Notes to Value Pluralism

1. For example, it has been argued that all moral theories can be described in consequentialist terms, and so consequentialism is trivial, and it has been argued that virtue ethics is not a structurally distinct theory from consequentialism or deontology. See the entries on consequentialism and virtue ethics. However, it is certainly the case that deontologists and consequentialists tend to talk about value in a different way. Here I shall remain neutral on whether or not these different ways of talking really reflect different views about the nature of value.

2. I shall return to the complicated question of what kind of pluralist Ross is.

3. Ruth Chang makes this distinction in slightly different terminology, referring to reductive value pluralism, or metaphysical value pluralism (what is called here foundational pluralism) and nonreductive value pluralism (what is called here non-foundational pluralism.) (Chang, 2015). Chris Heathwood talks about substantive pluralism and substantive monism. (Heathwood, 2015). Miles Tucker talks in terms of strong and weak value pluralism: strong value pluralism claims that there are plural values that are not reducible to each other or to some other value. Tucker usefully stresses that irreducibility is not the same as is not the same as unanalysibility (Tucker, 2016). The crucial point is that we cannot analyse a fundamental value in terms of some other value.

4. This is the famous open question argument. Moore establishes his preliminary conclusion that when we say ‘x is good’ we do not mean anything naturalistic like ‘x is pleasure’ by pointing out that there is always an open question of the form, ‘but is pleasure good?’. So according to Moore, the naturalistic fallacy consists in thinking that there is a naturalistic account of goodness. See the entry on Moore’s moral philosophy.

5. There is still an ambiguity here: in order for the theory to be foundationally monist we must assume that the judgment of the expert judges is univocal—it would be less ambiguous if we thought in terms of one expert judge. I return to preference satisfaction accounts below.

6. The distinction was introduced by Bales (1971). For more on its use in consequentialism see the entries on consequentialism and on rule consequentialism. In recent discussions of consequentialist theories, the strategy has often been used to argue that a consequentialist agent need not be motivated purely by the (monist) good, but can also be motivated by such things as her friends, her relationships, and her personal projects. This is an example of decision procedural pluralism.

7. There are too many such discussions to cite here: see entries on friendship, pleasure, hedonism, and on Kant's moral philosophy.

8. Griffin’s account of value is complex and subtle. His view is a foundational monist one on my classification: he thinks that the basic value is informed desire fulfillment, and he is a normative pluralist because he thinks that we desire irreducibly plural things, and so from our point of view there are plural values. Furthermore, the things we desire are values in a deep sense—I discuss Griffin’s view in detail in the section on preference satisfaction views.

9. Of course, Mill himself may have intended his higher and lower pleasures as foundational plural values—but that debate can be left aside.

10. Griffin presents a similar view in his later book, Value Judgment. In that book Griffin’s view is more identifiable as foundational pluralism.

Copyright © 2018 by
Elinor Mason <>

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