# The Revision Theory of Truth

*First published Fri Dec 15, 1995; substantive revision Tue Jun 6, 2023*

Consider the following sentence:

- (1)
- (1) is not true.

It has long been known that the sentence, (1), produces a paradox, the
so-called *liar’s paradox*: it seems impossible
consistently to maintain that (1) is true, and impossible consistently
to maintain that (1) is not true: if (1) is true, then (1) says,
truly, that (1) is not true so that (1) is not true; on the other
hand, if (1) is not true, then what (1) says is the case, i.e., (1) is
true. (For details, see Section 1, below.) Given such a paradox, one
might be sceptical of the notion of truth, or at least of the
prospects of giving a scientifically respectable account of truth.

Alfred Tarski’s great accomplishment was to show how to give
— contra this scepticism — a formal definition of truth
for a wide class of formalized languages. Tarski did *not*,
however, show how to give a definition of truth for languages (such as
English) *that contain their own truth predicates*. He thought
that this could not be done, precisely because of the liar’s
paradox. More generally, Tarski reckoned that *any* language
with its own truth predicate would be inconsistent, as long as it
obeyed the rules of standard classical logic, and had the ability to
refer to its own sentences. As we will see in our remarks on Theorem
2.1 in Section 2.3, Tarski was not quite right: there are consistent
classical interpreted languages that refer to their own sentences and
have their own truth predicates. (This point originates in Gupta 1982
and is strengthened in Gupta and Belnap 1993.)

Given the close connection between *meaning* and
*truth*, it is widely held that any semantics for a language
\(L\), i.e., any theory of meaning for \(L\), will be closely related
to a theory of truth for \(L\): indeed, it is commonly held that
something like a Tarskian theory of truth for \(L\) will be a central
part of a semantics for \(L\). Thus, the impossibility of giving a
Tarskian theory of truth for languages with their own truth predicates
threatens the project of giving a semantics for languages with their
own truth predicates.

We had to wait until the work of Kripke 1975 and of Martin &
Woodruff 1975 for a systematic formal proposal of a semantics for
languages with their own truth predicates. The basic thought is
simple: take the offending sentences, such as (1), to be *neither
true nor false*. Kripke, in particular, shows how to implement
this thought for a wide variety of languages, in effect employing a
semantics with three values, *true*, *false* and
*neither*.^{[1]}
It is safe to say that Kripkean approaches have replaced Tarskian
pessimism as the new orthodoxy concerning languages with their own
truth predicates.

One of the main rivals to the three-valued semantics is the Revision
Theory of Truth, or RTT, independently conceived by Hans Herzberger
and Anil Gupta, and first presented in publication in Herzberger 1982a
and 1982b, Gupta 1982 and Belnap 1982 — the first monographs on
the topic are Yaqūb 1993 and the *locus classicus*, Gupta
& Belnap 1993. The RTT is designed to model the kind of reasoning
that the liar sentence leads to, *within a two-valued context*.
(See Section 5.2 on the question of whether the RTT is genuinely
two-valued.) The central idea is the idea of a *revision
process*: a process by which we *revise* hypotheses about
the truth-value of one or more sentences. The present article’s
purpose is to outline the Revision Theory of Truth. We proceed as
follows:

- 1. Semiformal introduction
- 2. Framing the problem
- 3. Basic notions of the RTT
- 4. Interpreting the formalism
- 5. Further issues
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Semiformal introduction

Let’s take a closer look at the sentence (1), given above:

- (1)
- (1) is not true.

It will be useful to make the paradoxical reasoning explicit. First, suppose that:

- (2)
- (1) is not true.

It seems an intuitive principle concerning truth that, for any sentence \(p\), we have the so-called T-biconditional

- (3)
- ‘\(p\)’ is true iff \(p\).

(Here we are using ‘iff’ as an abbreviation for ‘if and only if’.) In particular, we should have

- (4)
- ‘(1) is not true’ is true iff (1) is not true.

Thus, from (2) and (4), we get

- (5)
- ‘(1) is not true’ is true.

Then we can apply the identity,

- (6)
- (1) = ‘(1) is not true.’

to conclude that (1) is true. This all shows that if (1) is not true, then (1) is true. Similarly, we can also argue that if (1) is true then (1) is not true. So (1) seems to be both true and not true: hence the paradox. As stated above, the three-valued approach to the paradox takes the liar sentence, (1), to be neither true nor false. Exactly how, or even whether, this move blocks the above reasoning is a matter for debate.

The RTT is not designed to block reasoning of the above kind, but to
model it — or most of
it.^{[2]}
As stated above, the central idea is the idea of a *revision
process*: a process by which we *revise* hypotheses about
the truth-value of one or more sentences.

Consider the reasoning regarding the liar sentence, (1) above. Suppose
that we *hypothesize* that (1) is not true. Then, with an
application of the relevant T-biconditional, we might revise our
hypothesis as follows:

Hypothesis: | (1) is not true. |

T-biconditional: | ‘(1) is not true’ is true iff (1) is not true. |

Therefore: | ‘(1) is not true’ is true. |

Known identity: | (1) = ‘(1) is not true’. |

Conclusion: | (1) is true. |

New revised hypothesis: |
(1) is true. |

We could continue the revision process, by revising our hypothesis once again, as follows:

New hypothesis: | (1) is true. |

T-biconditional: | ‘(1) is not true’ is true iff (1) is not true. |

Therefore: | ‘(1) is not true’ is not true. |

Known identity: | (1) = ‘(1) is not true’. |

Conclusion: | (1) is not true. |

New new revised hypothesis: |
(1) is not true. |

As the revision process continues, we flip back and forth between taking the liar sentence to be true and not true.

**Example 1.1**

It is worth seeing how this kind of revision reasoning works in a case with several interconnected sentences. Let’s apply the revision idea to the following three sentences:

- (7)
- (8) is true or (9) is true.
- (8)
- (7) is true.
- (9)
- (7) is not true.

Informally, we might reason as follows. Either (7) is true or (7) is
not true. Thus, either (8) is true or (9) is true. Thus, (7) is true.
Thus (8) is true and (9) is not true, and (7) is still true. Iterating
the process once again, we get (8) is true, (9) is not true, and (7)
is true. More formally, consider any initial hypothesis, \(h_0\),
about the truth values of (7), (8) and (9). Either \(h_0\) says that
(7) is true or \(h_0\) says that (7) is not true. In either case, we
can use the T-biconditional to generate our revised hypothesis
\(h_1\): if \(h_0\) says that (7) is true, then \(h_1\) says that
‘(7) is true’ is true, i.e. that (8) is true; and if
\(h_0\) says that (7) is not true, then \(h_1\) says that ‘(7)
is not true’ is true, i.e. that (9) is true. So \(h_1\) says
that either (8) is true or (9) is true. So \(h_2\) says that
‘(8) is true or (9) is true’ is true. In other words,
\(h_2\) says that (7) is true. So no matter what hypothesis \(h_0\) we
start with, two iterations of the revision process lead to a
hypothesis that (7) is true. Similarly, three *or more*
iterations of the revision process, lead to the hypothesis that (7) is
true, (8) is true and (9) is not true — regardless of our
initial hypothesis. In Section 3, we will reconsider this example in a
more formal context.

One thing to note is that, in Example 1.1, the revision process yields
*stable* truth values for all three sentences. The notion of a
sentence *stably true in all revision sequences* will be a
central notion for the RTT. The revision-theoretic treatment
contrasts, in this case, with the three-valued approach: on most ways
of implementing the three-valued idea, all three sentences, (7), (8)
and (9), turn out to be neither true nor
false.^{[3]}
In this case, the RTT arguably better captures the correct informal
reasoning than does the three-valued approach: the RTT assigns to the
sentences (7), (8) and (9) the truth-values that were assigned to them
by the informal reasoning given at the beginning of the example.

## 2. Framing the problem

### 2.1 Truth languages

The goal of the RTT is *not* to give a paradox-free account of
truth. Rather, the goal of the RTT is to give an account of our often
unstable and often paradoxical reasoning about truth. RTT seeks, more
specifically, to give a two-valued account that assigns stable
classical truth values to sentences when intuitive reasoning would
assign stable classical truth values. We will present a formal
semantics for a formal language: we want that language to have both a
truth predicate and the resources to refer to its own sentences.

Let us consider a first-order language \(L\), with connective &,
\(\vee\), and \(\neg\), quantifiers \(\forall\) and \(\exists\), the
equals sign =, variables, and some stock of names, function symbols
and relation symbols. We will say that \(L\) is a *truth
language*, if it has a distinguished predicate \(\boldsymbol{T}\)
and quotation marks ‘ and ’, which will be used to form
*quote names*: if \(A\) is a sentence of \(L\), then
‘\(A\)’ is a name. Let \(\textit{Sent}_L = \{A : A\) is a
sentence of \(L\}\).

It will be useful to identify the \(\boldsymbol{T}\)-free fragment of
a truth language \(L\): the first-order language \(L^-\) that has the
same names, function symbols and relation symbols as \(L\),
*except* the unary predicate \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Since \(L^-\)
has the same names as \(L\), including the same quote names, \(L^-\)
will have a quote name ‘\(A\)’ for every sentence \(A\) of
\(L\). Thus \(\forall x\boldsymbol{T}x\) is not a sentence of \(L^-\),
but ‘\(\forall x\boldsymbol{T}x\)’ is a name of \(L^-\)
and \(\forall x(x =\) ‘\(\forall x\boldsymbol{T}x\)’) is a
sentence of \(L^-\).

