Notes to War

1. War, here, means large-scale armed conflicts between organised groups.

2. For a robust response to realism, see Walzer 2006: Chapter 1.

3. These are archetypes; most theorists are traditionalist in some respects, revisionist in others.

4. Throughout this piece, “civilian” is used interchangeably with “noncombatant” and “soldier” interchangeably with “combatant”. This is for stylistic reasons; of course, taken literally, these terms are not exact equivalents.

5. On the relationship between the morality of war and the law of war, see the broadly traditionalist arguments of Henry Shue and Seth Lazar, the morally but not legally revisionist arguments of Jeff McMahan, and the morally and legally revisionist arguments of David Rodin: McMahan 2008; Shue 2008; McMahan 2010a; Shue 2010; Rodin 2011b; Lazar 2012a; Shue 2013; Lazar and Valentini 2017. For an innovative book-length treatment of the topic, see Haque forthcoming.

6. Some people think that all of morality is institutional, and that what here is called the interactional approach relies extensively on intuitions about cases in domestic contexts, with standard domestic institutions. Note that this contrast is the same as that drawn in the global justice debate. See, for example, Caney 2005.

7. Pace criticism from reductivists (e.g., Frowe 2014), only the most extreme and implausible exceptionalists think that the morality of war is genuinely sui generis.

8. Two useful starting points for considering evaluative and descriptive collectivism respectively: Taylor 1995; List and Pettit 2011.

9. For an exhausting but not exhaustive list of such factors, see Rodin 2011a.

10. Many deontologists think that both agent-neutral and agent-relative reasons are relevant to what we are all things considered permitted to do, and so should be accommodated within the proportionality and necessity calculations. Agent-neutral reasons apply to everyone with the same force. Agent-relative reasons either apply exclusively to some agents and not others, or apply with different force depending on the agent (McNaughton and Rawling 1995). For example, everyone has agent-neutral reason to save my son from drowning, but I have an especially strong agent-relative reason to do so. Agent-relative moral reasons should not, of course, be confused with mere prudential reasons. I have a stronger agent-relative reason than you do to save someone from drowning, if I pushed him into the water, but that might have nothing to do with my self-interest. However, some deontologists think that we can accommodate all of the familiar deontological ideas without appealing to agent-relativity. This dispute is beyond the scope of this entry.

11. This basic idea, much attenuated, formed the basis of the International Commission on Intervention and State Sovereignty’s report on the Responsibility to Protect (ICISS 2001).

12. For an excellent contemporary take on legitimate authority, see Benbaji 2016.

13. If the alternative to war is submission, then the topic of last resort becomes the same as that of proportionality: is the expected benefit of fighting great enough to outweigh the expected costs of submission?

14. Compare: “In order to ensure respect for and protection of the civilian population and civilian objects, the Parties to the conflict shall at all times distinguish between the civilian population and combatants and between civilian objects and military objectives and accordingly shall direct their operations only against military objectives.” (Article 48, first additional protocol to the Geneva Conventions).

15. Compare: “an attack which may be expected to cause incidental loss of civilian life, injury to civilians, damage to civilian objects, or a combination thereof, which would be excessive in relation to the concrete and direct military advantage anticipated.” (Article 51(4b), first additional protocol to the Geneva Conventions).

16. Compare: “With respect to attacks, the following precautions shall be taken: (a) those who plan or decide upon an attack shall… (ii) take all feasible precautions in the choice of means and methods of attack with a view to avoiding, and in any event to minimizing, incidental loss of civilian life, injury to civilians and damage to civilian objects; … 3. When a choice is possible between several military objectives for obtaining a similar military advantage, the objective to be selected shall be that the attack on which may be expected to cause the least danger to civilian lives and to civilian objects.” (Article 57, first additional protocol to the Geneva Conventions).

17. Other principles prohibit harming combatants in particular ways—for example with poison gas.

18. For the idea of a “supreme emergency exception” see Walzer 2006: 247–50. For criticism see Bellamy 2004; Statman 2006.

19. Article 43 of the first additional protocol states explicitly: “combatants… have the right to participate directly in hostilities”. The Preamble, meanwhile, makes clear that these principles apply “without any adverse distinction based on the nature or origin of the armed conflict or on the causes espoused by or attributed to the Parties to the conflict.” Haque (forthcoming) argues for a different interpretation of international law, according to which participation in an unjust war is decriminalised, but not strictly speaking legal. This interpretation seems to capture what international law should be—whether or not one finds the interpretation convincing. See Lazar 2012a.

20. Most just war theorists, until recently, endorsed this premise (Rodin 2002; McPherson 2004; Arneson 2006; McMahan 2009; Fabre 2012; Frowe 2014). More recently, philosophers have noticed the difficulty of squaring plausible conclusions in just war theory with a plausible theory of individual rights, and have accepted an expanded role for lesser evil justification in just war theory (in which rights are overridden but not lost) (Lazar 2010; Bazargan 2014; McMahan 2014).

21. Some think that noncombatants’ responsibilities are especially salient in asymmetric conflicts, in which they are often crucial to the combatants’ ability to fight (see, for example, Gross 2010).

22. This is Saba Bazargan’s suggestion.

Copyright © 2016 by
Seth Lazar <>

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