Wilhelm von Humboldt

First published Fri Feb 23, 2007; substantive revision Tue May 24, 2022

Wilhelm (Friedrich Wilhelm Christian Karl Ferdinand) von Humboldt, German man of letters extraordinary, close friend of the poets Goethe and Schiller, whose life’s work encompasses the areas of philosophy, literature, linguistics, anthropology, education, and political thought as well statesmanship was born in Potsdam on June 22, 1767 and died at Tegel near Berlin on April 8, 1835. Although there has always been strong interest in Humboldt expressed by political and cultural historians and educationists in Germany, it is only in recent decades that his contributions to the formation of modern linguistics, to semiotics, hermeneutics and philosophy of language have given rise to renewed attention to his pioneering achievements in these areas, even though much of his work in linguistics has remained unknown or unexplored until recently. Yet numerous linguists beginning with Pott and Steinthal in Germany and the American Brinton in the nineteenth century to Boas, Sapir, Bühler, Weisgerber, and Chomsky in the twentieth century derived or claimed to have derived important insights from Humboldt. But their interest in Humboldt was partial at best and limited to those aspects of his work that could be utilized to reinforce or to legitimize their own projects and methodologies. It is quite misleading to associate the term “Humboldtian linguistics” or “Humboldtian philosophy of language” with any one specific direction, for example with the Whorfian thesis of “linguistic relativity” or with Chomsky’s opposite notion of a universalist “generative grammar” because these tend to ignore other equally or more important dimensions of Humboldt’s work. After his death in 1835 his linguistic work was effectively disregarded by mainstream linguists in Germany whose primary interest was focused on the Indo-European language group. Thus a prominent figure like Franz Bopp would maintain that the languages of the South Pacific represented but decayed forms of Sanskrit despite the fact that Humboldt had already thoroughly disproved this opinion in his Kavi Work and demonstrated that these languages constituted what is called today the Austronesian language group (Mueller-Vollmer 1991). Even the linguist Heyman Steinthal, who published in 1884 a two volume edition of Humboldt’s writings entitled Die Sprachphilosophischen Werke Wilhelm’s von Humboldt (Humboldt’s works in philosophy of language) (see “Works”, bibliography), in his introduction and commentaries criticises Humboldt from a reductionist psychologistic position and neither here or anywhere in his other writings made a serious attempt to discuss Humboldt’s own arguments and to investigate his actual philosophical position. In France, on the other hand, we find throughout the nineteenth century a comparatively sustained interest in Humboldt that was confined chiefly to his work in the Asian languages and to his Basque studies. As a member of the Société Asiatique in Paris he published a number of articles in the society’s official journal, the Journal Asiatique (for a list of these articles, see Bösch 2006, p. 234) and the latter in turn carried reviews of some of his writings. It has to be noted that this French reception resulted largely from the personal contacts and scholarly exchanges that he maintained with a number of prominent French linguists such as Jean-François Champollion, Jean-Pierre Abel-Rémusat, Eugène Jacquet, and Eugène Burnouf. Yet Humboldt’s French reception, while including some of his important linguistic studies, all but omitted their philosophical concerns and underlying principles. Typical is the review of Humboldt’s groundbreaking treatise from 1827, “On the Dual” that appeared in the Nouvelle Revue Germanique, I: 378–381 (1829), where the reviewer blended out entirely the philosophical intent and key argument of the piece (Ibid. 105/6) and thus distorted beyond recognition Humboldt’s integration of linguistic research and philosophy of language, which lies at the heart of his linguistic enterprise. It is only in the late twentieth century that the philosopher of language and linguist Humboldt has been discovered in France by men like Henri Meschonic, Jean Rousseau or Denis Thouard (For their publications see, Bösch 2006, pp. 239f, 243f, and 247f). Surprisingly, Humboldt’s name has been notoriously absent in the extensive debates prompted by Jacques Derrida and his Grammatology concerning the role of writing (écriture) for an understanding of language and culture and its alleged neglect in the Western tradition because of its inherent phonocentrism. For Humboldt had in effect produced, on the basis of his extensive study of the world’s different writing systems past and present, a comprehensive theory of writing that does not fit into the rubrics of phonocentrism or eurocentrism. Writing constituted in his view an essential part of language, the material embodiment of the specific formative principle a language employs to construct meaning rather than being the mere representational mirror of speech. For him, the development of language and writing were mutually dependent on each other (On this issue see the extensive and groundbreaking work by Messling 2008).

There was an early presence of Humboldtian ideas in American linguistics and ethnology dating back to the early nineteenth century in which Humboldt himself had played an active role. Its beginning is marked by Stephen S. Duponceau’s (1760–1844) programmatic report to the American Philosophical Society in Philadelphia in 1819 on the study the American Indian languages in the “Transactions of the historical and literary committee of the American Philosophical Society”, the founding document of American linguistics, with its reference to Humboldt (Transactions of the historical and literary committee of the American Philosophical Society, vol. 1, Philadelphia, 1819) and the ensuing correspondence between the two men. There is in addition Humboldt’s important correspondence with the second founder of American linguistics, John Pickering (1777–1846) who wrote a lengthy article on the American Indian languages for Francis Lieber’s Encyclopedia Americana where specific reference is made to Humboldt’s work (see Pickering 1831). Francis Lieber (1798–1872), the creator and editor of the Encyclopedia Americana, besides corresponding with the German linguist, followed Humboldtian principles or what he understood of them in his own linguistic work on the American languages (see for example Lieber’s “The Plan of Thought in American Languages”, in H. R. Schoolcraf’s History and Statistics of the Indian Tribes of the United State, vol. ii, 346–349, Washington, 1853). The most prominent American ethnologist and linguist of the second half of the nineteenth century, Daniel G. Brinton (1837–1899) was well acquainted with Humboldt’s work on the American Indian tongues, as far as it was known then. He viewed his own researches as following the path that Humboldt had first laid out. There are references to Humboldt throughout his work, he translated an unpublished treatise of his “On the American Verb System” and regarded him as founder of “the Philosophy of Language” (Brinton 1890, p. 332.). Yet what he and his followers understood by this term was confined largely to the methodological principles that governed Humboldt’s typological and comparative studies and excluded essential dimensions and the actual philosophical concerns expressed in his writings.

A similar process of partial appropriation has been characteristic also of the philosophers who paid serious attention to Humboldt’s views, such as Ernst Cassirer (1923–29), Martin Heidegger (1927, 1959), and more recently Bruno Liebrucks (1965), Hans-Georg Gadamer (1960, 1965, 1972), and Jürgen Habermas (1985, 1988, 1991). It is only in the last decades that Humboldt’s philosophical and linguistic writings have become a focal point of attention in their own right. Linguists of various orientations, philosophers, historians and literary scholars of different nationalities alike have examined Humboldt’s philosophy and linguistic ideas by placing them into a variety of different contexts.

1. Humboldt’s Life

1.1 Education and Early Writings

Humboldt’s father was of German middle class background whose family had been granted the status of nobility with the title of “Freiherr” (Baron) in 1738 whereas his mother (maiden name de Colomb) was of middle class, mainly French Huguenot and German-Scottish extraction. Neither Wilhelm nor his younger brother Alexander (1769–1859) ever attended a public primary or secondary school. Instead their father, and after his untimely death in 1779, their mother employed private tutors at the family estate in Tegel who were recruited from among the leading figures of the Berlin Enlightenment scene. Among them were Joachim Heinrich Campe, well-known educational writer, Ernst Ferdinand Klein and Christian von Dohm, two leading political thinkers who brought enlightenment orientation and ideas to the areas of constitutional law and public policy. Johann Jakob Engel, the renowned philosopher and writer, introduced the young Humboldt to modern and contemporary European philosophy in the areas of logic, aesthetics, metaphysics and language.

With Engel, Humboldt read and discussed works by Leibniz, Hume, Locke, Harris, Herder, Condillac and Rousseau. Yet at the same time both Humboldt brothers were deeply immersed in the study of the Greeks. Wilhelm’s first publication (at the age of 19) dealt with Socrates and Plato’s idea of divinity (“Socrates und Plato über die Gottheit”) in which he defended the enlightenment ideal of natural religion. As adolescents the two brothers began frequenting the literary salon of Markus and Henriette Herz in Berlin where they came into contact with intellectual luminaries of the city. It was here that Wilhelm first met Moses Mendelssohn’s eldest daughter Brendel Veit, the subsequent Dorothea Schlegel, Schiller’s future spouse Charlotte von Lengefeld and his own bride-to-be, Karoline von Dacheröden. After only one disappointing semester at the narrow and provincial Prussian University at Frankurt-on-Oder, the Humboldt brothers transferred to the University of Göttingen in 1788, arguably the most distinguished University in all the German-speaking territories at the time. Besides jurisprudence, Wilhelm studied classical philology with Christian Gottlieb Heyne, natural science with Georg Christoph Lichtenberg (who counted him “among the brightest intellects” he had ever met), and immersed himself deeply in the study of the philosophy of Immanuel Kant. In Göttingen he met and became friends with August Wilhelm Schlegel, George Forster and the philosopher Friedrich Jacobi. In August 1789 shortly after the outbreak of the French Revolution and accompanied by his former teacher Campe, Wilhelm visited Paris, the Rhineland and Switzerland and captured his observations in a travel journal that he kept (GS Vol 14: 76–236). In response to the challenge of the encounters with Forster and Jakobi, Humboldt was lead to articulating his own philosophical position in “On Religion” (“Über Religion”, GS Vol 1: 45–76), his first important writing.

After having successfully passed his examinations in jurisprudence, he entered the Prussian civil service in Berlin in January of 1790 and was appointed councillor (Legationsrat) soon afterwards. But he found the position and the prospects it entailed uninspiring and boring and already in May 1791 decided to take leave from the service. In June he married Karoline von Dacheröden and spent the following years on his wife’s family estates in Thuringia in the vicinity of Jena devoting his entire time and energy to his scholarly and philosophical pursuits while at the same time establishing life-long personal and intellectual ties with the poets Johann Wolfgang von Goethe and Friedrich Schiller. He also befriended the famed Homeric scholar Friedrich August Wolf, author of the Prolegomena ad Homerum, and debated politics and political philosophy with the statesman and Archbishop-Elector of Mainz, Karl Theodor von Dalberg. In 1792 he spelled out his views on key issues of the social and political philosophy of the period in a series of articles for the Berlinische Monatsschrift and for Schiller’s journal Neue Thalia. Among these were the “Ideas concerning constitutions occasioned by the new French Constitution” and the programmatic “What should be the Limits of the Government’s Concern for the Well Being of its Citizens?”

These writings formed part of a book-length manuscript that, because of the fear of censorship for its radical liberal position, was published only posthumously in 1851 under the title Versuch die Grenzen der Wirksamkeit des Staates zu bestimmen (Engl. transl., 1854: The Spheres and Duties of Government). It represents the classical statement of the liberal humanist tradition in German political thought which, however, seems to have found a more appreciative readership in nineteenth century England (Matthew Arnold, John Stuart Mill), than in Humboldt’s native Germany. The Marxists (Lasalle) and conservative nationalists (Treitschke) alike rejected his ideas and his staunch defense of the rights of the individual. John Stuart Mill, on the other hand, used a quote from Humboldt’s text as motto for his own treatise On Liberty.

