Friendship, as understood here, is a distinctively personal relationship that is grounded in a concern on the part of each friend for the welfare of the other, for the other’s sake, and that involves some degree of intimacy. As such, friendship is undoubtedly central to our lives, in part because the special concern we have for our friends must have a place within a broader set of concerns, including moral concerns, and in part because our friends can help shape who we are as persons. Given this centrality, important questions arise concerning the justification of friendship and, in this context, whether it is permissible to “trade up” when someone new comes along, as well as concerning the possibility of reconciling the demands of friendship with the demands of morality in cases in which the two seem to conflict.
- 1. Nature of Friendship
- 2. Value and Justification of Friendship
- 3. Friendship and Moral Theory
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Friendship essentially involves a distinctive kind of concern for your friend, a concern which might reasonably be understood as a kind of love. Philosophers from the ancient Greeks on have traditionally distinguished three notions that can properly be called love: agape, eros, and philia. Agape is a kind of love that does not respond to the antecedent value of its object but instead is thought to create value in the beloved; it has come through the Christian tradition to mean the sort of love God has for us persons as well as, by extension, our love for God and our love for humankind in general. By contrast, eros and philia are generally understood to be responsive to the merits of their objects—to the beloved’s properties, especially his goodness or beauty. The difference is that eros is a kind of passionate desire for an object, typically sexual in nature, whereas ‘philia’ originally meant a kind of affectionate regard or friendly feeling towards not just one’s friends but also possibly towards family members, business partners, and one’s country at large (Liddell et al., 1940; Cooper, 1977a). Given this classification of kinds of love, philia seems to be that which is most clearly relevant to friendship (though just what philia amounts to needs to be clarified in more detail).
For this reason, love and friendship often get lumped together as a single topic; nonetheless, there are significant differences between them. As understood here, love is an evaluative attitude directed at particular persons as such, an attitude which we might take towards someone whether or not that love is reciprocated and whether or not we have an established relationship with her. Friendship, by contrast, is essentially a kind of relationship grounded in a particular kind of special concern each has for the other as the person she is; and whereas we must make conceptual room for the idea of unrequited love, unrequited friendship is senseless. Consequently, accounts of friendship tend to understand it not merely as a case of reciprocal love of some form (together with mutual acknowledgment of this love), but as essentially involving significant interactions between the friends—as being in this sense a certain kind of relationship.
Nonetheless, questions can be raised about precisely how to distinguish romantic relationships, grounded in eros, from relationships of friendship, grounded in philia, insofar as each involves significant interactions between the involved parties that stem from a kind of reciprocal love that is responsive to merit. Clearly the two differ insofar as romantic love normally has a kind of sexual involvement that friendship lacks; yet, as Thomas (1989) asks, is that enough to explain the real differences between them? Badhwar (2003, 65–66) seems to think so, claiming that the sexual involvement enters into romantic love in part through a passion and yearning for physical union, whereas friendship involves instead a desire for a more psychological identification. Yet it is not clear exactly how to understand this: precisely what kind of “psychological identification” or intimacy is characteristic of friendship? (For further discussion, see Section 1.2.)
In philosophical discussions of friendship, it is common to follow Aristotle (Nicomachean Ethics, Book VIII) in distinguishing three kinds of friendship: friendships of pleasure, of utility, and of virtue. Although it is a bit unclear how to understand these distinctions, the basic idea seems to be that pleasure, utility, and virtue are the reasons we have in these various kinds of relationships for loving our friend. That is, I may love my friend because of the pleasure I get out of her, or because of the ways in which she is useful to me, or because I find her to have a virtuous character. Given the involvement of love in each case, all three kinds of friendship seem to involve a concern for your friend for his sake and not for your own.
There is an apparent tension here between the idea that friendship essentially involves being concerned for your friend for his sake and the idea of pleasure and utility friendships: how can you be concerned for him for his sake if you do that only because of the pleasure or utility you get out of it? If you benefit your friend because, ultimately, of the benefits you receive, it would seem that you do not properly love your friend for his sake, and so your relationship is not fully one of friendship after all. So it looks like pleasure and utility friendships are at best deficient modes of friendship; by contrast, virtue friendships, because they are motivated by the excellences of your friend’s character, are genuine, non-deficient friendships. For this reason, most contemporary accounts, by focusing their attention on the non-deficient forms of friendship, ignore pleasure and utility friendships.
As mentioned in the first paragraph of this section, philia seems to be the kind of concern for other persons that is most relevant to friendship, and the word, ‘philia,’ sometimes gets translated as friendship; yet philia is in some ways importantly different from what we ordinarily think of as friendship. Thus, ‘philia’ extends not just to friends but also to family members, business associates, and one’s country at large. Contemporary accounts of friendship differ on whether family members, in particular one’s children before they become adults, can be friends. Most philosophers think not, understanding friendship to be essentially a relationship among equals; yet some philosophers (such as Friedman 1989; Rorty 1986/1993; Badhwar 1987) explicitly intend their accounts of friendship to include parent-child relationships, perhaps through the influence of the historical notion of philia. Nonetheless, there do seem to be significant differences between, on the one hand, parental love and the relationships it generates and, on the other hand, the love of one’s friends and the relationships it generates; the focus here will be on friendship more narrowly construed.
In philosophical accounts of friendship, several themes recur consistently, although various accounts differ in precisely how they spell these out. These themes are: mutual caring (or love), intimacy, and shared activity; these will be considered in turn.
A necessary condition of friendship, according to just about every view (Telfer 1970–71; Annas 1988, 1977; Annis 1987; Badhwar 1987; Millgram 1987; Sherman 1987; Thomas 1987, 1989, 1993; Friedman 1993, 1989; Whiting 1991; Hoffman 1997; Cocking & Kennett 1998; and White 1999a, 1999b, 2001) is that the friends each care about the other, and do so for her sake; in effect, this is to say that the friends must each love the other. Although many accounts of friendship do not analyze such mutual caring any further, among those that do there is considerable variability as to how we should understand the kind of caring involved in friendship. Nonetheless, there is widespread agreement that caring about someone for his sake involves both sympathy and action on the friend’s behalf. That is, friends must be moved by what happens to their friends to feel the appropriate emotions: joy in their friends’ successes, frustration and disappointment in their friends’ failures (as opposed to disappointment in the friends themselves), etc. Moreover, in part as an expression of their caring for each other, friends must normally be disposed to promote the other’s good for her sake and not out of any ulterior motive. (However, see Velleman 1999 for a dissenting view.)
