# Definitions

*First published Thu Apr 10, 2008; substantive revision Mon Apr 20, 2015*

Definitions have interested philosophers since ancient times.
Plato’s early dialogues portray Socrates raising questions about
definitions (e.g., in the *Euthyphro*, “What is
piety?”)—questions that seem at once profound and elusive.
The key step in Anselm’s “Ontological Proof” for the
existence of God is the definition of “God,” and the same
holds of Descartes’s version of the argument in his
*Meditation V*. More recently, the Frege-Russell definition of
number and Tarski’s definition of truth have exercised a
formative influence on a wide range of contemporary philosophical
debates. In all these cases—and many others can be
cited—not only have particular definitions been debated; the
nature of, and demands on, definitions have also been debated. Some of
these debates can be settled by making requisite distinctions, for
definitions are not all of one kind: definitions serve a variety of
functions, and their general character varies with function. Some other
debates, however, are not so easily settled, as they involve
contentious philosophical ideas such as essence, concept, and
meaning.

- 1. Some varieties of definition
- 2. The logic of definitions
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Some varieties of definition

Ordinary discourse recognizes several different kinds of things as possible objects of definition, and it recognizes several kinds of activity as defining a thing. To give a few examples, we speak of a commission as defining the boundary between two nations; of the Supreme Court as defining, through its rulings, “person” and “citizen”; of a chemist as discovering the definition of gold, and the lexicographer, that of ‘cool’; of a participant in a debate as defining the point at issue; and of a mathematician as laying down the definition of “group.” Different kinds of things are objects of definition here: boundary, legal status, substance, word, thesis, and abstract kind. Moreover, the different definitions do not all have the same goal: the boundary commission may aim to achieve precision; the Supreme Court, fairness; the chemist and the lexicographer, accuracy; the debater, clarity; and the mathematician, fecundity. The standards by which definitions are judged are thus liable to vary from case to case. The different definitions can perhaps be subsumed under the Aristotelian formula that a definition gives the essence of a thing. But this only highlights the fact that “to give the essence of a thing” is not a unitary kind of activity.

In philosophy, too, several different kinds of definitions are often in play, and definitions can serve a variety of different functions (e.g., to enhance precision and clarity). But, in philosophy, definitions have also been called in to serve a highly distinctive role: that of solving epistemological problems. For example, the epistemological status of mathematical truths raises a problem. Immanuel Kant thought that these truths are synthetic a priori, and to account for their status, he offered a theory of space and time—namely, of space and time as forms of, respectively, outer and inner sense. Gottlob Frege and Bertrand Russell sought to undermine Kant’s theory by arguing that arithmetical truths are analytic. More precisely, they attempted to construct a derivation of arithmetical principles from definitions of arithmetical concepts, using only logical laws. For the Frege-Russell project to succeed, the definitions used must have a special character. They must be conceptual or explicative of meaning; they cannot be synthetic. It is this kind of definition that has aroused, over the past century or so, the most interest and the most controversy. And it is this kind of definition that will be our primary concern. Let us begin by marking some preliminary but important distinctions.

### 1.1 Real and nominal definitions

John Locke distinguished, in his *Essay*, “real
essence” from “nominal essence.” Nominal essence,
according to Locke, is the “*abstract* Idea *to which
the Name is annexed* (III.vi.2).” Thus, the nominal essence
of the name ‘gold’, Locke said, “is that complex
*Idea* the word *Gold* stands for, let it be, for
instance, a Body yellow, of a certain weight, malleable, fusible, and
fixed.” In contrast, the real essence of gold is “the
constitution of the insensible parts of that Body, on which those
Qualities [mentioned in the nominal essence] and all other Properties
of *Gold* depend (III.vi.2).” A rough way of marking the
distinction between real and nominal definitions is to say, following
Locke, that the former states real essence, while the latter states
nominal essence. The chemist aims at real definition, whereas the
lexicographer aims at nominal definition.

This characterization of the distinction is rough because a zoologist’s definition of “tiger” should count as a real definition, even though it may fail to provide “the constitution of the insensible parts” of the tiger. Moreover, an account of the meaning of a word should count as a nominal definition, even though it may not take the Lockean form of setting out “the abstract idea to which the name is annexed.” Perhaps it is helpful to indicate the distinction between real and nominal definitions thus: to discover the real definition of a term \(X\) one needs to investigate the thing or things denoted by \(X\); to discover the nominal definition, one needs to investigate the meaning and use of \(X\). Whether the search for an answer to the Socratic question “What is virtue?” is a search for real definition or one for nominal definition depends upon one’s conception of this particular philosophical activity. When we pursue the Socratic question, are we trying to gain a clearer view of our uses of the word ‘virtue’, or are we trying to give an account of an ideal that is to some extent independent of these uses? Under the former conception, we are aiming at a nominal definition; under the latter, at a real definition.

For a critical discussion of the different activities that have been subsumed under “real definition,” see Robinson 1950. For ancient views about definitions, see the essays in Charles 2010.

### 1.2 Dictionary definitions

Nominal definitions—definitions that explain the meaning of a term—are not all of one kind. A dictionary explains the meaning of a term, in one sense of this phrase. Dictionaries aim to provide definitions that contain sufficient information to impart an understanding of the term. It is a fact about us language users that we somehow come to understand and use a potential infinity of sentences containing a term once we are given a certain small amount of information about the term. Exactly how this happens is a large mystery. But it does happen, and dictionaries exploit the fact. Note that dictionary entries are not unique. Different dictionaries can give different bits of information and yet be equally effective in explaining the meanings of terms.

Definitions sought by philosophers are not of the sort found in a dictionary. Frege’s definition of number (1884) and Alfred Tarski’s definition of truth (1983, ch. 8) are not offered as candidates for dictionary entries. When an epistemologist seeks a definition of “knowledge,” she is not seeking a good dictionary entry for the word ‘know’. The philosophical quest for definition can sometimes fruitfully be characterized as a search for an explanation of meaning. But the sense of ‘explanation of meaning’ here is very different from the sense in which a dictionary explains the meaning of a word.

### 1.3 Stipulative definitions

A stipulative definition imparts a meaning to the defined term, and involves no commitment that the assigned meaning agrees with prior uses (if any) of the term. Stipulative definitions are epistemologically special. They yield judgments with epistemological characteristics that are puzzling elsewhere. If one stipulatively defines a “raimex” as, say, a rational, imaginative, experiencing being then the judgment “raimexes are rational” is assured of being necessary, certain, and a priori. Philosophers have found it tempting to explain the puzzling cases of, e.g., aprioricity by an appeal to stipulative definitions.

Saul Kripke (1980) has drawn attention to a special kind of stipulative definition. We can stipulatively introduce a new name (e.g., ‘Jack the Ripper’) through a description (e.g., “the man who murdered \(X, Y\), and \(Z\)”). In such a stipulation, Kripke pointed out, the description serves only to fix the reference of the new name; the name is not synonymous with the description. For, the judgment

- (1) Jack the Ripper is the man who murdered \(X, Y\), and \(Z\), if a unique man committed the murders

is contingent, even though the judgment

Jack the Ripper is Jack the Ripper, if a unique man committed the murders

is necessary. A name such as ‘Jack the Ripper’, Kripke argued, is rigid: it picks out the same individual across possible worlds; the description, on the other hand, is non-rigid. Kripke used such reference-fixing stipulations to argue for the existence of contingent a priori truths—(1) being an example. Reference-fixing stipulative definitions can be given not only for names but also for terms in other categories, e.g., common nouns.

See Frege 1914 for a defense of the austere view that, in mathematics
at least, only stipulative definitions should be
countenanced.^{[1]}

### 1.4 Descriptive definitions

Descriptive definitions, like stipulative ones, spell out meaning, but they also aim to be adequate to existing usage. When philosophers offer definitions of, e.g., ‘know’ and ‘free’, they are not being stipulative: a lack of fit with existing usage is an objection to them.