1.2 Writings and Studies in Jena

In June 1794 Humboldt settled in Jena at a time when the city and its University became the center of German idealist philosophy and the Romantic movement and entertained contacts with the philosopher Fichte and with Friedrich and August Wilhelm Schlegel. He assumed the role of philosophical adviser and critical collaborator of Goethe and especially Schiller. Through his discerning criticism he furthered the production of some of their important works, for example Schiller’s Briefe über die Ästhetische Erziehung des Menschen of 1795 (Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Man), and his philosophical poems as well as Goethe’s epic Herrmann und Dorothea and his novel Wilhelm Meister. For Schiller’s newly created journal, Die Horen, he authored two important contributions, “Ueber den Geschlechts-Unterschied” (“On Sexual Difference”) where he formulated a gender theory on the basis of contemporary natural philosophy and “Ueber männliche und weibliche Form” (“On the Male and Female Form”) where he extended this theory into the realm of the arts and culture (1794, 1795, GS Vol 1: 311–34, 335–69). While in Jena he joined forces with his brother Alexander and Goethe and together the three men engaged in a study of the evolving new discipline of comparative anatomy at the University. Humboldt used the insights he had gained from this study to create a comprehensive blueprint for a future comparative anthropology (“Plan einer vergleichenden Anthropologie” (1797, GS Vol 1: 377–410). But only years later when he attempted to lay the foundation for his newly conceived discipline of general and comparative linguistics, he would return to it and rework his ideas.

Guided by his anthropological interests, however, Humboldt became involved in the problem of what constituted national character and how precisely one could within the context of modern Europe determine its essential features. Thus in 1797 he composed an extensive study in a genre of what we might call today “cultural and historical criticism” entitled: Das achtzehnte Jahrhundert (The Eighteenth Century, GS Vol 2: 1–112). He would soon have the opportunity to gather his own observations on those issues, when in the fall of 1797 he and his family moved to Paris where they would remain until the summer of 1801. This extended sojourn was interrupted by two extended journeys to Spain, from November 1799 to April 1800 and again in the spring and summer of 1801, the purpose of the latter being a visit to the Basque country in order to study the Basque language and culture.

1.3 A Linguistic Turn in Paris

During his Parisian sojourn Humboldt met and had contact with the foremost French politicians, scholars and intellectuals of the period such as Sieyès, Tracy, Roederer, Garat, Cabanis, Degérando, La Romiguière, Dupont de Nemours, Benjamin Constant and Madame de Staël whose literary salon he frequented. He attended meetings of the Institut National (as the Academie Française was called then) and debated Kantian philosophy with the leading French philosophers (GS Vol 14: 483–87), visited the theater regularly, and from a cultural anthropologist’s point of view, he observed and analyzed its different forms and varieties from the Comédie Française and the Théatre de la République to the Vaudeville. Meanwhile he studied and commented upon effectively the entire canon of classical and modern,—i.e., eighteenth century—French literature and philosophy, for example Rousseau, Diderot and Madame de Staël. His comments on these writers and his astute critique of the philosophy of Condillac and his followers found in his Parisian diaries offer important clues for an understanding of his own philosophical position. Goethe meanwhile published two essays by him on French theater and art in his journal Die Propyläen. Humboldt’s Parisian diaries reveal the extraordinary scope and intensity of his involvement with the complex cultural, social, political and cultural life-world of France under the Directoire (GS Vol 14: 361–643; Vol 15: 1–46).[1]

In Paris, Humboldt completed his major work on aesthetics, his Aesthetische Versuche I. Ueber Goethes Herrman und Dorothea (Essays in Aesthetics I. On Goethe’s Herrmann und Dorothea) in 1799. In the same year he also published in French for the benefit of Madame de Staël and her circle a concise summary of its major arguments with emphasis on his new theory of the imagination in the Parisian journal Magasin Encyclopédique. A decisive turning point in his intellectual career occurred with his discovery and pioneering investigations of the Basque language, an idiom whose origin and structure had defied hitherto all attempts at an explanation by historians, philosophers and linguists following conventional methodologies. He disproved all existing theories about its descent and affiliation but instead of advancing new theories he decided first to set out to study the language itself using all possible means at his disposal, from written documents, native informants, statistics, historical, ethnological and sociological information to inventing and actually conducting what is known today as “field work”. His Basque studies coincided with his formulation of a new conception of language questioning and defying the representational view of language that had been dominant in Western thinking from Aristotle all the way to the empiricist and rationalist thinkers of his day. This new conception would find its expression in Humboldt’s philosophy of language and linguistics that from this moment on became of central concern to him.

1.4 Rome: the World of Antiquity and the Languages of the New World

From 1803 until the end of 1808 he served as Prussian envoy (Minister Resident) to the Vatican in Rome, a post whose diplomatic chores he dispatched with skill and efficiency leaving him enough time for his own work. Besides his Basque studies he turned his attention again to ancient Greek language and literature, translating from the poetry of Pindar (Olympic Odes), Aischylos tragedy Agamemnon as well as smaller pieces from other authors (GS Vol 8: 3–270). The introduction to his German version of Agamemnon includes a succinct statement of his theory of translation where he formulated a new approach to the problem of translation and developed concepts that have been taken up again only in modern (Walter Benjamin) and contemporary translation theories. But Humboldt’s life in the Eternal City also lead him to reflect deeply about the fate of ancient culture and its history, a concern that found expression in his two essays “Latium und Hellas” 1806, and “Geschichte des Verfalls und Untergangs der griechischen Freistaaten” (“Latium and Hellas”, “History of the Decline and Fall of the Greek Republics”) 1807–1808 (GS Vol 3: 136–70; 171–218). Under the impact of Schiller’s untimely death in 1805 he composed the elegy “Rome” (published in 1806), the best known of his poems. His stay in Rome unexpectedly added yet another dimension to his linguistic interests that would become significant for his future linguistic research endeavors: the native languages of the Americas. He had already asked his brother Alexander before he set sail for the New World to be on the lookout for linguistic materials during his travels in South and Central America. In Rome he had the opportunity to meet and befriend the former chief of the Jesuit Missions in the Americas and head of the Papal Quirinal Library, the Spaniard Lorenzo Hervás (1753–1809). His new acquaintance was himself a renowned linguist with whose work (for example his Catálogo des las lenguas de las naciones conocidas, 1787) Humboldt was already familiar. He was given the chance to consult and eventually to copy the entire collection of Hervás’ extensive holdings of Native American grammars and materials. These would form the basis for his own study of the American languages. While he was perusing his linguistic researches, Humboldt’s residence in the Villa Gregoriana became a popular gathering place for the members of the European artist colony, which harbored figures like Bertel Thorwaldsen, Christian David Rauch, Gottlieb Schlick, Karl Ludwig Fernow and Johann Georg Zoega. Among the European visitors who came to see Humboldt were Madame de Staël, August Wilhelm Schlegel and the English poet Coleridge. Although he lost two of his sons in Rome (of the Humboldt’s eight children three died at an early age) he considered the Roman years as the happiest of his life.

1.5 Return to Germany: Public Education and Politics

After Napoleon’s decisive victory at Jena and Auerstedt and the resulting collapse of Prussia Humboldt returned to Germany in the fall of 1808 and reluctantly accepted the position as head of the section for ecclesiastic affairs and education in the ministry of the interior. Yet in the short period from 1809 to 1810 he was able to institute a radical reform of the entire Prussian educational system from elementary and secondary school to the University which was based on the principle of free and universal education. His idea of combining both teaching and research in one institution that guided him in establishing the University of Berlin in 1810 (today’s Humboldt University) and the structures he created for this institution would become the model not only throughout Germany but also for the modern university in most Western countries. Predictably, Humboldt soon ran into difficulties with the established landed aristocracy in Prussia when he insisted that the University be endowed with landed property in order to insure its independence from the state and the changing winds of politics. After quarreling with his superiors he was asked to resign his post and in 1810 was sent to Vienna as ambassador where, however, he soon became instrumental in convincing Austria to join the Grand Coalition of the European powers against Napoleon. But during the initial diplomatic lull in Vienna he still found time for his linguistic studies. His recently discovered Viennese note books contain sketches of grammars for several South and Central American languages written in French that were intended to become part of his brother’s American Travel account. In 1811 he produced his first extensive philosophical and methodological statement, the Essai sur les langues du Nouveau Continent (Essay on the languages of the New Continent) that was to introduce his study of the Indian grammars of the Americas (GS Vol 3: 300–341).

During the negotiations for the first and second Paris peace treaty and subsequently at the Congress of Vienna he was successful in defending Jewish rights but failed in his attempt to secure a liberal constitution for the German Confederation (Deutscher Bund) to be based on a statute of fundamental principles (Grundgesetz) that would have guaranteed the rights of all citizen. After representing Prussia at the newly constituted Bundestag in Frankfurt on Main for a short time, he was appointed Prussian ambassador to the Saint James Court in London where, besides studying Sanskrit at the British Museum Library in his spare time, he was able, with the help of the Banking House of Rothschild, to organize a financial aid program for the reconstruction of the war-ravished Prussian economy. He returned to Berlin to the ministry of the Interior to head a committee to draft a new Prussian constitution in 1819. But his carefully designed comprehensive plan for introducing a liberal constitution (GS Vol 2: 389–455) that would have transformed Prussia into a genuine constitutional monarchy did not have a chance to be adopted. When Humboldt strongly resisted the repressive measures taken by the royal government in the wake of the Karlsbad decrees and in the ensuing assault on civil liberties, King Friedrich Wilhelm III on New Years Eve of 1819 summarily dismissed him from all his duties. His dismissal marked not only the end of his political career but the de facto elimination in Prussia of the chances for the development of a true civil society, the creation of democratic institutions and thus for the middle classes to participate actively in the political life of the country. Aside from a prolonged visit to Paris and London in 1828, Humboldt spent the rest of his life at the family estate in Tegel which he had renowned architect Karl Friedrich Schinkel remodel in classicist style. There he concentrated his energy on his scholarly and linguistic work.

1.6 Later Writings: General and Comparative Linguistics

Already in June 1820 he was able to submit to the Berlin Academy a bold plan for the creation of the new discipline of comparative linguistics and to outline the philosophy and methodology on which it was to be built in a paper entitled: “On the Comparative Study of Language and its Relation to the Different Periods of Language Development” (“Ueber das vergleichende Sprachstudium in Beziehung auf die verschiedenen Epochen der Sprachentwicklung”, GS Vol 4: 1–34). In this compact yet highly complex presentation he offered a brief summary of his previous endeavors and proceeded to lay down the principles and the blueprint for a comprehensive research program that would guide his work during the following years but at the same time defined the tasks of a future linguistics. Humboldt viewed the function of language as not limited simply to representing or communicating existing ideas and concepts but as “formative organ of thought” (das bildende Organ des Gedankens, GS Vol 6: 152) and thus instrumental also in the production of new concepts that would not come into being without it. The differences between languages for him were not those of “sounds and signs” (Schällen und Zeichen) but ultimately of “differences of representing the world” (Verschiedenheit der Weltansichten), GS Vol 4: 27. Therefore it seemed obvious to Humboldt that a categorical separation between philosophy of language and empirical linguistics as it developed during the nineteenth century and still exists today, was unacceptable. For not only could there be no discipline of linguistics without a conceptual base and firm philosophical grasp of its many-faceted object of inquiry but, Humboldt maintained, empirical research into actual language use in different languages with quite diverging structures would provide the philosopher with concrete insights into the nature of human language that would otherwise not be attainable. One is reminded here of Kant’s dictum that “concepts without intuition” (Anschauung, i.e., empirical content) “are empty and that intuitions without concepts are blind.”

