Understanding is a protean concept in philosophy, and the desire for understanding is pervasive in everyday life. Scientists take it as their goal to understand the world and how it works, teachers and parents hope to transmit understanding to their students and children, and from a political and social point of view we often strive for mutual understanding.
This entry will look at some ways in which understanding has been conceptualized by philosophers—especially epistemologists, philosophers of science, and philosophers of social science. The focus will be on accounts of understanding the natural world and other people, and it will only touch occasionally on accounts of what it takes to understand other items, such as concepts, languages, or texts.
- 1. Contexts
- 2. Theoretical Frameworks
- 3. Special Issues in Epistemology
- 4. Special Issues in the Philosophy of Science
- 5. Humanistic Understanding
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The concept of understanding has been sometimes prominent, sometimes neglected, and sometimes viewed with suspicion, across a number of different areas of philosophy (for a partial overview, see Zagzebski 2001). This section traces some of that background, beginning with the place of understanding in Ancient Greek philosophy. It then considers how the topic of understanding was lost and then “recovered” in contemporary discussions in epistemology and the philosophy of science.
1.1 Ancient Philosophy
The ancient Greek word episteme is at the root of our contemporary word “epistemology”, and among philosophers it has been common to translate episteme simply as “knowledge” (see, e.g., Parry 2003 ).
For the last several decades, however, a case has been made that “understanding” is a better translation of episteme. (For early influential arguments see, e.g., Moravscik 1979; Burnyeat 1980, 1981; Annas 1981.) To appreciate why, note that knowledge, as now commonly conceived, can apparently be quite easy to get. Thus it seems I can know a proposition such as that it is raining outside just by opening my eyes. It also seems that items of knowledge can be in principle isolated or atomistic. I can therefore apparently know that it is raining while knowing very little about other things, such as why it is raining, or what constitutes rain, or when it will stop.
Understanding seems to be different than knowledge in both respects. For one thing, understanding typically seems harder to acquire, and more of an epistemic accomplishment, than knowledge (Pritchard 2010). For another, the objects of understanding seem more structured and interconnected (Zagzebski 2019). Thus the subject matters we try to understand are often highly complex (quantum mechanics, the U.S. Civil War), and even when we try to understand isolated events (such as the spilling of my coffee cup), we typically do so by drawing connections with other events (such as the jostling of the table by my knee).
With contrasts such as these in mind, it has seemed to several scholars of Ancient philosophy that episteme has more in common with what we would now call “understanding” than what we would now call “knowledge”. Thus Julia Annas notes that, for Plato, the person with episteme has a systematic understanding of things, and is not a mere possessor of various truths (Annas 1981: ch. 10). Jonathan Lear similarly claims that for Aristotle,
To have episteme one must not only know a thing, one must also grasp its cause or explanation. This is to understand it: to know in a deep sense what it is and how it has come to be. (Lear 1988: 6)
Granted, what Greek philosophers had in mind by episteme often does not fully align with our contemporary ideas about understanding, because in the hands of philosophers such as Plato and Aristotle episteme is an exceptionally high-grade epistemic accomplishment. For Plato, full episteme seems to require a grasp of the basic elements of reality—in its most complete form, a grasp that traces back to the Form of the Good itself (Schwab 2016, 2020; Moss 2020). For Aristotle, it seems to require an appreciation of the deductive relationships that allegedly hold between natures or first principles and observable phenomena (Burnyeat 1981). In our contemporary use, by contrast, we often happily ascribe understanding to quite low-grade cases, where forms or first principles do not seem to be grasped or even relevant—as when we take ourselves to understand why the coffee cup spilled. Still, with its stress on systematicity and interconnectedness, episteme plausibly has more in common with our contemporary concept understanding than our contemporary concept knowledge.
If an understanding-like state was of fundamental epistemic importance to the Greeks, it is interesting to ask why the focus of epistemology shifted over time, and why an interest in knowledge, especially propositional knowledge, came to predominate—including and maybe especially quite isolated bits of propositional knowledge, such as that I am sitting in front of a fire, or that I have two hands.
Perhaps the shift occurred in response to the rise of scepticism in Hellenistic philosophy (Burnyeat 1980: 188; cf. Zagzebski 2001: 236). Or perhaps the modern focus on propositional knowledge was a response to the wars of religion in sixteenth and seventeenth century Europe, where it became increasingly important to distinguish good knowledge claims from bad, even with respect to quite isolated claims. (For more on the modern rise of interest in propositional knowledge, see Pasnau 2010; 2017.) Regardless of why the shift occurred, a desire to grasp “how things hang together” undoubtedly remained a part of the human condition. It is therefore unsurprising that a move to revive understanding as a topic of philosophical inquiry eventually emerged.
1.2 Epistemology & Philosophy of Science
Although understanding as an epistemic good was largely neglected by modern epistemologists in favor of theorizing about knowledge (or related epistemic properties, such as justification and rationality), it reappeared as a central object of concern at the end of the twentieth century, for a few different reasons.
Catherine Elgin, for one, influentially argued that we cannot make sense of some of our greatest intellectual accomplishments, especially the accomplishments we associate with science and art, without appreciating the way they are often oriented not towards knowledge, but rather understanding (see especially Elgin 1991, 1996). From the perspective of virtue epistemology, Linda Zagzebski claimed that if we think of an intellectual virtue as an “excellence of the mind”, attuned to a variety of epistemic goods, then there is something one-sided about focusing attention only on the good of knowledge, while neglecting other highly prized goods such as understanding and wisdom (see especially Zagzebski 1996: 43–50; 2001). Finally, Jonathan Kvanvig forcefully argued that while understanding is distinctively valuable from an epistemic point of view—i.e., more valuable than any of its proper parts, such as truth, or justification, or a combination of the two—knowledge is not (Kvanvig 2003). For all these thinkers, the spotlight of concern within epistemology needed to be broadened so that goods such as understanding could be given their proper due, and their claims resonated with other epistemologists (for overviews, see Gordon 2017; Hannon forthcoming).
While the notion of understanding was often simply neglected in epistemology, in the philosophy of science it was for many years actively downplayed. A primary figure in this dynamic was Carl Hempel (see especially Hempel 1965). Although Hempel helped bring the notion of explanation back into respectability in the philosophy of science, he had significant reservations about tying explanation too closely to the notion of understanding.
Part of this seemed to stem from the fact that the idea of understanding that prevailed in his day was highly subjective and psychological—it emphasized more a subjective “sense” of understanding, often tied to a felt sense of familiarity. As Hempel notes, however, poor explanations might excel along this dimension because they might
give the questioner a sense of having attained some understanding; they may resolve his perplexity and in this sense “answer” his question.
“But”, he continues,
however satisfactory these answers may be psychologically, they are not adequate for the purposes of science, which, after all, is concerned to develop a conception of the world that has a clear, logical bearing on our experience and is thus capable of objective test. (Hempel 1966: 47–48)
The goodness of an explanation therefore seems to have little obvious connection to whether it manages to generate understanding in a particular audience. A good explanation might do that. But then again, it might not. Patently poor explanations are also able to generate a rich “sense” of understanding in some audiences (think of conspiracy theorists), despite their shortcomings.