To care about something is generally to find it worthwhile or valuable in some way; caring about one’s friend is no exception. A central difference among the various accounts of mutual caring is the way in which these accounts understand the kind of evaluation implicit therein. Most accounts understand that evaluation to be a matter of appraisal: we care about our friends at least in part because of the good qualities of their characters that we discover them to have (Annas 1977; Sherman 1987; Whiting 1991); this is in line with the understanding of love as philia or eros given in the first paragraph of Section 1 above. Other accounts, however, understand caring as in part a matter of bestowing value on your beloved: in caring about a friend, we thereby project a kind of intrinsic value onto him; this is in line with the understanding of love as agape given above.
Friedman (1989, 6) argues for bestowal, saying that if we were to base our friendship on positive appraisals of our friend’s excellences, “to that extent our commitment to that person is subordinate to our commitment to the relevant [evaluative] standards and is not intrinsically a commitment to that person.” However, this is too quick, for to appeal to an appraisal of the good qualities of your friend’s character in order to justify your friendship is not on its own to subordinate your friendship to that appraisal. Rather, through the friendship, and through changes in your friend over time, you may come to change your evaluative outlook, thereby in effect subordinating your commitment to certain values to your commitment to your friend. Of course, within friendship the influence need not go only one direction: friends influence each other’s conceptions of value and how to live. Indeed, that friends have a reciprocal effect on each other is a part of the concern for equality many find essential to friendship, and it is central to the discussion of intimacy in Section 1.2.
(For more on the notion of caring about another for her sake and the variety of philosophical accounts of it, see the entry on love.)
The relationship of friendship differs from other interpersonal relationships, even those characterized by mutual caring, such as relationships among colleagues: friendships are, intuitively, “deeper,” more intimate relationships. The question facing any philosophical account is how that characteristic intimacy of friendship is to be understood.
On this point, there is considerable variation in the literature—so much that it raises the question whether differing accounts aim at elucidating the same object. For it seems as though when the analysis of intimacy is relatively weak, the aim is to elucidate what might be called “acquaintance friendships”; as the analysis of intimacy gets stronger, the aim seems to tend towards closer friendships and even to a kind of ideal of maximally close friendship. It might be asked whether one or another of these types of friendship ought to take priority in the analysis, such that, for example, cases of close friendship can be understood to be an enhanced version of acquaintance friendship, or whether acquaintance friendship should be understood as being deficient in various ways relative to ideal friendship. Nonetheless, in what follows, views will be presented roughly in order from weaker to stronger accounts of intimacy.
To begin, Thomas (1987; 1989; 1993; 2013) claims that we should understand what is here called the intimacy of friendship in terms of mutual self-disclosure: I tell my friends things about myself that I would not dream of telling others, and I expect them to make me privy to intimate details of their lives. The point of such mutual self-disclosure, Thomas argues, is to create the “bond of trust” essential to friendship, for through such self-disclosure we simultaneously make ourselves vulnerable to each other and acknowledge the goodwill the other has for us. Such a bond of trust is what institutes the kind of intimacy characteristic of friendship. (Similar ideas can be found in Annis 1987.)
Cocking & Kennett (1998) caricature this as “the secrets view,” arguing:
It is not the sharing of private information nor even of very personal information, as such, that contributes to the bonds of trust and intimacy between companion friends. At best it is the sharing of what friends care about that is relevant here. 
Their point is that the secrets view underestimates the kind of trust at issue in friendship, conceiving of it largely as a matter of discretion. Given the way friendship essentially involves each caring about the other’s good for the other’s sake and so acting on behalf of the other’s good, entering into and sustaining a relationship of friendship will normally involve considerable trust in your friend’s goodwill towards you generally, and not just concerning your secrets. Moreover, friendship will normally involve trust in your friend’s judgment concerning what is in your best interests, for when your friend sees you harming yourself, she ought, other things being equal, to intervene, and through the friendship you can come to rely on her to do so. (See also Alfano, 2016, who emphasizes not just trust but trustworthiness to make similar points.)
Such enhanced trust can lead to “shared interests or enthusiasms or views … [or] a similar style of mind or way of thinking which makes for a high degree of empathy” (Telfer 1970–71, 227). Telfer finds such shared interests central to the “sense of a bond” friends have, an idea similar to the “solidarity”—the sharing of values and a sense of what’s important—that White (2001) advocates as central to friendship. For trusting my friend’s assessments of my good in this way seemingly involves trusting not only that she understands who I am and that I find certain things valuable and important in life but also and centrally that she understands the value of these things that are so meaningful to me. That in turn seems to be grounded in the empathy we have for each other—the shared sense of what’s important. So Telfer and White, in appealing to such shared sense of value, are offering a somewhat richer sense of the sort of intimacy essential to friendship than Thomas and Annis.
An important question to ask, however, is what precisely is meant by the “sharing” of a sense of value. Once again there are weaker and stronger versions. On the weak side, a sense of value is shared in the sense that a coincidence of interests and values is a necessary condition of developing and sustaining a friendship; when that happy coincidence dissipates, so too does the friendship. It is possible to read Annas’s summary of Aristotle’s view of friendship this way (1988, 1):
A friend, then, is one who (1) wishes and does good (or apparently good) things to a friend, for the friend’s sake, (2) wishes the friend to exist and live, for his own sake, (3) spends time with his friend, (4) makes the same choices as his friend and (5) finds the same things pleasant and painful as his friend.
(4) and (5) are the important claims for present purposes: making the same choices as your friend, if done consistently, depends on having a similar outlook on what reasons there are so to choose, and this point is reinforced in (5) given Aristotle’s understanding of pleasure and pain as evaluative and so as revealing what is (apparently) good and bad. The message might be that merely having coincidence in evaluative outlook is enough to satisfy (4) and (5).
