Supplement to Two-Dimensional Semantics

Objections to Generalized 2D Semantics

Although empiricists and rationalists invoke the 2D framework for different explanatory purposes, they agree on three important theses. First, they defend apriori conceptual truths, which play an important role in metaphysics. Second, they hold that the 2D framework captures a kind of meaning. And third, they use the 2D framework to represent a broadly internalist approach to reference determination. These positions are distinctive of generalized 2D semantics and all three are controversial.

This section will first canvas objections that have been raised against these shared commitments of G2D. Then we will turn to objections that have been raised against the rationalist and empiricist applications of the framework.

One common complaint about generalized 2D semantics is that there are no plausible extant analyses of names or natural kind terms, and the 2D framework provides no assurances that an extensionally correct analysis is possible (e.g., Block and Stalnaker 1999; Byrne and Pryor 2006; Soames 2005). Critics contend that any attempt to provide a precise definition will be subject to counterexamples: we can imagine empirical situations where the definition would fail to give the intuitively correct verdict about the extension. Insofar as this objection is based exclusively on induction from past failures, however, it is unconvincing. Generalized 2D semantics is not committed to any particular analysis, and the correct 2D analysis may be quite complex. Indeed, the 2D framework allows for “analyses” in the form of 1-intensions that cannot be finitely specified in any natural language. So 2D theorists can simply accept alleged counterexamples as contributing to the 2D analysis of a term. To challenge generalized 2D semantics, critics must appeal to broader theoretical considerations.

1. Apriority

According to G2D, 1-intensions reflect apriori conceptual truths about the application conditions of ordinary expressions. According to the Frontloading Argument (Chalmers and Jackson 2001; Chalmers 2012), we can have conclusive apriori knowledge of material conditionals of the form \((\PQTI \supset S),\) since all empirical information relevant to justifying a verdict about S is “frontloaded” into the antecedent of the conditional. So information \(E\) about one’s real-world environment plays no essential role in justifying verdicts about the conditional: either \(E\) is apriori entailed by PQTI or \(E\) is irrelevant to justifying a verdict about the conditional. So one’s justification for application conditionals is empirically indefeasible.

Some advocates of G2D have suggested that we have defeasible, rather than conclusive apriori access to application conditionals (Kipper 2012, 39–40; Biggs & Wilson 2020, 69). But as Wittmer (2013) points out, defeasible judgments will not suffice to fix the semantic facts about 1-intensions. And G2D semantics is a claim about the semantic facts.

Critics of G2D have challenged the Frontloading Argument and the apriori status of application conditionals in different ways.

Many critics insist on the aposteriori status of the initial patterns of understanding that ground the assignment of 1-intensions. Each element of your initial folk theory of water, for instance, was originally based on empirical experience and is epistemically corrigible in the light of further experience. Since your folk theory is aposteriori, critics argue, verdicts based on that theory should also count as aposteriori (e.g. Block and Stalnaker 1999; Laurence and Margolis 2003; Nimtz 2004; Byrne and Pryor 2006). A proponent of G2D might argue that a pattern of understanding acquires a new apriori status when it functions as an implicit definition – a pattern of understanding required for competence with the same meaning or concept. But critics contend this way of individuating semantic competence is implausible and begs the question against sceptics about rationally unrevisable conceptual truths (Schroeter 2006, 2014; Diaz-Leon 2011, Ebbs 2014). A different response is Chalmers’ Bayesian argument (2012), which seeks to show directly that a high conditional credence \(\cr(S \mid \PQTI)\) is rationally unrevisable, which in turn supports the apriori status of \((\PQTI \supset S).\) For criticisms of the dialectical force of this Bayesian argument, see Pickel and Schulz (2018), Topey (2018), and Heck (2018). For a formal model of how changes to the relevant conditionals could be epistemically justified on the basis of empirical evidence without violating Bayesian principles, see Pickel (2016).

A second type of challenge to the apriority of application conditionals focuses on the inferential principles involved in hypothetical reasoning. Williamson (2007, 2012), Jenkins (2008, 2012), Neta (2014), and Rupert (2016) argue that the intellectual skills involved in coming to judgments about hypothetical cases must be honed through empirical feedback if they are to justify verdicts about hypothetical cases. So purely hypothetical reasoning still depends for its justification on empirical experience, even if it is not based on any empirical premise. See Chalmers 2012, ch. 3.7 for a response. Dowell (2008) and Melnyk (2008) argue that purely hypothetical reasoning about a scenario may not reflect the verdicts one would endorse if one were actually confronted with the relevant scenario – so hypothetical reasoning is an empirically fallible guide to the facts about one’s actual dispositions. Braddon-Mitchell (2015) and Chalmers (2012: 181–84) construe such errors as a failure of ideal rationality in hypothetical reasoning. In a different vein, Ball (2014) suggests that deference to community usage affects virtually all of our representations – and as a consequence, they will not have necessary 1-intensions. Ball uses this conclusion to argue that E2D cannot explain either Fregean cognitive significance or the rationalist connection between conceivability and possibility.