It is useful to distinguish three grades of descriptive adequacy of
a definition: extensional, intensional, and sense. A definition is
*extensionally adequate* iff there are no actual counterexamples
to it; it is *intensionally adequate* iff there are no possible
counterexamples to it; and it is *sense adequate* (or
*analytic*) iff it endows the defined term with the right sense.
(The last grade of adequacy itself subdivides into different notions,
for “sense” can be spelled out in several different ways.)
The definition “Water is H_{2}O,” for example, is
intensionally adequate because the identity of water and H_{2}O
is necessary (assuming the Kripke-Putnam view about the rigidity of
natural-kind terms); the definition is therefore extensionally adequate
also. But it is not sense-adequate, for the sense of
‘water’ is not at all the same as that of
‘H_{2}O’. The definition ‘George Washington
is the first President of the United States’ is adequate only
extensionally but not in the other two grades, while ‘man is a
laughing animal’ fails to be adequate in all three grades. When
definitions are put to an epistemological use, intensional adequacy is
generally insufficient. For such definitions cannot underwrite the
rationality or the aprioricity of a problematic subject matter.

See Quine 1951 & 1960 for skepticism about analytic definitions; see also the entry on the analytic/synthetic distinction. Horty 2007 offers some ways of thinking about senses of defined expressions, especially within a Fregean semantic theory.

### 1.5 Explicative definitions

Sometimes a definition is offered neither descriptively nor
stipulatively but as, what Rudolf Carnap (1956, §2) called, an
*explication*. An explication aims to respect some central uses
of a term but is stipulative on others. The explication may be offered
as an absolute improvement of an existing, imperfect concept. Or, it
may be offered as a “good thing to mean” by the term in a
specific context for a particular purpose. (The quoted phrase is due to
Alan Ross Anderson; see Belnap 1993, 117.)

A simple illustration of explication is provided by the definition of ordered pair in set theory. Here, the pair \(\langle x,y\rangle\) is defined as the set \(\{\{x\}, \{x,y\}\}\). Viewed as an explication, this definition does not purport to capture all aspects of the antecedent uses of ‘ordered pair’ in mathematics (and in ordinary life); instead, it aims to capture the essential uses. The essential fact about our use of ‘ordered pair’ is that it is governed by the principle that pairs are identical iff their respective components are identical:

\[ \langle x, y\rangle = \langle u, v\rangle \text{ iff } x = u \amp y = v. \]And it can be verified that the above definition satisfies the principle. The definition does have some consequences that do not accord with the ordinary notion. For example, the definition implies that an object \(x\) is a member of a member of the pair \(\langle x, y\rangle\), and this implication is no part of the ordinary notion. But the mismatch is not an objection to the explication. What is important for explication is not antecedent meaning but function. So long as the latter is preserved, the former can be let go. It is this feature of explication that led W. V. O. Quine (1960, §53) to extol its virtues and to uphold the definition of “ordered pair” as a philosophical paradigm.

The truth-functional conditional provides another illustration of
explication. This conditional differs from the ordinary conditional in
some essential respects. Nevertheless, the truth-functional conditional
can be put forward as an explication of the ordinary conditional
*for certain purposes in certain contexts*. Whether the proposal
is adequate depends crucially on the purposes and contexts in question.
That the two conditionals differ in important, even essential, respects
does not automatically disqualify the proposal.

### 1.6 Ostensive definitions

Ostensive definitions typically depend on context and on
experience. Suppose the conversational context renders one dog salient
among several that are visible. Then one can introduce the name
‘Freddie’ through the stipulation “let Freddie be
this dog.” For another example, suppose you are looking at a
branch of a bush and you stipulatively introduce the name
‘Charlie’ thus: “let Charlie be the insect on that
branch.” This definition can pin a referent on
‘Charlie’ even if there are many insects on the branch. If
your visual experience presents you with only one of these insects
(say, because the others are too small to be visible), then that
insect is the denotation of your use of the description ‘the
insect on that branch’. We can think of experience as presenting
the subject with a restricted portion of the world. This portion can
serve as a point of evaluation for the expressions in an ostensive
definition.^{[2]}
Consequently, the definition can with the aid of
experience pin a referent on the defined term when without this aid it
would fail to do so. In the present example, the description
‘the insect on that branch’ fails to be denoting when it
is evaluated at the world as a whole, but it is denoting when it is
evaluated at that portion of it that is presented in your visual
experience. See Gupta 2019 for an account of the contribution of experience to the meaning of an ostensively defined term.

An ostensive definition can bring about an essential enrichment of a language. The ostensive definition of ‘Charlie’ enriches the language with a name of a particular insect, and it could well be that before the enrichment the language lacked resources to denote that particular insect. Unlike other familiar definitions, ostensive definitions can introduce terms that are ineliminable. (So, ostensive definitions can fail to meet the Eliminability criterion explained below; they can fail to meet also the Conservativeness criterion, also explained below.)

The capacity of ostensive definitions to introduce essentially new
vocabulary has led some thinkers to view them as the source of all
primitive concepts. Thus, Russell maintains in *Human
Knowledge* that

all nominal definitions, if pushed back far enough, must lead ultimately to terms having only ostensive definitions, and in the case of an empirical science the empirical terms must depend upon terms of which the ostensive definition is given in perception. (p. 242)

In “Meaning and Ostensive Definition”, C. H. Whiteley
takes it as a premiss that ostensive definitions are “the means
whereby men learn the meanings of most, if not all, of those
elementary expressions in their language in terms of which other
expressions are defined.” (332) It should be noted, however,
that nothing in the logic and semantics of ostensive definitions
warrants a foundationalist picture of concepts or of
language-learning. Such foundationalist pictures were decisively
criticized by Ludwig Wittgenstein in his *Philosophical
Investigations*. Wittgenstein’s positive views on ostensive
definition remain elusive, however; for an interpretation, see Hacker
1975.

Ostensive definitions are important, but our understanding of them remains at a rudimentary level. They deserve greater attention from logicians and philosophers.

### 1.7 A remark

The kinds into which we have sorted definitions are not mutually exclusive, nor exhaustive. A stipulative definition of a term may, as it happens, be extensionally adequate to the antecedent uses of the term. A dictionary may offer ostensive definitions of some words (e.g., of color words). An ostensive definitions can also be explicative. For example, one can offer an improvement of a preexisting concept “one foot” thus: “let one foot be the present length of that rod.” In its preexisting use, the concept “one foot” may be quite vague; the ostensively introduced explication may, in contrast, be relatively precise. Moreover, as we shall see below, there are other kinds of definition than those considered so far.

## 2. The logic of definitions

Many definitions—stipulative, descriptive, and explicative—can be analyzed into three elements: the term that is defined \((X)\), an expression containing the defined term \((\ldots X\ldots)\), and another expression \((- - - - - - -)\) that is equated by the definition with this expression. Such definitions can be represented thus:

\[\tag{2} X: \ldots X \ldots \eqdf - - - - - - - . \](We are setting aside ostensive definitions, which plainly require a richer representation.) When the defined term is clear from the context, the representation may be simplified to

\[ \ldots X \ldots \eqdf - - - - - - - . \]
The expression on the left-hand side of ‘\(\eqdf\)’
(i.e., \(\ldots X\ldots)\) is the *definiendum of* the
definition, and the expression on the right-hand side is its
*definiens*—it being assumed that the definiendum and the
definiens belong to the same logical category. Note the distinction
between defined term and definiendum: the defined term in the present
example is \(X\); the definiendum is the unspecified expression
on the left-hand side of ‘\(\eqdf\)’, which may or
may not be identical to \(X\). (Some authors call the defined
term ‘the definiendum’; some others use the expression
confusedly, sometimes to refer to the defined term and sometimes to
the definiendum proper.) Not all definitions found in the logical and
philosophical literature fit under scheme (2). Partial definitions,
for example, fall outside the scheme; another example is provided by
definitions of logical constants in terms of introduction and
elimination rules governing them. Nonetheless, definitions that
conform to (2) are the most important, and they will be our primary
concern.

Let us focus on stipulative definitions and reflect on their logic.
Some of the important lessons here carry over, as we shall see, to
descriptive and explicative definitions. For simplicity, let us
consider the case where a single definition stipulatively introduces a
term. (Multiple definitions bring notational complexity but raise no
new conceptual issues.) Suppose, then, that a language \(L\), the
*ground* language, is expanded through the addition of a new
term \(X\) to an *expanded* language \(L^{+}\), where \(X\) is
stipulatively defined by a definition \(\mathcal{D}\) of form
(2). What logical rules govern \(\mathcal{D}\)? What requirements
must the definition fulfill?