### 2.2 Ground models

Other than the truth predicate, we will assume that our language is
interpreted classically. More precisely, let a *ground model*
for \(L\) be a classical model \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\) for \(L^-\),
the \(\boldsymbol{T}\)-free fragment of \(L\), satisfying the
following:

- \(D\) is a nonempty domain of discourse;
- \(I\) is a function assigning
- to each name of \(L\) a member of \(D\);
- to each \(n\)-ary function symbol of \(L\) a function from \(D^n\) to \(D\); and
- to each \(n\)-ary relation symbol, other than \(\boldsymbol{T}\),
of \(L\) a function from \(D^n\) to one of the two truth-values in the
set \(\{\mathbf{t},
\mathbf{f}\}\);
^{[4]}

- \(\textit{Sent}_L\) \(\subseteq\) \(D\); and
- \(I\)(‘\(A\)’) \(= A\) for every \(A \in\) \(\textit{Sent}_L\).

Clauses (1) and (2) simply specify what it is for \(M\) to be a classical model of the \(\boldsymbol{T}\)-free fragment of \(L\). Clauses (3) and (4) ensure that \(L\), when interpreted, can talk about its own sentences. Given a ground model, we will consider the prospects of providing a satisfying interpretation of \(\boldsymbol{T}\). The most obvious desideratum is that the ground model, expanded to include an interpretation of \(\boldsymbol{T}\), satisfy Tarski’s T-biconditionals, i.e., the biconditionals of the form

\[ \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo A\rsquo \text{ iff } A \]for each \(A \in\) \(\textit{Sent}_L\).

Some useful terminology: Given a ground model \(M\) for \(L\) and a
name, function symbol or relation symbol \(X\), we can think of
\(I(X)\) as the *interpretation* or, to borrow a term from
Gupta and Belnap, the *signification* of \(X\). Gupta and
Belnap characterize an expression’s or concept’s
*signification* in a world \(w\) as “an abstract
something that carries all the information about all the
expression’s [or concept’s] extensional relations in
\(w\).” If we want to interpret \(\boldsymbol{T}x\) as
‘\(x\) is true’, then, given a ground model \(M\), we
would like to find an appropriate signification, or an appropriate
range of significations, for \(\boldsymbol{T}\).

### 2.3 Three ground models

We might try to assign to \(\boldsymbol{T}\) a *classical*
signification, by expanding \(M\) to a classical model \(M' = \langle
D',I'\rangle\) for all of \(L\), including \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Also
recall that we want \(M'\) to satisfy the T-biconditionals: for our
immediate purposes, let us interpret these classically. Let us say
that an expansion \(M'\) of a ground model \(M\) is *Tarskian*
iff \(M'\) is a classical model and all of the T-biconditionals,
interpreted classically, are true in \(M'\). We would like to expand
ground models to Tarskian models. We consider three ground models in
order to assess our prospects for doing this.

**Ground model**\(M_1\)- Our first ground model is a formalization of Example 1.1, above. Suppose that \(L_1\) contains three non-quote names, \(\alpha , \beta\), and \(\gamma\), and no predicates other than \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Let \(M_1 = \langle D_1 ,I_1 \rangle\) be as follows: \[\begin{align} D_1 &= \textit{Sent}_{L_1} \\ I_1(\alpha) &= \boldsymbol{T}\beta \vee \boldsymbol{T}\gamma \\ I_1 (\beta) &= \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \\ I_1 (\gamma) &= \neg \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \end{align}\]
**Ground model**\(M_2\)- Suppose that \(L_2\) contains one non-quote name, \(\tau\), and no predicates other than \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Let \(M_2 = \langle D_2 ,I_2 \rangle\) be as follows: \[\begin{align} D_2 &= \textit{Sent}_{L_2} \\ I_2 (\tau) &= \boldsymbol{T}\tau \end{align}\]
**Ground model**\(M_3\)- Suppose that \(L_3\) contains one non-quote name, \(\lambda\), and no predicates other than \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Let \(M_3 = \langle D_3 ,I_3 \rangle\) be as follows: \[\begin{align} D_3 &= \textit{Sent}_{L_3} \\ I_3 (\lambda) &= \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda \end{align}\]

**Theorem 2.1**

- (1)
- \(M_1\) can be expanded to exactly one Tarskian model: in this model, the sentences \((\boldsymbol{T}\beta \vee \boldsymbol{T}\gamma)\) and \(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha\) are true, while the sentence \(\neg \boldsymbol{T}\alpha\) is false.
- (2)
- \(M_2\) can be expanded to exactly two Tarskian models, in one of which the sentence \(\boldsymbol{T}\tau\) is true and in the other of which the sentence \(\boldsymbol{T}\tau\) is false.
- (3)
- \(M_3\) cannot be expanded to a Tarskian model.

The proofs of (1) and (2) are beyond the scope of this article, but some remarks are in order.

Re (1): The fact that \(M_1\) can be expanded to a Tarskian model is
not surprising, given the reasoning in Example 1.1, above: any initial
hypothesis about the truth values of the three sentences in question
leads, after three iterations of the revision process, to a stable
hypothesis that \((\boldsymbol{T}\beta \vee \boldsymbol{T}\gamma)\)
and \(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha\) are true, while \(\neg
\boldsymbol{T}\alpha\) is false. The fact that \(M_1\) can be expanded
to *exactly* one Tarskian model needs the so-called
*Transfer Theorem*, Gupta and Belnap 1993, Theorem 2D.4.

Remark: In the introductory remarks, above, we claim that there are consistent classical interpreted languages that refer to their own sentences and have their own truth predicates. Clauses (1) of Theorem 2.1 delivers an example. Let \(M_1 '\) be the unique Tarskian expansion of \(M_1\). Then the language \(L_1\), interpreted by \(M_1 '\) is an interpreted language that has its own truth predicate satisfying the T-biconditionals classically understood, obeys the rules of standard classical logic, and has the ability to refer to each of its own sentences. Thus Tarski was not quite right in his view that any language with its own truth predicate would be inconsistent, as long as it obeyed the rules of standard classical logic, and had the ability to refer to its own sentences.

Re (2): The only potential problematic self-reference is in the
sentence \(\boldsymbol{T}\tau,\) the so-called *truth teller*,
which says of itself that it is true. Informal reasoning suggests that
the truth teller can consistently be assigned either classical truth
value: if you assign it the value \(\mathbf{t}\) then no paradox is
produced, since the sentence now truly says of itself that it is true;
and if you assign it the value \(\mathbf{f}\) then no paradox is
produced, since the sentence now falsely says of itself that it is
true. Theorem 2.1 (2) formalizes this point, i.e., \(M_2\) can be
expanded to one Tarskian model in which \(\boldsymbol{T}\tau\) is true
and one in which \(\boldsymbol{T}\tau\) is false. The fact that
\(M_2\) can be expanded to *exactly* two Tarskian models needs
the Transfer Theorem, alluded to above. Note that the language
\(L_2\), interpreted by either of these expansions, provides another
example of an interpreted language that has its own truth predicate
satisfying the T-biconditionals classically understood, obeys the
rules of standard classical logic, and has the ability to refer to
each of its own sentences.

Proof of (3). Suppose that \(M_3 ' = \langle D_3 ,I_3 '\rangle\) is a classical expansion of \(M_3\) to all of \(L_3\). Since \(M_3 '\) is an expansion of \(M_3, I_3\) and \(I_3 '\) agree on all the names of \(L_3\). So

\[ I_3 '(\lambda) = I_3 (\lambda) = \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda = I_3(\lsquo \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda \rsquo) = I_3 '(\lsquo \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda\rsquo). \]So the sentences \(\boldsymbol{T}\lambda\) and \(\boldsymbol{T}\)‘\(\neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda\)’ have the same truth value in \(M_3 '\). So the T-biconditional

\[ \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda\rsquo \equiv \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda \]is false in \(M_3 '\).

Remark: The language \(L_3\) interpreted by the ground model \(M_3\) formalizes the liar’s paradox, with the sentence \(\neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda\) as the offending liar’s sentence. Thus, despite Theorem 2.1, Clauses (1) and (2), Clause (3) strongly suggests that in a semantics for languages capable of expressing their own truth concepts, \(\boldsymbol{T}\) cannot, in general, have a classical signification; and the ‘iff’ in the T-biconditionals will not be read as the classical biconditional. We take these suggestions up in Section 4, below.

## 3. Basic notions of the RTT

### 3.1 Revision rules

In Section 1, we informally sketched the central thought of the RTT,
namely, that we can use the T-biconditionals to generate a
*revision rule* — a rule for revising a hypothesis about
the extension of the truth predicate. Here we will formalize this
notion, and work through an example from Section 1.

In general, let L be a truth language and \(M\) be a ground model for
\(L\). An *hypothesis* is a function \(h:D \rightarrow
\{\mathbf{t}, \mathbf{f}\}\). A hypothesis will in effect be a
hypothesized classical interpretation for \(\boldsymbol{T}\).
Let’s work with an example that combines features from the
ground models \(M_1\) and \(M_3\). We will state the example formally,
but reason in a semiformal way, to transition from one hypothesized
extension of \(\boldsymbol{T}\) to another.