Of course, Aristotle (and Annas) would reject this reading: friends do not merely have such similarities antecedent to their friendship as a necessary condition of friendship. Rather, friends can influence and shape each other’s evaluative outlook, so that the sharing of a sense of value is reinforced through the dynamics of their relationship. One way to make sense of this is through the Aristotelian idea that friends function as a kind of mirror of each other: insofar as friendship rests on similarity of character, and insofar as I can have only imperfect direct knowledge about my own character, I can best come to know myself—both the strengths and weaknesses of my character—by knowing a friend who reflects my qualities of character. Minor differences between friends, as when my friend on occasion makes a choice I would not have made, can lead me to reflect on whether this difference reveals a flaw in my own character that might need to be fixed, thereby reinforcing the similarity of my and my friend’s evaluative outlooks. On this reading of the mirroring view, my friend plays an entirely passive role: just by being himself, he enables me to come to understand my own character better (cf. Badhwar 2003).
Cocking & Kennett (1998) argue against such a mirroring view in two ways. First, they claim that this view places too much emphasis on similarity as motivating and sustaining the friendship. Friends can be very different from each other, and although within a friendship there is a tendency for the friends to become more and more alike, this should be understood as an effect of friendship, not something constitutive of it. Second, they argue that the appeal to the friend’s role as a mirror to explain the increasing similarity involves assigning too much passivity to the friend. Our friends, they argue, play a more active role in shaping us, and the mirroring view fails to acknowledge this. (Cocking & Kennett’s views will be discussed further below. Lynch (2005) provides further criticisms of the mirroring view, arguing that the differences between friends can be central and important to their friendship.)
In an interesting twist on standard accounts of the sense in which (according to Aristotle, at least) a friend is a mirror, Millgram (1987) claims that in mirroring my friend I am causally responsible for my friend coming to have and sustain the virtues he has. Consequently, I am in a sense my friend’s “procreator,” and I therefore find myself actualized in my friend. For this reason, Millgram claims, I come to love my friend in the same way I love myself, and this explains (a) Aristotle’s otherwise puzzling claim that a friend is “another self,” (b) why it is that friends are not fungible, given my role as procreator only of this particular person, and (c) why friendships of pleasure and utility, which do not involve such procreation, fail to be genuine friendships. (For more on the problem of fungibility, see Section 2.1.) However, in offering this account, Millgram may seem to confound my being causally necessary for my friend’s virtues with my being responsible for those virtues—to confound my passive role as a mirror with that of a “procreator,” a seemingly active role. Millgram’s understanding of mirroring does not, therefore, escape Cocking & Kennett’s criticism of mirroring views as assigning too much passivity to the friend as mirror.
Friedman (1989) offers another way to make sense of the influence my friend has on my sense of value by appealing to the notion of bestowal. According to Friedman, the intimacy of friendship takes the form of a commitment friends have to each other as unique persons, a commitment in which the
friend’s successes become occasions for joy; her judgments may provoke reflection or even deference; her behavior may encourage emulation; and the causes which she champions may inspire devotion…. One’s behavior toward the friend takes its appropriateness, at least in part, from her goals and aspirations, her needs, her character—all of which one feels prima facie invited to acknowledge as worthwhile just because they are hers. 
As noted in the 3rd paragraph of Section 1.1, Friedman thinks my commitment to my friend cannot be grounded in appraisals of her, and so my acknowledgment of the worth of her goals, etc., is a matter of my bestowing value on these: her ends become valuable to me, and so suitable for motivating my actions, “just because they are hers.” That is, such a commitment involves taking my friend seriously, where this means something like finding her values, interests, reasons, etc. provide me with pro tanto reasons for me to value and think similarly. In this way, the dynamics of the friendship relation involves friends mutually influencing each other’s sense of value, which thereby comes to be shared in a way that underwrites significant intimacy.
In part, Friedman’s point is that sharing an evaluative perspective in the way that constitutes the intimacy of friendship involves coming to adopt her values as parts of my own sense of value. Whiting (1991) argues that such an approach fails properly to make sense of the idea that I love my friend for her sake. For to require that my friend’s values be my own is to blur the distinction between valuing these things for her sake and valuing them for my own. Moreover, Whiting (1986) argues, to understand my concern for her for her sake in terms of my concern for things for my sake raises the question of how to understand this latter concern. However, Whiting thinks the latter is at least as unclear as the former, as is revealed when we think about the long-term and my connection and responsibility to my “future selves.” The solution, she claims, is to understand the value of my ends (or yours) to be independent of the fact that they are mine (or yours): these ends are intrinsically valuable, and that’s why I should care about them, no matter whose ends they are. Consequently, the reason I have to care for myself, including my future selves, for my sake is the same as the reason I have to care about my friend for her sake: because I recognize the intrinsic value of the (excellent) character she or I have (Whiting 1991, 10; for a similar view, see Keller 2000). Whiting therefore advocates what she calls an “impersonal” conception of friendship: There are potentially many people exhibiting (what I would consider to be) excellences of character, and these are my impersonal friends insofar as they are all “equally worthy of my concern”; what explains but does not justify my “differential and apparently personal concern for only some … [is] largely a function of historical and psychological accident” (1991, 23).
It should be clear that Whiting does not merely claim that friends share values only in that these values happen to coincide; if that were the case, her conception of friendship would be vulnerable to the charge that the friends really are not concerned for each other but merely for the intrinsically valuable properties that each exemplifies. Rather, Whiting thinks that part of what makes my concern for my friend be for her sake is my being committed to remind her of what’s really valuable in life and to foster within her a commitment to these values so as to prevent her from going astray. Such a commitment on my part is clearly a commitment to her, and a relationship characterized by such a commitment on both sides is one that consistently and non-accidentally reinforces the sharing of these values.
Brink (1999) criticizes Whiting’s account of friendship as too impersonal because it fails to understand the relationship of friendship itself to be intrinsically valuable. (For similar criticisms, see Jeske 1997.) In part, the complaint is the same as that which Friedman (1989) offered against any conception of friendship that bases that friendship on appraisals of the friend’s properties (cf. the 3rd paragraph of Section 1.1 above): such a conception of friendship subordinates our concern for the friend to our concern for the values, thereby neglecting what makes friendship a distinctively personal relationship. Given Whiting’s understanding of the sense in which friends share values in terms of their appeal to the intrinsic and impersonal worth of those values, it seems that she cannot make much of the rebuttal to Friedman offered above: that I can subordinate my concern for certain values to my concern for my friend, thereby changing my values in part out of concern for my friend. Nonetheless, Brink’s criticism goes deeper:
Unless our account of love and friendship attaches intrinsic significance to the historical relationship between friends, it seems unable to justify concern for the friend qua friend. [1999, 270]
It is only in terms of the significance of the historical relationship, Brink argues, that we can make sense of the reasons for friendship and for the concern and activity friendship demands as being agent-relative (and so in this way personal) rather than agent-neutral (or impersonal, as for Whiting).