Before we address these questions, let us take note of a distinction
that is not marked in logic books but which is useful in thinking about
definitions. In one kind of definition—call it
*homogeneous* definition—the defined term and the
definiendum belong to the same logical category. So, a singular term is
defined via a singular term; a general term via a general term; a
sentence via a sentence; and so on. Let us say that a homogenous
definition is *regular* iff its definiendum is identical to the
defined term. Here are some examples of regular homogeneous
definitions:

Note that ‘The True’, as defined above, belongs to the category of sentence, not that of singular term.

It is sometimes said that definitions are mere recipes for
abbreviations. Thus, Alfred North Whitehead and Bertrand Russell say of
definitions—in particular, those used in *Principia
Mathematica*—that they are “strictly speaking,
typographical conveniences (1925, 11).” This viewpoint has
plausibility only for regular homogeneous definitions—though it
is not really tenable even here. (Whitehead and Russell’s own
observations make it plain that their definitions are more than mere
“typographical
conveniences.”^{[3]})
The idea that definitions are mere abbreviations is not at all
plausible for the second kind of definition, to which let us now
turn.

In the second kind of definition—call it a
*heterogenous* definition—the defined term and the
definiendum belong to different logical categories. So, for example, a
general term (e.g., ‘man’) may be defined using a
sentential definiendum (e.g., ‘\(x\) is a man’). For
another example, a singular term (e.g., ‘1’) may be defined
using a predicate (e.g., ‘is identical to 1’).
Heterogeneous definitions are far more common than homogenous ones. In
familiar first-order languages, for instance, it is pointless to
define, say, a one-place predicate \(G\) by a homogeneous
definition. These languages have no resources for forming compound
predicates; hence, the definiens of a homogeneous definition of
\(G\) is bound to be atomic. In a heterogeneous definition,
however, the definiens can easily be complex; for example,

If the language has a device for abstraction—e.g., for forming sets—we could give a different sort of heterogenous definition of \(G\):

\[\tag{5} \text{the set of } G\text{s} \eqdf \text{the set of numbers between 3 and 10.} \]
Observe that a heterogenous definition such as (4) is not a mere
abbreviation. For, if it were, the expression \(x\) in it would
not be a genuine variable, and the definition would provide no guidance
on the role of \(G\) in contexts other than \(Gx\). Moreover,
if such definitions were abbreviations, they would be subject to the
requirement that the definiendum must be *shorter* than the
definiens, but no such requirement exists. On the other hand, genuine
requirements on definitions would make little sense. The following
stipulation is not a legitimate definition:

But if it is viewed as a mere abbreviation, there is nothing illegitimate about it.

Some stipulative definitions are nothing but mere devices of abbreviation (e.g., the definitions governing the omission of parentheses in formulas; see Church 1956, §11). However, many stipulative definitions are not of this kind; they introduce meaningful items into our discourse. Thus, definition (4) renders \(G\) a meaningful unary predicate: \(G\) expresses, in virtue of (4), a particular concept. In contrast, under stipulation (6), \(G\) is not a meaningful predicate and expresses no concept of any kind. But what is the source of the difference? Why is (4) legitimate, but not (6)? More generally, when is a definition legitimate? What requirements must the definiens fulfill? And, for that matter, the definiendum? Must the definiendum be, for instance, atomic, as in (3) and (4)? If not, what restrictions (if any) are there on the definiendum?

### 2.1 Two criteria

It is a plausible requirement on any answer to these questions that
two criteria be
respected.^{[4]}
First, a stipulative definition should not enable us to establish
essentially new claims—call this the *Conservativeness*
criterion. We should not be able to establish, by means of a mere
stipulation, new things about, for example, the moon. It is true that
unless this criterion is made precise, it is subject to trivial
counterexamples, for the introduction of a definition materially
affects some facts. Nonetheless, the criterion can be made precise
and defensible, and we shall soon see some ways of doing this.

Second, the definition should fix the use of the defined expression
\(X\)—call this the *Use* criterion. This criterion
is plausible, since only the definition—and nothing
else—is available to guide us in the use of \(X\). There
are complications here, however. What counts as a use of \(X\)?
Are occurrences within the scope of ‘say’ and
‘know’ included? What about the occurrence of \(X\)
within quotation contexts, and those within words, for instance,
‘*Xenophanes*’? The last question should receive,
it is clear, the answer, “No.” But the answers to the
previous questions are not so clear. There is another complication:
even if we can somehow separate out genuine occurrences of \(X\),
it may be that some of these occurrences are rightfully ignored by the
definition. For example, a definition of quotient may leave some
occurrences of the term undefined (e.g., where there is division by
0). The orthodox view is to rule such definitions as illegitimate, but
the orthodoxy deserves to be challenged here. Let us leave the
challenge to another occasion, however, and proceed to bypass the
complications through idealization. Let us confine ourselves to
ground languages that possess a clearly determined logical structure
(e.g., a first-order language) and that contain no occurrences of the
defined term \(X\). And let us confine ourselves to definitions
that place no restrictions on legitimate occurrences
of \(X\). The Use criterion now dictates then that the definition
should fix the use of all expressions in the expanded language in
which \(X\) occurs.

A variant formulation of the Use criterion is this: the definition must fix the meaning of the definiendum. The new formulation is less determinate and more contentious, for it relies on “meaning,” an ambiguous and theoretically contentious notion.

Note that the two criteria govern all stipulative definitions, irrespective of whether they are single or multiple, or of whether they are of form (2) or not.

### 2.2 Foundations of the traditional account

The traditional account of definitions is founded on three ideas. The first idea is that definitions are generalized identities; the second, that the sentential is primary; and the third, that of reduction. The first idea—that definitions are generalized identities—motivates the traditional account’s inferential rules for definitions. These are, put crudely, that (i) any occurrence of the definiendum can be replaced by an occurrence of the definiens (Generalized Definiendum Elimination); and, conversely, (ii) any occurrence of the definiens can be replaced by an occurrence of the definiendum (Generalized Definiendum Introduction).

The second idea—the primacy of the sentential—has its
roots in the thought that the fundamental uses of a term are in
assertion and argument: if we understand the use of a defined term in assertion
and argument then we fully grasp the term. The sentential is,
however, primary in argument and assertion. Hence, to explain the use
of a defined term \(X\), the second idea maintains, it is
necessary and sufficient to explain the use of sentential items that
contain \(X\). (Sentential items are here understood to include
sentences and sentence-like things with free variables, e.g., the
definiens of (4); henceforth, these items will be called
*formulas*.) The issues the second idea raises are, of course,
large and important, but they cannot be addressed in a brief survey.
Let us accept the idea simply as a given.

The third idea—reduction—is that the use of a formula
\(Z\) containing the defined term is explained by reducing
\(Z\) to a formula in the ground language. This idea, when
conjoined with the primacy of the sentential, leads to a strong version
of the Use criterion, called the *Eliminability* criterion: the
definition must reduce each formula containing the defined term to a
formula in the ground language, i.e., one free of the defined term.
Eliminability is the distinctive thesis of the traditional account and,
as we shall see below, it can be challenged.

Note that the traditional account does not require the reduction of
*all* expressions of the extended language; it requires the
reduction only of formulas. The definition of a predicate \(G\),
for example, need provide no way of reducing \(G\), taken in
isolation, to a predicate of the ground language. The traditional
account is thus consistent with the thought that a stipulative
definition can add a new conceptual resource to the language, for
nothing in the ground language expresses the predicative concept that
\(G\) expresses in the expanded language. This is not to deny that
no new proposition—at least in the sense of
truth-condition—is expressed in the expanded language.

