Notes to Transmission of Justification and Warrant

1. For instance s’s background information should in this case include scientific assumptions—e.g., that a lethal quantity of the toxins contained in the specified mushrooms will kill an ordinary human being who has taken no antidote shortly after its absorption—and assumptions about Jones—e.g., that Jones is an ordinary individual who has taken no antidote.

2. E1 provides s with justification for P1 only given some background information. For instance s’s background information should include assumptions about the toadstools in the risotto—e.g., that a large risotto of Boletus Satana is sufficiently rich in lethal toxins.

3. It is standard practice to distinguish propositional justification from doxastic justification. Roughly, a subject s has propositional justification for believing a proposition p just in case, whether or not s actually believes p, it would be epistemically appropriate for s to believe p. On the other hand s is doxastically justified in believing p just in case s has propositional justification for believing p and s actually believes p in virtue of that justification.

4. Consider for instance Toadstool. Suppose that s acquires no justification from E1 for P1 because s ignores E1 or has a defeater of the justification from E1 for P1, or that s ignores that P1 entails Q1. In these cases, whether or not Q1 is justified for s, s has no justification for Q1 in virtue of s’s justification from E1 for P1 and s’s knowledge that P1 entails Q1. Yet if E1 had been known by s or if s had no defeater of the justification from E1 for P1, and s had known that P1 entails Q1, s would have acquired some justification for Q1 in virtue of her justification for P1 from E1 and her knowledge of the entailment from P1 to Q1.

5. This is presumably what Wright actually means. For instance Wright resumes the information dependence template by saying that the justification from e for p cannot transmit to p’s consequence q ‘if the justification for p supplied by e depends in the first place on prior and independent justification for q’ (Wright 2002, 336, edited). Elsewhere, much in the same spirit, Wright observes that transmission may fail in ‘cases where there is justification for the premises in the first place only because the conclusion is antecedently justified’ (2003, 57–58, edited). As we explain in Sect. 5.1, Wright contends that we sometimes have justification to accept background propositions. Wright’s notion of acceptance is clarified in note 11.

6. Wright (2011) describes this type of justification as second order justification or as involving second order justification. We find these characterisations a bit misleading.

7. Brown (2004) has criticised an earlier refinement of (c) in Wright (2003) and proposed an alternative amendment of the disjunctive template, criticised in turn by Wright (2011).

8. Although Smith (2009) offers an explanation of transmission failure, his account could be reformulated in terms of non-transmissivity.

9.  Davies (2003a, 2004 and 2009) distinguishes between the dialectical project of a speaker who aims at convincing a hearer who doubts of a given proposition q and the epistemic project of a subject s who aims at settling the question whether q is true. Within the epistemic project it is s herself who supposes that q is false—i.e., who has a  suppositional doubt about q (where s’s suppositional doubt about q is compatible with s’s actually having justification for believing q or s’s being entitled to believe q).

10. For example, Wright believes that a cornerstone for the region of discourse about other people’s mental states is the proposition that other people do have minds. If one had no independent justification for believing this proposition, one’s observation that another person’s behaviour and physical conditions are in all respects as if she were in a given mental state could supply one with no justification for believing that that person is actually in that mental state (cf. Wright 2004).

11. Entitlements are, for Wright, unearned in the sense that they depend on no a priori or a posteriori evidence. Furthermore, acceptance is to be understood, for Wright, as a more general attitude than belief that includes belief as a subcase. Acceptance of p also includes attitudes like acting under the assumption that p or taking p for granted. Cf. Wright (2004).

12. Pryor’s dogmatism takes perceptions to be mental states different from beliefs (though likewise provided with representational or propositional content); perceptual justification is thus taken to be non-inferential. Pryor’s (2000) and (2004) notion of perceptual justification is clearly internalist in character. Pryor’s recent characterisations of dogmatism allow for externalist notions of perceptual justification (see for instance the manuscript by Pryor in Other Internet Resources and Pryor 2013).