Cocking & Kennett (1998), in what might be a development of Rorty (1986/1993), offer an account of close friendship in part in terms of the friends playing a more active role in transforming each other’s evaluative outlook: in friendship, they claim, we are “receptive” to having our friends “direct” and “interpret” us and thereby change our interests. To be directed by your friend is to allow her interests, values, etc. to shape your own; thus, your friend may suggest that you go to the opera together, and you may agree to go, even though you have no antecedent interest in the opera. Through his interest, enthusiasm, and suggestion (“Didn’t you just love the concluding duet of Act III?”), you may be moved directly by him to acquire an interest in opera only because he’s your friend. To be interpreted by your friend is to allow your understanding of yourself, in particular of your strengths and weaknesses, to be shaped by your friend’s interpretations of you. Thus, your friend may admire your tenacity (a trait you did not realize you had), or be amused by your excessive concern for fairness, and you may come as a result to develop a new understanding of yourself, and potentially change yourself, in direct response to his interpretation of you. Hence, Cocking & Kennett claim, “the self my friend sees is, at least in part, a product of the friendship” (505). (Nehamas 2010 offers a similar account of the importance of the interpretation of one’s friends in determining who one is, though Nehamas emphasizes in a way that Cocking & Kennett do not that your interpretation of your friend can reveal possible valuable ways to be that you yourself “could never have even imagined beforehand” (287).)
It is a bit unclear what your role is in being thus directed and interpreted by your friend. Is it a matter of merely passively accepting the direction and interpretation? This is suggested by Cocking & Kennett’s understanding of friendship in terms of a receptivity to being drawn by your friend and by their apparent understanding of this receptivity in dispositional terms. Yet this would seem to be a matter of ceding your autonomy to your friend, and that is surely not what they intend. Rather, it seems, we are at least selective in the ways in which we allow our friends to direct and interpret us, and we can resist other directions and interpretations. However, this raises the question of why we allow any such direction and interpretation. One answer would be because we recognize the independent value of the interests of our friends, or that we recognize the truth of their interpretations of us. But this would not explain the role of friendship in such direction and interpretation, for we might just as easily accept such direction and interpretation from a mentor or possibly even a stranger. This shortcoming might push us to understanding our receptivity to direction and interpretation not in dispositional terms but rather in normative terms: other things being equal, we ought to accept direction and interpretation from our friends precisely because they are our friends. And this might push us to a still stronger conception of intimacy, of the sharing of values, in terms of which we can understand why friendship grounds these norms.
Such a stronger conception of intimacy is provided in Sherman’s interpretation of Aristotle’s account (Sherman 1987). According to Sherman’s Aristotle, an important component of friendship is that friends identify with each other in the sense that they exhibit a “singleness of mind.” This includes, first, a kind of sympathy, whereby I feel on my friend’s behalf the same emotions he does. Unlike similar accounts, Sherman explicitly includes pride and shame as emotions I sympathetically feel on behalf of my friend—a significant addition because of the role pride and shame have in constituting our sense of ourselves and even our identities (Taylor 1985). In part for this reason, Sherman claims that “through the sense of belonging and attachment” we attain because of such sympathetic pride and shame, “we identify with and share their [our friends’] good” (600).
Second, and more important, Sherman’s Aristotle understands the singleness of mind that friends have in terms of shared processes of deliberation. Thus, as she summarizes a passage in Aristotle (1170b11–12):
character friends live together, not in the way animals do, by sharing the same pasture, but “by sharing in argument and thought.” 
The point is that the friends “share” a conception of values not merely in that there is significant overlap between the values of the one friend and those of the other, and not merely in that this overlap is maintained through the influence that the friends have on each other. Rather, the values are shared in the sense that they are most fundamentally their values, at which they jointly arrive by deliberating together.
[Friends have] the project of a shared conception of eudaimonia [i.e., of how best to live]. Through mutual decisions about specific practical matters, friends begin to express that shared commitment…. Any happiness or disappointment that follows from these actions belongs to both persons, for the decision to so act was joint and the responsibility is thus shared. 
The intent of this account, in which what gets shared is, we might say, an identity that the friends have in common, is not to be descriptively accurate of particular friendships; it is rather to provide a kind of ideal that actual friendships at best only approximate. Such a strong notion of sharing is reminiscent of the union view of (primarily erotic) love, according to which love consists in the formation of some significant kind of union, a “we” (see the entry on love, the section on love as union). Like the union view of love, this account of friendship raises worries about autonomy. Thus, it seems as though Sherman’s Aristotle does away with any clear distinction between the interests and even agency of the two friends, thereby undermining the kind of independence and freedom of self-development that characterizes autonomy. If autonomy is a part of the individual’s good, then Sherman’s Aristotle might be forced to conclude that friendship is to this extent bad; the conclusion might be, therefore, that we ought to reject this strong conception of the intimacy of friendship.
It is unclear from Sherman’s interpretation of Aristotle whether there are principled reasons to limit the extent to which we share our identities with our friends; perhaps an appeal to something like Friedman’s federation model (1998) can help resolve these difficulties. Friedman’s idea is that we should understand romantic love (but the idea could also be applied to friendship) not in terms of the union of the two individuals, in which their identities get subsumed by that union, but rather in terms of the federation of the individuals—the creation of a third entity that presupposes some degree of independence of the individuals that make it up. Even so, much would need to be done to spell out this view satisfactorily. (For more on Friedman’s account, see the entry on love, the section on love as union.)
In each of these accounts of the kind of intimacy and commitment that are characteristic of friendship, we might ask about the conditions under which friendship can properly be dissolved. Thus, insofar as friendship involves some such commitment, we cannot just give up on our friends for no reason at all; nor, it seems, should our commitment be unconditional, binding on us come what may. Understanding more clearly when it is proper to break off a friendship, or allow it to lapse, may well shed light on the kind of commitment and intimacy that is characteristic of friendship; nonetheless, this issue gets scant attention in the literature.