### 2.3 Conservativeness and eliminability

Let us now see how Conservativeness and Eliminability can be made precise. First consider languages that have a precise proof system of the familiar sort. Let the ground language \(L\) be one such. The proof system of \(L\) may be classical, or three-valued, or modal, or relevant, or some other; and it may or may not contain some non-logical axioms. All we assume is that we have available the notions “theorem of \(L\)” and “provably equivalent in \(L\),” and also the notions “theorem of \(L^{+}\)” and “provably equivalent in \(L^{+}\)” that result when the proof system of \(L\) is supplemented with a definition \(\mathcal{D}\) and the logical rules governing definitions. Now, the Conservativeness criterion can be made precise as follows.

**Conservativeness criterion (syntactic formulation)**:
Any formula of \(L\) that is provable in \(L^{+}\) is
provable in \(L\).

That is, any formula of \(L\) that is provable using definition \(\mathcal{D}\) is also provable without using \(\mathcal{D}\): the definition does not enable us to prove anything new in \(L\). The Eliminability criterion can be made precise thus:

**Eliminability criterion (syntactic formulation)**:
For any formula \(A\) of \(L^{+}\), there is a
formula of \(L\) that is provably equivalent in
\(L^{+}\) to \(A\).

(Folklore credits the Polish logician S. Leśniewski for
formulating the criteria of Conservativeness and Eliminability, but
this is a mistake; see Dudman 1973, Hodges 2008, Urbaniak and Hämäri 2012 for
discussion and further
references.)^{[5]}

Now let us equip \(L\) with a model-theoretic semantics. That is, we associate with \(L\) a class of interpretations, and we make available the notions “valid in \(L\) in the interpretation \(M\)” (a.k.a.: “true in \(L\) in \(M\)”) and “semantically equivalent in \(L\) relative to \(M\).” Let the notions “valid in \(L^{+}\) in \(M\)” and “semantically equivalent in \(L^{+}\) relative to \(M\)” result when the semantics of \(L\) is supplemented with that of definition \(\mathcal{D}\). The criteria of Conservativeness and Eliminability can now be made precise thus:

**Conservativeness criterion (semantic formulation)**:
For all formulas \(A\) of \(L\) and all interpretations
\(M\), if \(A\) is valid in \(L^{+}\) in
\(M\) then \(A\) is also valid in \(L\) in
\(M\).

**Eliminability criterion (semantic formulation)**: For
any formula \(A\) of \(L^{+}\), there is a formula
\(B\) of \(L\) such that, relative to all interpretations
\(M, B\) is semantically equivalent in
\(L^{+}\) to \(A\).

The syntactic and semantic formulations of the two criteria are plainly parallel. However, even if we suppose that strong completeness theorems hold for \(L\) and \(L^{+}\), the two formulations are not equivalent. Indeed, several different, non-equivalent formulations of the two criteria are possible within each framework, the syntactic and the semantic.

Observe that the satisfaction of Conservativeness and Eliminability criteria, whether in their semantic or their syntactic formulation, is not an absolute property of a definition; the satisfaction is relative to the ground language. Different ground languages can have associated with them different systems of proof and different classes of interpretations. Hence, a definition may satisfy the two criteria when added to one language, but may fail to do so when added to a different language. For further discussion of the criteria, see Suppes 1957 and Belnap 1993.

### 2.4 Definitions in normal form

For concreteness, let us fix the ground language \(L\) to be a
classical first-order language with identity. The proof system of
\(L\) may contain some non-logical axioms \(T\); the
interpretations of \(L\) are then the classical models of
\(T\). As before, \(L^{+}\) is the expanded language
that results when a definition
\(\mathcal{D}\)
of a non-logical constant \(X\) is added
to \(L\); hence, \(X\) may be a name, a predicate, or a
function-symbol. Call two definitions *equivalent* iff they
yield the same theorems in the expanded language. Then, it can be
shown that if
\(\mathcal{D}\)
meets the criteria of Conservativeness and Eliminability then
\(\mathcal{D}\)
is equivalent to a
definition in normal form as specified
below.^{[6]}
Since definitions in normal form meet the demands
of Conservativeness and Eliminability, the traditional account implies
that we lose nothing essential if we require definitions to be in
normal form.

The normal form of definitions can be specified as follows. The definitions of names \(a, n\)-ary predicates \(H\), and \(n\)-ary function symbols \(f\) must be, respectively, of the following forms:

\[\begin{align} \tag{7} a = x &\eqdf \psi(x), \\ \tag{8} H(x_{1},\ldots , x_{n}) &\eqdf \phi\,(x_{1},\ldots, x_{n}), \\ \tag{9} f(x_{1},\ldots,x_{n})= y &\eqdf \chi(x_{1},\ldots, x_{n}, y), \end{align}\]
where the variables \(x_{1}\), …, \(x_{n}\), \(y\) are all
distinct, and the definiens in each case satisfies conditions that can
be separated into a general and a specific
part.^{[7]} The
general condition on definiens is the same in each case: it must not
contain the defined term or any free variables other than those in the
definiendum. The general conditions remain the same when the
traditional account of definition is applied to non-classical logics
(e.g., to many-valued and modal logics). The specific conditions are
more variable. In classical logic, the specific condition on the
definiens \(\psi(x)\) of (7) is that it satisfy an existence and
uniqueness condition: that it be provable that something satisfies
\(\psi(x)\) and that at most one thing satisfies
\(\psi(x)\).^{[8]}
There are no specific conditions on (8), but the condition on (9)
parallels that on (7). An existence and uniqueness claim must hold:
the universal closure of the formula

must be
provable.^{[9]}

In a logic that allows for vacuous names, the specific condition on the definiens of (7) would be weaker: the existence condition would be dropped. In contrast, in a modal logic that requires names to be non-vacuous and rigid, the specific condition would be strengthened: not only must existence and uniqueness be shown to hold necessarily, it must be shown that the definiens is satisfied by one and the same object across possible worlds.

Definitions that conform to (7)–(9) are heterogeneous; the definiendum is sentential, but the defined term is not. One source of the specific conditions on (7) and (9) is their heterogeneity. The specific conditions are needed to ensure that the definiens, though not of the logical category of the defined term, imparts the proper logical behavior to it. The conditions thus ensure that the logic of the expanded language is the same as that of the ground language. This is the reason why the specific conditions on normal forms can vary with the logic of the ground language. Observe that, whatever this logic, no specific conditions are needed for regular homogeneous definitions.

The traditional account makes possible simple logical rules for definitions and also a simple semantics for the expanded language. Suppose definition \(\mathcal{D}\) has a sentential definiendum. (In classical logic, all definitions can easily be transformed to meet this condition.) Let \(\mathcal{D}\) be

\[\tag{10} \phi(x_{1},\ldots,x_{n}) \eqdf \psi(x_{1},\ldots, x_{n}), \]where \(x_{1}\), …, \(x_{n}\) are all the variables free in either \(\phi\) or \(\psi\). And let \(\phi(t_{1},\ldots,t_{n})\) and \(\psi(t_{1},\ldots,t_{n})\) result by the simultaneous substitution of terms \(t_{1}\), …, \(t_{n}\) for \(x_{1}\), …, \(x_{n}\) in, respectively, \(\phi(x_{1},\ldots, x_{n})\) and \(\psi(x_{1},\ldots, x_{n})\); changing bound variables as necessary. Then the rules of inference governing \(\mathcal{D}\) are simply these:

\[\begin{align*} \frac{\phi(t_1,\ldots,t_n)}{\psi(t_1,\ldots,t_n)}\,\,&\textbf{Definiendum Elimination} \\ & \\ \frac{\psi(t_1,\ldots,t_n)}{\phi(t_1,\ldots,t_n)}\,\,&\textbf{Definiendum Introduction} \end{align*}\]The semantics for the extended language is also straightforward. Suppose, for instance, \(\mathcal{D}\) is a definition of a name \(a\) and suppose that, when put in normal form, it is equivalent to (7). Then, each classical interpretation \(M\) of \(L\) expands to a unique classical interpretation \(M^{+}\) of the extended language \(L^{+}\). The denotation of \(a\) in \(M^{+}\) is the unique object that satisfies \(\psi(x)\) in \(M\); the conditions on \(\psi(x)\) ensure that such an object exists. The semantics of defined predicates and function-symbols is similar. The logic and semantics of definitions in non-classical logics receive, under the traditional account, a parallel treatment.