Philosophers such as Michael Friedman responded to Hempel’s concerns by noting that simply because there seems to be a psychological element to understanding it does not follow that understanding is merely subjective or up for grabs (Friedman 1974). After all, knowledge has a psychological element, in light of the belief condition, but few hold that knowledge is merely subjective or up for grabs. Others, such as Jaegwon Kim, argued that leaving considerations about understanding out of accounts of explanation was deeply mistaken (Kim 1994 ). After all, Kim claimed, we desire to explain things because we want to understand them.
Despite the efforts of Friedman, Kim, and others, significant reservations about the notion of understanding continued to linger in the philosophy of science (see, for example, Trout 2002). A notable shift occurred with Henk de Regt’s distinction between the “feeling” or phenomenology of understanding and genuine understanding (de Regt 2004, 2009: ch. 1; cf. de Regt and Dieks 2005). In particular, he argued that the feeling is neither necessary nor sufficient for genuine understanding. De Regt’s important distinction helped pave the way for a new surge of work on the topic over the last two decades, and helped philosophers move beyond thinking of understanding mainly in terms of felt “aha!” or “eureka!” experiences.
2. Theoretical Frameworks
As we look to particular accounts of understanding, it will help to consider in turn:
- understanding’s distinctive object (or objects),
- its distinctive psychology, and
- the distinctive sort of normative relationship that needs to hold between the psychology of the person who understands and the object of his or her understanding.
By way of comparison, consider the traditional “justified true belief” analysis of knowledge. On this view, knowledge involves a distinctive object (roughly, the truth, or a true proposition), a distinctive psychology (the psychological act of belief or assent), and a distinctive normative relationship that needs to hold between the psychology of the believer and the thing believed (namely, that one’s belief in the true proposition needs to be justified, in some sense).
What can be said, in a parallel way, about the elements of understanding?
2.1 Objects of Understanding
At least at first glance, the objects of understanding appear to be so varied that it is not obvious where one might find a common thread. Thus, we can understand fields of study, particular states of affairs, institutions, other people, and on and on (cf. Elgin 1996: 123).
In line with the discussion in Ancient philosophy, and setting aside for the moment special issues related to understanding other people (see Section 5), let us start with the generic view that the objects of understanding are something like “connections” or “relations”. Following a distinction from Kim (1994 ), we can contrast two ways of thinking about these connections and relations—i.e., these plausible objects of understanding.
According to explanatory internalism, the connections or explanatory relations one grasps are “logico-linguistic” relations that hold among a person’s beliefs or attitudes, or more exactly the contents of those beliefs or attitudes (Kim 1994 ). What we grasp or see, when we understand some phenomenon, are how these various contents are logically or semantically related to one another.
Kim argues that Hempel is a paradigm example of an explanatory internalist (Kim 1994 ; cf. 1999 ). For instance, suppose that one wants to explain and hence understand why a particular bar of metal began to rust (McCain 2016: ch. 9). A good Hempelian explanation would be one in which a sentence describing the rusting follows inferentially from (a) a statement of the initial conditions (the moisture in the air, the constitution of the bar) and (b) a further law-like statement connecting the moisture, the constitution of the bar, and the onset of rust.
This Hempelian framework seems internalist because what you see or grasp, when you understand the phenomenon, are connections among the propositions you accept—more exactly, you see or grasp different inferential or probabilistic connections among the contents of your beliefs that bear on the rusting. As Kim puts it:
the basic relation that generates an explanatory relation is a logico-linguistic one that connects descriptions of events, and the job of formulating an explanation consists, it seems, in merely re-arranging appropriate items in the body of propositions that constitute our total knowledge at a time. In explaining something, then, all action takes place within the epistemic system, on the subjective side of the divide between knowledge and the reality known, or between representation and the world represented. (Kim 1994 [2010: 171–172])
An explanatory externalist by comparison holds that the basic connections or relationship one grasps, when one understands, are not logico-linguistic but metaphysical. What you grasp, when you understand why the metal began to rust, are not primarily relationships among your beliefs or their contents. Rather, you primarily grasp real, mind-independent relationships that obtain in the world.
Theorists who hold that the objects of understanding are internal—i.e., logico-linguistic relations, the grasp of which yields understanding—vary somewhat about which relations count. Although it seems clear in Hempel that the objects are inferential relationships of deductive and inductive support, epistemologists often appeal in a general way to relations of coherence. Thus Carter and Gordon write:
We think it is clear that objectual understanding—for example, as one attains when one grasps the relevant coherence-making relations between propositions comprising some subject matter—is a particularly valuable epistemic good… Understanding wider subject matters will tend to be more cognitively demanding than understanding narrow subject matters because more propositions must be believed and their relations grasped. (Carter & Gordon 2014: 7–8)
Kvanvig likewise points to the importance of coherence:
Central to the notion of understanding are various coherence-like elements: to have understanding is to grasp explanatory and conceptual connections between various pieces of information involved in the subject matter in question. Such language involves a subjective element (the grasping or seeing of the connections in question) and a more objective, epistemic element. The more objective, epistemic element is precisely the kind of element identified by coherentists as central to the notion of epistemic justification or rationality, as clarified, in particular, by Lehrer (1974), BonJour (1985) and Lycan (1988). (Kvanvig 2018: 699)
Other epistemologists similarly point to coherence relations as the objects of understanding (e.g., Riggs 2003: 192). Since “coherence” is presumably a relation that holds among the contents of beliefs, and not among items out there in the world, these views would qualify as internalist accounts of the objects of understanding, according to the Kimean framework. (For further examples and criticism, see Khalifa 2017a.)
For externalists about the object of understanding, especially concerning phenomena “out there in the world”, the proposed objects vary. For instance, there is some support for the idea that the objects are nomic relations, or relationships according to which individual events and other phenomena are explained by laws, and upper-level laws are explained by lower-level or more fundamental laws (Railton 1978). Another view is that the objects are causal relations (Salmon 1984; Lipton 1991 ), or more generally dependence relations (Kim 1974, 1994; Grimm 2014, 2017; Greco 2014; Dellsén 2020), where causation is usually taken to be just one species of dependence.
A variation on the “dependence relationships” idea is that the objects of understanding are “possibility spaces” (cf. le Bihan 2017). Indeed, on the plausible assumption that dependence is an essentially modal notion—that is, fundamentally tied to ideas of possibility and necessity—dependence relations ineliminably give rise to or generate possibility spaces. This is in keeping with a suggestion by Robert Nozick that
explanation locates something in actuality, showing its actual connections with other things, while understanding locates it in a network of possibility, showing the connections it would have to other nonactual things or processes. (Nozick 1981: 12; cf. Grimm 2008)
Note that the distinction between internal and external explanation relations is related to, but cross-cuts, another influential distinction by Wesley Salmon, between ontic and epistemic accounts of explanation (Salmon 1989; for discussion see Bechtel & Abrahamsen 2005 and Craver 2014). Salmon’s distinction has come in for criticism (see, e.g., Illari 2013; Bokulich 2016, 2018), because among other things it is not clear why epistemic accounts should not be ontic or world-involving; knowledge is an epistemic concept, after all, but it is ontic or world-involving in virtue of the truth condition. The distinction between explanatory internalism and externalism plausibly avoids this concern.