A third type of challenge targets a specific class of concepts – demonstrative or recognitional concepts. Critics suggest that the applicability conditions for these concepts depend essentially on actually having certain experiences: e.g. having the experience of seeing that color, or seeing that canary, or seeing a shape that’s similar to an egg (Loar 1990, 1999; Perry 2001; Pryor 2006; Valaris 2009; Yablo 2002, 2006). Apriori reflection on a possible scenario cannot elicit the relevant experiences, nor can it establish that you would have the relevant experiences if actually confronted with the scenario in question. These critics conclude that apriori reflection alone cannot justify verdicts about the applicability of this type of concept. For a response to these sorts of objections, see Chalmers (2002a; 2012: 139–148; 2014).

A final type of objection seeks to show that generalized 2D semantics over-generates apriori truths. For instance, Speaks (2010; 2014) argues that generalized 2D semantics is committed to the apriority of contingent facts about the existence of individuals – a result that conflicts with commonsense intuitions about what’s knowable apriori. See Elliott, McQueen, and Weber (2013) for a reply. And Williamson (2006; 2007) argues that there are no conclusively justifiable conceptual truths, even in the case of conventional kinds like ‘vixen’ or logical vocabulary like ‘all’. See Boghossian (2011) for a reply.

2. Semantic status

In order to count as a kind of meaning or conceptual content 1-intensions must be well-defined and they must figure in a plausible compositional semantics. In addition, the semantic assignments should reflect commitments about the subject matter picked out. A further desideratum is that they reflect commitments about stable meanings and semantic coordination over time and between individuals. Critics have raised worries about all of these roles.

Whether 1-intensions are well-defined depends on both there being semantically stable descriptions of scenarios and stable ways of evaluating the truth of sentences relative to those descriptions. Externalist critics challenge the idea of stable descriptive language for base-level properties like \(P\) and \(Q\) in a PQTI-sentence (e.g. Stalnaker 2008, Schroeter 2004). And Justin Tiehen (2014) raises an important worry about defining the ‘That’s all’ clause in a PQTI-sentence.

Another important worry is that G2D cannot provide an adequate compositional semantics. Graeme Forbes (2011) raises a group of puzzle cases for 2D semantics involving the interaction of factive operators like ‘someone establishes that’, with espistemic and metaphysical operators like ‘it’s apriori that’ and ’it’s necessary that’. Forbes sees this as a challenge to any two-factor theory of meaning. See also Soames (2005), Marconi (2005), and Bealer (2002). In response to Forbes’ puzzles, Chalmers and Rabern (2014) argue that the source of the tension is not the 2D semantic machinery, but rather commonsense commitments about apriority, necessity and contingent apriori truths. So any semantic theory will face similar difficulties in reconciling these commitments. See Fritz (2013), Johannesson and Packalén (2016) and Kipper (2017) for alternative semantic accounts of the puzzle cases that are compatible with generalized 2D semantics. More recently, Sbardolini (2019) argues that 1-intentions cannot be coherently negated – a problem that he takes to challenge any two-dimensionalist account of meaning.

Some critics argue that 1-intensions misrepresent the intuitive subject matter of language and thought. The worry is that generalized 2D semantics entails that one cannot speak or think directly about individuals or natural kinds (Byrne 2001; Perry 2001, ch. 8; Soames 2005, ch. 10; 2006a; Stalnaker 2004). In response, proponents of G2D argue that the second aspect of meaning, the 2-intension, fully explains these intuitions about the subject matter.

A different type of objection focuses on semantic competence conditions. These critics argue that the1-intensions generated for names and natural kind terms will be too sensitive to idiosyncrasies in a subject’s current understanding to be stable through reasonable changes in belief or shareable by different members of a linguistic community (e.g., Block and Stalnaker 1999; Kroon 2004a; Schroeter 2003; Soames 2005; Stalnaker 2004; Yablo 2000b). Whether this is a telling objection depends on larger issues about the explanatory role of meanings—in particular, to what extent meanings must be stable through disagreement and theory change. The 2D account can vindicate some stability, but it will not be able to vindicate all commonsense epistemic intuitions about sameness of meaning. For a response to such worries, see Chalmers (2012: ch. 5, 9th excursus).