**Example 3.1**Suppose that \(L\) contains four non-quote names, \(\alpha , \beta , \gamma\) and \(\lambda\) and no predicates other than \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Also suppose that \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\) is as follows: \[\begin{align} D &= \textit{Sent}_L \\ I(\alpha) &= \boldsymbol{T}\beta \vee \boldsymbol{T}\gamma \\ I(\beta) &= \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \\ I(\gamma) &= \neg \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \\ I(\lambda) &= \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda \end{align}\]

It will be convenient to let

\[\begin{align} &A \text{ be the sentence } \boldsymbol{T}\beta \vee \boldsymbol{T}\gamma \\ &B \text{ be the sentence } \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \\ &C \text{ be the sentence } \neg \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \\ &X \text{ be the sentence } \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda \end{align}\]Thus:

\[\begin{align} D &= \textit{Sent}_L \\ I(\alpha) &= A \\ I(\beta) &= B \\ I(\gamma) &= C \\ I(\lambda) &= X \end{align}\]Suppose that the hypothesis \(h_0\) hypothesizes that \(A\) is false, \(B\) is true, \(C\) is false and \(X\) is false. Thus

\[\begin{align} h_0 (A) &= \mathbf{f} \\ h_0 (B) &= \mathbf{t} \\ h_0 (C) &= \mathbf{f} \\ h_0 (X) &= \mathbf{f} \end{align}\]
Now we will engage in some semiformal reasoning, *on the basis of
hypothesis* \(h_0\). Among the four sentences, \(A, B, C\) and
\(X, h_0\) puts only \(B\) in the extension of \(\boldsymbol{T}\).
Thus, reasoning from \(h_0\), we conclude that:

The T-biconditional for the four sentences \(A, B, C\) and \(X\) are as follows:

\[\begin{align} \tag{T$_A$} A \text{ is true iff }& \boldsymbol{T}\beta \vee \boldsymbol{T}\gamma \\ \tag{T$_B$} B \text{ is true iff }& \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \\ \tag{T$_C$} C \text{ is true iff }& \neg \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \\ \tag{T$_X$} X \text{ is true iff }& \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda \end{align}\]Thus, reasoning from \(h_0\), we conclude that:

\[\begin{align} &A \text{ is true} \\ &B \text{ is not true} \\ &C \text{ is true} \\ &X \text{ is true} \end{align}\]This produces our new hypothesis \(h_1\):

\[\begin{align} h_1 (A) &= \mathbf{t} \\ h_1 (B) &= \mathbf{f} \\ h_1 (C) &= \mathbf{t} \\ h_1 (X) &= \mathbf{t} \end{align}\]
Let’s revise our hypothesis once again. So now we will engage in
some semiformal reasoning, *on the basis of hypothesis*
\(h_1\). Hypothesis \(h_1\) puts \(A, C\) and \(X\), but not \(B\), in
the extension of the \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Thus, reasoning from \(h_1\),
we conclude that:

Recall the T-biconditionals for the four sentences \(A, B, C\) and \(X\), given above. Reasoning from \(h_1\) and these T-biconditionals, we conclude that:

\[\begin{align} &A \text{ is true} \\ &B \text{ is true} \\ &C \text{ is not true} \\ &X \text{ is not true} \end{align}\]
This produces our *new* new hypothesis \(h_2\):

Let’s formalize the semiformal reasoning carried out in Example 3.1. First we hypothesized that certain sentences were, or were not, in the extension of \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Consider ordinary classical model theory. Suppose that our language has a predicate \(G\) and a name \(a\), and that we have a model \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\) which places the referent of \(a\) inside the extension of \(G\):

\[ I(G)(I(\alpha)) = \mathbf{t} \]Then we conclude, classically, that the sentence \(Ga\) is true in \(M\). It will be useful to have some notation for the classical truth value of a sentence \(S\) in a classical model \(M\). We will write \(\textit{Val}_M (S)\). In this case, \(\textit{Val}_M (Ga) = \mathbf{t}\). In Example 3.1, we did not start with a classical model of the whole language \(L\), but only a classical model of the \(\boldsymbol{T}\)-free fragment of \(L\). But then we added a hypothesis, in order to get a classical model of all of \(L\). Let’s use the notation \(M + h\) for the classical model of all of \(L\) that you get when you extend \(M\) by assigning \(\boldsymbol{T}\) an extension via the hypothesis \(h\). Once you have assigned an extension to the predicate \(\boldsymbol{T}\), you can calculate the truth values of the various sentences of \(L\). That is, for each sentence \(S\) of \(L\), we can calculate

\[ \textit{Val}_{M + h}(S) \]In Example 3.1, we started with hypothesis \(h_0\) as follows:

\[\begin{align} h_0 (A) &= \mathbf{f} \\ h_0 (B) &= \mathbf{t} \\ h_0 (C) &= \mathbf{f} \\ h_0 (X) &= \mathbf{f} \end{align}\]Then we calculated as follows:

\[\begin{align} \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha) &= \mathbf{f} \\ \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(\boldsymbol{T}\beta) &= \mathbf{t} \\ \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(\boldsymbol{T}\gamma) &= \mathbf{f} \\ \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(\boldsymbol{T}\lambda) &= \mathbf{f} \end{align}\]And then we concluded as follows:

\[\begin{align} \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(A) &= \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(\boldsymbol{T}\beta \lor \boldsymbol{T}\gamma) = \mathbf{t} \\ \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(B) &= \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha) = \mathbf{f} \\ \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(C) &= \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(\neg\boldsymbol{T}\alpha) = \mathbf{t} \\ \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(X) &= \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(\neg\boldsymbol{T}\lambda) = \mathbf{t} \end{align}\]These conclusions generated our new hypothesis, \(h_1\):

\[\begin{align} h_1 (A) &= \mathbf{t} \\ h_1 (B) &= \mathbf{f} \\ h_1 (C) &= \mathbf{t} \\ h_1 (X) &= \mathbf{t} \end{align}\]Note that, in general,

\[ h_1 (S) = \textit{Val}_{M+h_0}(S). \]
We are now prepared to define the *revision rule* given by a
ground model \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\). In general, given an
hypothesis \(h\), let \(M + h = \langle D,I'\rangle\) be the model of
\(L\) which agrees with \(M\) on the \(\boldsymbol{T}\)-free fragment
of \(L\), and which is such that \(I'(\boldsymbol{T}) = h\). So \(M +
h\) is just a classical model for all of \(L\). For any model \(M +
h\) of all of \(L\) and any sentence \(S\) of \(L\), let
\(\textit{Val}_{M+h}(S)\) be the ordinary classical truth value of
\(S\) in \(M + h\).

**Definition 3.2**- Suppose that \(L\) is a truth language and that \(M = \langle
D,I\rangle\) is a ground model for \(L\). The
*revision rule*, \(\tau_M\), is the function mapping hypotheses to hypotheses, as follows: \[\tau_M (h)(d) = \begin{cases} \mathbf{t}, \text{ if } d\in D \text{ is a sentence of } L \text{ and } \textit{Val}_{M+h}(d) = \mathbf{t} \\ \mathbf{f}, \text{ otherwise} \end{cases}\]

The ‘otherwise’ clause tells us that if \(d\) is not a
sentence of \(L\), then, after one application of revision, we stick
with the hypothesis that \(d\) is not
true.^{[5]}
Note that, in Example 3.\(1, h_1 = \tau_M (h_0)\) and \(h_2 = \tau_M
(h_1)\). We will often drop the subscripted ‘\(M\)’ when
the context make it clear which ground model is at issue.

### 3.2 Revision sequences

Let’s pick up Example 3.1 and see what happens when we iterate the application of the revision rule.

**Example 3.3**(Example 3.1 continued)

Recall that \(L\) contains four non-quote names, \(\alpha , \beta , \gamma\) and \(\lambda\) and no predicates other than \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Also recall that \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\) is as follows: \[\begin{align} D &= \textit{Sent}_L \\ I(\alpha) &= A = \boldsymbol{T}\beta \vee \boldsymbol{T}\gamma \\ I(\beta) &= B = \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \\ I(\gamma) &= C = \neg \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \\ I(\lambda) &= X = \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lambda \end{align}\]

The following table indicates what happens with repeated applications of the revision rule \(\tau_M\) to the hypothesis \(h_0\) from Example 3.1. In this table, we will write \(\tau\) instead of \(\tau_M\):

\(S\) | \(h_0 (S)\) | \(\tau(h_0)(S)^{}\) | \(\tau^2 (h_0)(S)\) | \(\tau^3 (h_0)(S)\) | \(\tau^4 (h_0)(S)\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(B\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(C\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(X\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) |

So \(h_0\) generates a *revision sequence* (see Definition 3.7,
below). And \(A\) and \(B\) are *stably true* in that revision
sequence (see Definition 3.6, below), while \(C\) is *stably
false*. The liar sentence \(X\) is, unsurprisingly, neither stably
true nor stably false: the liar sentence is *unstable*. A
similar calculation would show that \(A\) is stably true, regardless
of the initial hypothesis: thus \(A\) is *categorically true*
(see Definition 3.8).

Before giving a precise definition of a *revision sequence*, we
give an example where we would want to carry the revision process
beyond the finite stages, \(h, \tau^1 (h), \tau^2 (h), \tau^3 (h)\),
and so on.