Suppose in any case that the objects of understanding—the connections or relations we grasp when we understand—are out there in the world, and are not simply logico-linguistic items or elements of our psychology. According to a further important distinction from John Greco (2014), it does not follow that these logico-linguistic/psychological items—or more generally these mental representations—do not play a crucial role in our coming to understand, because the representations typically play the role of vehicles of understanding, even if they are not themselves understanding’s object. More generally, Greco notes, it is important to distinguish between the object of understanding vs. the vehicle of understanding, i.e., “between the thing understood and its representation” (Greco 2014: 293).
Thus consider that a good map—say, of Midtown Manhattan—is typically a vehicle of understanding rather than an object of understanding. When it is accurate, it allows the mind to grasp how the streets and landmarks of Midtown are laid out, and to appreciate the relationships they bear to one another. Or again, typically when you take a look at your car’s gas gauge and form the belief that the tank is half empty, the gauge is the vehicle by which you form your belief about the gas, but it is not the object of your belief (see Dretske 1981). Assuming that the gauge is functioning properly, the object of your belief is the gas itself, while the gauge is simply the vehicle that represents the state of the gas to you.
(Of course, either the map or the gauge could become an object of understanding—one could think about how the streets and landmarks are represented, e.g., the different colors or shapes or fonts the map uses to represent Midtown, or the length of the gauge—but this would be to “involve a representation of a representation” (Greco 2014: 293). And while the mind is capable of such an act, it represents an element of abstraction, and plausibly a departure from our usual way of engaging with the world.)
This distinction between objects and vehicles of understanding leaves open the possibility that mental representations might not be the only vehicles of understanding, or the only way of latching on to real relations in the world. Perhaps a person might come to understand the world by first manually manipulating it, thus noting the possibilities that it affords and how its different elements are connected (cf. Lipton 2009; Kuorikoski and Ylikoski 2015). This would be a way to “directly” grasp causal structure, a structure that could then—cognitively downstream, as it were—be represented by the mind, perhaps in the form of mental maps, or “dependence maps” (see Section 2.2).
Appreciating the contrast between vehicle of understanding and object of understanding helps to reveal that in addition to pure internalist views about the object of understanding (where the objects of understanding are logico-linguistic relations), and pure externalist views (where the objects are worldly), there are also possible hybrid views.
For instance, on the sort of view we find in Michael Strevens’s Depth (2008), what we grasp in the first instance are relations that hold among the contents of our beliefs: relations of deductive entailment or coherence or probabilistic support. This view is not simply internalist, however, because grasping these logico-linguistic relationships, and in particular the relationships of deductive entailment, “mirror” the real relationships that obtain in the world, and thus provide a vehicle for apprehending those relationships (Strevens 2008: 72). Thus Strevens holds that his theory is able to:
show how a deductive argument, or similar formal structure, can represent causal influence…. When a deductive argument is of the right sort to represent a causal process that has as a consequence the state of affairs asserted to hold by the argument’s conclusion, I say that the argument causally entails the conclusion. A derivation that causally entails its conclusion, then, is one that can be used to represent (whether truly or not) a causal process that has the concluding state of affairs as its consequence. (Strevens 2012: 449)
On this view, by grasping or appreciating the necessitating force of an entailment relation one thereby grasps or appreciates the necessitating force of a causal relation—or, at least, something importantly like it.
According to another hybrid approach, the internal logical or probabilistic relationships do not mirror the relationships out there in the world, but rather provide evidence for the existence of relationships out there in the world. Thus some hold that when things go well an appreciation or grasp of the probabilistic connections among the various things we believe allows us to infer the existence of real causal connections in the world (see Spirtes, Glymour, & Scheines 1993; Pearl 2000 ). As Wesley Salmon characterizes an earlier version of this idea,
The explanatory significance of statistical relations is indirect. Their fundamental import lies in the fact… that they constitute evidence for causal relations. (Salmon 1984: 192)
Bearing in mind earlier distinctions, these would be accounts on which one’s appreciation of statistical relations is the vehicle through which one grasps real (external) causal relations in the world.
2.2 Psychology of Understanding
With respect to the psychology of understanding, recall that the psychological element of propositional knowledge is typically construed in terms of belief, where belief is taken to be a kind of assent or saying “Yes” to the content of the proposition. Thus to believe that the sky is blue is to assent to the proposition that the sky is blue; it is “taking it to be true” that the sky is blue.
When we turn to understanding, by contrast, some have claimed that a new suite of cognitive abilities comes onto the scene, abilities that we did not find in ordinary cases of propositional knowledge. In particular, some philosophers claim that the kind of mental action verbs that naturally come to the fore when we think about understanding—“grasping” and “seeing”, for example—evoke mental abilities “beyond belief”, i.e., beyond simple assent or taking-to-be-true (for an overview, see Baumberger, Beisbart, & Brun 2017).
For instance, Elgin, de Regt, and Wilkenfeld argue that those who grasp how things are connected are able to cognitively “do” things that others cannot—they can apply their understanding to new cases, for example, and draw new inferences. (See, for example, Elgin 1996: 122–24; de Regt 2004, 2017; Wilkenfeld 2013). Thus car mechanics who understand how engines work are able to make sense of engines that they have not encountered before, and to anticipate how changes in one part of the engine will typically lead (or fail to lead) to changes in other parts.
Grimm claims that the distinctive nature of these abilities flows from the distinctive nature of the objects of understanding (Grimm 2017). Suppose that the connections or relations one grasps are complex enough to constitute what we might call “structures”—structures with parts that depend upon one another in various ways. Arguably, for the mind to take up these structures in the right way, it is not enough simply to assent to their existence. Rather, one needs to appreciate how the structure “works”, or how changes in its various parts will lead, or fail to lead, to changes in other parts.
For instance, suppose the structures to be grasped are represented by “causal maps” or “dependence maps”—maps with nodes representing variables that can take on different values and thus represent directions of dependence (Gopnik & Glymour 2002; Gopnik et al. 2004). In the schematic image below, from Gopnik et al. (2004), the map represents a system in which changes to the value of Z bring about changes to the value of S, changes to the value of S bring about changes to the values of X and R, and so on.
According to Grimm (2017), a striking feature of these maps is that they are, as it were, “mobile” maps. That is, they are cognitive representations that by their very nature can adapt and change as the variables represented by the map take on different values. Put another way, they are “unsaturated” maps, in the sense that they are characterized in terms of unsaturated variables that can become saturated by taking on different values. What this means in terms of cognitive uptake is important, Grimm argues, because if the maps are mobile or unsaturated in this way, then the mind that aptly takes them up must itself be mobile. In particular, the mind that takes up causal maps in a way that yields understanding must be able to anticipate how varying or adjusting the value of one of the variables will lead (or fail to lead) to changes in the values of the other variables (cf. Woodward 2003).
