First published Mon Jan 8, 2007; substantive revision Mon Feb 4, 2013

What is wisdom? Philosophers, psychologists, spiritual leaders, poets, novelists, life coaches, and a variety of other important thinkers have tried to understand the concept of wisdom. This entry will provide a brief and general overview, and analysis of, several philosophical views on the topic of wisdom. It is not intended to capture the many interesting and important approaches to wisdom found in other fields of inquiry. Moreover, this entry will focus on several major ideas in the Western philosophical tradition. In particular, it will focus on five general approaches to understanding what it takes to be wise: (1) wisdom as epistemic humility, (2) wisdom as epistemic accuracy, (3) wisdom as knowledge, (4) a hybrid theory of wisdom, and (5) wisdom as rationality.

1. Wisdom as Epistemic Humility

Socrates’ view of wisdom, as expressed by Plato in The Apology (20e-23c), is sometimes interpreted as an example of a humility theory of wisdom (see, for example, Ryan 1996 and Whitcomb, 2010). In Plato’s Apology, Socrates and his friend Chaerephon visit the oracle at Delphi. As the story goes, Chaerephon asks the oracle whether anyone is wiser than Socrates. The oracle’s answer is that Socrates is the wisest person. Socrates reports that he is puzzled by this answer since so many other people in the community are well known for their extensive knowledge and wisdom, and yet Socrates claims that he lacks knowledge and wisdom. Socrates does an investigation to get to the bottom of this puzzle. He interrogates a series of politicians, poets, and craftsmen. As one would expect, Socrates’ investigation reveals that those who claim to have knowledge either do not really know any of the things they claim to know, or else know far less than they proclaim to know. The most knowledgeable of the bunch, the craftsmen, know about their craft, but they claim to know things far beyond the scope of their expertise. Socrates, so we are told, neither suffers the vice of claiming to know things he does not know, nor the vice of claiming to have wisdom when he does not have wisdom. In this revelation, we have a potential resolution to the wisdom puzzle in The Apology.

Although the story may initially appear to deliver a clear theory of wisdom, it is actually quite difficult to capture a textually accurate and plausible theory here. One interpretation is that Socrates is wise because he, unlike the others, believes he is not wise, whereas the poets, politicians, and craftsmen arrogantly and falsely believe they are wise. This theory, which will be labeled Humility Theory 1 (H1), is simply (see, for example, Lehrer & Smith 1996, 3):

Humility Theory 1 (H1):
S is wise iff S believes s/he is not wise.

This is a tempting and popular interpretation because Socrates certainly thinks he has shown that the epistemically arrogant poets, politicians, and craftsmen lack wisdom. Moreover, Socrates claims that he is not wise, and yet, if we trust the oracle, Socrates is actually wise.

Upon careful inspection, (H1) is not a reasonable interpretation of Socrates’ view. Although Socrates does not boast of his own wisdom, he does believe the oracle. If he was convinced that he was not wise, he would have rejected the oracle and gone about his business because he would not find any puzzle to unravel. Clearly, he believes, on some level, that he is wise. The mystery is: what is wisdom if he has it and the others lack it? Socrates nowhere suggests that he has become unwise after believing the oracle. Thus, (H1) is not an acceptable interpretation of Socrates’ view.

Moreover, (H1) is false. Many people are clear counterexamples to (H1). Many people who believe they are not wise are correct in their self-assessment. Thus, the belief that one is not wise is not a sufficient condition for wisdom. Furthermore, it seems that the belief that one is not wise is not necessary for wisdom. It seems plausible to think that a wise person could be wise enough to realize that she is wise. Too much modesty might get in the way of making good decisions and sharing what one knows. If one thinks Socrates was a wise person, and if one accepts that Socrates did, in fact, accept that he was wise, then Socrates himself is a counterexample to (H1). The belief that one is wise could be a perfectly well justified belief for a wise person. Having the belief that one is wise does not, in itself, eliminate the possibility that the person is wise. Nor does it guarantee the vice of arrogance. We should hope that a wise person would have a healthy dose of epistemic self-confidence, appreciate that she is wise, and share her understanding of reality with the rest of us who could benefit from her wisdom. Thus, the belief that one is not wise is not required for wisdom.

(H1) focused on believing one is not wise. Another version of the humility theory is worth considering. When Socrates demonstrates that a person is not wise, he does so by showing that the person lacks some knowledge that he or she claims to possess. Thus, one might think that Socrates’ view could be better captured by focusing on the idea that wise people believe they lack knowledge (rather than lacking wisdom). That is, one might consider the following view:

Humility Theory 2 (H2):
S is wise iff S believes S does not know anything.