A final common thread in philosophical accounts of friendship is shared activity. The background intuition is this: never to share activity with someone and in this way to interact with him is not to have the kind of relationship with him that could be called friendship, even if you each care for the other for his sake. Rather, friends engage in joint pursuits, in part motivated by the friendship itself. These joint pursuits can include not only such things as making something together, playing together, and talking together, but also pursuits that essentially involve shared experiences, such as going to the opera together. Yet for these pursuits to be properly shared in the relevant sense of “share,” they cannot involve activities motivated simply by self interest: by, for example, the thought that I’ll help you build your fence today if you later help me paint my house. Rather, the activity must be pursued in part for the purpose of doing it together with my friend, and this is the point of saying that the shared activity must be motivated, at least in part, by the friendship itself.
This raises the following questions: in what sense can such activity be said to be “shared,” and what is it about friendship that makes shared activity so central to it? The common answer to this second question (which helps pin down an answer to the first) is that shared activity is important because friends normally have shared interests as a part of the intimacy that is characteristic of friendship as such, and the “shared” pursuit of such shared interests is therefore an important part of friendship. Consequently, the account of shared activity within a particular theory ought to depend at least in part on that theory’s understanding of the kind of intimacy relevant to friendship. And this generally seems to be the case: for example, Thomas (1987, 1989, 1993, 2013), who argues for a weak conception of intimacy in terms of mutual self-disclosure, has little place for shared activity in his account of friendship, whereas Sherman (1987), who argues for a strong conception of intimacy in terms of shared values, deliberation, and thought, provides within friendship a central place not just to isolated shared activities but, more significantly, to a shared life.
Nonetheless, within the literature on friendship the notion of shared or joint activity is taken for granted: not much thought has been given to articulating clearly the sense in which friends share their activity. This is surprising and unfortunate, especially insofar as the understanding of the sense in which such activities are “shared” is closely related to the understanding of intimacy that is so central to any account of friendship; indeed, a clear account of the sort of shared activity characteristic of friendship may in turn shed light on the sort of intimacy it involves. This means in part that a particular theory of friendship might be criticized in terms of the way in which its account of the intimacy of friendship yields a poor account of the sense in which activity is shared. For example, one might think that we must distinguish between activity we engage in together in part out of my concern for someone I love, and activity we share insofar as we engage in it at least partly for the sake of sharing it; only the latter, it might be argued, is the sort of shared activity constitutive of the relationship of friendship as opposed to that constitutive merely of my concern for him (see Nozick 1989). Consequently, according to this line of thought, any account of the intimacy of friendship that fails to understand the sharing of interests in such a way as to make sense of this distinction ought to be rejected.
Helm (2008) develops an account of shared activity and shared valuing at least partly with an eye to understanding friendship. He argues that the sense in which friends share activity is not the sort of shared intention and plural subjecthood discussed in literature on shared intention within social philosophy (on which, see Tuomela 1995, 2007; Gilbert 1996, 2000, 2006; Searle 1990; and Bratman 1999), for such sharing of intentions does not involve the requisite intimacy of friendship. Rather, the intimacy of friendship should be understood partly in terms of the friends forming a “plural agent”: a group of people who have joint cares—a joint evaluative perspective—which he analyzes primarily in terms of a pattern of interpersonally connected emotions, desires, judgments, and (shared) actions. Friendships emerge, Helm claims, when the friends form a plural agent that cares positively about their relationship, and the variety of kinds of friendships there can be, including friendships of pleasure, utility, and virtue, are to be understood in terms of the particular way in which they jointly understand their relationship to be something they care about—as tennis buddies or as life partners, for example.
Friendship clearly plays an important role in our lives; to a large extent, the various accounts of friendship aim at identifying and clarifying that role. In this context, it is important to understand not only why friendship can be valuable, but also what justifies particular friendships.
One way to construe the question of the value of friendship is in terms of the individual considering whether to be (or continue to be) engaged in a friendship: why should I invest considerable time, energy, and resources in a friend rather than in myself? What makes friendship worthwhile for me, and so how ought I to evaluate whether particular friendships I have are good friendships or not?
One sort of answer is that friendship is instrumentally good. Thus, Telfer (1970–71) claims that friendship is “life enhancing” in that it makes us “feel more alive”—it enhances our activities by intensifying our absorption in them and hence the pleasure we get out of them (239–40). Moreover, she claims, friendship is pleasant in itself as well as useful to the friends. Annis (1987) adds that it helps promote self-esteem, which is good both instrumentally and for its own sake.
Yet friendship is not merely instrumentally valuable, as is hinted at by Annis’ claim that “our lives would be significantly less full given the universal demise of friendship” (1987, 351). Cooper (1977b), interpreting Aristotle, provides two arguments for why this might be so. First, Cooper’s Aristotle claims, living well requires that one know the goodness of one’s own life; however, given the perpetual possibility of self-deception, one is able accurately to evaluate one’s own life only through friendship, in which one’s friend acts as a kind of mirror of one’s self. Hence, a flourishing life is possible only through the epistemic access friendship provides. Second, Cooper’s Aristotle claims that the sort of shared activity characteristic of friendship is essential to one’s being able to engage in the sort of activities characteristic of living well “continuously” and “with pleasure and interest” (310). Such activities include moral and intellectual activities, activities in which it is often difficult to sustain interest without being tempted to act otherwise. Friendship, and the shared values and shared activities it essentially involves, is needed to reinforce our intellectual and practical understanding of such activities as worthwhile in spite of their difficulty and the ever present possibility that our interest in pursuing them will flag. Consequently, the shared activity of friendship is partly constitutive of human flourishing.