Relatedly, Alison Hills characterizes the distinctive psychological abilities that undergird understanding in terms of “cognitive control” (Hills 2016). For example, Hills claims that in order to understand why it is right to give money to charity, it is not enough to simply believe the proposition that it is right to give money to charity because we owe assistance to the very needy (Hills 2016: 669), because I could accept a “because” claim along these lines on the basis of testimony while having only a very dim sense of how the two ingredient claims (that it is right to give money and we owe assistance to the very needy) are related. What is needed in addition is an appreciation of the relationship between these two claims. And what this involves, according to the cognitive control view, is an ability to “manipulate” the things standing in relationship: for example, to be able to make a variety of inferences in light of the relationship (Hills 2016: 663).
Although the views we have considered so far agree in thinking that there is “something special” from a psychological point of view about understanding, other accounts claim that there is nothing particularly special about understanding’s psychological profile. More exactly, it is said that understanding does not appeal to any special abilities or capacities that we do not find in ordinary cases of knowledge.
Emily Sullivan, for instance, claims that even if we grant that understanding involves abilities, it does not follow that there is something special about understanding from a psychological point of view, because ordinary propositional knowledge itself requires abilities (Sullivan 2018). Thus I can apparently only know that the traffic light is red, in the actual world, if I would have gotten the color right in close possible worlds as well. More generally, knowing seems to require the ability to track the truth about the world, so that when the world changes, my cognitive attitude about the world changes with it. But this ability to be responsive to changing conditions is not obviously anything exotic, and it does seem to entail that the object of the mind is not a proposition (that the traffic light is red seems like a paradigm example of a proposition, after all).
Along the same lines, Kareem Khalifa claims that abilities are involved in understanding, but holds that they are “especially unspecial” (Khalifa 2017b: 56). For Khalifa, the modal character of abilities is evident in normal scientific practice, because as scientists evaluate explanations on the basis of testing they naturally rule out inadequate explanations and gravitate towards well-supported ones. But evaluating and testing hypotheses in this way does not appear to require anything exotic or special from a psychological point of view, or to entail that the object of understanding is not propositional.
Finally, psychologists themselves have increasingly focused on characterizing the cognitive profile of understanding. Thus Tania Lombrozo and colleagues have explored the question of why we seek understanding, and how activities such as offering explanations aid in the acquisition and retention of understanding (Lombrozo, 2012; Williams & Lombrozo, 2010, 2013; Lombrozo & Wilkenfeld 2019). Psychologists have also explored the empirical question of how good (or bad) we are at identifying real relationships and dependencies in the world. According to Frank Keil, for example, we are not good at this at all, and we frequently fall prey to illusions of understanding (Keil 2006; cf. Ylikoski 2009). For instance, we often think we understand how a helicopter achieves lift, or how moving the pedals on a bicycle help to propel the bike forward. But in both cases, we are often well wide of the mark (Keil 2006; cf. Grimm 2009; Sloman & Fernbach 2017).
2.3 Normativity of Understanding
Suppose you accurately grasp that your house burned down because of faulty wiring. You do not think it burned down because of a lightning strike, or a stray cigarette. Faulty wiring was the cause, and you accurately grasp it as the cause (see Pritchard 2009, 2010 for more details on a case like this).
Is that all there is to understanding why your house burned down? Or does it also matter, for example, how one comes to grasp this relationship? These questions push us to ask about the normative dimension of understanding, and in particular to ask: Are there better and worse ways to come by one’s grasp, and does this matter for the acquisition of understanding? For example, are careful experiments or good evidence needed? Or can one come by one’s grasp more or less by luck, and yet still in a way that generates understanding?
A parallel question with respect to knowledge would ask: Supposing you have a true belief, is that all there is to knowledge? And here most would say “no”. In addition to the true belief, how you came by that true belief is also important. Is it based on good evidence, or a reliable process, or a well-functioning design plan? When it comes to knowledge, these further normative questions clearly matter. It is therefore not surprising that the same sorts of questions have been asked with respect to understanding.
While some argue that the normative profile of understanding is essentially the same as the normative profile of knowledge (Grimm 2006; Khalifa 2013, 2017b; Greco 2014), others claim that they differ in important ways, and especially with respect to the way in which understanding, but not knowledge, seems compatible with luck. Among theorists who see a difference between knowledge and understanding here, we can distinguish those who claim that understanding can be fully externally lucky from those who think it can only be partly externally lucky.
A leading advocate of the fully externally lucky view is Jonathan Kvanvig, who argues that how one comes by one’s accurate grasp matters—what we might call the “etiology” of the accurate grasp—but it does not matter in all the same ways that we find in cases of knowledge (see especially Kvanvig 2003). In particular, it matters that the grasp was acquired in a way that was internally appropriate (especially, in accord with the evidence in one’s possession), but it does not matter that the grasp was externally appropriate—for example, that one came by one’s evidence in a reliable way. Thus Kvanvig argues:
What is distinctive about understanding has to do with the way in which an individual combines pieces of information into a unified body. This point is not meant to imply that truth is not important for understanding, for we have noted already the factive character of both knowledge and understanding. But once we move past its facticity, the grasping of relations between items of information is central to the nature of understanding. By contrast, when we move past the facticity of knowledge, the central features involve non-accidental connections between mind and world. (Kvanvig 2003: 197)
For instance, suppose you read a history book full of inaccurate facts about the Comanche dominance of the Southern Plains in the nineteenth century, but your dyslexia miraculously transforms them all into truths (Kvanvig 2009). For Kvanvig, despite the one-in-a-billion luckiness of your grasp’s origins, you could nonetheless come to an understanding of this topic. So long as the accuracy and internal appropriateness conditions are satisfied, how you came by your accurate grasp is not important.
Other philosophers have objected to Kvanvig’s account. On their view, it is implausible to think you can come to understand the world through sheer external luck, or (perhaps worse) through being the victim of massive deception (Grimm 2006; Pritchard 2010; Khalifa 2017b: ch. 7; Kelp 2021). Thus Pritchard claims that one needs to acquire one’s accurate grasp “in the right fashion” (Pritchard 2010: 108) or “in the right kind of way” (Pritchard 2010: 110)—in other words, by means of a reliable source or method. One’s grasp therefore cannot be the result of “Gettier luck”—where, for instance, by sheer chance a story intended to deceive you happens to be right (Pritchard 2010).
At the same time, philosophers such as Pritchard and Alison Hills hold that understanding does tolerate certain kinds of luck, and in a way that propositional knowledge does not (Pritchard 2010; Hills 2016). They therefore hold that understanding can be partly externally lucky. Thus imagine your environment is filled with misleading information about some event—the fire that destroyed your house, for example. Suppose that only Source X will offer you the truth about the fire—that faulty wiring was the cause—while all of the other sources will offer plausible but mistaken accounts. If you luckily rely on Source X, that source can enable you to understand why the event occurred, even though it cannot generate knowledge about why it occurred, due to the presence of what Pritchard calls “environmental luck”. The upshot, on this view, is that while understanding is compatible with environmental luck, it is not compatible with Gettier luck. They conclude from this that since knowledge is compatible with neither Gettier luck nor environmental luck, understanding is not a species of knowledge.