His wide-ranging and ambitious empirical investigations into the cosmos of human languages covered practically the entire globe. Alexander von Humboldt said about his brother that it had been granted to him

to penetrate more deeply into the structure of a larger number of languages as probably have ever been grasped by one human mind. (Humboldt 1836: viii)

But Humboldt did not labor by himself in isolation, as some of his interpreters have claimed to this very day, but communicated with and entertained lively contacts with leading scholars in both Europe and America: with, for example, Franz Bopp in Berlin, August Wilhelm Schlegel in Bonn, Jean-François Champollion and Jean-Pierre Rémusat[2] in Paris, Alexander Johnston in London and Peter S. Du Ponceau and John Pickering in Philadelphia and Boston in the United States. Humboldt himself has utilized and understood his correspondence with the leading scholars of the world as an integral part of his ongoing research work.

He managed, with the help of his brother Alexander initially, to acquire what was probably the largest collection of linguistic materials in Europe for his time. There was in effect no language group on the globe that did not attract his attention. Among the European and Indo-European languages Humboldt knew and studied classical Greek and Latin, Sanskrit, all of the Romance languages, English, Basque, Old Icelandic, Lithuanian, Polish, Slovenian, Serbo-Croatian, Armenian but also Hungarian. He was familiar with Hebrew, Arabic and Coptic (of which he wrote a grammar). From among the Asian languages he studied Chinese, Japanese, Siamese and Tamil. Yet in the center of his work stood, besides Basque (he is considered the founder of Basque Studies), the native languages of South, Central and North America, and increasingly from 1827–28 the languages of the Pacific from the East Coast of Africa to Hawai‘i and the South Sea Islands. These form what we call today the Austronesian language group whose existence Humboldt was the first to demonstrate conclusively. Among the papers in his remains we find studies, notes, analyses, observations and materials relating to well over two hundred languages. In his private and public life he mastered and used (besides his native German) French, English, Italian and Spanish.

A self-imposed commitment to report on the progress of his research efforts to the Berlin Academy at regular intervals induced him to devise his own specific style of presentation that allowed him freely and creatively to combine elements of the philosophical essay with those of a scholarly exposition. Among the important of his academy addresses marking the progress and direction of his investigations belong his “On the Task of the Historian” (“Ueber die Aufgabe des Geschichtsschreibers”) of 1821 (GS Vol 4: 35–56); “On the Origin of Grammatical Forms and their Influence on the Development of Ideas” (“Ueber das Entstehen der grammatischen Formen und ihren Einfluss auf die Ideeentwicklung”) of 1822 (GS Vol 4: 285–313); “On Alphabetic Script and its Relation to the Structure of Language” (“Ueber die Buchstabenschrift und ihren Zusammenhang mit dem Sprachbau”) of 1824 (GS Vol 5: 107–133); “On the Grammatical Structure of the Chinese Language” (“Ueber den grammatischen Bau der Chinesischen Sprache”) of 1826 (GS Vol 5: 309–325); “On the Dual Form” (“Ueber den Dualis”) of 1827 (GS Vol 6: 4–30); “On the Languages of the South Sea Island” (“Ueber die Sprachen der Südseeinseln”) of 1828 (GS Vol 6: 37–51); and two presentations on the Indian Bhagavad-Gita poem (Ueber die Bhagavd-Gita) of 1826 (GS Vol 5: 158–89; 325–44). These and his other presentations formed part of the published proceedings of the Berlin Academy.

His paper “On the Task of the Historian”, besides dealing with the problems the historian has to confront in writing history, offers a theory of historical research that is augmented by observations on the nature of historical understanding. The piece occupies a special place in the development of the hermeneutics of the human sciences. The historian Droysen called Humboldt “the Bacon of the historical sciences” in his influential Historik (theory of historical studies) and some of his own concepts and distinctions echo Humboldt’s formulations (Droysen 1958: 324). Whereas Droysen speaks of the method of the historian as “understanding by investigation” (forschendes Verstehen), Humboldt sets off historical understanding from mere deductive rational procedures by calling it an assimilation of the investigative capability (forschende Kraft) and the object under investigation (GS Vol 4: 39). Furthermore, with his notion of a “preexisting basis of understanding” (“vorgängige Grundlage des Begreifens”) Humboldt clearly anticipated Heidegger’s and Gadamer’s respective notions of an ontological or historical pre-understanding as necessary condition of all formal understanding and interpretation in the human sciences (GS Vol 4: 48), even though Gadamer in his Truth and Method gravely misrepresents the hermeneutic dimensions of Humboldt’s thought omitting the fact that for Humboldt (and Schleiermacher) understanding was grounded in language and linguisticality and was perceived by them as the correlative of the act of speaking.

In 1830 Humboldt edited and published his correspondence with the poet Schiller and included a lengthy essay “On Schiller and the Path of his Intellectual Development” (“Ueber Schiller und den Gang seiner Geistesentwicklung”, GS Vol 6: 492–527). In the same year appeared also an extensive essay on the late Goethe in the form of a review of the concluding part of the poet’s Italian Journey that had been published the previous year. There he attempted, as he had done before in his Schiller essay, to interpret the various sides of the poet from one central point of view: this time from the poet’s perception of art and nature (“Rezension von Goethes Zweitem römischen Aufenthalt”, GS Vol 6: 528–550). During the remainder of his life most of his time and energy was spent on what was to be his magnum opus: a monumental study of the Kavi Language on the island of Java within the context of the entire Austronesian language group of the Pacific. But he was only able to complete the “Introduction” and Book 1 of the work. His research associate Buschmann published these parts in 1836, constituting the first volume of what came to be known as Humboldt’s Kawi Werk (Kavi-Work). Buschmann also edited and published the remaining two volumes in 1838 and 1839. About this work the American linguist Bloomfield wrote:

The second volume of Humboldt’s great treatise founded the comparative grammar of the Malayo-Polynesian language family. (Bloomfield 1933: 19)

At the behest of Alexander von Humboldt, who had written a “Preface” to the entire work, a separate edition of the “Introduction” was brought to publication to serve as a memorial to the deceased, its text shortened and adjusted by the editor to its new purpose which made it appear as an independent treatise containing a summary of Humboldt’s theoretical views on language. Therefore, the word “Introduction” was dropped from its title altogether: The Diversity of Human Language-Structure and its Influence on the intellectual and spiritual Development of Mankind (Ueber die Verschiedenheit des menschlichen Sprachbaus und seinen Einfluss auf die geistige Entwickelung des Menschengeschlechts) (Berlin, 1836). This text, often confused with the “Introduction” proper or even with the whole work, became the single most important text for the Humboldt reception throughout the nineteenth and much of the twentieth century.[3] While in this text Humboldt elaborated broadly on his understanding of language and human speech, it is no longer evident that he intended it as a clearing of the ground for the large-scale empirical investigations that were to make up the body of the work. Yet from a strictly philosophical perspective this text does not measure up in its organization, articulation of issues or its philosophical stringency to some of Humboldt’s earlier posthumous treatises. These, however, were not published until the twentieth century. Among these groundbreaking works (of which no English translations yet exist) must be counted the Grundzüge des allgemeinen Sprachtypus (Fundamentals of the Linguistic Prototype) and Vom grammatischen Baue der Sprachen (On the Grammatical Structure of Languages). It is only in the light of twentieth century linguistics, anthropology and philosophy, that is, after Saussure, Cassirer, Jakobson, Whorf, Chomsky and Wittgenstein, that the true scope of Humboldt’s linguistic philosophy has become visible and its actuality been perceived. During the nineteenth century Humboldt was for the representatives of the academically established discipline of linguistics with its positivistic historicist and strictly Indo-European orientation nothing but the odd man out. What separated him from the mainstream was his philosophically grounded understanding of language and linguistics and his decidedly non-Eurocentric orientation, which preserved the enlightenment Universalist tradition by providing it with a new philosophical base.

Before he died Humboldt bequeathed his entire collection of linguistic materials, including his own manuscripts, to the Royal Prussian Library in Berlin so that it would be accessible to the public for further research. Yet soon after his death in 1835 the integrity of the collection was violated, its contents were divided and dispersed and many items sent to different locations. Thus some of Humboldt’s books, with his marginal comments and annotations, could still be found in general circulation in libraries of the former East Germany. It was also wrongly believed until recently that the greater part of the collection, including Humboldt’s own manuscripts, was destroyed in Berlin or otherwise lost during the last months of World War 2. Throughout the nineteenth and most of the twentieth centuries with few exceptions, his papers did not attract the curiosity of professional linguists whose attention was focused mainly on Indo-European languages. Astonishingly, the extensive body of his posthumous works and papers was not ever systematically examined or properly catalogued, let alone studied in depth until recently. As a consequence, all existing editions have virtually excluded Humboldt’s empirical work, a situation that will be remedied with the appearance of the comprehensive critical edition of Humboldt’s linguistic works that is under way (Humboldt 1994–).

2. Examining Humboldt’s Writings: Contours, Scope, and Categories

Reflecting the extraordinary range of his intellectual interests and concerns, the corpus of Humboldt’s writings consists of a wide spectrum of diverse types and genres of texts of which only a small portion was ever published during his lifetime. Until this day all editions of his works have remained incomplete. His texts consist of philosophical reflections, fragments, studies of varying types and length, notes, diaries, as well as entire treatises and monographs with themes ranging from political theory, anthropology, aesthetics, educational theory, literature and history to hermeneutics, ethnology, and last but not least, to philosophy of language and linguistics. Not to be omitted are the political memoranda produced at the time Humboldt held public office, many of which must be counted among his outstanding literary and intellectual achievements. There is in addition also a sizable corpus of translations from the works of Lucretius, Pindar, Aeschylus, Aristophanes and others (GS Vol 8) and of non-Western works such as the Bhagavad Gita as well as his own poetic productions (GS Vol 9). Last but not least, must be considered Humboldt’s extensive and extraordinarily rich correspondence that he maintained with a large number of the important personalities of the age throughout his entire life. Noteworthy among these are his correspondence with his wife Caroline (7 vols.), his brother Alexander, Franz Bopp, Karl-Gustav Brinkmann, Charlotte Diede (Briefe an eine Freundin), Friedrich Gentz, Johann Wolfgang von Goethe, Henriette Herz, Friedrich Jacobi, Christian Gottfried Körner, Friedrich Schiller, August Wilhelm Schlegel, Germaine de Staël, Friedrich Welcker and Friedrich Wolf. An entire group of his correspondence consists of exchanges with scholars in different parts of the world and is concerned with specific issues and problems. The bulk of these communications can be found among his extant linguistic papers where they have come down to us in the order in which Humboldt filed them. His political correspondence forms a separate category and has been published as part of the Academy edition in GS Vol 16, 17.

Among his published writings only the Ideen zu einem Versuch die Grenzen der Wirksamkeit des Staats zu bestimmen (The Spheres and Duties of Government) 1792, the Aesthetische Versuche I (Essays on Aesthetics I) 1799, Prüfung der Untersuchungen über die Urbewohner Hispaniens (On the Early Inhabitants of Spain) 1821, and the Kawi-Einleitung (Introduction to the Kavi Language) 1836, constitute complete works in the traditional sense. The majority of his writings consist of essays, articles or presentations produced for specific occasions on the one hand and of a large body of sketches, studies, notes, expositions and entire treatises on the other. Humboldt used the medium of writing as a vehicle of intellectual exploration to untangle the complex and diverse aspects of a specific problem or set of problems rather than attempting to state a fixed and definite position or opinion, and he would often bring to bear different view-points onto the matter at hand and utilize varying formulations. It is characteristic of his intellectual style that he would with consistent philosophical and methodological astuteness develop a specific type of questioning that made it possible for him to bring to view particular phenomena or sets of problems in their inherent complexity. What lends a sense of unity to the large variety of his writings devoted to so many different domains of knowledge, is his consistency in articulating questions, in applying a specific viewpoint and perspective, and a recurring use of specific key concepts and their concomitant terminology.