3. Internalism

Proponents of G2D aim to vindicate an internalist approach to assigning semantic content to an individual’s expressions. Both the empiricist and the rationalist versions of G2D assign 1-intensions to words in such a way as to reflect individual speakers’ current rational dispositions: 1-intensions are therefore fully determined by the speaker’s current internal states. In contrast, semantic externalists hold that the aspects of meaning that 1-intensions are intended to explain—reference determination and competence conditions—depend in part on the subject’s relation to external facts, and so cannot be fully determined by the subject’s internal states at a given time.

Internalism is a deep methodological point of contention that separates proponents of G2D from many of their critics (e.g., Soames 2005; Stalnaker 2004). Adjudicating this disagreement raises difficult issues about the explanatory role of semantic theories and how that role is best fulfilled. Both the empiricist and rationalist projects privilege individualistic dispositions as explanatorily central. The empiricist hopes to explain communication in terms of matching patterns of individual understanding, while the rationalist seeks to connect individuals’ apriori judgments to what’s objectively possible. An internalist approach to intentionality is built into both of these projects (Chalmers and Jackson 2001; Gertler 2002; Braddon-Mitchell 2004). In contrast, semantic externalists tend to emphasize different explanatory projects: e.g. situating individuals with respect to objective features of their environment, explaining semantic coordination despite divergent beliefs, and vindicating the holistic, falliblist, and open-ended character of empirical inquiry. These explanatory projects highlight individuals’ relation to aspects of their real-world environment and their fallibility about those relations, and thus naturally suggest an externalist approach to intentionality. Just which explanatory projects are most central to intentionality and how the relevant phenomena are best explained are both hotly contested issues. [See the entries on externalism about mental content and narrow mental content.]

4. The rationalist project

Two distinctive aspects of the rationalist project are (1) its commitment to the modal rationalist thesis that we have apriori access to the space of metaphysical possibility and (2) its commitment to an apriori aspect of meaning that can be captured with the 2D modal framework. Both aspects of the rationalist project have been challenged by critics.

4.1 Modal rationalism

According to the modal rationalist, if a hypothesis cannot be ruled out by idealized apriori reflection then it’s metaphysically possible for it to be true. So the space of apriori coherent scenarios is a failsafe guide to the space of metaphysical possibility. This thesis is crucial if one hopes to draw metaphysical conclusions on the basis of apriori conceptual analysis (e.g., the 2D argument against materialism). Critics have challenged the extensional adequacy of modal rationalism on the basis of putative counterexamples. The thesis is also open to more general theoretical challenges.

Certain examples suggest that a hypothesis can be apriori coherent even though it’s metaphysically impossible for it to be true. Sometimes a claim and its negation both seem apriori coherent. For instance, it seems apriori coherent that there could be a necessarily existing god and that there could be no such god—but obviously it’s impossible for both of these claims to be true. This suggests that apriori coherence is a fallible guide to genuine possibility (Yablo 1999, 2000b Schroeter 2004). Other examples of this sort include unprovable mathematical necessities and metaphysically necessary laws of nature. Chalmers (1999; 2002a) argues that all such alleged counterexamples fail: either they are not apriori coherent (e.g., necessarily existing beings) or they are not necessary (e.g., necessary laws of nature). A different type of counterexample turns on concepts whose applicability is determined by a subject’s ostensive or recognitional capacities in the actual world (Hill and McLaughlin 1999; Loar 1999; Perry 2001; Yablo 2002). For instance, we may recognize ovals by the way they would visually strike us. Since the applicability of such concepts depends on the actual exercise of these psychological capacities (whose nature we don’t fully understand), it’s impossible to know apriori whether a certain equation in analytic geometry captures the shape of ovals. To know this, one must actually see the shapes generated by the equation (Yablo 2002, §13–19; 2006). In response, Chalmers (2002a, §12) argues that the alleged counterexamples can be accommodated within his 2D framework.

The underlying rationalist claim that objective metaphysical possibility is constitutively bound up with ideal rationality is controversial. Modal conventionalists seek to explain the access to modal facts by denying their objective status: facts about what’s possible are mere projections of our implicit semantic rules or psychological dispositions (e.g., Kant 1787; Carnap 1950; Sidelle 1989). Modal empiricists, in contrast, insist on the judgment-independent nature of metaphysical facts and deny that we have apriori access to them: our access to the nature of empirical objects, kinds, and properties is always based on and corrigible by experience (e.g., Putnam 1975; Stalnaker 2003; Williamson 2007; Yablo 2000). In contrast, the modal rationalist seeks to vindicate the objectivity of modal facts by appealing to idealized apriori reasoning (Descartes 1641; Chalmers 2002a). [See the entry on the epistemology of modality.]