(For recent empirical studies regarding the compatibility of judgments of understanding with luck, and finding mixed support for this compatibility, see Wilkenfeld et al. 2018; Carter et al. 2019.)
Regarding the normative profile of understanding and its relation to knowledge, others have argued that understanding is not vulnerable to defeat, especially in the face of known counterevidence, in the way that knowledge is (Hills 2016; Dellsén 2017). Dellsén for instance argues that if I come to believe or grasp that a car engine works a certain way, and it really does work that way, then my understanding of how the engine works is secure even if I have (misleading) evidence that the person telling me about the engine is unreliable (Dellsén 2017). To these philosophers, this provides still another reason for thinking that understanding is not a species of knowledge.
3. Special Issues in Epistemology
3.1 The Epistemic Value of Understanding
As part of what Wayne Riggs has called the “value turn in epistemology”, epistemologists have increasingly attempted to identify the fundamental bearers of epistemic value (Riggs 2008). From a purely epistemic point of view, is knowledge of just any sort valuable? Or is the fundamentally valuable thing instead the ability to provide reasons, or to possess beliefs that are in some way “Gettier proof”?
Into this mix some have argued that the really valuable things from an epistemic point of view are “higher grade” cognitive accomplishments, such as understanding or wisdom (Riggs 2003; cf. Baehr 2014). Thus by nature we do not seem to have any desire to acquire trivial pieces of information, such as the name of the 589th person in the 1971 Dallas phone book. But any instance of understanding might seem worth pursuing or in some way worthwhile; thus Riggs writes,
it seems to me that any understanding, even of some subject matter we may consider trivial or mundane, contributes to the epistemic value of one’s life. (2003: 217)
Understanding might therefore be a better candidate for a fundamentally valuable epistemic state than knowledge or truth.
Just why understanding might have this property is up for debate. Some proposals focus on the “internal” benefits that understanding is alleged to provide. According to Zagzebski (2001), understanding has a kind of first-person transparency, tied to an ability to articulate reasons, that we do not always find in cases of knowledge. Thus to say a chicken-sexer knows the sex of a particular chicken without being able to cite his or her grounds is one thing, but to say that someone understands some subject matter—say, the U.S. Civil War—without being able to explain it or to describe how the subject’s different elements depend upon and relate to one another seems like another, more implausible step (cf. Pritchard 2010). Understanding therefore arguably provides “a more natural home” (cf. Kvanvig 2003: 1993) for internalist intuitions in epistemology than knowledge, because it seems to more naturally appeal to notions such as transparency, articulacy, and reason-giving than knowledge. (For the view that understanding too can be inarticulate, see Grimm 2017.)
Another view, from Pritchard (2009, 2010), is that any instance of understanding is valuable because it counts as an achievement, and achievements are the kinds of things that are distinctively and finally valuable. Instances of understanding count as achievements (and indeed what Pritchard calls strong achievements) either because they involve overcoming an obstacle or because they bring to bear “significant cognitive ability”. For Pritchard, however, the same cannot be said for any instance of knowledge. For example, in many cases I might come to believe the truth on the basis of testimony, but the credit for my true belief seems to belong more to the testifier than to me (cf. Lackey 2007). I do not reach the truth on this question primarily because of my ability or skill, but because of the ability or skill of the testifier; such items of knowledge therefore do not count as achievements, and hence lack final value.
Against this, some have objected that there are many cases of “easy understanding” where no significant obstacle seems to be involved, and no significant cognitive ability at play (e.g., Lawler 2019). For instance, it seems I could come to understand why my tumble-dryer isn’t working—because it is unplugged—quite easily and without bringing to bear any particularly significant cognitive ability (Carter & Gordon 2014: 5). It has therefore been claimed that not just any item of understanding is valuable, and particularly not just any item of “understanding why”. Rather, only so-called objectual understanding is distinctively valuable, where objectual understanding is said to concern “wide” subject matters that involve “a large network of propositions and relations between those propositions” (Carter & Gordon 2014: 8; cf. Khalifa 2017b: ch. 8).
A final proposal is that understanding is a better candidate for the goal of inquiry than knowledge (Pritchard 2016; cf. Kvanvig 2003: 202 and Kelp 2021). Suppose you learn from a reliable source that the rising and falling of the tides are due to the moon’s gravitational pull. You will then apparently have knowledge of why the tides rise and fall, but according to Pritchard this knowledge will not properly close your inquiry or satisfy your curiosity.
Indeed, one would expect our subject to continue asking questions of her informant until she gains a proper explanatory grip on how cause and effect are related; mere knowledge of the cause will not suffice. (Pritchard 2016: 34)
On this view, an explanation of how cause and effect are related is essential to understanding why, and one’s inquiry will not reach its natural end until one resolves this question.
A key issue in social epistemology is whether understanding, like ordinary propositional knowledge, can be transmitted via testimony. Thus it seems that I can transmit my knowledge to you that the next train is arriving at 4:15, just by telling you. Transmitting understanding, however, does not seem to work so easily, if it is possible at all. According to Myles Burnyeat,
Understanding is not transmissible in the same sense as knowledge is. It is not the case that in normal contexts of communication the expression of understanding imparts understanding to one’s hearer as the expression of knowledge can and often does impact understanding. (Burnyeat 1980: 186)
Thus a teacher might try to convey her understanding of some subject matter—say, of how Type II Diabetes works—but there is no guarantee that the understanding will in fact be transmitted, or that her students will come to see or grasp what she herself sees and grasps.
Supposing that understanding cannot be transmitted by testimony, there are a few explanations for why this might be the case. For one, Zagzebski argues that the kind of “seeing” or “grasping” that seems integral to understanding is something a person can only do “first hand”—it cannot be inherited from anyone else (Zagzebski 2008: ch. 6). For another, and according to Hills, if we agree that understanding is a skill or ability, then understanding will be difficult or impossible to transmit because skills and abilities in general are difficult or impossible to transmit (Hills 2009, 2020). It is therefore a specific case of a more general phenomena.
Others have argued that understanding is not, in fact, so difficult to transmit. Suppose I ask why you are late for our meeting, and you tell me “traffic”. It then seems like you have transmitted your understanding to me quite directly—apparently just as directly as when you communicate your knowledge to me that the next train is coming at 4:15 (Grimm 2020). What seems required for successful transmission of understanding is thus that the right conceptual scaffolding is in place, on the part of the recipient. But supposing the scaffolding is in place, understanding can plausibly be transmitted in much the way knowledge can (Boyd 2017; cf. Malfatti 2019, 2020). Others argue that since something like propositional knowledge of causes entails at least a low degree of understanding, a low degree of understanding can be transmitted via testimony in the same way as knowledge can (Hu 2019).
It has also been pointed out that even if we agree that seeing or grasping needs to be first-hand, and that others cannot do this for me, the same “first-handedness” apparently holds for belief. That is, no one else can believe for me, because believing is a first-personal act (Hazlett forthcoming: sec. 2.3). But just as this fact about belief does not lead us to think that propositional knowledge cannot be transmitted, so too it should not lead us to think that understanding cannot be transmitted (Boyd 2017).