Note that the inferential force of adding definition (10) to the language is the same as that of adding as an axiom, the universal closure of

\[\tag{11} \phi(x_{1},\ldots, x_{n}) \leftrightarrow \psi(x_{1},\ldots,x_{n}). \]However, this similarity in the logical behavior of (10) and (11) should not obscure the great differences between the biconditional (‘\(\leftrightarrow\)’) and definitional equivalence (‘\(\eqdf\)’). The former is a sentential connective, but the latter is trans-categorical: not only formulas, but also predicates, names, and items of other logical categories can occur on the two sides of ‘\(\eqdf\)’. Moreover, the biconditional can be iterated—e.g., \(((\phi \leftrightarrow \psi) \leftrightarrow \chi)\)—but not definitional equivalence. Finally, a term can be introduced by a stipulative definition into a ground language whose logical resources are confined, say, to classical conjunction and disjunction. This is perfectly feasible, even though the biconditional is not expressible in the language. In such cases, the inferential role of the stipulative definition is not mirrored by any formula of the extended language.

The traditional account of definitions should not be viewed as
*requiring* definitions to be in normal form. The only
requirements that it imposes are (i) that the definiendum contain the
defined term; (ii) that the definiendum and the definiens belong to the
same logical category; and (iii) the definition satisfies
Conservativeness and Eliminability. So long as these requirements are
met, there are no further restrictions. The definiendum, like the
definiens, can be complex; and the definiens, like the definiendum, can
contain the defined term. So, for example, there is nothing
*formally* wrong if the definition of the functional expression
‘the number of’ has as its definiendum the formula
‘the number of \(F\)s is the number of \(G\)s’.
The role of normal forms is only to provide an easy way of ensuring
that definitions satisfy Conservativeness and Eliminability; they do
not provide the only legitimate format for stipulatively introducing a
term. Thus, the reason why (4) is, but (6) is not, a legitimate
definition is not that (4) is in normal form and (6) is not.

The reason is that (4) respects, but (6) does not, the two criteria. (The ground language is assumed here to contain ordinary arithmetic; under this assumption, the second definition implies a contradiction.) The following two definitions are also not in normal form:

\[\begin{align*} \tag{12} Gx &\eqdf (x \gt 3 \amp x \lt 10) \amp y = y. \\ \tag{13} Gx &\eqdf [x = 0 \amp(G0 \vee G1)] \vee [x = 1 \amp ({\sim}G0 \amp {\sim}G1)]. \end{align*}\]But both should count as legitimate under the traditional account, since they meet the Conservativeness and Eliminability criteria. It follows that the two definitions can be put in normal form. Definition (12) is plainly equivalent to (4), and definition (13) is equivalent to (14):

\[\tag{14} Gx \eqdf x = 0. \]Observe that the definiens of (13) is not logically equivalent to any \(G\)-free formula. Nevertheless, the definition has a normal form.

Similarly, the traditional account is perfectly compatible with
*recursive* (a.k.a.: *inductive*) definitions such as those
found in logic and mathematics. In Peano Arithmetic, for example,
exponentiation can be defined by means of the following equations:

Here the first equation—called the *base*
clause—defines the value of the function when the exponent is 0.
And the second clause—called the *recursive*
clause—uses the value of the function when the exponent is
\(n\) to define the value when the exponent is \(n + 1\).
This is perfectly legitimate, according to the traditional account,
because a theorem of Peano Arithmetic establishes that the above
definition is equivalent to one in normal
form.^{[10]}
Recursive definitions are circular in their format, and indeed it is
this circularity that renders them perspicuous. But the circularity is
entirely on the surface, as the existence of normal forms shows. See
the discussion of circular definitions below.

### 2.5 Implicit definitions

The above viewpoint allows the traditional account to bring within
its fold ideas that might at first sight seem contrary to it. It is
sometimes suggested that a term \(X\) can be introduced
axiomatically, that is, by laying down as axioms certain sentences of
the expanded language \(L^{+}\). The axioms are then said
to *implicitly* define \(X\). This idea is easily
accommodated within the traditional account. Let a *theory* be a
set of sentences of the expanded language \(L^{+}\). Then,
to say that a theory \(T^*\) is an *implicit*
(*stipulative*) *definition of X* is to say that
\(X\) is governed by the definition

where \(\phi\) is the conjunction of the members of \(T^*\). (If
\(T^*\) is infinite then a stipulation of the above form will be
needed for each sentence \(\psi\) in
\(T^*\).)^{[11]}
The definition is legitimate, according to the traditional account,
so long as it meets the Conservativeness and Eliminability
criteria. If it does meet these criteria, let us call \(T^*\)
*admissible* (*for a definition* *of X*). So, the
traditional account accommodates the idea that theories can
stipulatively introduce new terms, but it imposes a strong demand: the
theories must be
admissible.^{[12]}

Consider, for concreteness, the special case of classical
first-order languages. Let the ground language \(L\) be one such,
and let its interpretations be models of some sentences \(T\). Say
that an interpretation \(M^{+}\) of \(L^{+}\)
is an *expansion* of an interpretation \(M\) of \(L\)
iff \(M\) and \(M^{+}\) have the same domain and they
assign the same semantic values to the non-logical constants in
\(L\). Furthermore, let us say that

\(T^*\) is an *implicit semantic definition of X* iff, for
each interpretation \(M\) of \(L\), there is a unique model
\(M^{+}\) of \(T^*\) such that \(M^{+}\)
is an expansion of \(M\).

Then the following claim is immediate:

If \(T^*\) is admissible then \(T^*\) is an implicit semantic definition of \(X\).

That is, an admissible theory fixes the semantic value of the defined term in each interpretation of the ground language. This observation provides one natural method of showing that a theory is not admissible:

**Padoa’s method**. To show that \(T^*\) is not
admissible, it suffices to construct two models of \(T^*\) that
are expansions of one and the same interpretation of the ground
language \(L\). (Padoa 1900)

Here is a simple and philosophically useful application of Padoa’s method. Suppose the proof system of \(L\) is Peano Arithmetic and that \(L\) is expanded by the addition of a unary predicate \(Tr\) (for “Gödel number of a true sentence of \(L\)”). Let \(\mathbf{H}\) be the theory consisting of all the sentences (the “Tarski biconditionals”) of the following form:

\[ Tr(s) \leftrightarrow \psi, \]where \(\psi\) is a sentence of \(L\) and \(s\) is the canonical name for the Gödel number of \(\psi\). Padoa’s method implies that \(\mathbf{H}\) is not admissible for defining \(Tr\). For \(\mathbf{H}\) does not fix the interpretation of \(Tr\) in all interpretations of \(L\). In particular, it does not do so in the standard model, for \(\mathbf{H}\) places no constraints on the behavior of \(Tr\) on those numbers that are not Gödel numbers of sentences. (If the coding renders each natural number a Gödel number of a sentence, then a non-standard model of Peano Arithmetic provides the requisite counterexample: it has infinitely many expansions that are models of \(\mathbf{H}\).) A variant of this argument shows that Tarski’s theory of truth, as formulated in \(L^{+}\), is not admissible for defining \(Tr\).

What about the converse of Padoa’s method? Suppose we can show that in each interpretation of the ground language, a theory \(T^*\) fixes a unique semantic value for the defined term. Can we conclude that \(T^*\) is admissible? This question receives a negative answer for some semantical systems, and a positive answer for others. (In contrast, Padoa’s method works so long as the semantic system is not highly contrived.) The converse fails for, e.g., classical second-order languages, but it holds for first-order ones:

**Beth’s Definability Theorem**. If \(T^*\) is an
implicit semantic definition of \(X\) in a classical first-order
language then \(T^*\) is admissible.

Note that the theorem holds even if \(T^*\) is an infinite set. For a proof of the theorem, see Boolos, Burgess, and Jeffrey 2002; see also Beth 1953.

