combined (O’Malley 2011a).

Developments in systems and synthetic biology have encouraged philosophers to revisit traditional conceptions of disease as dysfunctional states (Holm 2013, 2014), or broken mechanisms (Gross 2011). Rather than focusing on the function or dysfunction of specific mechanisms, network approaches to disease may suggest a more dynamic approach to disease focusing on how network states can be reorganized (Del Sol et al. 2010; Huang et al. 2009). Since cancer research is a major priority of systems biology research, epistemic and social implications of cancer research can be expected to gain more attention in future philosophy of systems biology (Bertolaso 2016).

In 2005, the Cancer Genome Atlas (TCGA) was launched to catalogue cancer-related mutations through tumor sequencing. TCGA and similar developments in cancer genomics have revealed an astonishing diversity of tumor types, suggesting that finer-grained disease-categories may be needed. This line of research has opened new research venues, such as the development of multi-action remedies targeting numerous disease-related pathways identified via genomic analysis. The discovered diversity of mutations identified in sequenced tumors has, however, also led to heated debates on whether the behavior and identity of cancer cells can fully be understood through the current focus on somatic mutations. Some have stressed the need to move beyond gene-centric or cell-centric approaches and to consider cancer as a problem of tissue-organization (Soto & Sonnenschein 2011). These debates have philosophical implications for discussions about (downward) causation and reductionism as well as practical implications for how cancer should be approached experimentally (Bertolaso 2011; Soto et al. 2008).

Data-intensive strategies aiming to identify biomarkers and genetic risk factors are expected to improve prediction, early detection, and prevention of common diseases (Hood & Flores 2012; Hood et al. 2015). Against this optimism, some have raised concerns about uncertainties and potential harmful results associated with genetic risk profiling, including the risk of overdiagnosis and unnecessary medicalization of healthy individuals (Green & Vogt 2016; Vogt et al. 2016a,b). Since predictive modeling as envisioned in systems medicine is dependent on access to patient-specific data, concerns regarding data security and social responsibilities are also brought up (Juengst et al. 2012). Philosophers and social scientists have for instance critically examined how risk information is communicated to the public by companies capitalizing on personalized genomics, and discussed how such information may affect health outcomes and perceptions of health (Bartol 2013; Prainsack 2014; Reydon et al. 2012). More generally, systems medicine has spurred debates about whether the vision to predict and control future health outcomes is compatible with a humanistic approach to medicine and social complexity (Tutton 2014; Vogt et al. 2014).

Ethical implications associated with the issue of control are also debated in the context of synthetic biology, e.g., through reflections on whether the attempt to create synthetic organisms may downgrade the value of or respect for life (cf. Douglas et al. 2013; Christiansen 2016a). Other ethical debates in synthetic biology consider the risk of negative consequences of specific synthetic applications. Discussions often involve so-called dual-use problems where the benefits of genetically modified organisms are weighted against potential problems and risks. Examples are biohazards associated with intentional or unintentional release of synthetic pathogens, or the possibility that synthetic production of biomedical compounds opens for efficient and inexpensive production of illegal drugs (Christiansen 2016b).

Finally, concerns have been raised about the commercialization of biotechnologies in both systems and synthetic biology. Examples are applications of broad patents concerning minimal genomes or synthetic genes (O’Malley et al. 2008), and vested interests in access to health data and lowering of diagnostic thresholds (Vogt et al. 2016a). Socioeconomic concerns have also been raised that industrial production via synthetic organisms may outcompete conventional farming in developing countries (Christiansen 2016b). Thus, the strong push to address societal problems through systems and synthetic biology gives rise to new exciting possibilities but also calls for critical examination from philosophers and social scientists.

6. Concluding Remarks

Systems and synthetic biology are often described as distinguishable in their emphasis on analysis versus synthesis, but the ties to engineering approaches are complex and multi-faceted in both fields. Systems and synthetic biology have been addressed together in this entry because many scientific and philosophical issues overlap. Both approaches draw inspiration from engineering, mathematics, physics, and computer science, but in various different ways and towards the different aims of understanding, predicting, and modifying biological systems. Accordingly, both approaches provide excellent sources for philosophical discussions of interdisciplinary integration, particularly the implications of the increasing embedding of mathematical and computational approaches in biology. Some practices encourage philosophers to revisit classical philosophical topics such as reductionism and scientific explanation, but systems and synthetic biology also broaden the scope of philosophical topics to include data-intensive practices and modeling strategies towards the aims of design and control.

Since this entry has examined the philosophical implications of both systems biology and synthetic biology, much attention has been given to the implications of engineering approaches, including the quest for so-called design principles. It is, however, important to note that systems biology and synthetic biology cover a broad spectrum of research practices, some of which are more strongly inspired by chemistry or physics than engineering. This entry should thus be taken as an attempt to only cover some ground of the vast philosophical landscape that these research fields reach into. With the rapid development of both approaches and their explicit aim to address grand scientific and societal challenges, exciting times lie ahead for philosophy of biology.


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Lucy Holt, Maria Serban, Sune Holm, William Bechtel, Fridolin Gross, Mikkel W. Johannsen, Line Andersen, Leonardo Bich, and an anonymous reviewer provided extremely valuable comments to an earlier version of this entry.

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