3. Humboldt’s Approach to Anthropology, Political Philosophy and Aesthetics

In his essay “On Religion” (1789) Humboldt drew the outlines of a historical typology that would make it possible to study the relationship between religion and state power from the Greek city-states to present times and envisaged the purpose of the modern state as enabling its citizens to realize fully their “human vocation” (Bestimmung als Mensch, GS Vol 1: S.54). It would be necessary for this purpose, Humboldt thought, to accord a positive value to human sensuality and give it a freer and more creative rein. Consequently, he rejected the traditional dualistic view of human nature with its mind/body dichotomy and the Cartesian notion of the human spirit as a kind of ghost in the machine. Instead, he maintained, mind and body form a vital unity and what we call spirit (Geist) for him was nothing but “the finest ramification of sensuality.” The path to self-determination that Kant had demanded in his moral philosophy must therefore proceed through the cultivation of man’s sensuality (Sinnlichkeit). Hence the realm of aesthetics is granted a key function in any attempt to overcome the inherited mind/body dichotomy, in which Humboldt saw a major obstacle in the path of achieving individual self-determination. Schiller, in the central sections of his Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Man of 1795 would take up Humboldt’s ideas. In the twentieth century members of the Frankfurt School, such as Herbert Marcuse in his book Eros and Civilization, would infuse these ideas with a renewed sense of relevancy and importance by linking them to Freudian psychology in their “Critical Theory” and philosophy. In his two contributions for Schiller’s journal Die Horen, Humboldt took the additional step of characterizing sexual difference as basic biological and anthropological givens of human culture and society.

His political writings from this period take issue with the eighteenth century absolutist idea of the state while at the same time offering a critical analysis of the political situation in contemporary France. Humboldt tried to explain the unsuccessful attempts by the French National Assembly to create a lasting constitution and civic order by its unrealistic absolutist reliance on principles of abstract reason. As early as 1791 he predicted the fate of the new French constitution when he argued that “constitutions cannot be grafted upon human beings as sprigs on a tree.” Where time and nature had not prepared the ground, he argued “it would be like tying blossoms on trees with pieces of twine: the first sunlight at noon will scorch them to death” (GS Vol 1: 80). In order to safeguard the freedom of the individual from government encroachment, Humboldt proposed to limit the functions and the authority of the state. This included the state’s endeavors to provide actively for the welfare of its citizens whenever this would cripple or hinder the free development of the individual’s own potential for self-realization. For the “true end of man”, Humboldt wrote, was “the highest and most harmonious development of his powers to a complete and consistent whole”. To reach that goal, freedom was the indispensable condition (GS Vol 1: 107). Yet the free development of the individuals, their self-realization, or Bildung, their “self-culture”, as the American Transcendentalists would translate the term, for Humboldt necessarily implied a social and political dimension. Self-culture demanded “a manifold of situations” (eine Mannigfaltigkeit der Situationen) for the individual citizens, so that they would be able to enter freely into relationships of association and cooperation with one another, because, Humboldt argued, humans can realize their potential as individuals only in society. For this reason, Humboldt maintained, a government should not be evaluated solely by its legal system that granted freedom and liberty to its citizens but equally by how much and to what degree it helped assure the creation of such a manifold of situations and opportunities for the individual citizens to develop their human capacities in actual reality.

In his Aesthetische Versuche I (Essays in Aethetics I) of 1799 Humboldt employed an unusual and original approach that enabled him to combine successfully three different tasks, namely a close interpretation of Goethe’s epic poem Hermann und Dorothea, the laying of the foundations of a new aesthetics and poetics proceeding from Kantian transcendental principles and finally the formulation of a theory of literature and literary genres. His starting point is the question:

What makes it possible for an artist to produce aesthetic effects? (GS Vol 2: 318)

Combining a Kantian questioning from the Critique of Judgment with the performative model of the human mind presented by Fichte in his Science of Knowledge (Wissenschaftslehre), Humboldt advanced a theory of the imagination (Einbildungskraft) that enabled him to explain aesthetic effects as an interactive process involving the triad of artist, work of art and recipient.

Art in its most basic sense is to be understood as the transformation of what is real into an image (Das Wirkliche in ein Bild zu verwandeln, GS Vol 2: 126, de transformer en image ce qui, dans la nature est réel”, GS Vol 1: 1). The art of the poet, more specifically, “consists in his ability or competence (Fertigkeit) to render the imagination creative according to rules”, to incite the imagination through the imagination (GS Vol 2: 127) and thereby create “a live act of communication” (lebendige Mitteilung) (GS Vol 2: 132). Among all the arts poetry occupies a special position in Humboldt’s view, because the material from which it is fashioned is not like ordinary material, as the stone or marble the sculptor uses, but instead consists of something already endowed with form, namely language. Poetry therefore “is art through language”. Through his imagination the poet creates works that represent “a world” embodying a totality of their own that differs in principle from the world of reality. In his definition of art Humboldt no longer looks at artworks as objects in order to gather from them a list of quasi objective qualities from which the nature of art could then be derived, but instead focuses on the process of aesthetic production and the rules by which it is governed and on how these rules are revealed in the poet’s art. In other words, a generative one has replaced the traditional mimetic or objective concept of art.

4. Some Essentials of Humboldt’s Understanding of Language

Subsequently, in his linguistics and philosophy of language Humboldt would advance a similar generative view of human language and speech. Because he understood linguistic form as procedural rule and direction, as forma formans, (Form von Form, GS Vol 5: 455) rather than as some kind of material shape or fixed objective entity (Form von Materie), the structure and organization of a language for him could not be gathered from the actual verbal forms of its construction, its grammar. It was to be obtained rather from an analysis of the procedures language employs in its generation of speech (Verfahrensweise der Sprache bei der Erzeugung der Rede). For, as Humboldt put it

… language in actuality only exists in spoken discourse, its grammar and dictionary are hardly even comparable to its dead skeleton (Die Sprache liegt nur in der verbundenen Rede, Grammatik und Wörterbuch sind kaum ihrem todten Gerippe vergleichbar, GS Vol 6: 147)

How such an analysis of the process of speech production is to proceed, what it encompasses, what it is able to achieve and how it will enable the linguist to study and describe different natural languages, Humboldt has discussed in great depth and detail in several of his larger linguistic treatises, as for example in his Fundamentals of the Linguistic Prototype (Grundzüge des allgemeinen Sprachtypus, GS Vol 5: 400ff.)

To understand his approach to linguistics and to appreciate the empirical linguistic investigations that will follow from it, it is necessary to take a closer look at his conception of language at its formative stage where philosophy and linguistics intersect in a distinct manner. During Humboldt’s Jena period the problem of the relationship between thinking, language and reality that seemed to have been settled once and for all by rationalist (Descartes, Leibniz) and empiricist (Locke, Condillac) thinkers alike, became an open question again for Humboldt, who looked at it from the new perspective that Kantian and Fichtean philosophy had opened up. In 1795 he wrote a series of sixteen theses on On Thinking and Speaking (Ueber Denken und Sprechen, GS Vol 7: 581–83) in response to a recent essay by Fichte “On the origin of language and human language ability”. In this, his first major statement on language, he takes issue with the concept of the linguistic sign, which had been one of the cornerstones of seventeenth and eighteenth-century philosophy of language. In both the rationalist and empiricist schools of thought it was assumed that signs constituted a special class of objects outside the mind existing independently from it to which convenient labels agreed upon by society had been attached. The relationship of these signs to the mental ideas they were supposed to represent were therefore understood as “arbitrary” or “conventional”. Although empiricists and rationalists agreed that speaking required the use of signs and that without them mental operations whether they derived from sensations or not were not possible, they were unable to explain as Herder had put it, how “the sound of roundness was able to represent the idea of roundness”. But Herder himself had not been able to advance a plausible solution to the problem, either, even though he connected the origin of language with reflection (Besonnenheit), claiming that it was through reflection that humans had first created language.

5. Transcendental Semiotics: The Overturning of the Traditional Objectivist Concept of the Sign

Humboldt’s approach differs radically from that of his predecessors. “The Nature of thinking consists in reflecting”, he states in thesis 1, “that is, in the act by which the thinking subject differentiates itself from its thought” (im Unterscheiden des Denkenden vom Gedachten). This basic fact that every person can easily verify by performing such an act is the starting point of Humboldt’s deliberations. Now, to reflect we must in our mind arrest the continuous flow of impressions in order to concentrate on something, comprehend this something as a separate “unit” (Einheit), and set it as an object over against our thinking activity (thesis 2). As a next step, the mind can now proceed to compare several of these “units”, divide and combine them in different ways. In drawing the conclusion (thesis 4) from this state of affairs, Humboldt lays the ground for a radically new notion of the sign that anticipates (and points beyond) Saussure’s definition given in his Cours de Linguistique Générale. Thinking consists for Humboldt

in segmenting its own process, thereby forming whole units out of certain portions of its activity, and in setting these formations separately in opposition to one another, collectively, however, as objects, in opposition to the thinking subject.

In other words, in this process of segmentation not only are different objects are created, but with it the very subject of this thinking activity constitutes itself. Up to this point we seem to have been moving very much along the lines of Fichte’s Wissenschaftslehre—the “I” positing itself in the act of thinking—but in thesis 5, Humboldt’s argumentation takes a sudden Kantian turn:

No thinking, not even the purest, can occur without the aid from the general forms of our sensibility (allgemeinen Formen unsrer Sinnlichkeit); only through them can it be apprehended and, as it were, arrested.

What Humboldt is saying, then, is that the mental acts he has described would not have been possible without assistance from the general forms of our sensibility. But how precisely do they make these acts possible? Thesis 6 offers an unexpectedly suspenseful answer that builds up to its culmination in the very last word which is: “language”:

The sensory designations of those units, into which certain portions of our thinking are united, in order to be opposed as parts to other parts of a greater whole as objects to the subjects, is called in the broadest sense of the word: language (Sprache).

What Humboldt describes here is a dual process of segmentation: that of the mental stream of impressions and a corresponding one of sensory order, exactly what linguists today refer to as the “principle of double articulation” (Martinet 1963: 22f). Through reflection we single out “certain portions” from the unending and amorphous flow of impressions and mental images while at the same time imposing an order upon them. This imposition of order is the work of the sensory medium of language: word sounds function as structured units (Einheiten) through which we discern and secure the mental units in the flow of impressions and images. Human speech, therefore, is no longer seen by Humboldt as applying and manipulating a fixed system of arbitrary signs as was assumed by both rationalists and empiricists, but consists rather of the operation of joining together these two different sets of orders: that of the articulated sound, the signifier, and that of the “thought” or signified. Over a century later Saussure in his Cours de Linguistique Générale would define language and the linguistic sign with almost the same words. What constituted language, according to Saussure, was

the somehow mysterious fact that the thought-sound implies the divisions which are the ultimate units of linguistics. Sound and thought can be combined only by means of these units. (1916/1968: 252–3)

It is Humboldt who deserves the credit for having first discovered the triadic nature of the linguistic sign: Signification (speaking) is defined by him as the synthesis (Saussure’s combination) of sound and idea—Ton and Vorstellung.