In relation to moral testimony in particular, understanding has been invoked to explain why it often seems odd or “fishy” to defer to others about moral issues, such as whether eating meat is morally wrong (for an overview, see Callahan 2020; cf. Riaz 2015). One explanation of the fishiness is that the epistemic good we really want with respect to moral questions is not mere knowledge but rather understanding. It is then said, for reasons tied to those just mentioned, that understanding cannot be easily (if at all) transmitted by testimony—either because it is an ability, and abilities cannot easily be transmitted (Hills 2009, 2013, 2016) or because genuine understanding in moral matters involves a suite of emotional and affective responses that cannot easily be transmitted by testimony (Callahan 2018). Deferring to moral testimony is therefore fishy, it is argued, because it does not get us the epistemic good we really want—moral understanding.
4. Special Issues in the Philosophy of Science
4.1 Explanation and Understanding
We seek explanations for an epistemic benefit, but how should we think about that benefit? We noted above (Section 1.2) that philosophers such as Hempel have significant reservations about thinking about the benefit in terms of understanding. As they point out, just as a mistaken explanation can generate a “feeling” of understanding in some people, so too an accurate explanation might leave people cold.
In response to this concern, others note that the feeling of understanding (or the phenomenology of understanding) should not be confused with the epistemic state itself, any more than the feeling of knowing should be confused with the epistemic state of knowledge (de Regt 2004, 2017). But even if this move is granted, and we think of understanding as a full-bodied epistemic state and not a mere feeling, the relationship between explanation and understanding remains controversial.
According to what we might call an “understanding-first” approach to the relationship, thinking about the epistemology of understanding is indispensable for thinking about what makes for a good explanation. More exactly, because we seem to assess the goodness or badness of an explanation in terms of its ability to generate understanding, understanding is in some sense conceptually prior to, or more basic than, the notion of explanation. Thus intuitions about understanding are often taken to be diagnostic of the goodness (the explanatoriness) of an explanation (Wilkenfeld 2013; cf. Wilkenfeld & Lombrozo 2020), and if we can think of a case where all of the conditions for the theory of explanation are met, but understanding does not result, that is a reason to reject the sufficiency of the conditions (see, e.g., Woodward 2003: 195, in diagnosing Hempel’s view). Similarly, if we have understanding in ways not sanctioned by the theory, that is reason to think the conditions are not necessary. More generally, an advocate of the “understanding-first” approach would likely concur with Paul Humphreys’s claim that:
Scientific understanding provides a far richer terrain than does scientific explanation and the latter is best viewed as a vehicle to understanding, rather than an end in itself. (Humphreys 2000: 267; cf. Potochnik 2017: ch. 5)
Against understanding-first approaches, there are “debunking” approaches according to which understanding is of little if any help to accounts of explanation. (More positively, these might simply be considered “explanation-first” approaches.) Thus Khalifa argues that attempts to revive understanding as a central notion in the philosophy of science have amounted to little more than a repackaging of existing models of explanation (Khalifa 2012, 2017b: ch. 3), and that strictly speaking all one needs for a plausible account of understanding is a plausible account of what counts as a good or correct explanation, combined with a plausible account of knowledge. Understanding therefore amounts to knowing a correct explanation. But then nothing new or special is needed to theorize about understanding; our accounts of explanation and our theories of knowledge do all the important theoretical work (see especially Khalifa 2017b; cf. Kelp 2015).
Similarly, consider the following attempt, from Bradford Skow, to characterize the relationship between explanation and understanding:
Something E is an explanation of why Q only if someone who possesses E understands why Q. (Skow 2018: 214)
This condition on explanation cannot help us as theorists, Skow argues, because it is not even true. Thus suppose we construe “possessing” an explanation as knowing an explanation. Plugged into the formula, the result is that one cannot know an explanation of why Q unless that knowledge constitutes an understanding of why Q. But, plausibly, we can know an explanation of why Q without understanding why Q. For example, someone can know why the litmus paper turned red—because it was dipped in acid—without understanding why it turned red (Skow 2018: 215). This suggests it takes more to understand why p than simply to know why p. In the case of the litmus paper, Skow claims one also needs to appreciate how the acid turns the paper red, or why it turns it red.
Opinions differ about the force of such examples. According to some, to require that understanding why p involves knowledge of mechanisms or deeper processes in this way would annihilate most of our everyday understanding (Grimm 2019a). Thus I can apparently understand why my eyes are watering—because I am chopping onions—without appreciating anything about the mechanism or connection that underlies the watering. Others argue that there is indeed understanding in these cases, although perhaps not a lot (Sliwa 2015).
4.2 Understanding and Idealization
A longstanding puzzle in the philosophy of science concerns how idealized models and representations (“idealizations”, for short) allow cognitive access to the world. The puzzle is that although idealizations seem to provide real epistemic benefits, the benefits cannot apparently be identified with truth, because to the extent that they falsify or mispresent the world, idealizations often fail to reflect the truth. For example, idealizations often appeal to entities that do not and perhaps cannot exist—fully rational agents, frictionless planes, etc. Or they subtract important worldly elements from their accounts—e.g., long range inter-molecular forces.
Yet if idealizations provide epistemic benefits, and we cannot readily think of the benefits in terms of truth, then how exactly should we think about them? According to some philosophers, we should think not in terms of truth but rather in terms of understanding. Understanding is the epistemic benefit we receive from idealizations, and understanding and truth can come apart. On this view, understanding (unlike knowledge) can therefore be “non-factive” (Elgin 2004, 2017; Potochnik 2017; cf. Sullivan & Khalifa 2019).
For instance, Elgin asks us to consider a paint sample we might see in a hardware store—say, of the shade jonquil yellow (Elgin 2017: 187). While the sample might in fact be subtly different than the actual shade, and hence in that sense misrepresent it, it nonetheless seems to provide epistemic access to the shade. Idealizations such as the Ideal Gas Law or Snell’s law work are then held to work in a similar way. They represent not by mirroring but rather by exemplifying certain aspects of the target system, and via the mechanism of exemplification enable understanding of the system (Elgin 2017).
Others agree that idealizations enable scientists to understand the world even though, strictly speaking, the idealizations misrepresent their target systems. According to Angela Potochnik (2017), this is because the systems studied by scientists are enormously complex networks of causal patterns and interactions. Particular interests and cognitive limitations will lead scientists to focus on some of these causal patterns and neglect others, and they might get those particular patterns right. In the process, however, they will misrepresent the actual messy complexity of the target system, and the understanding of phenomena that results will thereby be non-factive.
For Strevens, idealizations enable understanding because they draw attention to the difference makers that bring about the thing to be explained (Strevens 2017). More exactly, idealizations help us to appreciate the factors that make a difference to bringing about the phenomena we want to explain, and to identifying the factors that do not make a difference. The Ideal Gas Law helps us to understand the Boylean behavior of a gas, for example, even though the law imagines that there are zero long-range forces at work, because the existence of those long-rage forces does not make a difference to the derivation of the Boylean behavior: they are insignificant enough that their values can be set to zero without loss.