So far these are attempts to understand the value of friendship to the individual in terms of the way friendship contributes, instrumentally or constitutively, to something else that is valuable to the individual. Yet one might also think that friendship is valuable for its own sake. Schoeman (1985), partly in response to the individualism of other accounts of the value of friendship, claims that in friendship the friends “become a unique community with a being and value of its own” (280): the intimacy of friendship results in “a way of being and acting in virtue of being united with another” (281). Although this claim has intuitive appeal, Schoeman does not clearly explain what the value of that “unique community” is or why it should have that value. Indeed, we ought to expect that fleshing out this claim would involve a substantive proposal concerning the nature of that community and how it can have a separate (federated?—cf. Friedman 1998) existence and value. Once again, the literature on shared intention and plural subjecthood is relevant here; see, for example, Gilbert 1989, 1996, 2000; Tuomela 1984, 1995; Searle 1990; and Bratman 1999.
A question closely related to this question of the value of friendship is that of what justifies my being friends with this person rather than with someone else or no one at all. To a certain extent, answers to the question of the value of friendship might seem to provide answers to the question of the justification of friendship. After all, if the value of friendship in general lies in the way it contributes (either instrumentally or constitutively) to a flourishing life for me, then it might seem that I can justify particular friendships in light of the extent to which they contribute to my flourishing. Nonetheless, this seems unacceptable because it suggests—what is surely false—that friends are fungible. (To be fungible is to be replaceable by a relevantly similar object without any loss of value.) That is, if my friend has certain properties (including, perhaps, relational properties) in virtue of which I am justified in having her as my friend (because it is in virtue of those properties that she contributes to my flourishing), then on this view I would be equally justified in being friends with anyone else having relevantly similar properties, and so I would have no reason not to replace my current friend with someone else of this sort. Indeed, it might even be that I ought to “trade up” when someone other than my current friend exhibits the relevant friendship-justifying properties to a greater degree than my friend does. This is surely objectionable as an understanding of friendship.
In solving this problem of fungibility, philosophers have typically focused on features of the historical relationship of friendship (cf. Brink 1999, quoted above). One approach might be found in Sherman’s 1987 union account of friendship discussed above (this type of view might be suggested by the account of the value of friendship in Schoeman 1985). If my friend and I form a kind of union in virtue of our having a shared conception of how to live that is forged and maintained through a particular history of interaction and sharing of our lives, and if my sense of my values and identity therefore depends on these being most fundamentally our values and identity, then it is simply not possible to substitute another person for my friend without loss. For this other person could not possibly share the relevant properties of my friend, namely her historical relationship with me. However, the price of this solution to the problem of fungibility, as it arises both for friendship and for love, is the worry about autonomy raised towards the end of Section 1.2 above.
An alternative solution is to understand these historical, relational properties of my friend to be more directly relevant to the justification of our friendship. Thus, Whiting (1991) distinguishes the reasons we have for initiating a friendship (which are, she thinks, impersonal in a way that allows for fungibility) from the reasons we have for sustaining a friendship; the latter, she suggests, are to be found in the history of concern we have for each other. However, it is unclear how the historical-relational properties can provide any additional justification for friendship beyond that provided by thinking about the value of friendship in general, which does not solve the fungibility problem. For the mere fact that this is my friend does not seem to justify my continued friendship: when we imagine that my friend is going through a rough time so that he loses those virtues justifying my initial friendship with him, why shouldn’t I just dump him and strike up a new friendship with someone who has those virtues? It is not clear how the appeal to historical properties of my friend or our friendship can provide an answer.
In part the trouble here arises from tacit preconceptions concerning the nature of justification. If we attempt to justify continued friendship in terms of the friend’s being this particular person, with a particular historical relationship to me, then it seems like we are appealing to merely idiosyncratic and subjective properties, which might explain but cannot justify that friendship. This seems to imply that justification in general requires the appeal to the friend’s being a type of person, having general, objective properties that others might share; this leads to the problem of fungibility. Solving the problem, it might therefore seem, requires somehow overcoming this preconception concerning justification—a task which no one has attempted in the literature on friendship.
(For further discussion of this problem of fungibility as it arises in the context of love, as well as discussion of a related problem concerning whether the object (rather than the grounds) of love is a particular person or a type of person, see Section 6 of the entry on love.)
Another way to construe the question of the value of friendship is in more social terms: what is the good to society of having its members engaged in relationships of friendship? Telfer (1970–71, 238) answers that friendship promotes the general good “by providing a degree and kind of consideration for others’ welfare which cannot exist outside it.” Blum (1980) concurs, arguing that friendship is an important source of moral excellence precisely because it essentially involves acting for the sake of your friend, a kind of action that can have considerable moral worth. (For similar claims, see Annis 1987.)
Cocking & Kennett (2000) argue against this view that friendly acts per se are morally good, claiming that “I might be a perfectly good friend. I might just not be a perfectly moral one” (287). They support this conclusion, within their account of friendship as involving being directed and interpreted by one’s friend, by claiming that “I am just as likely to be directed by your interest in gambling at the casino as by your interest in ballet” (286). However, Cocking & Kennett seem to be insufficiently sensitive to the idea, which they accept (cf. 284), that friends care about promoting each other’s well-being. For if I am concerned with your well-being and find you to be about to embark on an immoral course of action, I ought not, contrary to what Cocking & Kennett suggest, blindly allow you to draw me into joining you; rather, I ought to try to stop you or at least get you to question whether you are doing the right thing—as a matter of my directing and interpreting you. In this context, Koltonski (2016) argues that one ought to ensure that one’s friend is properly engaging in moral deliberation, but then defer to one’s friend’s judgment about what to do, even when one disagrees with the moral conclusion, for such deference is a matter of properly respecting the friend’s moral agency.
These answers to the social value of friendship seem to apply equally well to love: insofar as love essentially involves both a concern for your beloved for his sake and, consequently, action on his behalf for his sake, love will exhibit the same social value. Friedman (1989), however, argues that friendship itself is socially valuable in a way that love is not. Understanding the intimacy of friendship in terms of the sharing of values, Friedman notes that friendship can involve the mutual support of, in particular, unconventional values, which can be an important stimulus to moral progress within a community. For “our commitments to particular persons are, in practice, necessary counterbalances to our commitments to abstract moral guidelines, and may, at times, take precedence over them” (6). Consequently, the institution of friendship is valuable not just to the individuals but also to the community as a whole.