6. The Anthropological Side of Language Production and the Humboldtian Model of Communication; Laying the Basis of Modern Structural Linguistics

But there is yet another important facet in Humboldt’s account that is lacking in Saussure and that Humboldt already had referred to in thesis 5. There he had shown the act of language production, or Articulation to be at one and the same time the constitutive act for the consciousness of self of the speaking individual. Thus there arises in the act of speaking the distinction between subject and object as mutually constitutive correlatives of this act. Subsequently, in thesis 7 we learn that besides the linguistic and epistemological angle there is still an anthropological side to this process. For language begins simultaneously with “the first act of reflection”, Humboldt argues, and

precisely when man awakens from the stupor of desire (Dumpfheit der Begierde), in which the subject devours the object, to self-consciousness, the word is there also the first impulse, as it were, which man gives himself to stand still, to look around and to orient himself.

His notion of the rise of human self-consciousness is therefore quite the opposite of Hobbes’ and particularly Hegel’s view as depicted by the latter in the life and death struggle of the master/slave dialectics in his Phenomenology of the Spirit. For Humboldt it is language instead that serves as the civilizing force leading the individual to self-consciousness and societal interaction and thus involves a positive relation to the other. In his later linguistic writings, discussed below, he developed a communicative model of human speech that can be seen as an extension and transformation of the Fichtean concept of the intersubjective “I”. In the twentieth century the philosopher Jürgen Habermas attempted to incorporate Humboldt’s model in his theory of communicative action.

Humboldt’s notion of articulation first introduced in his “On Thinking and Speaking” of 1795 formed the theoretical basis also for his empirical work into the phonemic structures of natural languages where his research anticipated modern linguists’, e.g., Trubetzkoy’s and Jakobson’s, conception of phonology. Already in 1795 he drew a clear distinction between the physical sound of nature on the one hand and the “articulated” sounds that constitute language on the other. In his empirical studies he discovered that the latter alone would form a clearly discernible “unit” (scharf zu vernehmende Einheit), capable of embodying features to allow these sounds to enter into specific relationships with each other and any other sound (GS Vol 7: 67). What this means is that for Humboldt, the individual sound of a given language can be formed only “in relation to the others” (in Beziehung auf die übrigen) that make up the entire “sound system” (Lautsystem) of that language (GS Vol 7: 67). He thought it possible and desirable to set up schemata accounting for the different classes of phonemes (Buchstabenlaute) found in the world’s languages, and the different relationships into which these may enter according to their affinities (Verwandtschaft) or their mutual opposition (“in Verschiedenheit einander gegenüberstellen” GS Vol 7: 69). In working with over a dozen native South and Central American languages, Humboldt created one such schema enabling him to describe and to compare the phonetic systems of these different languages.[4]

7. Humboldtian and Cartesian Linguistics

If linguistic signs no longer function as instruments for communicating independently existing thoughts and ideas from one mind to another, as Descartes, his followers and the empiricists believed, this raises the question of how individuals can communicate with each other through language, a question that becomes even more urgent if, as Humboldt maintained, states of consciousness cannot be transmitted from one individual to another at all, for “there can be nothing in our mind than that which is the result of its own activity” (eigne Thätigkeit) (GS Vol 5: 382). However, any communication between individuals presupposes a shared foundation: “We understand the word we hear only, because we could have said it ourselves” (GS Vol 5: 382). The words we hear and those that we utter are the stimuli for our language capacity to generate participatory responses. However, shared language capacity and linguistic competence cannot guarantee that one individual understands what the other is saying. Only through dialogue with the other can they test their understanding, amend and correct it, if necessary. Every understanding is therefore also a non-understanding, Humboldt argued. Thinking, in other words, is by its very nature tied to man’s social existence which means that it requires “a Thou that corresponds to the I”. A concept, Humboldt argued, can attain its distinctness and clarity only through its being reflected back from the intellect of another person (einer fremden Denkkraft, GS Vol 5: 380) with language as the only mediator between one intellect and another. At this point it becomes evident how radically Humboldt’s linguistic philosophy and his language studies part company with the traditional Cartesian way of understanding language. There existed for him a communicative prototype of human speech that is embedded in the structure of language itself manifesting itself in the different languages. This “prototype of all language” (Urtypus aller Sprachen) finds expression through the personal pronoun, that is, by the differentiation between the second and the third person. All speech is directed at someone and its structure cannot be understood by applying Cartesian grammatical analysis to it, because from a logical and grammatical point of view, it makes no difference whether I use the first, second or third personal pronoun, when in each case these pronouns function as the subject of a sentence. But for Humboldt I and he really are different entities, and with them, he argued, all possibilities are exhausted: because they constitute the I and the not-I. Thou is also a not I but unlike he, not in the “sphere of all beings”, but rather in another sphere of common action and interaction. In his empirical investigations Humboldt therefore paid special attention to the system of personal pronouns in a given language because it was from there that one could reconstruct the specific manifestation of the prototypal speech situation. Following this line of research in his Academy addresses “On the Dual Form” (1827) and “On the Relationship of the Adverbs of Place with the Pronoun in some Languages” (1829) Humboldt analyzed several dozen languages of different language groups from around the globe. It is in these texts that the marriage of philosophy of language and empirical linguistics that characterizes his work, can best be studied.

Cartesian linguistics is intimately connected with the notion of Universal or Philosophical Grammar and, given its revival in Chomsky’s generative approach to language and his naming of Humboldt as one of his immediate precursors, Humboldt’s relation to this tradition needs to be clarified. First of all, Humboldt was decidedly critical of all attempts to construct a system of Philosophical Grammar supposedly underlying all natural languages, because it was patterned after the concepts of Latin and French grammar and in practice had resulted in the writing of grammars that violated the nature of the Non-European languages by forcing them into the procrustean bed of a Western system, whose categories were completely alien to their own inherent structures (GS Vol 5: 355). He did not, however, reject the idea of linguistic universals. On the contrary, these constituted the backbone of his concept of linguistic variety, the fact namely that each language by its structure and formation was able to represent a specific view of the world (Weltansicht). With Kant he believed in the universality of the mental structures and Kantian categories represented for him the rules and the laws of thinking that were ultimately responsible also for the rule systems that govern our linguistic utterances. But he rejected the idea that these structures were themselves already a kind of logical grammar from which a Philosophical Grammar could directly be deduced. Therefore, the comparative study of the languages required some new kind of Universal Grammar to serve as tertium comparationes for the linguist not to lose himself in endless and aimless comparisons. Hence he replaced the traditional principles with a radically different conception that he had derived from his work in comparative anatomy at Jena in 1794: the notion of type, used first in his Plan for a Comparative Anthropology of 1795 and which he now adapted to the study of language. As the title of his treatise Fundamentals of the Linguistic Prototype (Grundzüge des allgemeinen Sprachtypus) suggests, the term stands for the idea of a prototype of language, similar in concept to Goethe’s idea of a protoplant (Urpflanze) which was not to be confused with a real plant but instead embodied the essential features found in all existing plants. But whereas Goethe’s Urpflanze was something quasi-real that could be perceived through one’s mental eyes, Goethe claimed, Humboldt’s type is of a different nature[5] Since linguistic form is not something material or something abstracted from natural languages, but pertains to a Verrichtung (performance) namely the production of speech, Humboldt’s prototype embodies the ensemble of elements and rule systems that must be considered common and essential for speech production in all languages (Verfahrensweise); in short, it is a generative rather than a substantive notion. Once established, through a combination of philosophical-methodological reflection and concrete linguistic analysis, the linguistic prototype was to serve and did serve Humboldt as a guide and tertium comparationis for the study and comparison of different languages and language groups. In short, the prototype is not to be seen as an object, a list of specific surface structure features, nor does it resemble any existing actual language, but instead stands for the communality of elements, rules, and structures that underlie all language production. For example, the existence of phonetic elements in a given language, constituting a sound system (Lautsystem) and its individual word always combining a sound-unit with a thought-unit, must be understood as part of the prototypal nature of language, whereas the particular Lautsystem of that language as it resulted from its historical development becomes the subject of specific linguistic investigations.

Similarly, but on a larger scale, Humboldt thought the investigation of individual languages and their specific form and character should be guided by the linguist’s awareness of the prototypal element in them while his work should also contribute to our knowledge of the prototype. The task of the linguist was therefore “to study each language as a fragment of the universal language of the human species”, (“comme un fragment du langage général du genre humain”) (Essai sur les langues du Nouveau Continent in Stetter 2004: 238). Yet for Humboldt languages do not differ from each other as species (Gattungen) but as individuals; their character does not pertain to the species but to them as individuals as conditioned by and as a result of their own specific historical development (GS Vol 6: 150). The comparative study of the world’s languages, as Humboldt envisioned it, thus represented a constant challenge to the empirical linguist and to the philosopher; namely, to discover in the linguistic data that which relates to the prototypal in language and to increase our knowledge of the nature of language and the human language capacity. Furthermore, he saw the importance of linguistic studies (Sprachstudien) in the discovery of the part language plays in the formation and transmission of ideas (Vorstellungen) not just in “the metaphysical sense” as conditioning the creation of concepts, but also in the way in which an individual language imparts its formative imprint on these concepts (GS Vol 6: 147).

There are some critical distinctions that Humboldt employs in his linguistic writings, which shed light on his understanding of language and the approach he follows in his empirical investigations. Most famous (and often misunderstood) is his distinction between language perceived as product (Werk) or ergon on the one hand and as activity (Tätigkeit) or energeia on the other (Humboldt 1836: LVII). It is not identical with the distinction introduced by Saussure between langue and parole, since Humboldt’s distinction cuts across both langue and parole and both can be seen from the angle of either process or product. Because Humboldt perceived language not as a fixed entity or object, but as something transitory, something that is real only in the moment of speaking, as an activity, he thought “its true definition can only be a genetic one” (Humboldt 1836: LVVII). Thus he distinguished sharply (as did his contemporary Schleiermacher) before Saussure and twentieth-century linguistics, between language (Sprache) and Speech (Rede). In his French Essai of 1811 he also uses Saussure’s third term, langage in a similar manner as pertaining to language in a general sense.

Although he developed almost single-handedly against the tenets of his time and of most of the Nineteenth Century a structural approach for his investigation of dozens of mostly non-European languages, Humboldt did not consider the study of a language’s structure, its Bau, the ultimate end of linguistics. Because language in its fullest sense occurs only in the societal context in its acts of speech production and in what is being said through them, its true nature can only be intimated and perceived in living discourse (verbundener Rede) and should be studied equally in its lasting manifestations in the works of culture and of science, in literature, poetry, and philosophy.

