Notes to The Identity Theory of Truth

1. Throughout “that”-clauses in relevant positions are italicized for clarity and ease of reading: the italicization has no grammatical significance, and could be omitted without solecism.

2. The inclusion of (8) in the definition of the identity theory pushes it somewhat in the direction of linguistic idealism: this emerges clearly from Hornsby’s discussion (at 1997: 9). That, though not a problem for everyone, would or might be objectionable to some upholders of the identity theory; so again, for that reason too, it makes sense to keep the two positions (i.e., (5)/(7) and (8)) definitionally separate from one another.

3. The word “thought” is capitalized throughout whenever Frege’s special sense is in question.

4. See, e.g., Bradley 1914: 112–13. For further discussion and references, see Candlish 1989; 1995; 1999b: 209–12; Baldwin 1991: 36–40.

5. See Baldwin 1991: 44–8; Candlish 1999a: 234; 1999b: 206–9.

6. Frege 1918–19: 74; 1977: 25. See Hornsby 1997: 4–6.

7. Sullivan’s ground for proposing that we regard Tractarian objects as senses is that, like bona fide Fregean senses, they cannot be grasped in different ways. But one might feel that that was rather inadequate as a basis for the proposal: there is surely more to Fregean sense than just the property of transparency. Russell also attached the property of transparency to his basic objects, but no one, it would seem, has suggested that Russellian objects are really senses, and the suggestion would seem to have little going for it (partly, though not only, because Russell himself explicitly disavowed the whole idea of Fregean sense).

8. Strictly, this phrase is a solecism: it should be either “truth-donors” or “true-makers”, as Künne points out (2003: 158 n. 200). But unfortunately the incorrect phrase has acquired currency, so I shall use it here.

9. But this assumption is not essential, and the ensuing discussion can easily be adapted to accommodate nominalist qualms about universals.

10. A question that arises here is whether tropes might be able to provide a “thinner” alternative to such ontologically “rich” entities as the fact that Socrates is wise: for discussion see Dodd 2008a: 7–9. The problem that seems to confront any such strategy is that of making the proposed alternative a genuine one, i.e., of construing the relevant tropes in such a way that they do not simply collapse into, or ontologically depend on, entities of the relatively rich form that Socrates is wise.

11. But in favor of keeping the label “theory”, see David 2002: 126.

12. If Sullivan (2005) were right about the Tractatus§2 above—one might think that Wittgenstein there propounded something like this position.

13. In defense of the possibility of unified false propositions in re, see Gaskin 2006: 215–20; 2008: 110–14.

14. Notwithstanding this point, the sense of one linguistic expression can itself be the referent of another such expression. What is ruled out is that that entity might be both the sense and referent of the same expression. At least, so one might naturally assume: but to discuss this issue fully would take us into the territory of Frege’s views on oratio obliqua and Dummett’s interpretation thereof.

15. Dodd 1995 and 1999; Suhm, Wagemann, Wessels 2000; Gaskin 2006: 181–4. Dodd withdraws the charge against McDowell at 2008b: 82. See also his 2008a: 174–86, where the charge against Hornsby is not so much withdrawn as made subject to hedging and nuance. It is actually not clear that Dodd is right to withdraw the charge against McDowell, given the latter’s insistence that facts are “perceptible … an aspect of the perceptible world” (McDowell 1996: 26; cf. Dodd 2008a: 182).

16. McDowell 2000; 2005: 84–5; Hornsby 1999: 241–2. It is clear from the final paragraph of one of Hornsby’s footnotes (1997: 4, n. 6) that she embraces an intensional conception of facts, and so locates them at the level of sense.

17. This issue has generated some discussion in the literature. Apart from the pieces already mentioned (in the last two footnotes), see Engels 2001, 2005; Fish and Macdonald 2007, 2009.

18. One might wish to identify the world with more than merely the true or obtaining reference-level propositions/facts, but also with the false or non-obtaining ones. See Gaskin 2006: ch. 6; 2008: ch. 2. And there is also the problem (if it is one) of facts that cannot be expressed in language (§1) to worry about.