A growing body of research since the mid-1970s questions the relationship between the phenomenon of friendship and particular moral theories. Thus, many (Stocker 1976, 1981; Blum 1980, 1993; Wilcox 1987; Friedman 1989, 1993; Badhwar 1991; Cocking & Oakley 1995) have criticized consequentialist and deontological moral theories on the grounds that they are somehow incompatible with friendship and the kind of reasons and motives that friendship provides. Often, the appeal to friendship is intended to bypass traditional disputes among major types of moral theories (consequentialism, deontology, and virtue ethics), and so the “friendship critique” may seem especially important and interesting.
At the root of these questions concerning the relationship between friendship and morality is the idea that friendship involves special duties: duties for specific people that arise out of the relationship of friendship. Thus, it seems that we have obligations to aid and support our friends that go well beyond those we have to help strangers because they are our friends, much like we parents have special duties to aid and support our children because they are our children. Indeed, Annis (1987) suggests, such duties “are constitutive of the relationship” of friendship (352; but see Bernstein (2007) for an argument that friendship does not involve any requirement of partiality). Given this, the question arises as to what the relationship is between such special duties of friendship and other duties, in particular moral duties: can our obligations to our friends sometimes trump our moral duties, or must we always subordinate our personal relationships to morality in order to be properly impartial (as, it might be thought, morality demands)?
One concern in this neighborhood, articulated by Stocker (1976), is that the phenomenon of friendship reveals that consequentialist and deontological moral theories, by offering accounts of what it is right to do irrespective of the motives we have, promote a kind of “moral schizophrenia”: a split between our moral reasons on the one hand and our motives on the other. Such moral schizophrenia, Stocker argues, prevents us in general from harmonizing our moral reasons and our motives, and it does so in a way that destroys the very possibility of our having and sustaining friendships with others. Given the manifest value of friendship in our lives, this is clearly a serious problem with these moral theories.
What is it about friendship that generates these problems? One concern arises out of the teleological conception of action, implicit in consequentialism, according to which actions are understood in terms of their ends or purposes. The trouble is, Stocker (1981) argues, the characteristic actions of friendship cannot be understood in this way. To be a friend is at least sometimes to be motivated to act out of a concern for your friend as this individual (cf. Section 1.1). Although actions done out of friendship may have ends, what characterizes these as “friendly acts,” as we might call them, is not that they are done for any particular purpose:
If acting out of friendship is composed of purposes, dispositions to have purposes, and the like, where these are purposes properly so-called, and thus not essentially described by the phrase ‘out of friendship’, there seems … no guarantee that the person cares about and likes, has friendship for, the ‘friend’. [Stocker 1981, 756–57]
That is, actions done out of friendship are essentially actions motivated by a special sort of concern—a concern for this particular person—which is in part a matter of having settled habits of response to the friend. This, Stocker concludes, is a kind of motivation for action that a teleological conception of action cannot countenance, resulting in moral schizophrenia. (Jeske (2008) argues for a somewhat different conclusion: that in order to heal this apparent split between impartial moral obligations and the partial obligations of friendship, we must abandon the distinction between moral and nonmoral obligations.)
Stocker (1976) raises another, more general concern for consequentialism and deontology arising out of a conception of friendship. Thus, although act consequentialists—those who justify each particular act by appeal to the goodness of the consequences of that act, impersonally conceived (see the entry on consequentialism)—could justify friendly acts, they “cannot embody their reason in their motive” (1976, 70), for to be motivated teleologically by the concern to maximize goodness is not to be motivated out of friendship. Consequently, either act consequentialists must exhibit moral schizophrenia, or, to avoid it, they must understand consequentialist reasons for action to be our motives. However, because such consequentialist reasons are impersonal, taking this latter tack would be to leave out the kind of reasons and motives that are central to friendship, thereby undermining the very institution of friendship. (Cf. the discussion of impersonal justification of friendship and the problem of fungibility in Section 2.1.)
The same is true, Stocker argues, of rule consequentialism (the view that actions are right if they follow principles or rules that tend to result in the most good overall, impersonally conceived—see the entry on rule-consequentialism) and on deontology (the view that actions are right just in case they are in accordance with certain rules or principles that are binding on all moral agents). For even if rule consequentialism and deontology can provide moral reasons for friendly actions in terms of the rule that one must benefit one’s friends, for example, such reasons would be impersonal, giving no special consideration to our particular friends at all. If we are to avoid moral schizophrenia and embody this reason in our motives for action, we could not, then, act out of friendship—out of a concern for our friends for their sakes. This means that any rule consequentialist or deontologist that avoids moral schizophrenia can act so as to benefit her friends, but such actions would be merely as if friendly, not genuinely friendly, and she could not therefore have and sustain genuine friendships. The only alternative is to split her moral reasons and her motives for friendly acts, thereby becoming schizophrenic. (For some discussion about whether such moral schizophrenia really is as bad as Stocker thinks, see Woodcock 2010. For concerns similar to Stocker’s about impartial moral theories and motivation for action arising out of a consideration of personal relationships like friendship, see Williams 1981.)
Blum (1980) (portions of which are reprinted with slight modifications in Blum 1993) and Friedman (1993), pick up on this contrast between the impartiality of consequentialism and deontology and the inherent partiality of friendship, and argue more directly for a rejection of such moral theories. Consequentialists and deontologists must think that relationships like friendship essentially involve a kind of special concern for the friend and that such relationships therefore demand that one’s actions exhibit a kind of partiality towards the friend. Consequently, they argue, these impartialist moral theories must understand friendship to be inherently biased and therefore not to be inherently moral. Rather, such moral theories can only claim that to care for another “in a fully morally appropriate manner” requires caring for him “simply as a human being, i.e., independent of any special connection or attachment one has with him” (Blum 1993, 206). It is this claim that Blum and Friedman deny: although such universalist concern surely has a place in moral theory, the value—indeed the moral value (cf. Section 2.2)—of friendship cannot properly be appreciated except as involving a concern for another for his sake and as the particular person he is. Thus, they claim, insofar as consequentialism and deontology are unable to acknowledge the moral value of friendship, they cannot be adequate moral theories and ought to be rejected in favor of some alternative.