A comprehensive account and just assessment of Humboldt’s achievements in philosophy of language and linguistics will become possible only as the new complete edition of his Writings on Linguistics (Schriften zur Sprachwissenschaft), presently under way, becomes available.[6]


Primary Literature

Über die Verschiedenheit des menschlichen Sprachbaues und ihren Einfluss auf die geistige Entwickelung des Menschengeschlechts, Berlin: F. Dümmler.
Über die Kawi–Sprache auf der Insel Java, nebst einer Einleitung über die Verschiedenheit des menschlichen Sprachbaues und ihren Einfluss auf die geistige Entwickelung des Menschengeschlechts, Vol 1–3, Berlin: F. Dümmler.
Gesammelte Werke, Carl Brandes (ed.), 7 vols, Berlin: G. Reimer. Reprint Berlin: De Gruyer, 1988.
Die Sprachphilosophischen Werke Wilhelm von Humboldts, 2 vols, Heymann Steinthal (ed.), Berlin: F. Dümmler.
Gesammelte Schriften, (GS) edited by Königlich Preussische, Akademie der Wissen-schaften, 17 vols., Berlin: Behr.
  • Abteilung 1: Werke, Albert Leitzmann (ed.), vols. 1–9 and 13.
  • Abteilung 2: Politische Denkschriften, Bruno Gebhardt (ed.), vols. 10–12.
  • Abteilung 3: Tagebücher, Albert Leitzmann (ed.), vols. 14, 15.
  • Abteilung 4: Politische Briefe, Wilhelm Richter (ed.), vols. 16, 17.
Werke in Fünf Bänden, Andreas Flitner and Klaus Giel (eds.), Darmstadt: Wissenschafliche Buchgesellschaft.
Wilhelm von Humboldt Studienausgabe, Kurt Mueller-Vollmer (ed.), 3 vols, Frankfurt: Fischer [only vols 1 & 2 ever appeared].
Über die Sprache, Reden vor der Akademie, Hg., kommentiert, und mit einem Nachwort versehen von Jürgen Trabant, Tübingen and Basel: A. Francke.
Schriften zur Sprachwissenschaft (Writings on Linguistics), edited by Kurt Mueller-Vollmer in cooperation with Tilman Borsche, Bernhard Hurch, Manfred Ringmacher, Jürgen Trabant, and Gordon Whittaker. Sponsored by the Berlin Brandenburg Academy of Sciences, Paderborn, München, Wien, Zürich: Schöningh Verlag. For an overview of the plan and structure of this edition, see note 6. Appeared so far or about to appear, by part (Abteilung) and volume (Band):
  • Abt. 2. Bd. 1. Schriften zur Anthropologie der Basken, with introduction and commentary, Bernhard Hurch (ed.), 2010, VIII + 432 pages.
  • Abt. 2. Bd. 2. Baskische Wortstudien und Grammatik, with introduction and commentary, Bernhard Hurch (ed.), 2012, XIII + 427 pages.
  • Abt. 2. Bd. 3. Schriften zur Geschichte und Frühgeschichte der Basken und des Baskischen, with introduction and commentary, 2022, Bernhard Hurch (ed.), [forthcoming].
  • Abt. 3. Bd. 1. Einleitende und vergleichende Amerikanische Arbeiten, with introduction and commentary, Manfred Ringmacher (ed.), VIII + 496 pages.
  • Abt. 3. Bd. 2. Mexicanische Grammatik, with introduction and commentary, Manfred Ringmacher (ed.), 1994, VIII + 352 pages.
  • Abt. 3. Bd. 3. Wörterbuch der Mexicanischen Sprache / Eduard Buschmann und Wilhelm von Humboldt, with introduction and commentary, Manfred Ringmacher (ed.), 2000, LXXVI + 1,034 pages.
  • Abt. 3. Bd. 4. Mittelamerikanische Grammatiken, Manfred Ringmacher and Ute Tintemann (eds.), 2009, VII + 388 pages.
  • Abt. 3, Bd. 5. Südamerikanische Grammatiken, Note: Summaries in English and Spanish, Manfred Ringmacher and Ute Tintemann (eds.), 2011, VII + 727 pages.
  • Abt. 3, Bd. 6. Nordamerikanische Grammatiken, with introduction and commentary, Micaela Verlato (ed.), 2013, X + 427 pages.
  • Abt. 4. Bd. 1. Von den Sprachen Amerikas zum allgemeinen Typus der Sprache, with introduction and commentary, Bettina Lindorfer and Jürgen Trabant (eds.), 2017, VI + 293 pages.
  • Abt. 6. Bd. 1. Südsee- und Südostasiatische Sprachen / Vorarbeiten zu “Über die Kawi-Sprache...”, with introduction and commentary, Ulrike Folie et.al. (eds.), 2017, VI + 675 pages.

English Translations

The Spheres and Duties of Government, translated from the German by Joseph Coulthard, London: Chapman. Reprint: Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 1994
Essays on Language, T. Harden and D. Farrelly (eds.), Frankfurt, Berlin, Bern, New York: P. Lang.
On Language: On the Diversity of Human Language Construction and its Influence on the Mental Development of the Human Species, Michael Losonsky (ed.), translated by Peter Heath, Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
“On the Task of the Historian”, Linda DeMichiel (trans.), in The Hermeneutics Reader, Kurt Mueller-Vollmer (ed.), New York: Continuum, 105–119.
“Korrespondenz von Wilhelm von Humboldt mit Jean-Louis Burnouf und Eugène Burnouf”, in Sarah Bösch, Wilhelm vom Humboldt in Frankreich. Studien zur Rezeption (1797–2005), Paderborn, München, Wien, Zürich: F. Schöningh, pp. 253–275.
“Erstedition des Briefwechsel zwischen WvH und Jean-François Champollion le Jeune (1824–1827)”, in Markus Messling, Pariser Orientlektüren. Zu Wilhelm von Humboldts Theorie der Schrift, Paderborn, München, Wien, Zürich: F.Schöningh, pp. 313–400.
Selected Basque Writings: “The Basques” and “Announcement of a Publication”, translated by Andreas Corcoran, with an introduction by Inaki Zabaleta Gorrotxategi, Reno: University of Nevada.


There is as yet no complete edition of Humboldt’s correspondence.

Briefwechsel zwischen Schiller und Wilhelm von Humboldt Mit einer Vorerinnerung über Schiller und den Gang seiner Geistesentwicklung von Wilhelm von Humboldt, Stuttgart and Tübingen: Cotta.
Wilhelm von Humboldt’s Briefe an Friedrich Gottlob Welcker, Rudolf Haym (ed.), Berlin: R. Gaertner.
Briefe von Wilhelm von Humboldt an Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, Albert Leitzmann (ed.), Halle/S: Niemeyer.
“Briefe an Franz Bopp”, in Salomon Liefmann, Franz Bopp, sein Leben und seine Wissenschaft Nachtrag, Berlin: G. Reimer. pp. 1–104.
Wilhelm und Caroline von Humboldt in ihren Briefen, Anna von Sydow (ed.), 7 vols, Berlin: Mittler.
Briefwechsel zwischen Wilhelm von Humboldt und August Wilhelm Schlegel, Albert Leitzmann (ed.), Halle/S: Niemeyer.
Briefe an eine Freundin, Zum ersten Male nach den Originalen, Albert Leitzmann (ed.), 2 vols., Leipzig: Insel.
Goethes Briefwechsel mit Wilhelm und Alexander von Humboldt, Ludwig Geiger (ed.), Berlin: H. Bondy.
Wilhelm von Humboldt und Frau von Staël, Albert Leitzmann (ed.), Deutsche Rundschau, Vol 169 (1916), 95–112, 271–280, 431–442; Vol 170 (1917), 95–108, 256–266, 425–435; Vol 171 (1917), 82–95.
Georg und Therese Forster und die Brüder v. Humboldt Urkunden und Umrisse, Albert Leitzmann (ed.), Bonn: Röhrscheid.
Briefe an Karl Gustav von Brinkmann, Albert Leitzmann (ed.), Leipzig: Hiersmann.
Briefe an Christian Gottfried Körner, Albert Leitzmann (ed.), Berlin: E. Ebering.
Briefe an Christine Reinhard-Reimarus, Arndt Schreiber (ed.), Heidelberg: Lamber Schneider.
Der Briefwechsel zwischen Friedrich Schiller und Wilhelm von Humboldt, Siegfried Seidel (ed.), 2 vols. Berlin: Aufbau Verlag.
Briefe an Friedrich August Wolf, critical edition, Philip Mattson (ed.)., Berlin/New York: De Gruyter.
Lettres édifiantes et curieuses sur la langue chinoise: un débat philosophico-grammatical entre Wilhelm von Humboldt et Jean-Pierre Abel-Rémusat (1821–1831), Jean Rousseau and Denis Thouard (eds.), with new correspondence of Humboldt (1824–1831), introduction by Jean Rousseau, Villeneuve-d’Ascq: Presses universitaires du Septentrion.
Briefe. Historisch-kritische Ausgabe, Philipp Mattson (ed.), Berlin/New York: De Gruyter. Bd. 1: 1781–1791 (2014), Bd. 2: 1791–1795 (2015), Bd. 3: 1795–1797 (2016)

Secondary Literature


  • Goedeke, Karl, 1959, Grundriss zur Geschichte der Deutschen Dichtunge, Vol 14, 2nd revised edition, Dresden: Ehlermann, pp. 502–78, 1015–16.
  • Mattson, Philip, 1980, Verzeichnis des Briefwechsels Wilhelm von Humboldts, 2 vols., Heidelberg: Wilhelm von Humboldt Briefarchiv.
  • Sweet, Paul, 1980, Wilhelm von Humboldt: A Biography, Vol 2, Columbus, Ohio: Ohio University Press, pp. 530–56.

Monographs, Biographies and Collected Essays

  • Berglar, Peter, 1970, Wilhelm von Humboldt in Selbstzeugnissen und Bilddokumenten, Reinbek bei Hamburg: Rowohlt.
  • Bösch, Sarah and Markus Messling (eds.), 2004, Sprachdenken zwischen Berlin und Paris: Wilhelm von Humboldt/La pensée linguistique entre Berlin et Paris, Wilhelm von Humboldt, Tübingen: Narr (= Kodikas/Code 27.1–2).
  • Freese, Rudolf (ed.), 1955, Wilhelm von Humboldt Sein Leben und Wirken, dargestellt in Briefen, Tagebüchern und. Dokumenten, Berlin: Verlag der Nation [2nd enlarged and revied ed. Darmstadt: WBG, 1986].
  • Gall, Lothar, 2011, Wilhelm von Humboldt. Ein Preuße von Welt, Berlin: Propyläen.
  • Geier, Manfred, 2009, Die Brüder Humboldt. Eine Biographie, Reinbek: Rowohlt Verlag.
  • Harnack, Otto, 1913, Wilhelm von Humboldt, Berlin: Hofmann.
  • Haym, Rudolf, 1856, Wilhelm von Humboldt Lebensbild und Charakeristik, Berlin. Reprint Osnabrück: O. Zeller, 1965.
  • Heilmann, Luigi (ed.), 1976, Wilhelm von Humboldt nella cultura contemporanea, Bologna: Il Mulino.
  • Kaehler, Siegfried, 1927, Wilhelm von Humboldt und der Staat, München: Oldenburg. 2nd revised edition, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1963.
  • Kessel, Eberhard, 1967, Wilhelm von Humboldt Idee und Wirklichkeit, Stuttgart: Koehler.
  • Leroux, Robert, 1932, Guillaume de Humboldt, La formation de sa pensée jusqu’en 1794, Paris: Les Belles Lettres.
  • Maurer, Michael, 2016, Wilhelm von Humboldt: Ein Leben als Kunstwerk, Köln/Weimar: Böhlau.
  • Schaffstein, Friedrich, 1952, Wilhelm von Humboldt Ein Lebensbild, Frankfurt: Klostermann.
  • Schlerath, Bernfried (ed.), 1986, Wilhelm von Humboldt Vortragszyklus zum 150. Todestag, Berlin, New York: de Gruyter.
  • Schlesier, Gustav, 1843–45, Erinnerungen an Wilhelm von Humboldt, 2 vols., Stuttgart: H. Köhler. New edition 1854.
  • Scurla, Herbert, 1970, 1975, Wilhelm von Humboldt Werden und Wirken, Berlin: Verlag der Nation, DDR.
  • Sweet, Paul S., 1978–80, Wilhelm von Humboldt A Biography, 2 vols., Columbus, Ohio: Ohio University Press.
  • Tintemann, Ute and Markus Messling (eds.), 2009, Der Mensch ist nur Mensch durch Sprache: Zur Sprachlichkeit des Menschen, München: Wilhelm Fink Verlag.
  • Trabant, Jürgen and Ute Tintemann (eds.), 2004, Sprache und Sprachen in Berlin um 1800, Hannover: Wehrhahn.
  • Trabant, Jürgen, 2012, Weltansichten. Wilhelm von Humboldts Sprachprojekt, Munich: C.H. Beck.
  • Trabant, Jürgen and Ute Tintemann (eds.), 2012, Wilhelm von Humboldt: Universalität und Individualität, München/Paderborn: Fink.