The idea of implicit definition is not in conflict, then, with the traditional account. Where conflict arises is in the philosophical applications of the idea. The failure of strict reductionist programs of the late-nineteenth and early-twentieth century prompted philosophers to explore looser kinds of reductionism. For instance, Frege’s definition of number proved to be inconsistent, and thus incapable of sustaining the logicist thesis that the principles of arithmetic are analytic. It turns out, however, that the principles of arithmetic can be derived without Frege’s definition. All that is needed is one consequence of it, namely, Hume’s Principle:

**Hume’s Principle**. The number of \(F\)s = the
number of \(G\)s iff there is a one-to-one correspondence between
the \(F\)s and \(G\)s.

If we add Hume’s Principle to second-order logic, then we can
analytically derive (second-order) Peano Arithmetic. (The essentials of
the argument are found already in Frege 1884.) It is a central thesis
of *Neo-Fregeanism* that Hume’s Principle is an implicit
definition of the functional expression ‘the number of’
(see Hale and Wright 2001). If this thesis can be defended then
logicism about arithmetic can be sustained while foregoing
Frege’s explicit (and inconsistent) definition. However, the
neo-Fregean thesis is in conflict with the traditional account of
definitions, for Hume’s principle violates both Conservativeness
and Eliminability. The principle allows one to prove, for arbitrary
\(n\), that there are at least \(n\) objects. (A related
application aims to sustain the analyticity of a geometry through the
idea that the axioms of geometry are implicit definitions of
geometrical concepts such as “point” and
“line.” Here, too, there is conflict with the traditional
account, for Conservativeness and Eliminability are violated.)

Another example: The reductionist program for theoretical concepts
(e.g., those of physics) aimed to solve epistemological problems that
these concepts pose. The program aimed to reduce theoretical sentences
to (classes of) observational sentences. However, the reductions proved
difficult, if not impossible, to sustain. Thus arose the suggestion
that perhaps the non-observational component of a theory can, without
any claim of reduction, be regarded as an implicit definition of
theoretical terms. The precise characterization of the
non-observational component can vary with the specific epistemological
problem at hand. But there is bound to be a violation of one or both of
the two criteria, Conservativeness and
Eliminability.^{[13]}

A final example: We know by a theorem of Tarski that no theory can be an admissible definition of the truth predicate, \(Tr\), for the language of Peano Arithmetic considered above. Nonetheless, perhaps we can still regard theory \(\mathbf{H}\) as an implicit definition of \(Tr\). (Paul Horwich has made a closely related proposal for the ordinary notion of truth.) Here, again, pressure is put on the bounds imposed by the traditional account. \(\mathbf{H}\) meets the Conservativeness criterion, but not that of Eliminability.

In order to assess the challenge these philosophical applications
pose for the traditional account, we need to resolve issues that are
under current philosophical debate. Some of the issues are the
following. (i) It is plain that some violations of Conservativeness are
illegitimate: one cannot make it true by a *stipulation* that,
e.g., Mercury is larger than Venus. Now, if a philosophical application
requires some violations of Conservativeness to be legitimate, we need
an account of the distinction between the two sorts of cases: the
legitimate violations of Conservativeness and the non-legitimate ones.
And we need to understand what it is that renders the one legitimate, but not the
other. (ii) A similar issue arises for Eliminability. It
would appear that not any old theory can be an implicit definition of a
term \(X\). (The theory might contain only tautologies.) If so,
then again we need a demarcation of theories that can serve to
implicitly define a term from those that cannot. And we need a
rationale for the distinction. (iii) The philosophical applications
rest crucially on the idea that an implicit definition fixes the
meaning of the defined term. We need therefore an account of what this
meaning is, and how the implicit definition fixes it. Under the
traditional account, formulas containing the defined term can be seen
as acquiring their meaning from the formulas of the ground language.
(In view of the primacy of the sentential, this fixes the meaning of
the defined term.) But this move is not available under a liberalized
conception of implicit definition. How, then, should we think of the
meaning of a formula under the envisioned departure from the
traditional account? (iv) Even if the previous three issues are
addressed satisfactorily, an important concern remains. Suppose we
allow that a theory \(T\), say, of physics can stipulatively
define its theoretical terms, and that it endows the terms with
particular meanings. The question remains whether the meanings thus
endowed are identical to (or similar enough to) the meanings the
theoretical terms have in their actual uses in physics. This question
must be answered positively if implicit definitions are to serve their
philosophical function. The aim of invoking implicit definitions is to
account for the rationality, or the aprioricity, or the analyticity of
our ordinary judgments, not of some extraordinary judgments that are
somehow assigned to ordinary signs.

For further discussion of these issues, see Horwich 1998, especially chapter 6; Hale and Wright 2001, especially chapter 5; and the works cited there.

### 2.6 Vicious-Circle Principle

Another departure from the traditional theory begins with the idea not that the theory is too strict, but that it is too liberal, that it permits definitions that are illegitimate. Thus, the traditional theory allows the following definitions of, respectively, “liar” and the class of natural numbers \(\mathbf{N}\):

- (16)
\(z\)
*is a liar*\(\eqdf\) all propositions asserted by \(z\) are false; - (17) \(z\) belongs to \(\mathbf{N}\) \(\eqdf\) \(z\) belongs to every inductive class, where a class is inductive when it contains 0 and is closed under the successor operation.

Russell argued that such definitions involve a subtle kind of vicious circle. The definiens of the first definition invokes, Russell thought, the totality of all propositions, but the definition, if legitimate, would result in propositions that can only be defined by reference to this totality. Similarly, the second definition attempts to define the class \(\mathbf{N}\) by reference to all classes, which includes the class \(\mathbf{N}\) that is being defined. Russell maintained that such definitions are illegitimate. And he imposed the following requirement—called, the “Vicious-Circle Principle”—on definitions and concepts. (Henri Poincaré had also proposed a similar idea.)

**Vicious-Circle Principle**. “Whatever involves
*all* of a collection must not be one of the collection (Russell
1908, 63).”

Another formulation Russell gave of the Principle is this:

**Vicious-Circle Principle (variant
formulation)**. “If, provided a certain collection had a
total, it would have members only definable in terms of that total,
then the said collection has no total (Russell, 1908, 63).”

In an appended footnote, Russell explained, “When I say that a
collection has no total, I mean that statements about *all* its
members are nonsense.”

Russell’s primary motivation for the Vicious-Circle Principle were the logical and semantic paradoxes. Notions such as “truth,” “proposition,” and “class” generate, under certain unfavorable conditions, paradoxical conclusions. Thus, the claim “Cheney is a liar,” where “liar” is understood as in (16), yields paradoxical conclusions, if Cheney has asserted that he is a liar, and all other propositions asserted by him are, in fact, false. Russell took the Vicious-Circle Principle to imply that if “Cheney is a liar” expresses a proposition, it cannot be in the scope of the quantifier in the definiens of (16). More generally, Russell held that quantification over all propositions, and over all classes, violates the Vicious-Circle Principle and is thus illegitimate. Furthermore, he maintained that expressions such as ‘true’ and ‘false’ do not express a unique concept—in Russell’s terminology, a unique “propositional function”—but one of a hierarchy of propositional functions of different orders. Thus the lesson Russell drew from the paradoxes is that the domain of the meaningful is more restricted than it might ordinarily appear, that the traditional account of concepts and definitions needed to be made more restrictive in order to rule out the likes of (16) and (17).

In application to ordinary, informal definitions, the Vicious-Circle Principle does not provide, it must be said, a clear method of demarcating the meaningful from the meaningless. Definition (16) is supposed to be illegitimate because, in its definiens, the quantifier ranges over the totality of all propositions. And we are told that this is prohibited because, were it allowed, the totality of propositions “would have members only definable in terms of the total.” However, unless we know more about the nature of propositions and of the means available for defining them, it is impossible to determine whether (16) violates the Principle. It may be that a proposition such as “Cheney is a liar”—or, to take a less contentious example, “Either Cheney is a liar or he is not”— can be given a definition that does not appeal to the totality of all propositions. If propositions are sets of possible worlds, for example, then such a definition would appear to be feasible.