13. A similar diagnosis of the ineffectiveness of Moore’s proof has been offered by Burge (2003) and Markie (2005).

14. This is White’s argument in more detail. White models acquisition of justification as a boost in rational credence, to the effect that s acquires justification for x from y only if Pr(x|y) > Pr(x) –– i.e., y confirms x. It is plausible that Pr (E8| P8) ≅ Pr(E8| Not-Q8*) ≅ 1 –– i.e., s’s credence in E8 should be close to certainty if the truth of P8 or the truth of Not-Q8* were given to her. Furthermore, since s shouldn’t in general expect to have an experience of a hand, Pr(E8) << 1 –– i.e. s’s prior credence in E8 should be far from certainty. Thus Pr(E8| P8) > Pr (E8) and Pr(E8| Not-Q8*) > Pr (E8). The first inequality entails that Pr(P8| E8) > Pr(P8), and the second that Pr (Not-Q8*| E8) > Pr(Not-Q8*). So E8 confirms both P8 and Not-Q8*. This indicates that when s learns E8, s acquires some justification for both P8 and Not-Q8*. It can be shown that Pr(Not-Q8*| E8) > Pr (Not-Q8*) entails that Pr(Q8*| E8) < Pr(Q8*). This indicates that when s learns E8, s’s justification for Q8* decreases. Thus, it seems that when s experiences as if there is a hand before her face, s cannot acquire justification for Q8*. White concludes from this that if s has perceptual justification for P8, this justification cannot transmit from P8 to its logical consequence Q8. (For a more complete explanation of the formalism see the supplement on Bayesian Formalisations of the Information-Dependence Template.)

15. One of White’s (2006) Bayesian arguments against dogmatism would seem to attest that the information-dependence template is satisfied by Moore*. White argues that since Pr(Not-Q8*| E8) > Pr(Not-Q8*) –– i.e., E8 confirms Not-Q8* –– it necessarily follows that Pr(Q8*| E8) < Pr(Q8*) –– i.e., E8 disconfirms Q8* (see note 17 above). Furthermore, since P8 entails Q8*, it necessarily follows that Pr(P8| E8) ≤ Pr(Q8*| E8). The last two inequalities trivially imply by transitivity that Pr(P8| E8) < Pr(Q8*). As White suggests, if we model epistemic justification as sufficiently high rational credence, the last inequality says that E8 can justify P8 only if there is prior justification for Q8*. In fact suppose j is the justification threshold. The inequality implies that Pr(P8| E8) > j only if Pr(Q8*) > j. For responses to White, see for instance Silins (2007), Weatherson (2007), Kung (2010) and Moretti (2015). (For a more complete explanation of the formalism see the supplement on Bayesian Formalisations of the Information-Dependence Template.)

16. Although Pryor (2000 and 2004) is not explicit on this point, he seems to implicitly accept that s’s experience as if p can provide s with prima facie justification for p whether or not s assumes any cornerstone.

17. Davies’s various limitation principles have undergone various transformations in time (see Davies 1998, 2000, 2003a and 2009). Important criticism can be found in McLaughlin (2003).

18. Things get worse as one considers Wright’s (2011) reformulation of (d) as (d*): not-q entails r. In this case it is clear that Water does not instantiate the (so reformulated) disjunctive template. For it seems possible that s (or s’s community) has failed to be embedded in an environment that contains water—so that Not-Q9 is true—but ‘water’ nonetheless refers to a natural kind (the watery substance abounding on Twin Earth)—so that R is false.

19. Endorsed more hesitantly in Wright (2011).

20. Davies (2003a) made use of a limitation principle that McLaughlin (2003) has shown to be flawed. Here we have replaced that limitation principle with (LP*).

Copyright © 2018 by
Luca Moretti <l.moretti@abdn.ac.uk>
Tommaso Piazza <tommaso.piazza@unipv.it>

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