One difference between theorists such as Strevens and Potochnik may lie in the nature of the explanandum. For Potochnik, it seems clear that the thing to be explained is a concrete, coarse-grained phenomenon: the behavior of a gas in a container, for example. For Strevens, it is a more abstract, fine-grained, and high-level event: the expansion of the gas. Thus for Strevens the thing to be explained is something along the lines of: that the gas expanded, not how it expanded. If one were to hold the explanandum consistent, there might be notable agreement between these views (though see Potochnik 2016 for further discussion).
5. Humanistic Understanding
To this point we have mainly focused on what it takes to understand phenomena in the natural world, such as rusting metal bars, or the rising and falling of the tides, or the behavior of gases. A longstanding question, however, especially in the Continental tradition of philosophy and especially in the philosophy of the social sciences, is whether understanding human beings and their artifacts requires something different and distinctive from an epistemic point of view—perhaps, for example, a distinctive set of abilities or methodologies, tied to the distinctive objects (or, importantly, subjects!) we are trying to understand.
Moreover, a long string of influential thinkers—starting roughly with Giambattista Vico and continuing through figures such Wilhelm Dilthey and R. G. Collingwood—answer this question affirmatively. Distinctive abilities and perhaps methodologies do come on the scene when we try to understand human beings, at least when we try to understand them in a particular way. In broad strokes, the idea is that there is a kind of understanding of other human beings that we can only acquire by reconstructing their perspectives—in some sense, “from within” those perspectives and according to their own terms (cf. Ismael 2018).
Sometimes this approach has been referred to as “the verstehen tradition”—in honor of its special roots in the German tradition, and leaving untranslated the German word for understanding (Martin 2000; Feest 2010). Alternative labels for this approach include “the interpretative tradition”, “the historicist tradition”, “the hermeneutic tradition”, and “the humanistic tradition” (for overviews, see Hiley et al. 1992; Stueber 2012). For convenience, we will refer to this as “the humanistic tradition”. It is not an essential part of this tradition that human beings can only be understood by reconstructing their perspectives, but the tradition does characteristically claim that there is special value in trying to do so. It also typically claims that taking up perspectives “from within” requires distinctive cognitive resources and perhaps distinctive methods—resources and methods that are not clearly needed when we attempt to understand natural phenomena.
Giambattista Vico (1668–1744) was among the first to try to articulate how exactly understanding human beings differs from understanding the natural world (see especially Vico 1725 .) According to Vico, just as we have a special scienza (knowledge or understanding) of things we have made or produced ourselves, so too we can have special insight into things that other human beings have made or produced—where the things made or produced included not just physical artifacts but also human actions. Vico further postulated a special ability—fantasia, or reconstructive imagination—by which we can enter into the minds of others and see the world through their eyes and in terms of their categories of thought (Miller 1993: ch. 5).
Further north in Europe, Johann Gottfried Herder (1744–1803) held that because human nature is not static, or fixed irrespective of time and place, understanding alien cultures requires a process of Einfühlung—a “feeling one’s way into”—the culture in question, in all its specificity and perhaps with an eye to its particular genius. In Herder’s hands, however, Einfühlung was not a quasi-mystical or irrational attempt to leap into the minds of others. Instead, it was often a slow, methodical process that needed to be aided by careful historical-philological inquiry (Forster 2002: xvii). (For central texts, see Herder 2002.)
In the late nineteenth and early twentieth century, Wilhelm Dilthey (1833–1911) became the most celebrated advocate of the idea that the human sciences—in German, the Geisteswissenschaften, such as history—had a different focus than the natural sciences, and centered on the idea of inner or lived experience. (See Dilthey 1883  for a characteristic work.) Someone’s lived experience, moreover, was constituted not only by their beliefs or attitudes, but also by their emotions and volitions. For Dilthey, as Frederick Beiser puts the idea,
We understand an episode in a person’s life only when we see how it plays a role in realizing his basic values, his conception of what makes life worth living. (Beiser 2011: 334)
In England, the humanistic approach was championed especially by R. G. Collingwood (1889–1943). According to Collingwood, what distinguishes human history from, say, geological history, is that human history is suffused with thought—i.e., it is a record of human aspirations, goals, beliefs, frustrations, and so on. We can, moreover, have two possible stances towards these thoughts. We can try to map them from a third person point of view, and identify the various ways the thoughts depend upon and relate to one another. But we can also try to “re-enact” or “rethink” them (D’Oro 2000, 2004). Thus Collingwood held that,
The events of history are never mere phenomena, never mere spectacles for contemplation, but things which the historian looks, not at, but through, to discern the thought within them. (Collingwood 1946 [1993: 214])
5.1 Perspective-taking and its Critics
A central tenet of the humanistic tradition is that when an agent has a first-person perspective on the world, there is value in trying to “take up” or “assume” that perspective, rather than simply trying to map that agent’s perspective from a detached, third-person perspective. Abraham Lincoln for instance, could presumably be understood from a third-person, detached perspective by a psychologist adept at mapping the various ways in which Lincoln’s beliefs and desires, hopes and fears, seemed to depend upon and relate to one another. What the humanistic tradition says is that even if the psychologist were to do this exquisitely, so that all of these relationships were accurately plotted, there would still be an important sort of understanding missing—an understanding of what it was like to be Lincoln from the inside, or to regard the world as he regarded it, at least in part.
Philosophers differ about the epistemic value of this project of perspective-taking. Thus some claim that there are certain facts that only show up from a first-person point of view (Nagel 1974), and hence can only be apprehended from that point of view. For instance, if I want to apprehend facts about “what it is like” to experience the world from your perspective, I arguably need to try to place myself, somehow, in that perspective. Others claim that certain concepts only show up for us from a first-personal, engaged perspective. For instance, perhaps the concept of chronic pain can only be acquired by someone who has experienced it, or the concept of romantic love, or racial bigotry. A related view is that while these concepts can perhaps be acquired without the relevant first-person experience, they cannot be adequately grasped or mastered without that experience. As Stephen Turner writes:
When a mother tells her 13 year old daughter that she does not know what “love” is, she is not making a comment about semantics; she is pointing to the nonlinguistic experiential conditions that are bound up with the understanding of the term that the daughter does not share. (Turner 2019: 254)
The thought here seems to be that while the daughter might have the concept of love, her grasp of the concept will be extremely poor without the benefit of the first-person experience, and her attempts to apply it will be unreliable.