**Example 3.4**

Suppose that \(L\) contains nonquote names \(\alpha_0, \alpha_1, \alpha_2, \alpha_3,\ldots\), and unary predicates \(G\) and \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Now we will specify a ground model \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\) where the name \(\alpha_0\) refers to some tautology, and where \[\begin{align} &\text{the name } \alpha_1 \text{ refers to the sentence } \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_0 \\ &\text{the name } \alpha_2 \text{ refers to the sentence } \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_1 \\ &\text{the name } \alpha_3 \text{ refers to the sentence } \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_2 \\ &\ \vdots \end{align}\]

More formally, let \(A_0\) be the sentence \(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha_0 \vee \neg \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_0\), and for each \(n \ge 0\), let \(A_{n+1}\) be the sentence \(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha_n\). Thus \(A_1\) is the sentence \(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha_0\), and \(A_2\) is the sentence \(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha_1\), and \(A_3\) is the sentence \(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha_2\), and so on. Our ground model \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\) is as follows:

\[\begin{align} D &= \textit{Sent}_L \\ I(\alpha_n) &= A_n \\ I(G)(A) &= \mathbf{t} \text{ iff } A = A_n \text{ for some } n \end{align}\]Thus, the extension of \(G\) is the following set of sentences: \[\{A_0, A_1, A_2, A_3 , \ldots \} = \{(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha_0 \vee \neg \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_0), \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_0, \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_1, \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_2, \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_3 , \ldots \}. \] Finally let \(B\) be the sentence \(\forall x(Gx \supset \boldsymbol{T}x)\). Let \(h\) be any hypothesis for which we have, for each natural number \(n\),

\[ h(A_n) = h(B) = \mathbf{f}. \]The following table indicates what happens with repeated applications of the revision rule \(\tau_M\) to the hypothesis \(h\). In this table, we will write \(\tau\) instead of \(\tau_M\):

\(S\) | \(h(S)\) | \(t(h)(S)\) | \(\tau^2 (h)(S)\) | \(\tau^3 (h)(S)\) | \(\tau^4 (h)(S)\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_0\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_1\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_2\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_3\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_4\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) |

\(B\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) |

At the \(0^{\text{th}}\) stage, each \(A_n\) is outside the
hypothesized extension of \(\boldsymbol{T}\). But from the
\(n{+}1^{\text{th}}\) stage onwards, \(A_n\) is \(in\) the
hypothesized extension of \(\boldsymbol{T}\). So, for each \(n\), the
sentence \(A_n\) is eventually stably hypothesized to be true. Despite
this, there is no *finite* stage at which all the
\(A_n\)’s are hypothesized to be true: as a result the sentence
\(B = \forall x(Gx \supset \boldsymbol{T}x)\) remains false at each
finite stage. This suggests extending the process as follows:

\(S\) | \(h(S)\) | \(\tau(h)(S)\) | \(\tau^2 (h)(S)\) | \(\tau^3 (h)(S)\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\omega\) | \(\omega +1\) | \(\omega +2\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_0\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_1\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_2\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_3\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_4\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) |

\(B\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

Thus, if we allow the revision process to proceed beyond the finite stages, then the sentence \(B = \forall x(Gx \supset \boldsymbol{T}x)\) is stably true from the \(\omega{+}1^{\text{th}}\) stage onwards. \(\Box\)

In Example 3.4, the intuitive verdict is that not only should each
\(A_n\) receive a stable truth value of \(\mathbf{t}\), but so should
the sentence \(B = \forall x(Gx \supset \boldsymbol{T}x)\). The only
way to ensure this is to carry the revision process beyond the finite
stages. So we will consider revision sequences that are very long: not
only will a revision sequence have a \(n^{\text{th}}\) stage for each
finite number \(n\), but a \(\eta^{\text{th}}\) stage for every
*ordinal* number \(\eta\). (The next paragraph is to help the
reader unfamiliar with ordinal numbers.)

One way to think of the ordinal numbers is as follows. Start with the finite natural numbers:

\[ 0, 1, 2, 3, \ldots \]Add a number, \(\omega\), greater than all of these but not the immediate successor of any of them:

\[ 0, 1, 2, 3, \ldots ,\omega \]And then take the successor of \(\omega\), its successor, and so on:

\[ 0, 1, 2, 3, \ldots ,\omega , \omega +1, \omega +2, \omega +3\ldots \]Then add a number \(\omega +\omega\), or \(\omega \times 2\), greater than all of these (and again, not the immediate successor of any), and start over, reiterating this process over and over:

\[\begin{align} &0, 1, 2, 3, \ldots \\ &\omega , \omega +1, \omega +2, \omega +3,\ldots, \\ &\omega \times 2, (\omega \times 2)+1, (\omega \times 2)+2, (\omega \times 2)+3,\ldots, \\ &\omega \times 3, (\omega \times 3)+1, (\omega \times 3)+2, (\omega \times 3)+3,\ldots \\ &\ \vdots \end{align}\]At the end of this, we add an ordinal number \(\omega \times \omega\) or \(\omega^2\):

\[\begin{align} &0, 1, 2, \ldots ,\omega , \omega +1, \omega +2, \ldots ,\omega \times 2, (\omega \times 2)+1,\ldots, \\ &\omega \times 3, \ldots ,\omega \times 4, \ldots ,\omega \times 5, \ldots ,\omega^2, \omega^2 +1,\ldots \end{align}\]
The ordinal numbers have the following structure: every ordinal number
has an immediate successor known as a *successor ordinal*; and
for any infinitely ascending sequence of ordinal numbers, there is a
*limit ordinal* which is greater than all the members of the
sequence and which is not the immediate successor of any member of the
sequence. Thus the following are successor ordinals: \(5, 178, \omega
+12, (\omega \times 5)+56, \omega^2 +8\); and the following are limit
ordinals: \(\omega , \omega \times 2, \omega^2 , (\omega^2 +\omega)\),
etc. Given a limit ordinal \(\eta\), a sequence \(S\) of objects is an
\(\eta\)-*long* sequence if there is an object \(S_{\delta}\)
for every ordinal \(\delta \lt \eta\). We will denote the class of
ordinals as \(\textsf{On}\). Any sequence \(S\) of objects is an
\(\textsf{On}\)-*long* sequence if there is an object
\(S_{\delta}\) for every ordinal \(\delta\).

When assessing whether a sentence receives a stable truth value, the
RTT considers sequences of hypotheses of length \(\textsf{On}\). So
suppose that \(S\) is an \(\textsf{On}\)-long sequence of hypotheses,
and let \(\zeta\) and \(\eta\) range over ordinals. Clearly, in order
for \(S\) to represent the revision process, we need the
\(\zeta{+}1^{\text{th}}\) hypothesis to be generated from the
\(\zeta^{\text{th}}\) hypothesis by the revision rule. So we insist
that \(S_{\zeta +1} = \tau_M(S_{\zeta})\). But what should we do at a
limit stage? That is, how should we set \(S_{\eta}\)(d) when \(\eta\)
is a limit ordinal? Clearly any object that is stably true [false]
*up to* that stage should be true [false] \(at\) that stage.
Thus consider Example 3.4. The sentence \(A_2\), for example, is true
up to the \(\omega^{\text{th}}\) stage; so we set \(A_2\) to be true
\(at\) the \(\omega^{\text{th}}\) stage. For objects that do not
stabilize up to that stage, Gupta and Belnap 1993 adopt a liberal
policy: when constructing a revision sequence \(S\), if the value of
the object \(d \in D\) has not stabilized by the time you get to the
limit stage \(\eta\), then you can set \(S_{\eta}\)(d) to be whichever
of \(\mathbf{t}\) or \(\mathbf{f}\) you like. Before we give the
precise definition of a *revision sequence*, we continue with
Example 3.3 to see an application of this idea.

**Example 3.5** (Example 3.3 continued)

Recall that \(L\) contains four non-quote names, \(\alpha , \beta ,
\gamma\) and \(\lambda\) and no predicates other than
\(\boldsymbol{T}\). Also recall that \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\) is as
follows:

The following table indicates what happens with repeated applications of the revision rule \(\tau_M\) to the hypothesis \(h_0\) from Example 3.3. For each ordinal \(\eta\), we will indicate the \(\eta^{\text{th}}\) hypothesis by \(S_{\eta}\) (suppressing the index \(M\) on \(\tau)\). Thus \(S_0 = h_0,\) \(S_1 = \tau(h_0),\) \(S_2 = \tau^2 (h_0),\) \(S_3 = \tau^3 (h_0),\) and \(S_{\omega},\) the \(\omega^{\text{th}}\) hypothesis, is determined in some way from the hypotheses leading up to it. So, starting with \(h_0\) from Example 3.3, our revision sequence begins as follows:

\(S\) | \(S_0 (S)\) | \(S_1 (S)\) | \(S_2 (S)\) | \(S_3 (S)\) | \(S_4 (S)\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(B\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(C\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(X\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) |

What happens at the \(\omega^{\text{th}}\) stage? \(A\) and \(B\) are
stably true *up to* the \(\omega^{\text{th}}\) stage, and \(C\)
is stably false *up to* the \(\omega^{\text{th}}\) stage. So
\(at\) the \(\omega^{\text{th}}\) stage, we must have the
following:

\(S\) | \(S_0 (S)\) | \(S_1 (S)\) | \(S_2 (S)\) | \(S_3 (S)\) | \(S_4 (S)\) | \(\cdots\) | \(S_{\omega}(S)\) |

\(A\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) |

\(B\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) |

\(C\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) |

\(X\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) | ? |

But the entry for \(S_{\omega}(X)\) can be either \(\mathbf{t}\) or \(\mathbf{f}\). In other words, the initial hypothesis \(h_0\) generates at least two revision sequences. Every revision sequence \(S\) that has \(h_0\) as its initial hypothesis must have \(S_{\omega}(A) = \mathbf{t}, S_{\omega}(B) = \mathbf{t}\), and \(S_{\omega}(C) = \mathbf{f}\). But there is some revision sequence \(S\), with \(h_0\) as its initial hypothesis, and with \(S_{\omega}(X) = \mathbf{t}\); and there is some revision sequence \(S'\), with \(h_0\) as its initial hypothesis, and with \(S_{\omega}'(X) = \mathbf{f}. \Box\)

We are now ready to define the notion of a *revision
sequence*:

**Definition 3.6**- Suppose that \(L\) is a truth language, and that \(M = \langle
D,I\rangle\) is a ground model. Suppose that \(S\) is an
\(\textsf{On}\)-long sequence of hypotheses. Then we say that \(d \in
D\) is
*stably*\(\mathbf{t} [\mathbf{f}]\) in \(S\) iff for some ordinal \(\theta\) we have \[ S_{\zeta}(d) = \mathbf{t}\ [\mathbf{f}], \text{ for every ordinal } \zeta \ge \theta. \]Suppose that \(S\) is a \(\eta\)-long sequence of hypothesis for some limit ordinal \(\eta\). Then we say that \(d \in D\) is

\[ S_{\zeta}(d) = \mathbf{t}\ [\mathbf{f}], \text{ for every ordinal } \zeta \text{ such that } \zeta \ge \theta \text{ and } \zeta \lt \eta. \]*stably*\(\mathbf{t}\) \([\mathbf{f}]\) in \(S\) iff for some ordinal \(\theta \lt \eta\) we haveIf \(S\) is an \(\textsf{On}\)-long sequence of hypotheses and \(\eta\) is a limit ordinal, then \(S|_{\eta}\) is the initial segment of \(S\) up to but not including \(\eta\). Note that \(S|_{\eta}\) is a \(\eta\)-long sequence of hypotheses.