The Vicious-Circle Principle serves, nevertheless, as an effective
motivation for a particular account of legitimate concepts and
definitions, namely that embodied in Russell’s Ramified Type
Theory. The idea here is that one begins with some unproblematic
resources that involve no quantification over propositions, concepts,
and such. These resources enable one to define, for example, various
unary concepts, which are thereby assured of satisfying the
Vicious-Circle Principle. Quantification over these concepts is thus
bound to be legitimate, and can be added to the language. The same
holds for propositions and for concepts falling under other types: for
each type, a quantifier can be added that ranges over items (of that
type) that are definable using the initial unproblematic resources. The
new quantificational resources enable the definition of further items
of each type; these, too, respect the Principle, and again, quantifiers
ranging over the expanded totalities can legitimately be added to the
language. The new resources permit the definition of yet further items.
And the process repeats. The result is that we have a hierarchy of
propositions and of concepts of various orders. Each type in the type
hierarchy ramifies into a multiplicity of orders. This ramification
ensures that definitions formulated in the resulting language are bound
to respect the Vicious-Circle Principle. Concepts and classes that can
be defined within the confines of this scheme are said to be
*predicative* (in one sense of this word); the others,
*impredicative*.

For further discussion of the Vicious-Circle Principle, see Russell
1908, Whitehead and Russell 1925, Gödel 1944, and Chihara 1973.
For a formal presentation of Ramified Type Theory, see Church 1976;
for a more informal presentation, see Hazen 1983. See also the entries
on
type theory and
*Principia Mathematica*,
which contain further references.

### 2.7 Circular definitions

The paradoxes can also be used to motivate a conclusion that is the very opposite to Russell’s. Consider the following definition of a one-place predicate \(G\):

\[\tag{18} \begin{align*} Gx \eqdf x = \text{Socrates} &\vee (x = \text{Plato} \amp Gx) \\ &\vee (x = \text{Aristotle} \amp {\sim}Gx). \end{align*}\]
This definition is essentially circular; it is not reducible to one in
normal form. Still, intuitively, it provides substantial guidance on
the use of \(G\). The definition dictates, for instance, that Socrates
falls under \(G\), and that nothing apart from the three ancient
philosophers mentioned does so. The definition leaves unsettled the
status of only two objects, namely, Plato and Aristotle. If we suppose
that Plato falls under \(G\), the definition yields that Plato does
fall under \(G\) (since Plato satisfies the definiens), thus
confirming our supposition. The same thing happens if we suppose the
opposite, namely, that Plato does not fall under \(G\); again our
supposition is confirmed. With Aristotle, any attempt to decide
whether he falls under \(G\) lands us in an even more precarious
situation: if we suppose that Aristotle falls under \(G\), we are led
to conclude by the definition that he does not fall under \(G\) (since
he does not satisfy the definiens); and, conversely, if we suppose
that he does not fall under \(G\), we are led to conclude that he
does. But even on Plato and Aristotle, the behavior of \(G\) is not
unfamiliar: \(G\) is behaving here in the way the concept of truth
behaves on the Truth Teller (“What I am now saying is
true”) and the Liar (“What I am now saying is not
true”). More generally, there is a strong parallel between the
behavior of the concept of truth and that of concepts defined by circular
definitions. Both are typically well defined on a range of cases, and
both display a variety of unusual logical behavior on the other cases.
Indeed, all the different kinds of perplexing logical behavior found
with the concept of truth are found also in concepts defined by
circular definitions. This strong parallelism suggests that since
truth is manifestly a legitimate concept, so also are concepts defined
by circular definitions such as (18). The paradoxes, according to this
viewpoint, cast no doubt on the legitimacy of the concept of truth.
They show only that the logic and semantics of circular concepts is
different from that of non-circular ones. This viewpoint is developed
in the *revision theory of definitions*.

In this theory, a circular definition imparts to the defined term a
meaning that is *hypothetical* in character; the semantic value
of the defined term is a *rule of revision*, not as with
non-circular definitions, a *rule of application*. Consider
(18) again. Like any definition, (18) fixes the interpretation of the
definiendum \(if\) the interpretations of the non-logical constants in
the definiens are given. The problem with (18) is that the defined
term \(G\) occurs in the definiens. But suppose that we arbitrarily
assign to \(G\) an interpretation—say we let it be the set \(U\)
of all objects in the universe of discourse (i.e., we suppose that
\(U\) is the set of objects that satisfy \(G)\). Then it is easy to
see that the definiens is true precisely of Socrates and Plato. The
definition thus dictates that, under our hypothesis, the
interpretation of \(G\) should be the set \(\{ \text{Socrates},
\text{Plato}\}\). A similar calculation can be carried out for any
hypothesis about the interpretation of \(G\). For example, if the
hypothesis is \(\{\text{Xenocrates}\}\), the definition yields the
result \(\{\text{Socrates}, \text{Aristotle}\}\). In short, even
though (18) does not fix sharply what objects fall under \(G\), it
does yield a rule or function that, when given a hypothetical
interpretation as an input, yields another one as an output. The
fundamental idea of the revision theory is to view this rule as
a *revision* rule: the output interpretation is better than the
input one (or it is at least as good; this qualification will be taken
as read). The semantic value that the definition confers on the
defined term is not an extension—a demarcation of the universe
of discourse into objects that fall under the defined term, and those
that do not. The semantic value is a revision rule.

The revision rule explains the behavior, both ordinary and extraordinary, of a circular concept. Let \(\delta\) be the revision rule yielded by a definition, and let \(V\) be an arbitrary hypothetical interpretation of the defined term. We can attempt to improve our hypothesis \(V\) by repeated applications of the rule \(\delta\). The resulting sequence,

\[ V, \delta(V), \delta(\delta(V)), \delta(\delta(\delta(V))),\ldots, \]
is a *revision sequence* *for* \(\delta\). The totality
of revision sequences for \(\delta\), for all possible initial hypotheses,
is the *revision process generated by* \(\delta\). For example, the
revision rule for (18) generates a revision process that consists of
the following revision sequences, among others:

Observe the behavior of our four ancient philosophers in this
process. After some initial stages of revision, Socrates always falls
in the revised interpretations, and Xenocrates always falls outside.
(In this particular example, the behavior of the two is fixed after the
initial stage; in other cases, it may take many stages of revision
before the status of an object becomes settled.) The revision process
yields a *categorical* verdict on the two philosophers: Socrates
categorically falls under \(G\), and Xenocrates categorically
falls outside \(G\). Objects on which the process does not yield a
categorical verdict are said to be *pathological* (*relative
to* the revision rule, the definition, or the defined concept). In
our example, Plato and Aristotle are pathological relative to (18). The
status of Aristotle is not stable in any revision sequence. It is as if
the revision process cannot make up its mind about him. Sometimes
Aristotle is ruled as falling under \(G\), and then the process
reverses itself and declares that he does not fall under \(G\),
and then the process reverses itself again. When an object behaves in
this way in all revision sequences, it is said to be
*paradoxical*. Plato is also pathological relative to
\(G\), but his behavior in the revision process is different.
Plato acquires a stable status in each revision sequence, but the
status he acquires depends upon the initial hypothesis.

Revision processes help provide a semantics for circular
definitions.^{[14]}
They can be used to define semantic
notions such as “categorical truth” and logical notions
such as “validity.” The characteristics of the logical
notions we obtain depend crucially on one aspect of revision: the
number of stages before objects settle down to their regular behavior
in the revision process. A definition is said to be *finite*
iff, roughly, its revision process necessarily requires only finitely
many such
stages.^{[15]}
For finite definitions, there is a simple logical calculus,
\(\mathbf{C}_{0}\), that is sound and complete for the
revision
semantics.^{[16]}
With non-finite definitions, the
revision process extends into the
transfinite.^{[17]}
And these definitions can add considerable expressive power to the
language. (When added to first-order arithmetic, these definitions
render all \(\Pi^{1}_{2}\) sets of natural numbers
definable.) Because of the expressive power, the general notion of
validity for non-finite circular definitions is not axiomatizable
(Kremer 1993). We can give at best a sound logical calculus, but not a
complete one. The situation is analogous to that with second-order
logic.