4.2 The Core Thesis

Even if one rejects modal rationalism, the semantic rationalist insists that epistemic 2D semantics may capture an important aspect of meaning that connects meaning, apriority, and the space of epistemic possibility. A crucial criterion of adequacy for this project is to provide a way of interpreting the 2D framework that satisfies the rationalist’s Core Thesis:

Core Thesis: For any \(S\), \(S\) is apriori iff its epistemic intension is necessary.

Some critics have sought to show that epistemic 2D semantics cannot satisfy this constraint. The problem is that epistemic intensions are assigned on the basis of the speaker’s commonsense standards for evaluating the apriori coherence of combining the target sentence with a description of a scenario. But commonsense standards may presuppose that the speaker, her words, or her thoughts exist within the hypothetical scenario. If so, the epistemic approach will run into similar problems to those that plagued the contextualist approach: the necessity of the epistemic intension will not line up with genuine epistemic or metaphysical necessity.[28] This sort of objection has been pressed in different ways by Yablo (2002), Schroeter (2005l 2014), and Speaks (2010). Chalmers (2002a, 169–71) responds to Yablo. For a continuation of this debate, see (Elliott, McQueen, and Weber 2013; Schroeter 2013; Speaks 2014; Stillman 2015).

5. The empiricist project

Criticisms of the empiricist use of 2D semantics to explain linguistic coordination can be divided into two broad categories: (i) criticisms that target the account of linguistic conventions, and (ii) criticisms that target the account of individuals’ linguistic understanding.

The empiricist account of linguistic conventions has elicited the most criticism. On this account, A-intensions capture the content of tacit linguistic conventions of the sort outlined by Lewis (1969). If this is right, then the reference-fixing conditions for words like ‘knowledge’, ‘water’, or ‘Barack Obama’ must meet two strong empirical constraints:

  1. All (or almost all) speakers in a community must associate the very same reference-fixing condition with the term.
  2. This convergence must be mutually obvious to all (or almost all) speakers.

Both assumptions have been challenged. On the first point: Most philosophers acknowledge that competent English speakers can have entirely different criteria for identifying the reference of a proper name like ‘Barack Obama’ and many acknowledge significant variability in competent speakers’ initial understanding of natural kind terms like ‘water’: we don’t need to share precisely the same “folk theory” of Obama or of water in order to be linguistically competent with those terms (e.g., Burge 1979; Kripke 1980; Quine 1951a). To back up this intuitive point, experimental philosophers have marshalled survey data to argue that English speakers from different ethnic or socio-economic backgrounds classify hypothetical cases, such as Gettier cases or Twin Earth cases, differently. [See the entry on experimental philosophy]. In response to such worries, Jackson acknowledges that different speakers’ criteria for applying a term may not be perfectly matched, but he argues that there must be significant overall similarity in reference-fixing criteria for everyday practical coordination. Empiricist 2D semantics is meant to explain this imperfect similarity (1998b, 214–5). See also Lewis (1997), who posits higher-order similarities among speakers’ reference-fixing commitments. On the second point: critics (Kroon 2004a; Schroeter 2003) challenge 2D empiricist’s assumption of common knowledge of reference-fixing conditions, arguing that speakers are not in a position to know the range of variation and similarity in speakers’ understanding of a term within their linguistic community. If this is right, then tacit linguistic conventions cannot get off the ground: if speakers don’t know what the standard linguistic practices are, they cannot be expected to conform to those standards. In response, an empiricist may claim that communal standards will inevitably involve some indeterminacy.

The second distinctive aspect of the empiricist account of meaning is the idea that individual speakers have implicit knowledge of reference-fixing conditions. This model of linguistic understanding can be challenged in two different ways. First, there is the psychological claim that competent speakers have something like an internal reference-fixing template—a stable set of criteria for identifying the reference that guides the application of the term both in everyday use and in hypothetical reasoning. Some critics argue that individuals’ judgments about cases are more plausibly explained without positing any such stable template (Schroeter 2006; Schroeter and Bigelow 2009). Second, there is the semantic claim that a speaker’s everyday criteria determine the real reference of her words. The semantic claim is challenged by theorists working in a broadly Quinean tradition. Such critics argue that the reference of someone’s word is determined not by the speaker’s settled dispositions to apply a word to cases, but by how these criteria should be refined in light of empirical facts about the speaker’s environment so as to meet broader theoretical and practical interests associated with the speaker’s use of the word (Block and Stalnaker 1999; Schroeter 2003; Williamson 2007; Yablo 2000a, 2000b). While 2D empiricists can acknowledge that refinements of the subject’s current conception are important, they will insist that refinements that depart from naïve understanding (such as a compatibilist conception of free will) constitute a change of meaning. The 2D empiricist thus advocates the sort of position articulated by Carnap (1950), while critics champion views closer to those of Quine (1951a, 1951b) or Putnam (1974).

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