Notes to Two-Dimensional Semantics

1. There are two standard ways of interpreting rigid designation, both of which are consistent with Saul Kripke’s original introduction of the term (1970 lectures, published 1980). On the first interpretation, a name rigidly designates a given object at every world in which that object exists, and it fails to designate anything at worlds in which the object does not exist. On the second interpretation, a name rigidly designates a given object at every world regardless of whether the object exists in that world. For present expository purposes, we’ll rely on the latter interpretation.

2. An object’s modal profile or nature, in this sense, should be distinguished from its essential properties. A modal profile (or nature) captures all the possible combinations of properties the object might instantiate in different possible worlds. In contrast, the object’s essential properties are the specific subset of properties (if any) that the object must have in every world in which it exists. Standard possible world semantics can be used to capture the modal profile associated with ‘Roger Federer’ by first assigning an intension to the name which maps every possible world onto a particular individual, RF, and then providing the resources for determining, of any given predicate, ‘\(P\)’, whether there is a possible situation in which RF exemplifies the property picked out by that predicate. The complete modal profile of RF can be made explicit by surveying all the different combinations of properties RF exhibits in the possible worlds in which he exists.

3. Kripke’s book is based on a series of lectures delivered in 1970.

4. This way of representing possible contexts presupposes that the agent exists at the designated time. This is known as a “proper context”, and it reflects the empirical facts available for interpreting actual utterances. But some theorists work with a weaker notion of context, which allows for arbitrary combinations of agents, spatio-temporal locations, and worlds. This weaker notion of context can help represent how we interpret indexical utterances, like a recording of ‘I am not here now’ on an answering machine, when the agent is not located at the time and place of the utterances (Predelli 1998).

5. The sentence counts as a logical truth in Kaplan’s 2D framework because logical validity is defined only on proper contexts, in which the designated agent is located at designated time and place in the world of the context (1989, 544 clause 10, 547 remark 3).

6. What is the semantic role of the logical operator, ‘Fixedly’ (‘\(\mathcal{F}\)’), considered on its own? Borrowing formalism introduced by (Davies and Humberstone 1980), we can say that a sentence is always evaluated with respect to an ordered pair of possible worlds, \(\langle w_x, w_y\rangle\), where the first member of the pair represents the world designated as actual and the second represents a circumstance of evaluation. A sentence \(S\) is fixedly true at \(w_n\), iff \(S\) is true with respect to every ordered pair \(\langle w_x, w_n\rangle\), where we allow the \(w_x\) to vary arbitrarily. (Graphically, a sentence \(S\) will be Fixedly true at \(w_n\) just in case the entire (vertical) column corresponding to \(w_n\) in a 2D matrix contains ‘True’ all the way down.) In effect, the Fixedly operator tells us about what must be true with respect to a specific world considered as counterfactual, no matter which world is designated as actual. When we combine the operators ‘Fixedly’ and ‘Actually’ (‘\(\mathcal{F}\mathcal{A}\)’), the complex operator behaves like a necessity operator ranging over possible worlds playing the actual world role. A sentence is fixedly actually true just in case it is true at the designated world no matter which world is so designated. So a sentence is fixedly actually true iff it is true with respect to every ordered pair \(\langle w_x,w_x\rangle\), where the value of \(w_x\) is allowed to vary arbitrarily. (Graphically, \(S\) will be fixedly actually true iff the diagonal of the 2D matrix contains ‘True’ all the way down.)

7. Notice that, unlike Kaplan, Crossley and Humberstone do not think of the possible worlds ranged along the vertical axis of the 2D matrix as possible contexts of use. On their 2D framework, the worlds “considered as actual” are just arbitrarily designated as the reference of the term ‘actually’ for the purposes of modeling the behavior of ‘actually’ within the scope of operators like ‘necessarily’ or ‘possibly’. Thus, their 2D semantics does not explain how the significance of the natural language expression ‘actually’ is affected by the context in which it’s used, only how the term interacts with other modal operators.