19. That seems to me to be the right point to make against McDowell’s location of the world at the level of sense. Sullivan offers another objection. He writes of McDowell’s appeal to de re sense—the point that referents are “contained in” de re senses—that

this response is too local to be effective: the descriptive conception of sense is, after all, not universally wrong. (2005: 60 n. 6)

There is perhaps an awkwardness of terminology hereabouts, for we talk of de re senses, and we have in mind the way in which (genuine) proper names and demonstrative expressions present their referents; but of course concept-expressions present their referents in an equally direct way. “Red” refers, as directly as may be, and certainly not descriptively, to the property or (Fregean) concept of redness, “not” refers directly to negation, and so on. If we are ready to be realists about redness and negation, then we should speak of de re senses in these latter cases too, that is, we should speak of their names as having de re sense. In fact I suggest that the descriptive conception of Fregean sense is universally wrong, at least for semantically simple expressions. That is, no genuine names—including names of properties, functions, operations, etc.—have a descriptive sense or reference. (Of course some complex expressions, and in particular descriptions, definite and indefinite, together with names or other linguistic expressions that abbreviate or in some other way do duty for descriptions, do have descriptive senses and references.) But that, if correct, still does not vindicate McDowell’s idea that the world is a sense-level rather than a reference-level entity.

20. See Gaskin 2002 (with references to further relevant literature). The problem and its solution have been discussed in terms not merely of the distinction between real and formal identity/distinctness, but also the distinction between the de re and the de dicto. In both cases, to make the terminology fit our version of the problem, one needs to work with an extended conception of what it is to be a res, one which allows such entities as that Socrates is wise to count as res.

21. I depart from Candlish’s formulation at 1999b: 203. Candlish’s discussion of the “right fact” problem at this point involves him in oscillations between formal- and material-mode versions of the identity theory, i.e., in oscillations between treating the “p” as it figures in these versions (i) as a placeholder for a proposition (formal mode), and (ii) as a variable occurring in a name position that can be quantified into (material mode). Not unnaturally, he diagnoses confusion. But these difficulties seem to be both avoidable and strictly extraneous to the core of the “right fact” problem. That problem can be raised, and I believe solved, without departing from the formal mode of expression: this is what I attempt to do here.

22. Beall’s formulation has been tidied up slightly, so as to maintain the formal mode of expression (see previous note).

23. In response to an objector who presses him with

You have shown that the true proposition that p is identical with a fact, but which fact is it identical with?

Beall indeed gives what, it is here suggested, is the right answer: “It is identical with the fact that p” (2000: 129). However, since he thinks he has “dissolved” Candlish’s problem by appeal to the indiscernibility of identicals, Beall is inclined to regard the question as a spurious one and the answer as unnecessary. If he has failed to show that the “right fact” problem is spurious, the answer is crucial to solving (not dissolving) the problem.

24. See supplement on the Slingshot Argument to the Facts entry for discussion and references.

25. See further Gaskin 2008: ch. 2 esp. §15.

26. Oddly, Künne, who advances this argument against the identity theory, seems to undermine the argument when he remarks in a footnote that

We would badly affect the rhythm, rhyme, and reason in Schiller’s Ode to Joy if we were to replace the final word of “All men are brothers” by “male siblings”. Nevertheless, brothers are male siblings, and “brother” even means MALE SIBLING. (2003: 11 n. 25).

If the non-congruence of “brother” and “male sibling” does not derogate from their synonymy, it is unclear why the non-congruence of “true proposition” and “fact” should derogate from (in some sense) their synonymy. But note that we do not need here to settle the question whether “brother” and “male sibling” are actually synonymous, in any sense. Similarly with “true proposition” and “fact”. One view would be that these expressions are not, strictly speaking, synonymous, in respect of either sense or reference, but rather necessarily co-extensive. And that is quite sufficient for the purposes of the identity claim. (So the case would be like “equilateral triangle” and “equiangular triangle”, which, plausibly, share neither sense nor reference—being composite expressions that do not match in either sense or reference in all their meaningful parts—but are, as wholes, necessarily satisfied by the same objects.) See further Gaskin 2008: ch. 2.

27. The account has to be slightly complicated to accommodate a distinction between simple and complex propositions: it will apply directly only to simple propositions, and indirectly to complex ones. See Gaskin 2006: 220–4.

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Richard Gaskin <>

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