Let us observe some general features of the revision theory of definitions. (i) Under this theory, the logic and semantics of non-circular definitions—i.e., definitions in normal form—remain the same as in the traditional account. The introduction and elimination rules hold unrestrictedly, and revision stages are dispensable. The deviations from the traditional account occur only over circular definitions. (ii) Under the theory, circular definitions do not disturb the logic of the ground language. Sentences containing defined terms are subject to the same logical laws as sentences of the ground language. (iii) Conservativeness holds. No definition, no matter how vicious the circularity in it, entails anything new in the ground language. Even the utterly paradoxical definition

\[ Gx \eqdf {\sim}Gx \]respects the Conservativeness requirement. (iv) Eliminability fails to hold. Sentences of the expanded language are not, in general, reducible to those of the ground language. This failure has two sources. First, revision theory fixes the use, in assertion and argument, of sentences of the expanded language but without reducing the sentences to those of the ground language. The theory thus meets the Use criterion, but not the stronger one of Eliminability. Second, in this theory, a definition can add logical and expressive power to a ground language. The addition of a circular definition can result in the definability of new sets. This is another reason why Eliminability fails.

It may be objected that every concept must have an extension, that there must be a definite totality of objects that fall under the concept. If this is right then a predicate is meaningful—it expresses a concept—only if the predicate necessarily demarcates the world sharply into those objects to which it applies and those to which it does not apply. Hence, the objection concludes, no predicate with an essentially circular definition can be meaningful. The objection is plainly not decisive, for it rests on a premiss that rules out many ordinary and apparently meaningful predicates (e.g., ‘bald’). Nonetheless, it is noteworthy because it illustrates how general issues about meaning and concepts enter the debate on the requirements on legitimate definitions.

The principal motivation for revision theory is descriptive. It has been argued that the theory helps us to understand better our ordinary concepts such as truth, necessity, and rational choice. The ordinary as well as the perplexing behavior of these concepts, it is argued, has its roots in the circularity of the concepts. If this is correct, then there is no logical requirement on descriptive and explicative definitions that they be non-circular.

For more detailed treatments of these topics, see Gupta 1988/89, Gupta and Belnap 1993, and Chapuis and Gupta 1999. See also the entry on the revision theory of truth. For critical discussions of the revision theory, see the papers by Vann McGee and Donald A. Martin, and the reply by Gupta, in Villanueva 1997. See also Shapiro 2006.

## Bibliography

- Belnap, N., 1993, “On Rigorous Definitions,”
*Philosophical Studies*, 72: 115–146. - Beth, E. W., 1953, “On Padoa’s Method in the Theory of
Definitions,”
*Indagationes Mathematicae*, 15: 330–339. - Boolos, G. S., Burgess, J. P., and Jeffrey, R. C., 2002,
*Computability and Logic*, fourth edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Carnap, R., 1956,
*Meaning and Necessity: A Study in Semantics and Modal Logic*, enlarged edition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press. - Chapuis, A., and Gupta, A. (eds.), 1999,
*Circularity, Definition, and Truth*, New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research. - Charles, D. (ed.), 2010,
*Definition in Greek Philosophy*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Chihara, C. S., 1973,
*Ontology and the Vicious-Circle Principle*, Ithaca: Cornell University Press. - Church, A., 1956,
*Introduction to Mathematical Logic*, Princeton: Princeton University Press. - –––, 1976, “Comparison of Russell’s
Resolution of the Semantical Antinomies with that of
Tarski,”
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 41: 747–760. - Demopoulos, W., 2003, “On the Rational Reconstruction of our
Theoretical Knowledge,”
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 54: 371–403. - Dudman, V. H., 1973, “Frege on
Definitions,”
*Mind*, 83: 609–610. - Frege, G., 1879,
*Begriffschrift*, in*From Frege to Gödel: A Source Book in Mathematical Logic, 1879–1931*, edited by J. van Heijenoort, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press (1967), pp. 1–82. - –––, 1884,
*The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Inquiry into the Concept of Number*, second revised edition (1980), Evanston: Northwestern University Press. - –––, 1914, “Logic in Mathematics,”
in
*Gottlob Frege: Posthumous Writings*, edited by H. Hermes, F. Kambartel, and F. Kaulbach, Chicago: University of Chicago Press (1979), pp. 203–250. - Gödel, K., 1944, “Russell’s Mathematical
Logic,” reprinted in his
*Collected Works: Volume II: Publications 1938–1974*, New York: Oxford University Press (1990), pp. 119–141 - Gupta, A., 1988/89, “Remarks on Definitions and the Concept
of Truth,”
*Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society*, 89: 227–246. - –––, 2006, “Finite Circular
Definitions,” in
*Self-Reference*, edited by T. Bolander, V. F. Hendricks, and S. A. Andersen, Stanford: CSLI Publications, pp. 79–93. - –––, 2019,
*Conscious Experience: A Logical Inquiry*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Gupta, A. and Belnap, N., 1993,
*The Revision Theory of Truth*, Cambridge MA: MIT Press. - Hacker, P.M.S., 1993, “Wittgenstein on Ostensive Definitions,”
*Inquiry*, 18: 267–287. - Hale B., and Wright C., 2001,
*The Reason’s Proper Study: Essays towards a Neo-Fregean Philosophy of Mathematics*, Oxford: Clarendon Press. - Hazen, A., 1983, “Predicative Logics,” in
*Handbook of Philosophical Logics: Volume I: Elements of Classical Logic*, edited by D. Gabbay and F. Guenthner, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 331–407. - Hodges, W., 1993, “Tarski’s Theory of Definition,”
in
*New Essays on Tarski and Philosophy*, edited by D. Patterson, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 94–132. - Horty, J., 2007,
*Frege on Definitions: A Case Study of Semantic Content*, New York: Oxford University Press. - Horwich, P., 1998,
*Meaning*, Oxford: Clarendon Press. - Kremer, P., 1993, “The Gupta-Belnap systems
\(\mathbf{S}^{\#}\) and \(\mathbf{S}^{*}\) are
not axiomatisable,”
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 34: 583–596. - Kripke, S. A., 1980,
*Naming and Necessity*, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press. - Locke, J., 1689,
*An Essay concerning Human Understanding*, edited by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Oxford University Press (1975). - Martinez, M., 2001, “Some Closure Properties of Finite
Definitions,”
*Studia Logica*, 68: 43–68. - Moschovakis, Y., 1974,
*Elementary Induction on Abstract Structures*, Amsterdam: North-Holland. - Padoa, A., 1900, “Logical Introduction to Any Deductive
Theory,” in
*From Frege to Gödel: A Source Book in Mathematical Logic, 1879–1931*, edited by J. van Heijenoort, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press (1967), pp. 118–123. - Quine, W. V. O., 1951, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism,”
reprinted in his
*From a Logical Point of View*, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press (1953), pp. 20–46. - –––, 1960,
*Word and Object*, Cambridge MA: MIT Press. - Robinson, R., 1950,
*Definition*, Oxford: Clarendon Press. - Russell, B., 1908, “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory
of Types,” reprinted in his
*Logic and Knowledge: Essays 1901–1950*, London: George Allen & Unwin (1956), pp. 59–102. - –––, 1948,
*Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits*, New York: Simon and Schuster. - Shapiro, L., 2006, “The Rationale Behind Revision-Rule
Semantics,”
*Philosophical Studies*, 129: 477–515. - Suppes, P., 1957,
*Introduction to Logic*, New York: Van Nostrand Reinhold. - Tarski, A., 1983,
*Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics: Papers from 1923 to 1938*, second edition, edited by J. Corcoran, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company. - Urbaniak, R., and Hämäri, K. S., 2012, “Busting a
Myth about Leśniewski and Definitions,”
*History and Philosophy of Logic*, 33: 159–189. - Villanueva, E., (ed.), 1997,
*Truth*(*Philosophical Issues*8), Atascadero: Ridgeview Publishing Company. - Whitehead, A. N., and Russell, B., 1925,
*Principia Mathematica*, vol. 1, second edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Whiteley, C. H., 1956, “Meaning and Ostensive Definition,”
*Mind*, 65: 332–335. - Wittgenstein, L., 1953,
*Philosophical Investigations*, New York: Macmillan.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- Definitions, Dictionaries, and Meanings, notes by Norman Swartz, Simon Fraser University

### Acknowledgments

The author would like to thank Ed Zalta and any anonymous editor for helpful suggestions for improving this entry.