**Definition 3.7**- Suppose that \(L\) is a truth language, and that \(M = \langle
D,I\rangle\) is a ground model. Suppose that \(S\) is an
\(\textsf{On}\)-long sequence of hypotheses. \(S\) is a
*revision sequence for*\(M\) iff- \(S_{\zeta +1} = \tau_M(S_{\zeta})\), for each \(\zeta \in \textsf{On}\), and
- for each limit ordinal \(\eta\) and each \(d \in D\), if \(d\) is stably \(\mathbf{t}\) \([\mathbf{f}\)] in \(S|_{\eta}\), then \(S_{\eta}(d) = \mathbf{t} [\mathbf{f}\)].

**Definition 3.8**- Suppose that \(L\) is a truth language, and that \(M = \langle
D,I\rangle\) is a ground model. We say that the sentence \(A\) is
*categorically true*[*false*]*in*\(M\) iff \(A\) is stably \(\mathbf{t}\) \([\mathbf{f}]\) in every revision sequence for \(M\). We say that \(A\) is*categorical in*\(M\) iff \(A\) is either categorically true or categorically false in \(M\).

We now illustrate these concepts with an example. The example will also illustrate a new concept to be defined afterwards.

**Example 3.9**

Suppose that \(L\) is a truth language containing nonquote names \(\beta , \alpha_0, \alpha_1, \alpha_2, \alpha_3,\ldots\), and unary predicates \(G\) and \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Let \(B\) be the sentence \[ \boldsymbol{T}\beta \vee \forall x\forall y(Gx \amp \neg \boldsymbol{T}x \amp Gy \amp \neg \boldsymbol{T}y \supset x=y). \]

Let \(A_0\) be the sentence \(\exists x(Gx \amp \neg \boldsymbol{T}x)\). And for each \(n \ge 0\), let \(A_{n+1}\) be the sentence \(\boldsymbol{T}\alpha_n\). Consider the following ground model \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\)

\[\begin{align} D &= \textit{Sent}_L \\ I(\beta) &= B \\ I(\alpha_n) &= A_n \\ I(G)(A) &= \mathbf{t} \text{ iff } A = A_n \text{ for some } n \end{align}\]Thus, the extension of \(G\) is the following set of sentences: \(\{A_0, A_1, A_2, A_3 , \ldots \} = \{\exists x(Gx \amp \neg \boldsymbol{T}x), \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_0, \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_1, \boldsymbol{T} \alpha_2, \boldsymbol{T}\alpha_3 , \ldots \}\). Let \(h\) be any hypothesis for which we have, \(h(B) = \mathbf{f}\) and for each natural number \(n\),

\[ h(A_n) = \mathbf{f}. \]And let \(S\) be a revision sequence whose initial hypothesis is \(h\), i.e., \(S_0 = h\). The following table indicates some of the values of \(S_{\gamma}(C)\), for sentences \(C \in \{B, A_0, A_1, A_2, A_3 , \ldots \}\). In the top row, we indicate only the ordinal number representing the stage in the revision process.

0 | 1 | 2 | 3 | \(\cdots\) | \(\omega\) | \(\omega{+}1\) | \(\omega{+}2\) | \(\omega{+}3\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\omega{\times}2\) | \((\omega{\times}2){+}1\) | \((\omega{\times}2){+}2\) | \(\cdots\) | |

\(B\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_0\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_1\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_2\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_3\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(A_4\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\cdots\) |

\(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\vdots\) | \(\ddots\) |

It is worth contrasting the behaviour of the sentence B and the
sentence \(A_0\). From the \(\omega{+}1^{\text{th}}\) stage on, \(B\)
stabilizes as true. In fact, \(B\) is stably true in every revision
sequence for \(M\). Thus, \(B\) is categorically true in \(M\). The
sentence \(A_0\), however, never quite stabilizes: it is usually true,
but within a few finite stages of a limit ordinal, the sentence
\(A_0\) can be false. In these circumstances, we say that \(A_0\) is
*nearly stably true* (See Definition 3.10, below.) In fact,
\(A_0\) is nearly stably true in every revision sequence for \(M.
\Box\)

Example 3.9 illustrates not only the notion of stability in a revision sequence, but also of near stability, which we define now:

**Definition 3.10.**-
Suppose that \(L\) is a truth language, and that \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\) is a ground model. Suppose that \(S\) is an \(\textsf{On}\)-long sequence of hypotheses. Then we say that \(d \in D\) is

*nearly stably*\(\mathbf{t}\) \([\mathbf{f}]\)*in*\(S\) iff for some ordinal \(\theta\) we havefor every \(\zeta \ge \theta\), there is a natural number \(n\) such that, for every \(m \ge n, S_{\zeta +m}(d) = \mathbf{t}\) \([\mathbf{f}]\).

Gupta and Belnap 1993 characterize the difference between stability
and near stability as follows: “Stability *simpliciter*
requires an element [in our case a sentence] to settle down to a value
\(\mathbf{x}\) [in our case a truth value] after some initial
fluctuations say up to [an ordinal \(\eta\)]… In contrast, near
stability allows fluctuations after \(\eta\) also, but these
fluctuations must be confined to finite regions just after limit
ordinals” (p. 169). Gupta and Belnap 1993 introduce two theories
of truth, \(\boldsymbol{T}^*\) and \(\boldsymbol{T}^{\#}\), based on
stability and near stability. Theorems 3.12 and 3.13, below,
illustrate an advantage of the system \(\boldsymbol{T}^{\#}\), i.e.,
the system based on near stability.

**Definition 3.11**- Suppose that \(L\) is a truth language, and that \(M = \langle
D,I\rangle\) is a ground model. We say that a sentence \(A\) is
*valid in*\(M\)*by*\(\boldsymbol{T}^*\) iff \(A\) is stably true in every revision sequence^{[6]}. And we say that a sentence \(A\) is*valid in*\(M\)*by*\(\boldsymbol{T}^{\#}\) iff \(A\) is nearly stably true in every revision sequence.

**Theorem 3.12**- Suppose that \(L\) is a truth language, and that \(M = \langle D,I\rangle\) is a ground model. Then, for every sentence \(A\) of \(L\), the following is valid in \(M\) by \(\boldsymbol{T}^{\#}\): \[ \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo \neg A\rsquo \equiv \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo A\rsquo. \]

**Theorem 3.13**- There is a truth language \(L\) and a ground model \(M = \langle
D,I\rangle\) and a sentence \(A\) of \(L\) such that the following is
*not*valid in \(M\) by \(\boldsymbol{T}^*\): \[ \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo \neg A\rsquo \equiv \neg \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo A\rsquo. \]

Gupta and Belnap 1993, Section 6C, note similar advantages of \(\boldsymbol{T}^{\#}\) over \(\boldsymbol{T}^*\). For example, \(\boldsymbol{T}^{\#}\) does, but \(\boldsymbol{T}^*\) does not, validate the following semantic principles:

\[\begin{align} \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo A \amp B\rsquo &\equiv \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo A\rsquo \amp \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo B\rsquo \\ \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo A \vee B\rsquo &\equiv \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo A\rsquo \vee \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo B\rsquo \end{align}\]Gupta and Belnap remain noncommittal about which of \(\boldsymbol{T}^{\#}\) and \(\boldsymbol{T}^*\) (and a further alternative that they define, \(\boldsymbol{T}^c)\) is preferable.

## 4. Interpreting the formalism

The main formal notions of the RTT are the notion of a *revision
rule* (Definition 3.2), i.e., a rule for revising hypotheses; and
a *revision sequence* (Definition 3.7), a sequence of
hypotheses generated in accordance with the appropriate revision rule.
Using these notions, we can, given a ground model, specify when a
sentence is *stably* (or *nearly stably) true* or
*stably* (or *nearly stably) false* (Definition 3.6 and
3.10, respectively) in a particular revision sequence. Thus we could
define two theories of truth, \(\boldsymbol{T}^*\) and
\(\boldsymbol{T}^{\#}\) (Definition 3.11), based on stability and near
stability (respectively). The final idea is that each of these
theories delivers a verdict on which sentences of the language are
*valid* (Definition 3.11), given a ground model.