8. The semantic rules governing ‘actually’ allow us to know the definitions given in (i) and (ii) are true no matter which world is actual (i.e. they are fixedly actually true). According to (i), whoever invented the zip (whether it was Mary Anne Evans or Whitcomb Judson), that person is Julius. Since you know that (i) is true no matter which world is actual, you can know that it’s true on the basis of apriori reasoning alone. But still, (i) does not reflect the modal profile of Julius: Whitcomb Judson (the real inventor of the zip) could have died in infancy. So the definition in (i) does not ensure that the claim is necessary in the sense of the standard modal operator, ‘\(\Box\)’. In contrast, the true identity claim ‘Julius = Whitcomb Judson’ is necessary in this sense, since both names rigidly designate the same individual in all possible worlds. But the semantic rule in (i) does not allow us to know this identity is true: we need to conduct some empirical investigation to find out who the inventor was. Similar observations follow from the definition of ‘water’ in (ii).

9. Some theorists push the argument further, arguing that the potential for ignorance and error highlighted by externalist examples generalizes to other types of expression, such as artifact terms (‘pencil’, ‘sofa’), conventional kinds (‘arthritis’, ‘fortnight’), or even logical expressions (‘not’, ‘every’) (Putnam 1972; Burge 1979; Williamson 2007).

10. Kripke’s book is based on a series of lectures delivered in 1970.

11. Jackson emphasizes that his account of meaning is not intended to explain thought contents (1998b; 2004). The reason for this is simple: the account posits implicit conventions that require individual speakers to associate a word with specific reference-fixing assumptions about the object, kind or property in question. The account thus presupposes an independent explanation of the content of these thoughts. Moreover, it’s hard to see how anything like linguistic conventions could apply to thought contents directly: since we don’t seem to have any way of focusing on our own mental representations independently of our understanding of their contents, it’s implausible that we could establish conventions requiring thinkers to associate some pattern of understanding with a given mental representation.

12. It’s worth noting that Jackson is not committed to any particular interpretation of the possible worlds that define his 2D framework. Jackson’s 2D framework is just a tool for testing one’s current understanding of how two different vocabularies relate to each other, and cataloguing the resulting information in a perspicuous way. The goal is to identify conditions, specified in some base vocabulary, that one takes to suffice for the applicability of a given target expression. For these purposes, any vocabulary can be used to describe hypothetical cases, as long as it provides enough information for the speaker to be confident in applying the target expression. The fact that Jackson sometimes takes the commitments of a sophisticated proponent of physicalism as his primary example may obscure this point, suggesting that the possibilities that define the 2D framework should always be couched in the language of idealized physics. But it’s important to keep in mind that the empiricist theory of meaning is supposed to characterize actual linguistic competence—a psychological and social phenomenon—not to characterize the nature of reality. So, in contrast to the rationalist project, the empiricist project needn’t posit an idealized vocabulary that can exhaustively specify all possible worlds.

13. It’s worth noting that indirect reference-fixing is also possible when the nature of the reference can be discovered through apriori reflection—and in such cases the difference between reference-fixing criteria and theoretical criteria will not correspond to different A- and C-intentions. Jackson and Pettit’s ‘moral functionalism’ is a case in point: the reference of moral terms is allegedly fixed by a variety of superficial properties (e.g. killing is normally wrong, people are normally motivated to do what they judge right, etc), but these properties do not constitute the ultimate theoretical characterization of the properties picked out by moral terms. The fact that you don’t realize that your term ‘morally right’ picks out a rule-utilitarian property (let’s say) may be due to a failure of apriori reflection rather than lack of empirical knowledge of your environment (Jackson 1998a, ch. 5 & 6; Jackson and Pettit 1995).

14. N.B., the rationalist is not committed to the idea that a 2D semantic framework accounts for all aspects of meaning: in particular, further aspects of meaning may be required to account for differences in content between apriori equivalent claims. See the discussion of semantic pluralism in 2.3.3 below.

