Notes to Time Travel and Modern Physics

1. There is a large philosophical literature on the first two paradoxes (and others), see, e.g., the entry on time travel, Wasserman (2018), and Effingham (2020), but very little on the easy knowledge paradox (emphasized by Deutsch 1991, discussed further below). Our approach differs from the literature surveyed in these two books by focusing on the physical—rather than metaphysical—possibility of time travel.

2. Multiple collisions are handled in the obvious way by continuity considerations: just continue straight lines through the collision point and identify which particle is which by their ordering in space.

3. The dynamics here is radically non-time-reversible. Indeed, the dynamics is deterministic in the future direction but not in the past direction.

4. One might hope that fixed point theorems can be used to prove the existence of solutions in this type of cases too. Consider, for instance, a fixed initial state of motion I of the ball. Then consider all the possible velocities and locations and times \(\langle v,x,t\rangle\) at which such a ball could enter mouth 1 of the wormhole. Each such triple \(\langle v,x,t\rangle\) will determine the trajectory of that ball out of mouth 2. One can then look at the continuation of the trajectory from state I and that from state s, and see whether these trajectories collide. Then one can see for each possible triple \(\langle v,x,t\rangle\) whether the ball that starts in state I will be collided into mouth 1, and if it is, with which speed at what location and at which time this will occur. Thus given state I, each triple \(\langle v,x,t\rangle\) maps onto another triple \(\langle v',x',t'\rangle\). One might then suggest appealing to a fixed point theorem to argue that there must be a solution for each initial state I. However, in the first place the set of possible speeds and times are open sets. And in the second place there can be multiple wormhole traversals. Thus the relevant total state-space of wormhole mouth crossings consists of discretely many completely disconnected state-spaces (with increasing numbers of dimensions). So standard fixed point theorems do not apply directly. It should be noted that the results that have been achieved regarding this case do make use of fixed points theorems quite extensively. But their application is limited to certain sub-problems, and do not yield a fully general proof of the lack of constraints for arbitrary I.

5. This argument, especially the second illustration of it, is similar to the one in Horwich (1987: 124–128). However, we do not share Horwich’s view that it only tells against time travel of humans into their local past.

6. Recently physicists have developed a similar computational approach (called the process matrix formalism) to describe interactions among systems with indefinite causal structure. See Adlam (unpublished) for a philosophical discussion and references to the physics literature.

7. In this section we will presume familiarity with quantum mechanics. See, for example, the entry on quantum mechanics, and its extremely useful guide to further reading, for an entry point to this subject.

Copyright © 2023 by
Christopher Smeenk <>
Frank Arntzenius
Tim Maudlin

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