Recall the suggestions made at the end of Section 2:

In a semantics for languages capable of expressing their own truth concepts, \(\boldsymbol{T}\) will not, in general, have a classical signification; and the ‘iff’ in the T-biconditionals will not be read as the classical biconditional.

Gupta and Belnap fill out these suggestions in the following way.

### 4.1 The signification of \(\boldsymbol{T}\)

First, they suggest that the signification of \(\boldsymbol{T}\),
given a ground model \(M\), is the revision rule \(\tau_M\) itself. As
noted in the preceding paragraph, we can give a fine-grained analysis
of sentences’ statuses and interrelations on the basis of
notions generated directly and naturally from the revision rule
\(\tau_M\). Thus, \(\tau_M\) is a good candidate for the signification
of \(\boldsymbol{T}\), since it does seem to be “an abstract
something that carries all the information about all [of
\(\boldsymbol{T}\)’s] extensional relations” in \(M\).
(See Gupta and Belnap’s characterization of an
expression’s *signification*, given in Section 2,
above.)

### 4.2 The ‘iff’ in the T-biconditionals

Gupta and Belnap’s related suggestion concerning the
‘iff’ in the T-biconditionals is that, rather than being
the classical biconditional, this ‘iff’ is the distinctive
biconditional used to *define* a previously undefined concept.
In 1993, Gupta and Belnap present the revision theory of truth as a
special case of a revision theory of *circularly defined
concepts*. Suppose that \(L\) is a language with a unary predicate
\(F\) and a binary predicate \(R\). Consider a new concept expressed
by a predicate \(G\), introduced through a definition like this:

Suppose that we start with a domain of discourse, \(D\), and an interpretation of the predicate \(F\) and the relation symbol \(R\). Gupta and Belnap’s revision-theoretic treatment of concepts thus circularly introduced allows one to give categorical verdicts, for certain \(d \in D\) about whether or not \(d\) satisfies \(G\). Other objects will be unstable relative to \(G\): we will be able categorically to assert neither that \(d\) satisfies \(G\) nor that d does not satisfy \(G\). In the case of truth, Gupta and Belnap take the set of T-biconditionals of the form

\[\tag{10} \boldsymbol{T}\lsquo A\rsquo =_{df} A \]together to give the definition of the concept of truth. It is their treatment of ‘\(=_{df}\)’ (the ‘iff’ of definitional concept introduction), together with the T-biconditionals of the form (10), that determine the revision rule \(\tau_M\).

### 4.3 The paradoxical reasoning

Recall the liar sentence, (1), from the beginning of this article:

- (1)
- (1) is not true

In Section 1, we claimed that the RTT is designed to model, rather than block, the kind of paradoxical reasoning regarding (1). But we noted in footnote 2 that the RTT does avoid contradictions in these situations. There are two ways to see this. First, while the RTT does endorse the biconditional

(1) is true iff (1) is not true,

the relevant ‘iff’ is not the material biconditional, as explained above. Thus, it does not follow that both (1) is true and (1) is not true. Second, note that on no hypothesis can we conclude that both (1) is true and (1) is not true. If we keep it firmly in mind that revision-theoretical reasoning is hypothetical rather than categorical, then we will not infer any contradictions from the existence of a sentence such as (1), above.

### 4.4 The signification thesis

Gupta and Belnap’s suggestions, concerning the signification of
\(\boldsymbol{T}\) and the interpretation of the ‘iff’ in
the T-biconditionals, dovetail nicely with two closely related
intuitions articulated in Gupta & Belnap 1993. The first
intuition, loosely expressed, is “that the T-biconditionals are
analytic and *fix* the meaning of ‘true’” (p.
6). More tightly expressed, it becomes the “Signification
Thesis” (p. 31): “The T-biconditionals fix the
signification of truth in every world [where a world is represented by
a ground
model].”^{[7]}
Given the revision-theoretic treatment of the definition
‘iff’, and given a ground model \(M\), the
T-biconditionals (10) do, as noted, fix the suggested signification of
\(\boldsymbol{T}\), i.e., the revision rule \(\tau_M\).

### 4.5 The supervenience of semantics

The second intuition is *the supervenience of the signification of
truth*. This is a descendant of M. Kremer’s 1988 proposed
*supervenience of semantics*. The idea is simple: which
sentences fall under the concept *truth* should be fixed by (1)
the interpretation of the nonsemantic vocabulary, and (2) the
empirical facts. In non-circular cases, this intuition is particularly
strong: the standard interpretation of “snow” and
“white” and the empirical fact that snow is white, are
enough to determine that the sentence “snow is white”
falls under the concept *truth*. The supervenience of the
signification of truth is the thesis that the signification of truth,
whatever it is, is fixed by the ground model \(M\). Clearly, the RTT
satisfies this principle.

It is worth seeing how a theory of truth might violate this principle. Consider a truth-teller sentence, i.e., the sentence that says of itself that it is true:

- (11)
- (11) is true

As noted above, Kripke’s three-valued semantics allows three
truth values, true \((\mathbf{t})\), false \((\mathbf{f})\), and
neither \((\mathbf{n})\). Given a ground model \(M = \langle
D,I\rangle\) for a truth language \(L\), the candidate interpretations
of \(\boldsymbol{T}\) are three-valued interpretations, i.e.,
functions \(h:D \rightarrow \{\mathbf{t}, \mathbf{f}, \mathbf{n}\}\).
Given a three-valued interpretation of \(\boldsymbol{T}\), and a
scheme for evaluating the truth value of composite sentences in terms
of their parts, we can specify a truth value \(\textit{Val}_{M+h}(A) =
\mathbf{t}, \mathbf{f}\) or \(\mathbf{n}\), for every sentence \(A\)
of \(L\). The central theorem of the three-valued semantics is that,
given any ground model \(M\), there is a three-valued interpretation h
of \(\boldsymbol{T}\) so that, for every sentence \(A\), we have
\(\textit{Val}_{M+h}(\boldsymbol{T}\lsquo A\rsquo) =
\textit{Val}_{M+h}(A)\).^{[8]}
We will call such an interpretation of \(\boldsymbol{T}\) an
*acceptable* interpretation. Our point here is this: if
there’s a truth-teller, as in (11), then there is not only one
acceptable interpretation of \(\boldsymbol{T}\); there are three: one
according to which (11) is true, one according to which (11) is false,
and one according to which (11) is neither. Thus, there is no single
“correct” interpretation of \(\boldsymbol{T}\) given a
ground model M. Thus the three-valued semantics seems to violate the
supervenience of
semantics.^{[9]}

The RTT does not assign a truth value to the truth-teller, (11). Rather, it gives an analysis of the kind of reasoning that one might engage in with respect to the truth-teller: If we start with a hypothesis \(h\) according to which (11) is true, then upon revision (11) remains true. And if we start with a hypothesis \(h\) according to which (11) is not true, then upon revision (11) remains not true. And that is all that the concept of truth leaves us with. Given this behaviour of (11), the RTT tells us that (11) is neither categorically true nor categorically false, but this is quite different from a verdict that (11) is neither true nor false.

### 4.6 A nonsupervenient interpretation of the formalism

We note an alternative interpretation of the revision-theoretic formalism. Yaqūb 1993 agrees with Gupta and Belnap that the T-biconditionals are definitional rather than material biconditionals, and that the concept of truth is therefore circular. But Yaqūb interprets this circularity in a distinctive way. He argues that,

since the truth conditions of some sentences involve reference to truth in an essential, irreducible manner, these conditions can only obtain or fail in a world that already includes an extension of the truth predicate. Hence, in order for the revision process to determine an extension of the truth predicate, aninitialextension of the predicate must be posited. This much follows from circularity and bivalence. (1993, 40)

Like Gupta and Belnap, Yaqūb posits no privileged extension for
\(\boldsymbol{T}\). And like Gupta and Belnap, he sees the revision
sequences of extensions of \(\boldsymbol{T}\), each sequence generated
by an initial hypothesized extension, as “capable of
accommodating (and diagnosing) the various kinds of problematic and
unproblematic sentences of the languages under consideration”
(1993, 41). But, unlike Gupta and Belnap, he concludes from these
considerations that “*truth in a bivalent language is not
supervenient*” (1993, 39). He explains in a footnote: for
truth to be supervenient, the truth status of each sentence must be
“fully determined by nonsemantical facts”. Yaqūb does
not explicitly use the notion of a concept’s
*signification*. But Yaqūb seems committed to the claim
that the signification of \(\boldsymbol{T}\) — i.e., that which
determines the truth status of each sentence — is given by a
particular revision sequence itself. And no revision sequence is
determined by the nonsemantical facts, i.e., by the ground model,
alone: a revision sequence is determined, at best, by a ground model
and an initial
hypothesis.^{[10]}

### 4.7 Classifying sentences

To obtain a signification of \(\boldsymbol{T}\) and a notion of
validity based on the concept of stability (or near stability) is by
no means the only use we can make of revision sequences. For one
thing, we could use revision-theoretic notions to make rather
fine-grained distinctions among sentences: Some sentences are unstable
in every revision sequence; others are stable in every revision
sequence, though stably true in some and stably false in others; and
so on. Thus, we can use revision-theoretic ideas to give a
fine-grained analysis of the status of various sentences, and of the
relationships of various sentences to one another. Hsiung (2017)
explores further this possibility by generalizing the notion of a
revision sequence to a *revision mapping* on a digraph, in
order to extend this analysis to *sets* of sentences of a
certain kind, called *Boolean paradoxes*. As shown in Hsiung
2022 this procedure can also be reversed, at least to some extent: Not
only we can use revision sequences (or mappings) to classify
paradoxical sentences by means of their revision-theoretic patterns,
but we can also construct “new” paradoxes from given
revision-theoretic patterns. Rossi (2019) combines the
revision-theoretic technique with graph-theoretic tools and
fixed-point constructions in order to represent a threefold
classification of paradoxical sentences (liar-like, truth-teller-like,
and revenge sentences) within a single model.