15. According to a modal rationalist like Chalmers, the primary job of modal notions like possibility and necessity is to keep track of apriori consistency relations among semantic contents. To fulfill this explanatory role, the rationalist posits a “logically possible world” for every apriori conceivable way the world might be. Chalmers thinks that critics of modal rationalism should concede (i) that this notion of logical possibility is an important and useful one for keeping track of consistency among thought contents and (ii) that at least some logical possibilities represent genuine metaphysical possibilities. The debate over the truth of modal rationalism would then hinge on whether every logically possible world is also metaphysically possible. Put graphically: is the space of metaphysically possible worlds a proper subset of the space of logically possible worlds? Chalmers argues that any way of demarcating metaphysical from logical possibilities would constitute “an ad hoc proliferation of modalities” which posited a second “brute and inexplicable” modal primitive. So we should accept a single space of possibility, in which every apriori coherent hypothesis represents a genuine metaphysical possibility (1996, 136­-8; 1999, 488-91).

16. Chalmers introduces the term ‘1-intension’ as a way of talking about the various different kinds of intension that correspond to the diagonal of a 2D framework. Strictly speaking, therefore, it makes no sense to talk about the 1-intension of a particular expression without further ado, since the notion of a 1-intension is defined purely in terms of the formalism. To obtain a specific 1-intension for an expression, we need to interpret the 2D framework by specifying the possibilities relative to which extensions are assigned and explaining the principles for assigning extensions. Chalmers’ Core Thesis doesn’t appeal to any specific interpretation of the 2D formalism, instead it is intended as a constraint on how the framework should be interpreted if it is to vindicate the rationalist conception of meaning. (Similarly, Chalmers introduces the term ‘2-intension’ to pick out the first horizontal row of a 2D matrix, regardless of how exactly the 2D formalism is interpreted. In any 2D framework, the first row assigns an intension relative to the actual world considered as actual. So an expression’s 2-intension will correspond to the kind of intension posited by standard possible world semantics.)

17. Chalmers notes a further dialectical problem in appealing to contextualist 2D semantics to vindicate rationalism (2004, 2006a). In order to generate a 1-intension, a contextualist must specify which properties of an utterance are held fixed in every possible context of use. Very different contextual 1-intensions will be generated for your term ‘I’, for instance, depending on whether we require that the target utterance of ‘I’ be spelled a certain way in every context or if we instead require that it be understood a certain way by the agent of the context. A contextualist 1-intension based on spelling will not capture any interesting notion of meaning: depending on how it’s used and understood in a context, the string ‘I’ may pick out apples, Antarctica, arguments, or anything else. So if contextualist 1-intensions are to capture a kind of meaning, we will need some independent way of identifying those properties of an expression that, if held fixed, guarantee sameness of meaning. In the case of indexicals like ‘I’ this requirement is not too onerous, since there are conventional linguistic rules for identifying the extension in a context that all competent speakers readily acknowledge. But in the case of names or natural kind terms, it is highly controversial whether there are any conventional linguistic rules, except the aposteriori rules that link these expressions directly to their 2-intensions. So contextualist 2D semantics by itself does nothing to allay skepticism about the existence of rationalist meanings for expressions like names and natural kind terms.

18. Chalmers leaves the door open for weaker ways of understanding epistemic possibility. For instance, he suggests that one might define epistemic possibilities in terms of whether a sentence (or set of sentences) seems coherent after a specified amount of “cognitive work”. However, Chalmers takes the notion of ideal apriori coherence to be the most principled sense of epistemic possibility, and the one that underwrites our access to metaphysical modality (2002b).

19. Chalmers is neutral about a more substantive analysis of scenarios. He sketches three different approaches: (i) scenarios might be identified with centered possible worlds, (ii) scenarios might be identified with sets of apriori coherent sentences in an idealized language, or (iii) scenarios might be taken as epistemic primitives. As a modal rationalist, he takes these analyses to be extensionally equivalent, but he argues that the different options have important consequences for how the 2D framework is elaborated (2004, 2006a).

20. The Fregean triviality test is not exactly the same as apriori equivalence: cognitive significance marks what’s obvious to a subject at a given time, whereas apriori equivalence is often far from obvious. Mathematical identities like ‘\(12^3 = 1728\)’ are a clear case where the two notions come apart. Still, Chalmers argues that apriori equivalence is a well-behaved theoretical refinement of the Fregean notion. He also suggests that the 2D framework might capture something close to the Fregean notion of triviality if we substitute a weaker epistemic relation for ‘apriori coherence’ in defining the epistemic framework (Chalmers 2002b).