In reply, Railton (1984) distinguishes between subjective and objective consequentialism, arguing that this “friendship critique” of Stocker and Blum (as well as Friedman) succeeds only against subjective consequentialism. (See Mason (1998) for further elaborations of this argument, and see Sadler (2006) for an alternative response.) Subjective consequentialism is the view that whenever we face a choice of actions, we should both morally justify a particular course of action and be motivated to act accordingly directly by the relevant consequentialist principle (whether what that principle assesses are particular actions or rules for action). That is, in acting as one ought, one’s subjective motivations ought to come from those very moral reasons: because this action promotes the most good (or is in accordance with the rule that tends to promote the most good). Clearly, Stocker, Blum, and Friedman are right to think that subjective consequentialism cannot properly accommodate the motives of friendship.
By contrast, Railton argues, objective consequentialism denies that there is such a tight connection between the objective justification of a state of affairs in terms of its consequences and the agent’s motives in acting: the moral justification of a particular action is one thing (and to be undertaken in consequentialist terms), but the motives for that action may be entirely separate. This means that the objective consequentialist can properly acknowledge that sometimes the best states of affairs result not just from undertaking certain behaviors, but from undertaking them with certain motives, including motives that are essentially personal. In particular, Railton argues, the world would be a better place if each of us had dispositions to act so as to benefit our friends out of a concern for their good (and not the general good). So, on consequentialist grounds each of us has moral reasons to inculcate such a disposition to friendliness, and when the moment arrives that disposition will be engaged, so that we are motivated to act out of a concern for our friends rather than out of an impersonal, impartial concern for the greater good. Moreover, there is no split between our moral reasons for action and our motives because such reasons may in some cases (such as that of a friendly act) require that in acting we act out of the appropriate sort of motive. So the friendship critique of Stocker, Blum, and Friedman fails.
Badhwar (1991) thinks even Railton’s more sophisticated consequentialism ultimately fails to accommodate the phenomenon of friendship, and that the moral schizophrenia remains. For, she argues, a sophisticated consequentialist must both value the friend for the friend’s sake (in order to be a friend at all) and value the friend only so long as doing so is consistent with promoting the most good overall (in order to be a consequentialist).
As a non-schizophrenic, un-selfdeceived consequentialist friend, however, she must put the two thoughts together. And the two thoughts are logically incompatible. To be consistent she must think, “As a consequentialist friend, I place special value on you so long, but only so long, as valuing you thus promotes the overall good.” … Her motivational structure, in other words, is instrumental, and so logically incompatible with the logical structure required for end friendship. 
Badhwar is here alluding to a case of Railton’s in which, through no fault of yours or your friend’s, the right action according to consequentialism is to sacrifice your friendship for the greater good. In such a case, the sophisticated consequentialist must in arriving at this conclusion “evaluate intrinsic goods [of friendship] and their virtues by reference to a standard external to them”—i.e., by reference to the overall good as this is conceived from an impersonal point of view (496). However, Badhwar argues, the value of friendship is something we can appreciate only from a personal point of view, so that the moral rightness of friendly actions must be assessed only by appeal to an essentially personal relationship in which we act for the sake of our friends and not for the sake of producing the most good in general and in indifference to this particular personal relationship. Therefore, sophisticated consequentialism, because of its impersonal nature, blinds us to the value of particular friendships and the moral reasons they provide for acting out of friendship, all of which can be properly appreciated only from the personal point of view. In so doing, sophisticated consequentialism undermines what is distinctive about friendship as such. The trouble once again is a split between consequentialist reasons and friendly motivations: a kind of moral schizophrenia.
At this point it might seem that the proper consequentialist reply to this line of criticism is to refuse to accept the claim that a moral justification of the value of friendship and friendly actions must be personal: the good of friendship and the good that friendly actions promote, a consequentialist should say, are things we must be able to understand in impersonal terms or they would not enter into a properly moral justification of the rightness of action. Because sophisticated consequentialists agree that motivation out of friendship must be personal, they must reject the idea that the ultimate moral reasons for acting in these cases are your motives, thereby rejecting the relatively weak motivational internalism that is implicit in the friendship critique (for weak motivational internalism, see the entry on moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism, and in particular the section on motivational internalism and the action-guiding character of moral judgements). Indeed, this seems to be Railton’s strategy in articulating his objective consequentialism: to be a good person is to act in the morally right ways (justified by consequentialism) and so to have, on balance, motivations that tend to produce right action, even though in certain cases (including those of friendship) these motivations need not—indeed cannot—have the consequentialist justification in view. (For further elaborations of this strategy in direct response to Badhwar 1991, see Conee 2001 and Card 2004; for a defense of Railton in opposition to Card’s elaboration of sophisticated consequentialism, see Tedesco 2006.)
This means that the debate at issue in the friendship critique of consequentialism needs to be carried on in part at the level of a discussion of the nature of motivation and the connection between moral reasons and motives. Indeed, such a discussion has implications for how we should construe the sort of mutual caring that is central to friendship. For the sophisticated consequentialist would presumably try to spell out that mutual caring in terms of friendly dispositions (motives divorced from consequentialist reasons), an attempt which advocates of the friendship critique would say involves insufficient attention to the particular person one cares about, insofar as the caring would not be justified by who she is (motives informed by personal reasons).
The discussion of friendship and moral theories has so far concentrated on the nature of practical reason. A similar debate focuses on the nature of value. Scanlon (1998) uses friendship to argue against what he calls teleological conceptions of values presupposed by consequentialism. The teleological view understands states of affairs to have intrinsic value, and our recognition of such value provides us with reasons to bring such states of affairs into existence and to sustain and promote them. Scanlon argues that friendship involves kinds of reasons—of loyalty, for example—are not teleological in this way, and so the value of friendship does not fit into the teleological conception and so cannot be properly recognized by consequentialism. In responding to this argument, Hurka (2006) argues that this argument presupposes a conception of the value of friendship (as something we ought to respect as well as to promote) that is at odds with the teleological conception of value and so with teleological conceptions of friendship. Consequently, the debate must shift to the more general question about the nature of value and cannot be carried out simply by attending to friendship.
These conclusions that we must turn to broader issues if we are to settle the place friendship has in morality reveal that in one sense the friendship critique has failed: it has not succeeded in making an end run around traditional debates between consequentialists, deontologists, and virtue theorists. Yet in a larger sense it has succeeded: it has forced these moral theories to take personal relationships seriously and consequently to refine and complicate their accounts in the process.
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