In fields such as anthropology, ethnography, and sociology, and in the philosophical areas that reflect on these disciplines (primarily, the philosophy of social science), questions related to the epistemic value of perspective-taking gave rise to debates about whether it is necessary to immerse oneself in a society in order to understand it adequately. According to some, the answer is “yes”: if I want to understand a society or culture, I need to understand it from the participants’ perspective, with special sensitivity to the concepts and rules that guide the participants’ perspective, even if only implicitly (see especially Winch 1958, 1964). It is then sometimes claimed that one can only really grasp or master these concepts by participating in the relevant form of life. As the ethnographer James Spradley writes:
Immersion is the time-honored strategy used by most ethnographers. By cutting oneself off from other interests and concerns, by listening to informants hours on end, by participating in the cultural scene, and by allowing one’s mental life to be taken over by the new culture, themes [the implicit beliefs of a culture] often emerge … This type of immersion will often reveal new relationships among domains and bring to light cultural themes you cannot discover any other way. (Spradley 1980: 145; cf. Kampa 2019)
Another view is that immersion, while perhaps helpful, is not strictly necessary. What is necessary is recognizing the priority of the participants’ perspective, and using that perspective to characterize the activities that need to be understood in the first place (Taylor 1971; McCarthy 1973). If we want to make sense of what looks like (say) voting or praying in another culture, we need to adopt that culture’s way of identifying what counts as voting or praying (which perhaps will turn out to be a distinct but closely related activity, such as voting* or praying*). Carving up the behavior according to our own categories will only misrepresent what is happening and lead to misunderstanding.
Peter Winch, among others, further argues that it is hard or impossible to try to adopt another culture’s way of carving up the world without somehow taking that culture on board in a holistic way, because it is hard or impossible to characterize particular bits of behavior in isolation (Winch 1958). To make sense of what a medieval knight means by praying (or praying*), for example, I might need to connect this with other concepts (perhaps such as honor, or duty, or salvation) that again might be quite different than my own. The result might then be that one gradually acquires what Alasdair MacIntyre calls a “second first language”, as one’s grasp of the relationships between different concepts and their applications increases (MacIntyre 1988: ch. 19).
Against the push for perspective-taking as a source of understanding, especially in the social sciences, at least three strains of criticism arose: Positivist, Critical, and Gadamerian.
The Positivist critique—associated with thinkers such as Theodore Abel (1948), Ernest Nagel (1953), and Richard Rudner (1966)—had a number of prongs. For one thing, there were grave doubts about the reliability of the processes associated with perspective taking. After all, it seems all too easy to project one’s own cares and concerns onto the minds of others. It was also argued that reliving experiences, to the extent that this is possible, does not actually amount to an explanation of why the experiences happened. I could, after all, have lived through a series of events myself, but not been able to explain or understand them—so why should imaginatively living through someone else’s experiences, to the extent this is possible, automatically grant me understanding? (For an overview of these objections, see Martin 2000; Fay 2016; Beiser 2019.)
Critical Theorists have argued that the first-person perspective is not the most theoretically or politically important perspective, because it often masks deeper and more significant sources of behavior (see Warnke 2019). The deeper sources might include an agent’s own, unacknowledged motivations, or they might include the presuppositions, power dynamics, and economic conditions of the society that shaped the possibility spaces in which the agent moves. It is thus what happens “behind the back” of the subject that is often crucial for truly understanding behavior—the hidden impulses and power dynamics and systems of oppression that are often obscured from the perspective of the agent, sometimes in an unacknowledged way by the agent herself. (Here we also find influential Marxist and Feminist analyses and critiques. See Alcoff 2005; Warnke 2014.) A hybrid view, from Habermas, is that we need to be able to shift back and forth between the subject’s perspective and the structural perspective, if we are to properly understand the reality of social life (Habermas 1981 [1984/1987]; for an overview, see Baynes 2016).
The Gadamerian critique, finally, is that we can never fully jump outside of our own cares and concerns in order to adopt the cares and concerns of others. Reliving or re-experiencing— in the sense of transposing ourselves out of our framework and into the framework of other agents or cultures—is thus an impossible ideal. Instead, we always take our frameworks with us (Gadamer 1960 ). For Gadamer, what understanding others—and especially their written or spoken words—requires is not transposing ourselves into their worldviews, but trying to fuse our worldviews in some way (Horizontverschmelzung). Perhaps, for example, my conception of voting or prayer will become enlarged or modified by engaging with the conceptions I find in other cultures, and perhaps especially through a dialogue with the texts of those cultures. Whether this fusion essentially amounts to a project of translation (from one worldview to another), or something else is a matter for debate. (See Vessey 2009 for an overview.)
5.2 Understanding as an Ontological Category
An additional question, especially in the Continental tradition, is whether we should think of understanding primarily in epistemic terms. Perhaps it is better to think of understanding as an ontological category—a way of being in the world—rather than an epistemic one (for an overview, see Fehér 2016).
According to Heidegger’s influential account, for instance, understanding is not a cognitive act that we might or might not perform. Rather, it is our fundamental way of living in the world, and we are “always already” engaged in understanding. Thus he writes that:
Understanding is not an acquaintance derived from knowledge, but a primordially existential kind of being, which, more than anything else, makes such knowledge and acquaintance possible (123–4; trans. by Wrathall 2013).
Just as Descartes spoke of himself as a res cogitans—a thinking thing—so for Heidegger we are, fundamentally, understanding things. As Gadamer elaborates the Heideggerian idea:
Understanding is… the original form of the realization of Dasein, which is being-in-the-world. Before any differentiation of understanding into the various directions of pragmatic or theoretical interest, understanding is Dasein’s mode of being. (Gadamer 1960 [1989: 259])
One central element of this view is that we are always projecting possibilities onto the world around us. Or rather, it is not as if the world first presents itself as a bare thing empty of possibilities, and then we construe it as possessing these possibilities; instead, our experience of the world is from the first suffused with this sense of possibility. To take an example that Samantha Matherne (2019) uses to illustrate Heidegger’s view: when I first apprehend the martini in front of me, I take it as offering a variety of possibilities—to be sipped, to be thrown, to be shaken, to be stirred. If I then take the martini as to be sipped, I am seizing on one of these possibilities and interpreting the martini in light of this specific possibility. But my experience of the drink was never devoid of an apprehension of possibilities altogether.
A further question is why, on the Heideggerian framework, the state of projecting possibilities does not count as epistemic or truth-evaluable, even if we allow that it is also in some sense ontological. After all, the possibilities that we project onto the world might not be genuine or grounded in reality. As Grimm (2008) notes, someone might think that apparently solid things (like baseballs) could not possibly pass through other apparently solid things (like tables), but learning about quantum tunneling might call this into question, and transform one’s sense of possibility. There thus seem to be facts about the possibilities that the world affords, and it seems like a mind could either track these facts accurately, or not. But this appears to be a topic of interest not just to ontologists or metaphysicians, but to epistemologists as well (cf. Westphal 1999).
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- Gordon, Emma C., 2017, “Understanding in Epistemology”, The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
I am grateful to the following for helpful comments and conversations regarding previous versions of this entry: Laura Callahan, Henk de Regt, Catherine Elgin, John Greco, Crina Gschwandtner, Michael Hannon, Xingming Hu, Tania Lombrozo, Federica Malfatti, Kevin McCain, Keith McPartland, Soazig le Bihan, Angela Potochnik, Constantine Sandis, Armin Schulz, Whitney Schwab, Bhavya Sharma, Brad Skow, Michael Strevens, Karsten Stueber, Emily Sullivan, Daryl Tress, Rene van Woudenberg, Daniel Wilkenfeld, and Bryan Williams. Special thanks to Kareem Khalifa for careful discussion of the final version.