## 5. Further issues

### 5.1 Three-valued semantics

We have given only the barest exposition of the three-valued
semantics, in our discussion of the supervenience of the signification
of truth, above. Given a truth language \(L\) and a ground model
\(M\), we defined an *acceptable* three-valued interpretation
of \(\boldsymbol{T}\) as an interpretation \(h:D \rightarrow
\{\mathbf{t}, \mathbf{f}, \mathbf{n}\}\) such that
\(\textit{Val}_{M+h}(\boldsymbol{T}\lsquo A\rsquo) =
\textit{Val}_{M+h}(A)\) for each sentence \(A\) of \(L\). In general,
given a ground model \(M\), there are many acceptable interpretations
of \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Suppose that each of these is indeed a truly
acceptable interpretation. Then the three-valued semantics violates
the supervenience of the signification of \(\boldsymbol{T}\).

Suppose, on the other hand, that, for each ground model \(M\), we can
isolate a privileged acceptable interpretation as *the* correct
interpretation of \(\boldsymbol{T}\). Gupta and Belnap present a
number of considerations against the three-valued semantics, so
conceived. (See Gupta & Belnap 1993, Chapter 3.) One principal
argument is that the central theorem, i.e., that for each ground model
there is an acceptable interpretation, only holds when the underlying
language is expressively impoverished in certain ways: for example,
the three-valued approach fails if the language has a connective
\({\sim}\) with the following truth table:

\(A\) | \({\sim}A\) |

\(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) |

\(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) |

\(\mathbf{n}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) |

The only negation operator that the three-valued approach can handle has the following truth table:

\(A\) | \(\neg A\) |

\(\mathbf{t}\) | \(\mathbf{f}\) |

\(\mathbf{f}\) | \(\mathbf{t}\) |

\(\mathbf{n}\) | \(\mathbf{n}\) |

But consider the liar that says of itself that it is ‘not’ true, in this latter sense of ‘not’. Gupta and Belnap urge the claim that this sentence “ceases to be intuitively paradoxical” (1993, 100). The claimed advantage of the RTT is its ability to describe the behaviour of genuinely paradoxical sentences: the genuine liar is unstable under semantic evaluation: “No matter what we hypothesize its value to be, semantic evaluation refutes our hypothesis.” The three-valued semantics can only handle the “weak liar”, i.e., a sentence that only weakly negates itself, but that is not guaranteed to be paradoxical: “There are appearances of the liar here, but they deceive.”

We’ve thus far reviewed two of Gupta and Belnap’s complaints against three-valued approaches, and now we raise a third: in the three-valued theories, truth typically behaves like a nonclassical concept even when there’s no vicious reference in the language. Without defining terms here, we note that one popular precisification of the three-valued approach, is to take the correct interpretation of T to be that given by the ‘least fixed point’ of the ‘strong Kleene scheme’: putting aside details, this interpretation always assigns the truth value \(\mathbf{n}\) to the sentence \(\forall\)x\((\boldsymbol{T}\)x \(\vee \neg \boldsymbol{T}\)x), even when the ground model allows no circular, let alone vicious, reference. Gupta and Belnap claim an advantage for the RTT: according to revision-theoretic approach, they claim, truth always behaves like a classical concept when there is no vicious reference.

Kremer 2010 challenges this claim by precisifying it as a formal claim against which particular revision theories (e.g. \(\boldsymbol{T}^*\) or \(\boldsymbol{T}^{\#}\), see Definition 3.11, above) and particular three-valued theories can be tested. As it turns out, on many three-valued theories, truth does in fact behave like a classical concept when there’s no vicious reference: for example, the least fixed point of a natural variant of the supervaluation scheme always assigns \(\boldsymbol{T}\) a classical interpretation in the absence of vicious reference. When there’s no vicious reference, it is granted that truth behaves like a classical concept if we adopt Gupta and Belnap’s theory \(\boldsymbol{T}^*\), however, so Kremer argues, this is not the case if we instead adopt Gupta and Belnap’s theory \(\boldsymbol{T}^{\#}\). This discussion is further taken up by Wintein 2014. A general assessment of the relative merits of the three-valued approaches and the revision-theoretic approaches, from a metasemantic point of view, is at the core of Pinder 2018.

### 5.2 Two values?

A contrast presupposed by this entry is between allegedly two-valued theories, like the RTT, and allegedly three-valued or other many-valued rivals. One might think of the RTT itself as providing infinitely many semantic values, for example one value for every possible revision sequence. Or one could extract three semantic values for sentences: categorical truth, categorical falsehood, and uncategoricalness.

In reply, it must be granted that the RTT generates many
*statuses* available to sentences. Similarly, three-valued
approaches also typically generate many statuses available to
sentences. The claim of two-valuedness is not a claim about statuses
available to sentences, but rather a claim about the *truth
values* presupposed in the whole enterprise.

### 5.3 Amendments to the RTT

We note three ways to amend the RTT. First, we might put constraints
on which hypotheses are acceptable. For example, Gupta and Belnap 1993
introduce a theory, \(\mathbf{T}^c\), of truth based on
*consistent* hypotheses: an hypothesis \(h\) is
*consistent* iff the set \(\{A:h(A) = \mathbf{t}\}\) is a
complete consistent set of sentences. The relative merits of
\(\mathbf{T}^*, \mathbf{T}^{\#}\) and \(\mathbf{T}^c\) are discussed
in Gupta & Belnap 1993, Chapter 6.

Second, we might adopt a more restrictive *limit policy* than
Gupta and Belnap adopt. Recall the question asked in Section 3: How
should we set \(S_{\eta}(d)\) when \(\eta\) is a limit ordinal? We
gave a partial answer: any object that is stably true [false] *up
to* that stage should be true [false] *at* that stage. We
also noted that for an object \(d \in D\) that does not stabilize up
to the stage \(\eta\), Gupta and Belnap 1993 allow us to set
\(S_{\eta}(d)\) as either \(\mathbf{t}\) or \(\mathbf{f}\). In a
similar context, Herzberger 1982a and 1982b assigns the value
\(\mathbf{f}\) to the unstable objects. And Gupta originally
suggested, in Gupta 1982, that unstable elements receive whatever
value they received at the initial hypothesis \(S_0\).

These first two ways of amending the RTT both, in effect, restrict the
notion of a revision sequence, by putting constraints on which of
*our* revision sequences really count as acceptable revision
sequences. The constraints are, in some sense local: the first
constraint is achieved by putting restrictions on which hypotheses can
be used, and the second constraint is achieved by putting restrictions
on what happens at limit ordinals. A third option would be to put more
global constraints on which putative revision sequences count as
acceptable. Yaqūb 1993 suggests, in effect, a limit rule whereby
acceptable verdicts on unstable sentences at some limit stage \(\eta\)
depend on verdicts rendered at *other* limit stages. Yaqūb
argues that these constraints allow us to avoid certain
“artifacts”. For example, suppose that a ground model \(M
= \langle D,I\rangle\) has two independent liars, by having two names
\(\alpha\) and \(\beta\), where \(I(\alpha) = \neg
\boldsymbol{T}\alpha\) and \(I(\beta) = \neg \boldsymbol{T}\beta\).
Yaqūb argues that it is a mere “artifact” of the
revision semantics, naively presented, that there are revision
sequences in which the sentence \(\neg \boldsymbol{T}\alpha \equiv
\neg \boldsymbol{T}\beta\) is stably true, since the two liars are
independent. His global constraints are developed to rule out such
sequences. (See Chapuis 1996 for further discussion.)

The first and the second way of amending the RTT are in some sense put
together by Campbell-Moore (2019). Here, the notion of stability for
objects is extended to sets of hypotheses: A set \(H\) of hypotheses
is stable in a sequence \(S\) of hypotheses if for some ordinal
\(\theta\) all hypotheses \(S_{\zeta}\), with \(\zeta \ge \theta\),
belong to \(H\). With this, we can introduce the notion of
\(P\)-revision sequence: If \(P\) is a class of sets of hypotheses, a
sequence \(S\) is a \(P\)-revision sequence just in case that, at
every limit ordinal \(\eta\), if a set of hypotheses \(H\) belongs to
\(P\) and is stable in \(S\), then \(S_{\eta}\) belongs to \(H\). It
can be shown that, for a suitable choice of \(P\), all limit stages of
\(P\)-revision sequences are *maximal consistent*
hypotheses.