Aesthetics, Art, Literature

  • Borinski, Karl, 1923–24, Die Antike in Poetik und Kunsttheorie vom Ausgang des klassischen Altertums bis auf Goethe und Wilhelm von Humboldt, Vol 2, Leipzig: Dieterich.
  • Harnack, Otto, 1892, Die klassische Ästhetik der Deutschen, Leipzig: J.C. Hinrichs.
  • Kost, Jürgen, 2004, Wilhelm von Humboldt—Weimarer Klassik—Bürgerliches Bewußtsein. Kulturelle Entwürfe in Deutschland um 1800, Würzburg: Königshausen und Neumann.
  • Leitzmann, Albert, 1912, Wilhelm von Humboldts Sonettdichtung, Bonn: A.Markus & E.Weber.
  • Leroux, Robert, 1948, “L’esthétique sexuée de Guillaume de Humboldt”, Etudes Germaniques, 3: 261–273.
  • Marcovaldi, Gaetano, 1934, “Il pensiero estetico di Guglielmo Humboldt”, in Scritti di Estetica, Wilhelm von Humboldt, Firenze: Sansoni.
  • Mueller-Vollmer, Kurt, 1967, Poesie und Einbildungskraft: Zur Dichtungstheorie Wilhelm von Humboldts, Stuttgart: Metzler.
  • Novak, Richey A., 1972, Wilhelm von Humboldt as a Literary Critic, Bern: P. Lang.
  • Price, Cora Lee, 1967, “Wilhelm von Humboldt und Schillers ‘Briefe über die ästhetische Erziehung des Menschen’”, Jahrbuch der Deutschen Schillergesellschaft, 11: 358–373.
  • Rehm, Walter, 1960, Europäische Romdichtung, 2nd revised edition, München: Max Hueber, p.174–96.
  • Rüdiger, Horst, 1936–7, “Wilhelm von Humboldt als Übersetzer”, Imprimatur, 7: 79–96.
  • Trabant, Jürgen, 2009, “Humboldt, eine Fußnote? Wilhelm von Humboldt als Gründergestalt der modernen Altertumswissenschaft”, in Die modernen Väter der Antike: Die Entwicklung der Altertumswissenschaften an Akademie und Universität im Berlin des 19. Jahrhunderts, Annette M. Baertschi and Colin G. King (eds.), Berlin/New York: De Gruyter, 2009, pp. 25–43.

Politics and Education

  • Benner, Dietrich, 2003, Wilhelm von Humboldts Bildungstheorie, Weinheim and Munich: Juventus.
  • Borsche, Tilman, 2007, “Zum Begriff der Bildung bei Wilhelm von Humboldt”, in Susanne Gölitzer and Jürgen Roth (eds.), Wirklichkeitssinn und Allegorese. Festschrift für Hubert Ivo zum achtzigsten Geburtstag, Münster: MV Wissenschaft, 9–20.
  • Craig, Gordon, 1967, “Wilhelm von Humboldt as a diplomat”, in his Studies in International History, London: Longmans.
  • Gebhardt, Bruno, 1896–99, Wilhelm von Humboldt als Staatsmann, Stuttgart: Cotta. (Reprint: Aalen, 1965.)
  • Fehér, István, 2007, Schelling–Humboldt: Idealismus und Universität; mit Ausblicken auf Heidegger und die Hermeneutik, Frankfurt a. M.: Lang.
  • Heinz, Christine von and Ulrich von Heinz, 2001, Wilhelm von Humboldt in Tegel: Ein Bildprogramm als Bildungsprogramm, Deutscher Kunstverlag: Berlin, München.
  • Henningsen, Bernd (ed.), 2007, Humboldts Zukunft: das Projekt Reformuniversität, Berlin: Berliner Wissenschaftsverlag.
  • Kaehler, Siegfried A., 1963, Wilhelm von Humboldt und der Staat: Ein Beitrag zur Geschichte deutsche Lebensgestaltung um 1800, 2nd edition, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
  • Lohmann, Uta, 2020, Haskala und allgemeine Menschenbildung. David Friedländer und Wilhelm von Humboldt im Gespräch: Zur Wechselwirkung zwischen jüdischer Aufklärung und neuhumanistischer Bildungstheorie, Münster/New York: Waxmann.
  • Meinecke, Friedrich, 1933, Staat und Persönlichkeit, Berlin: Mittler. English version, Cosmopolitanism and the national state, Robert B. Kimber (trans.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1970.
  • Menze, Clemens, 1966, Wilhelm von Humboldts Lehre und Bild vom Menschen, Ratingen: A. Henn.
  • –––, 1975, Die Bildungsreform Wilhelm von Humboldts, Hannover, Darmstadt, Derlin: Schroedel.
  • Mueller-Vollmer, Kurt, 1989, “Humboldts Bildungspolitik und die Französische Revolution”, Diskursanalysen 2. Institution Universität, Friedrich Kittler, Manfred Schneider, and Samuel Weber (eds.), Opladen: Westdeutscher Verlag, pp. 63–81.
  • Muhlack, Ulrich, 1967, Das zeitgenössische Frankreich in der Politik Humboldts, Lübeck and Hamburg: Matthiesen.
  • Petersen, Jens, 2007, Wilhelm von Humboldts Rechtsphilosophie, 2nd edition, De Gruyter: Berlin.
  • Schelsky, Helmut, 1963, Einsamkeit und Freiheit, Reinbek: Rowohlt.
  • Spranger, Eduard, 1909, Wilhelm von Humboldt und die Humanitätsidee, Berlin: Reuther & Reichard. 2nd edition, 1928.
  • –––, 1910, Wilhelm von Humboldt und die Reform des Bildungswesens, Berlin: Reuther & Reichard. New edition Tübingen: Niemeyer, 1965.
  • Spitta, Dietrich, 2004, Die Staatsidee Wilhelm von Humboldts, Duncker & Humblot: Berlin.
  • Spitta, Dietrich, 2006, Menschenbildung und Staat. Das Bildungsideal Wilhelm von Humboldts angesichts der Kritik des Humanismus, Mayer: Stuttgart.
  • Wiedemann, Conrad, 2021, “Die Berliner Haskala – Utopie und Wirklichkeit”, Jüdische und christliche Intellektuelle in Berlin um 1800, Cord-Friedrich Berghahn, Avi Lifschitz and Conrad Wiedemann (eds.), Hannover: Wehrhahn, pp. 17–40.

Anthropology, Hermeneutics, History

  • Berman, Antoine, 1992 “F. Schleiermacher and W. von Humboldt: Translation in the Hermeneutical-Linguistic Space”, in S. Heyvaert (trans.) The Experience of the Foreign, Ch. 10, Albany, NY: SUNY Press. [Original French publication, 1984, L’épreuve de l’étranger, Paris: Gallimard.]
  • Betz, Manfred, Jörn Garber, and Heinz Thoma (eds.), 2007, Physis und Norm: Neue Perspektiven der Anthropologie im 18. Jahrhundert, Göttingen: Wallstein Verlag.
  • Droysen, Johann Gustav, 1937, Historik Vorlesungen über Enzyklopaedie und Methodologie der Geschichte, R. Hübner (ed.), Munich and Berlin. 3rd edition, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1958.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1972, Wahrheit und Methode, 3rd enlarged edition, Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr, (1960, 1965). English translation, Truth and Method, 2nd revised edition, New York: Crossroad, 1989.
  • Feger, Hans, 2008, Die Realität der Idealisten. Schiller und die Gebrüder Humboldt Böhlau, Köln, Weimar, Wien: Verlag.
  • Heinemann, Fritz, 1929, Wilhelm von Humboldts philosophische Anthropologie und Theorie der Menschenkenntnis, Halle/S: Niemeyer.
  • Herling, Bradley L., 2006, “German Absorption in the Gita: Wilhelm von Humboldt and Hegel”, in The German Gita. Hermeneutics and Discipline in the German Reception of Indian thought, 1778–1831, Bradley L. Herling (ed.), New York/London: Routledge, pp. 203–253. doi:10.4324/9780203959664
  • Koch, Manfred, 1993, “Von der vergleichenden Anatomie zur Kulturanthropologie. Wilhelm von Humboldts Hermeneutik fremder Kulturen im Kontext der zeitgenössischen Wissenschaft vom Menschen‘”, Zeitschrift für Germanistik, new series, 3(1): 80–98.
  • Kost, Jürgen, 2004, Wilhelm von Humboldt—Weimarer Klassik—Bürgerliches Bewußtsein. Kulturelle Entwürfe in Deutschland um 1800, Würzburg: Königshausen und Neumann.
  • Leroux, Robert, 1959, L’Anthropologie comparée de Guillaume de Humboldt, Strassbourg: Presses Universitaires de Strassbourg.
  • Marchignoli, Saverio, 2004, “Canonizing an Indian Text? A. W. Schlegel, W. von Humboldt, Hegel, and the Bhagavadgita”, in Sanskrit and ‘Orientalism’: Indology and Comparative Linguistics in Germany (1750–1958), Douglas T. McGetchin and Peter K.J. Park and D.R. SarDesai (eds.), New Delhi: Manohar, pp. 345–270.
  • Mattig, Ruprecht, 2019, Wilhelm von Humboldt als Ethnograph. Bildungsforschung im Zeitalter der Aufklärung, Weinheim: Beltz, 2019.
  • –––, 2020, “Ethnography and Liberty: A New Look at the Anthropological Work of Wilhelm von Humboldt”, History and Anthropology, 31(4): 491–508.
  • Mueller-Vollmer, Kurt, 1985, “Von der Durchdringbarkeit des wirkungsgeschichtlichen Bewusstseins. Zur Hermeneutik Hegels, Gadamers und Humboldts”, in Literary Theory and Criticism. Festschrift in Honor of René Wellek, Joseph P. Stelka (ed.), Bern: P. Lang, pp. 475–494.
  • Quillien, Jean, 1991, L’Anthropologie Philosophique de G. de Humboldt, Lille: Presses Universitaires de Lille.
  • Riedel, Manfred, 1978, Erklären oder Verstehen? Stutgart: Klett, Cotta.
  • Ritter, Heidi, 2007, “Wechselseitige Ergänzung. Wilhelm von Humboldts Geschlechteranthropologie zwischen Erfahrung und Konstruktion”, in Manfred Beetz (ed.), Physis und Norm. Neue Perspektiven der Anthropologie im 18, Jahrhundert, Göttingen: Wallstein Verlag, pp. 175–186.
  • Spranger, Eduard, 1908, “Wilhelm von Humboldts Rede ‘Über die Aufgabe des Geschichtsschreibers’ und die Schellingsche Philosophie”, Historische Zeitschrift, 100(3): 541–563.
  • –––, 1952, “Aufgaben des Geschichtsschreibers”, Historische Zeitschrift, 174(2): 251–268.
  • Stadler, Peter B., 1959, Wilhelm von Humboldts Bild der Antike, Zürich: Artemis.
  • Wach, Joachim, 1926, Das Verstehen, Vol 1, Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr. (Rep. Hildesheim 1966).
  • Tessitore, Fulvio, 1998, Wilhelm von Humboldt und der Historismus, Nürnberg: Helmut Seubert Verlag.
  • Thouard, Denis, 2000, “Goethe, Humboldt: poétique et herméneutique de la traduction”, in Jean-Louis Chiss and Gérard Dessons (eds.), La force du langage. Rythme, discours, traduction. Autour de l’oeuvre d’Henri Meschonnic, Paris: Champion, pp. 193–210.
  • Wagner, Hans-Josef, 2002, Wilhelm von Humboldt, ‘Anthropologie und Theorie der Menschenkenntnis’, Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft: Darmstadt