21. It’s worth noting that a 2D empiricist is not committed to the rationalist’s Core Thesis. The empiricist project is to explain how speakers manage to coordinate their reference-fixing criteria through implicit conventions. For these purposes, there is no need to insist that 1-intensions must be defined for worlds with no thought or language: we may have no interest in deciding how to apply terms in situations in which we ourselves don’t exist. It is the rationalist project of linking meaning to the space of apriori coherent scenarios that gives rise to the Core Thesis.

22. The word ‘concept’ here is not meant to imply that these matrices reflect stable semantic units of thought—it is merely meant to suggest that they reflect some aspect of the subject’s current understanding. Stalnaker rejects concepts as theoretical entities that reflect stable units of cognitive significance in thought (1984).

23. On Stalnaker’s account, to determine just which proposition is ascribed by a particular belief report, we must answer three questions. First, how should we characterize the possible worlds that define propositional concepts: which objects, kinds, or properties should we invoke in describing the different ways the world might be? Second, which possible worlds so characterized should we treat as members of the context set for the belief ascription? Third, which aspects of the attributor’s understanding should we hold constant in evaluating her report in those different worlds considered as contexts of use? These factors determine the content of the diagonal proposition attributed to the believer.

24. There is a further way in which the interests of an interpreter are taken into account on Stalnaker’s approach. Whereas a rationalist 2D theorist like Chalmers will invoke a single space of apriori possible scenarios to define 2D matrices, Stalnaker’s externalist commitments lead him to deny that we can exhaustively characterize the space of metaphysical possibility in a descriptive vocabulary that’s devoid of any empirical presuppositions. Since there is no privileged way of describing the space of possibility, the explanatory interests and presuppositions of the theorist will affect just what objects, kinds or properties she uses to individuate the possible worlds that define 2D matrices:

It might be nice if we had a neutral language with an internally grounded semantics, a language that required no factual assumptions for its interpretation and that could provide a complete description of the world, and of all possible worlds. It might be nice if there were a pure epistemic space to which we had apriori access and in terms of which we could locate our disagreements about what the actual world is like. But I don’t think these things are possible. The only way we can describe the world is to use the materials that the actual world offers us—the things, properties and relations that we find there. (Stalnaker 2004, 319)

25. Stalnaker’s initial response to proponents of finer-grained propositional structure is to insist that possible world semantics provides a minimal kind of content that all theorists should accept (1984, 1999b). Stalnaker’s context-sensitive use of the 2D framework is intended to provide a flexible framework for explaining commonsense intuitions about logical equivalence and de re thought. And self-locating aspects of thought, according to Stalnaker, should not be considered an aspect of propositional contents, but rather part of one’s epistemic relation to a propositional content (Stalnaker 2006).

Notes to Supplement

1. Chalmers argues that establishing the stability of phenomenal terms like ‘pain’ is not really essential to establishing his anti-materialist conclusion (1996, 2009). His idea is that the epistemic 1-intension for ‘pain’ itself corresponds to a property—call it ‘diagonal pain’—that does not supervene on the physical properties of the actual world. Diagonal pain \(is\) instantiated in the actual world and it is not instantiated in the scenario that, if actual, would make \((P \amp \neg Q)\) true. Given that there is a metaphysically possible world for every coherent scenario (premise 4), there will be a possible world just like ours physically but without diagonal pain. Since the actual world has a property—diagonal pain—that doesn’t supervene on the physical, it follows that materialism is false.

2. Chalmers in fact believes that phenomenal terms are stable, but he is less confident of the semantic stability of microphysical predicates like ‘is a quark’: perhaps different intrinsic properties are picked out depending on what the actual world is like. To allow for this possibility, Chalmers weakens the conclusion of his argument: either materialism is false or phenomenal properties are determined by the intrinsic nature of basic physical properties (Chalmers 2009). As Chalmers emphasizes, most materialists will reject even this weaker conclusion, since it denies that phenomenal properties can be explained by the structural and causal properties studied by the physical sciences.

3. Chalmers (2009, §5) replies that the criticism misfires because it targets the apriori coherence of an explicitly modal claim, \(\Diamond(P \amp \neg Q)\), rather than the apriori coherence of \((P \amp \neg Q)\).

Copyright © 2017 by
Laura Schroeter <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free