### 5.4 Revision theory for circularly defined concepts

As indicated in our discussion, in Section 4, of the ‘iff’ in the T-biconditionals, Gupta and Belnap present the RTT as a special case of a revision theory of circularly defined concepts. To reconsider the example from Section 4. Suppose that \(L\) is a language with a unary predicate F and a binary predicate R. Consider a new concept expressed by a predicate \(G\), introduced through a definition, \(D\), like this:

\[ Gx =_{df} A(x,G) \]where \(A(x,G)\) is the formula

\[ \forall y(Ryx \supset Fx) \vee \exists y(Ryx \amp Gx). \]
In this context, a *ground model* is a classical model \(M =
\langle D,I\rangle\) of the language \(L\): we start with a domain of
discourse, \(D\), and an interpretation of the predicate \(F\) and the
relation symbol \(R\). We would like to extend \(M\) to an
interpretation of the language \(L + G\). So, in this context, an
hypothesis will be thought of as an hypothesized extension for the
newly introduced concept \(G\). Formally, a hypothesis is simply a
function \(h:D \rightarrow \{\mathbf{t}, \mathbf{f}\}\). Given a
hypothesis \(h\), we take \(M+h\) to be the classical model \(M+h =
\langle D,I'\rangle\), where \(I'\) interprets \(F\) and \(R\) in the
same way as \(I\), and where \(I'(G) = h\). Given a hypothesized
interpretation \(h\) of \(G\), we generate a new interpretation of
\(G\) as follows: and object \(d \in D\) is in the new extension of
\(G\) just in case the defining formula \(A(x,G)\) is true of \(d\) in
the model \(M+h\). Formally, we use the ground model \(M\) and the
definition \(D\) to define a *revision rule*, \(\delta_{D,M}\),
mapping hypotheses to hypotheses, i.e., hypothetical interpretations
of \(G\) to hypothetical interpretations of \(G\). In particular, for
any formula \(B\) with one free variable \(x\), and \(d \in D\), we
can define the truth value \(\textit{Val}_{M+h,d}(B)\) in the standard
way. Then,

Given a revision rule \(\delta_{D,M}\), we can generalize the notion
of a *revision sequence*, which is now a sequence of
hypothetical extensions of \(G\) rather than \(\boldsymbol{T}\). We
can generalize the notion of a sentence \(B\) being *stably
true*, *nearly stably true*, etc., relative to a revision
sequence. Gupta and Belnap introduce the systems \(\mathbf{S}^*\) and
\(\mathbf{S}^{\#}\), analogous to \(\mathbf{T}^*\) and
\(\mathbf{T}^{\#}\), as
follows:^{[11]}

Definition 5.1.

- A sentence \(B\) is
valid on the definition\(D\)in the ground model\(M\)in the system\(\mathbf{S}^*\) (notation \(M \vDash_{*,D} B)\) iff \(B\) is stably true relative to each revision sequence for the revision rule \(\delta_{D,M}\).- A sentence \(B\) is
valid on the definition\(D\)in the ground model\(M\)in the system\(\mathbf{S}^{\#}\) (notation \(M \vDash_{\#,D} B)\) iff \(B\) isnearlystably true relative to each revision sequence for the revision rule \(\delta_{D,M}\).- A sentence \(B\) is
valid on the definition\(D\)in the system\(\mathbf{S}^*\) (notation \(\vDash_{*,D} B)\) iff for all classical ground models \(M\), we have \(M \vDash_{*,D} B\).- A sentence \(B\) is
valid on the definition\(D\)in the system\(\mathbf{S}^{\#}\) (notation \(\vDash_{\#,D} B)\) iff for all classical ground models \(M\), we have \(M \vDash_{\#,D} B\).

One of Gupta and Belnap’s principle open questions is whether there is a complete calculus for these systems: that is, whether, for each definition \(D\), either of the following two sets of sentences is recursively axiomatizable: \(\{B:\vDash_{*,D} B\}\) and \(\{B:\vDash_{\#,D} B\}\). Kremer 1993 proves that the answer is no: he shows that there is a definition \(D\) such that each of these sets of sentences is of complexity at least \(\Pi^{1}_2\), thereby putting a lower limit on the complexity of \(\mathbf{S}^*\) and \(\mathbf{S}^{\#}\). (Antonelli 1994a and 2002 shows that this is also an upper limit.)

Kremer’s proof exploits an intimate relationship between
circular definitions understood *revision*-theoretically and
circular definitions understood as *inductive* definitions: the
theory of inductive definitions has been quite well understood for
some time. In particular, Kremer proves that every inductively defined
concept can be revision-theoretically defined. The expressive power
and other aspects of the revision-theoretic treatment of circular
definitions is the topic of much interesting work: see Welch 2001,
Löwe 2001, Löwe and Welch 2001, and Kühnberger *et
al*. 2005.

Alongside Kremer’s limitative result there is the positive
observation that, for some semantic system of definitions based on
restricted kinds of revision sequences, sound and complete calculi
*do* exist. For instance, Gupta and Belnap give some examples
of calculi and revision-theoretic systems which use only finite
revision sequences. Further investigation on proof-theoretic calculi
capturing some revision-theoretic semantic systems is done in Bruni
2013, Standefer 2016, Bruni 2019, and Fjellstad 2020.

### 5.5 Axiomatic Theories of Truth and the Revision Theory

The RTT is a clear example of a semantically motivated theory of truth. Quite a different tradition seeks to give a satisfying axiomatic theory of truth. Granted we cannot retain all of classical logic and all of our intuitive principles regarding truth, especially if we allow vicious self-reference. But maybe we can arrive at satisfying axiom systems for truth, that, for example, maintain consistency and classical logic, but give up only a little bit when it comes to our intuitive principles concerning truth, such as the T-biconditionals (interpreted classically); or maintain consistency and all of the T-biconditionals, but give up only a little bit of classical logic. Halbach 2011 comprehensively studies such axiomatic theories (mainly those that retain classical logic), and Horsten 2011 is in the same tradition. Both Chapter 14 of Halbach 2011 and Chapter 8 of Horsten 2011 study the relationship between the Friedman-Sheard theory FS and the revision semantics, with some interesting results. For more work on axiomatic systems and the RTT, see Horsten et al 2012.

Field 2008 makes an interesting contribution to axiomatic theorizing about truth, even though most of the positive work in the book consists of model building and is therefore semantics. In particular, Field is interested in producing a theory as close to classical logic as possible, which retains all T-biconditionals (the conditional itself will be nonclassical) and which at the same time can express, in some sense, the claim that such and such a sentence is defective. Field uses tools from multivalued logic, fixed-point semantics, and revision theory to build models showing, in effect, that a very attractive axiomatic system is consistent. Field’s construction is an intricate interplay between using fixed-point constructions for successively interpreting T, and revision sequences for successively interpreting the nonclassical conditional — the final interpretation being determined by a sort of super-revision-theoretic process.

The connection between revision and Field’s theory is explored further in Standefer 2015b and in Gupta and Standefer 2017.

### 5.6 Applications

Given Gupta and Belnap’s general revision-theoretic treatment of
circular definitions — of which their treatment of
*truth* is a special case — one would expect
revision-theoretic ideas to be applied to other concepts. Antonelli
1994b applies these ideas to non-well-founded sets: a non-well-founded
set \(X\) can be thought of as circular, since, for some \(X_0 ,
\ldots ,X_n\) we have \(X \in X_0 \in \ldots \in X_n \in X\). Chapuis
2003 applies revision-theoretic ideas to rational decision making.
This connection is further developed by Bruni 2015 and by Bruni and
Sillari 2018. For a discussion of revision theory and abstract objects
see Wang 2011. For a discussion of revision theory and vagueness, see
Asmus 2013.

Standefer (2015a) studies the connection between the circular
definitions of revision theory and a particular modal logic RT (for
“Revision Theory”). Campbell-Moore *et al.* 2019
and Campbell-Moore 2021 use revision sequences to model probabilities
and credences, respectively. Cook 2019 employs a revision-theoretic
analysis to find a new possible solution of Benardete’s version
of the Zeno paradox.

In recent times, there has been increasing interest in bridging the gap between classic debates on the nature of truth — deflationism, the correspondence theory, minimalism, pragmatism, and so on — and formal work on truth, motivated by the liar’s paradox. The RTT is tied to pro-sententialism by Belnap 2006; deflationism, by Yaqūb 2008; and minimalism, by Restall 2005.

We must also mention Gupta 2006. In this work, Gupta argues that an
experience provides the experiencer, not with a straightforward
entitlement to a proposition, but rather with a hypothetical
entitlement: as explicated in Berker 2011, if subject S has experience
\(e\) and is entitled to hold view \(v\) (where S’s
*view* is the totality of S’s concepts, conceptions, and
beliefs), then S is entitled to believe a certain class of perceptual
judgements, \(\Gamma(v)\). (Berker uses “propositions”
instead of “perceptual judgements” in his formulation.)
But this generates a problem: how is S entitled to hold a view? There
seems to be a circular interdependence between entitlements to views
and entitlements to perceptual judgements. Here, Gupta appeals to a
general form of revision theory — generalizing beyond both the
revision theory of truth and the revision theory of circularly defined
concepts (Section 5.4, above) — to given an account of how
“hypothetical perceptual entitlements could yield categorical
entitlements” (Berker 2011).

### 5.7 An open question

We close with an open question about \(\mathbf{T}^*\) and
\(\mathbf{T}^{\#}\). Recall Definition 3.11, above, which defines when
a sentence \(A\) of a truth language \(L\) is *valid in the ground
model* \(M\) *by* \(\mathbf{T}^*\) or *by*
\(\mathbf{T}^{\#}\). We will say that \(A\) is *valid by*
\(\mathbf{T}^*\) [alternatively, *by* \(\mathbf{T}^{\#}\)] iff
\(A\) is valid in the ground model \(M\) by \(\mathbf{T}^*\)
[alternatively, by \(\mathbf{T}^{\#}\)] for every ground model \(M\).
Our open question is this: What is the complexity of the set of
sentences valid by \(\mathbf{T}^* [\mathbf{T}^{\#}\)]?

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## Other Internet Resources

- Hammer, E., 2003, “The Revision Theory of Truth”,
*The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy*(Spring 2003 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2003/entries/truth-revision/>. (This was the entry on the revision theory of truth which appeared in the active portion of the SEP from 1997–2006.)