Philosophy and Linguistics

  • Adler, G.J, 1866, Wilhelm von Humboldt’s Linguistic Studies, New York: Wynkoop & Hallenbeck.
  • Bloomfield, Leonhard, 1933, Language, New York: Henry Holt and Co.
  • Borsche, Tilman, 1981, Der Begriff der menschlichen. Rede in der Sprachphilosophie Wilhelm von Humboldts, Stuttgart: Cotta.
  • Bösch, Sarah, 2006, Wilhelm von Humboldt in Frankreich. Studien zur Rezeption (1797–2005), Paderborn: Schöningh.
  • Brinton, Daniel Garrison 1885. “The Philosophic Grammar of American Languages, as set forth by Wilhelm von Humboldt, with the translation of an unpublished memoir by him on the American Verb”, Proceedings of the American Philosophical Society, 22(120/Part IV): 306–331. [Brinton 1885 available online]
  • –––, 1890, Essays of an Americanist, Philadelphia: Porter & Coates. [Brinton 1890 available online]
  • Brown, Roger Langham, 1967, Wilhelm von Humboldt’s Conception of Linguistic Relativity, The Hague and Paris: Mouton.
  • Buchholz, Ulrike, 1986, Das Kawi-Werk Wilhelm von Humboldts, Münster: Institut f. Allgemeine Sprachwissenschaft, Nodus.
  • Chomsky, Noam, 1965, Aspects of the Theory of Syntax, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • –––, 1966, Cartesian Linguistics: A Chapter in the History of Rationalist Thought, New York/London: Harper & Row.
  • Cassirer, Ernst, 1923, “Die kantischen Elemente in Wilhelm von Humboldts Sprachphilosophie”, Festschrift für Paul Hensel, Julius Binder (ed.), Greiz: Ohag.
  • ––– 1923–31, Philosophie der symbolischen Formen, 3 vols. 4th edition, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1964. (On Humboldt: see Vol 1). Translated as The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, 1953, Ralph Manheim (trans.), New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • De Mauro, Tullio and Lia Formigari (eds.), 1988, Leibniz, Humboldt, and the Origins of Comparativism, Amsterdam-Philadelphia: Benjamins.
  • Di Cesare, Donatella, 1990, “Pour une herméneutique du langage. Epistémologie et méthodologie de la recherche linguistique d’après Humboldt”, Cahiers Ferdinand de Saussure, 44: 123–140.
  • ––– 1996. “Individualität der Sprache und Verstehen des Anderen Humboldts dialogische Hermeneutik”, Internationale Zeitschrift für Philosophie, 2: 160–183.
  • Fiesel, Eva, 1927, Die Sprachphilosophie der deutschen Romantik, Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr. Reprint Hildesheim: Olms, 1973.
  • Gipper, Helmut, 1965, “Wilhelm von Humboldt als Begründer der modernen Sprachforschung”, Wirkendes Wort, 15: 1–19.
  • Gipper, Helmut and Peter Schmittert, 1979, Sprachwissenschaft.und Sprachphilosophie im Zeitalter der Romantik, Tübingen: Günter Narr.
  • Habermas, Jürgen, 1991, “Communicative Action”, in Essays on Jürgen Habermas’ Theory of Communicative Action, Axel Honneth and Hans Jonas (eds.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 214–250.
  • Hansen-Loeve, Ole, 1972, La révolutionne copernicienne du langage dans l’oeuvre de Wilhelm von Humboldt, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Heeschen, Volker, 1972, Die Sprachphilosophie Wilhelm von Humboldts, Ph.D. thesis, Ruhr-Universität Bochum.
  • Heidegger, Martin, 1927, Sein und Zeit, Tübingen: Niemeyer. 9th edition, 1960.
  • –––, 1962, Being and Time, John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson (trans.), New York: Harper & Row.
  • –––, 1959, Unterwegs zur Sprache, Pfullingen: G. Neske.
  • –––, 1971, On the Way to Language, Peter D. Hertz (trans.), New York: Harper & Row.
  • Joseph, John E., 1999, “A Matter of Consequence: Humboldt, Race and the Genius of the Chinese Language”, Historiographia Linguistica, XXVI(1–2): 89–148.
  • Koch, Manfred 1993. “Von der vergleichenden Anatomie zur Kulturanthopologie. Wilhelm von Humboldts Hermeneutik fremder Kulturen im Kontext der zeitgenössischen ‘Wissenschaft vom Menschen’”, Zetschrift für Germanistik, 3(1): 80–98.
  • Lammer, Wilhelm, 1936, Wilhelm von Humboldts Weg zur Sprachforschung 1785–1801, Berlin and Rostock: Junker & Dünnhaupt.
  • Liebrucks, Bruno, 1965, Sprache und Bewusstsein, Vol 2: Sprache. Wilhelm von Humboldt, Frankfurt/ M.: Akademische Verlagsgesellschaft.
  • Loogan, Dominik Peter, 2014, Vom transzendentalen Subjekt zum transitorischen Ich. Novalis und Wilhelm von Humboldt antworten auf Kant und Fichte, Berlin: Ch. A. Bachmann Verlag.
  • Losonsky, Michael, 1999, “Introduction” to Wilhelm von Humboldt “On Language”, Cambridge, New York: Cambridge University Press, pp. vii—xxxxix.
  • Manchester, Martin, 1985, The Philosophical Foundations of Humboldt’s Linguistic Doctrines, Amsterdam/Philadelphia: Benjamins.
  • Martinet, André, 1963, Grundzüge der allgemeinen Sprachwissenschaft, Stuttgart: Verlag W. Kohlhammer.
  • Messling, Markus, 2008, Pariser Orientlektüren. Zu Wilhelm von Humboldts Theorie der Schrift. Nebst der Erstedition des Briefwechsels zwischen Wilhelm von Humboldt und Jean-François Champollion le jeune (1824–1827), Paderborn, München, Wien, Zürich: Schöningh (Humboldt-Studien).
  • Miller, Robert L., 1968, The Linguistic Relativity Principle and Humboldtian Ethnolinguistics, The Hague and Paris: Mouton.
  • Mueller-Vollmer, Kurt, 1976, Wilhelm von Humboldt und der Anfang der amerikanischen Sprachwissenschaft:Die Briefe an John Pickering, Frankfurt a. M.: Klostermann
  • –––, 1977, “From Poetics to Linguistics: Wilhelm von Humboldt and the Romantic Idea of Language”, in Le Groupe de Coppet. Actes et Documents du deuxième Colloque de Coppet, Geneva and Paris: M. Slatkin and H. Champion, pp. 195–215.
  • –––, 1989, “Thinking and Speaking: Herder, Humboldt and Saussurean Semiotics. A Translation and Commentary on Wilhelm von Humboldt’s ‘On Thinking and Speaking: Sixteen Theses on Language’”, Comparative Criticism, 11: 159–214.
  • –––, 1991, “Die Vaskische Haupt-und Muttersprache. Zwei unveröffentlichte Stücke aus Humboldts baskischen Arbeitsbüchern 1800–1801”, in Multum-non multa? Studien zur Einheit der Reflexion im Werk Wilhelm von Humboldts, Peter Schmitter (ed.), Münster: Nodus, pp. 111–130.
  • –––, 1993, Wilhelm von Humboldts Sprachwissenschaft. Ein kommentiertes Verzeichnis des sprachwissenschaftlichen Nachlasses, with introduction and two appendices, Paderborn, München, Wien, Zürich: F Schöningh.
  • –––, 1997, “Sprache, Zeichen, System: Humboldt gegen Saussure”, in Festschrift Joseph Strelka, Tübingen: Stauffenburg Verlag, pp. 603–622.
  • Mueller-Vollmer, Kurt and Volker Heeschen, 2007, “Wilhelm von Humboldts Bedeutung für die Beschreibung der südostasiatischen Sprachen und die Anfänge der Südostasien Forschung”, in Geschichte der Sprachtheorie, Peter Schmitter (ed.), Tübingen: Günter Narr. Vol 6/2, pp. 430–61.
  • Oesterreicher, Wulf, 1981, “Wem gehört Humboldt?” in Logos Semanticos, Festschrift Coseriu, Vol 1, Berlin, New York, Madrid: de Gruyer & Gredos.
  • Olson, Kenneth Russell, 1978, Wilhelm von Humboldt’s Philosophy of Language, Ph.D. Thesis, Dept. of German Studies, Stanford University.
  • Pickering, John, 1831, “Indian Languages”, Encyclopedia Americana, Vol. 6, (Appendix), pp. 581–600.
  • Plank, Frans, 1989, “On Humboldt on the Dual”, in Roberta Corrigan, Fred Eckman & Michael Noonan (eds.), Linguistic Categorization (Current Issues in Linguistic Theory, 61), Amsterdam: Benjamins, pp. 293–333.
  • Pott, August Wilhelm, 1876, Wilhelm von Humboldt und die vergleichende Sprachwissenschaft, Berlin: S. Calvary. 2nd English edition 1880.
  • Reutter, Georg, 2011, Kosmos der Sprachen. Wilhelm von Humboldts linguistisches System, Paderborn, München, Wien, Zürich: Schöningh (Humboldt-Studien).
  • Roscher, Rainhard, 2006, Sprachsinn. Studien zu einem Grundbegriff im Sprachdenken Wilhelm von Humboldts, Ph.D. Thesis, H.-Studien, Paderborn, München, Wien, Zürich: Schöningh.
  • Saussure, Ferdinand de, 1916/1968, Cours de Linguistique Générale, Critical Edition by Rudolf Engler, Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
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  • –––, 1994, Das Verfahren der Sprache: Humboldt gegen Chomsky, Paderborn, München, Wien, Zürich: F. Schöningh.
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  • Steiner, George, 1975, After Babel:Aspects of Language and Translation, New York and London: Oxford University Press.
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  • –––, 2004, introduction to Wilhelm von Humboldt, Grundzüge des allgemeinen Sprachtypus, Berlin, Wien: Philo, pp. 9–32.
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  • –––, 1990, Traditionen Humboldts, Frankfurt a.M.: Suhrkamp.
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  • Zimmermann, Klaus, Jürgen Trabant, and Kurt Mueller-Vollmer (eds.), 1994, Wilhelm von Humboldt und die amerikanischen Sprachen, Paderborn, München, Wien, Zürich: F. Schöningh.

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The editors would like to thank Cord-Friedrich Berghahn for working on the 2022 bibliography update.

Copyright © 2022 by
Kurt Mueller-Vollmer
Markus Messling

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