Unfortunately, this interpretation is not any better than (H1). It falls prey to problems similar to those that refuted (H1) both as an interpretation of Socrates, and as an acceptable account of wisdom. Moreover, remember that Socrates admits that the craftsmen do have some knowledge. Socrates might have considered them to be wise if they had restricted their confidence and claims to knowledge to what they actually did know about their craft. Their problem was that they professed to have knowledge beyond their area of expertise. The problem was not that they claimed to have knowledge.

Before turning to alternative approaches to wisdom, it is worth mentioning another interpretation of Socrates that fits with the general spirit of epistemic humility. One might think that what Socrates is establishing is that his wisdom is found in his realization that human wisdom is not a particularly valuable kind of wisdom. Only the gods possess the kind of wisdom that is truly valuable. This is clearly one of Socrates’ insights, but it does not provide us with an understanding of the nature of wisdom. It tells us only of its comparative value. Merely understanding this evaluative insight would not, for reasons similar to those discussed with (HP1) and (HP2), make one wise.

Humility theories of wisdom are not promising, but they do, perhaps, provide us with some important character traits associated with wise people. Wise people, one might argue, possess epistemic self-confidence, yet lack epistemic arrogance. Wise people tend to acknowledge their fallibility, and wise people are reflective, introspective, and tolerant of uncertainty. Any acceptable theory of wisdom ought to be compatible with such traits. However, those traits are not, in and of themselves, definitive of wisdom.

2. Wisdom as Epistemic Accuracy

Socrates can be interpreted as providing an epistemic accuracy, rather than an epistemic humility, theory of wisdom. The poets, politicians, and craftsmen all believe they have knowledge about topics on which they are considerably ignorant. Socrates, one might argue, believes he has knowledge when, and only when, he really does have knowledge. Perhaps wise people restrict their confidence to propositions for which they have knowledge or, at least, to propositions for which they have excellent justification. Perhaps Socrates is better interpreted as having held an Epistemic Accuracy Theory such as:

Epistemic Accuracy Theory 1 (EA1):
S is wise iff for all p, (S believes S knows p iff S knows p.)

According to (EA1), a wise person is accurate about what she knows and what she does not know. If she really knows p, she believes she knows p. And, if she believes she knows p, then she really does know p. (EA1) is consistent with the idea that Socrates accepts that he is wise and with the idea that Socrates does have some knowledge. (EA1) is a plausible interpretation of the view Socrates endorses, but it is not a plausible answer in the search for an understanding of wisdom. Wise people can make mistakes about what they know. Socrates, Maimonides, King Solomon, Einstein, Goethe, Gandhi, and every other candidate for the honor of wisdom have held false beliefs about what they did and did not know. It is easy to imagine a wise person being justified in believing she possesses knowledge about some claim, and also easy to imagine that she could be shown to be mistaken, perhaps long after her death. If (EA1) is true, then just because a person believes she has knowledge when she does not, she is not wise. That seems wrong. It is hard to imagine that anyone at all is, or ever has been, wise if (EA1) is correct.

We could revise the Epistemic Accuracy Theory to get around this problem. We might only require that a wise person’s belief is highly justified when she believes she has knowledge. That excuses people with bad epistemic luck.

Epistemic Accuracy 2 (EA2):
S is wise iff for all p, (S believes S knows p iff S’s belief in p is highly justified.)

(EA2) gets around the problem with (EA1). The Socratic Method challenges one to produce reasons for one’s view. When Socrates’ interlocutor is left dumbfounded, or reduced to absurdity, Socrates rests his case. One might argue that through his questioning, Socrates reveals not that his opponents lack knowledge because their beliefs are false, but he demonstrates that his opponents are not justified in holding the views they profess to know. Since the craftsmen, poets, and politicians questioned by Socrates all fail his interrogation, they were shown, one might argue, to have claimed to have knowledge when their beliefs were not even justified.

Many philosophers would hesitate to endorse this interpretation of what is going on in The Apology. They would argue that a failure to defend one’s beliefs from Socrates’ relentless questioning does not show that a person is not justified in believing a proposition. Many philosophers would argue that having very good evidence, or forming a belief via a reliable process, would be sufficient for justification.

Proving, or demonstrating to an interrogator, that one is justified is another matter, and not necessary for simply being justified. Socrates, some might argue, shows only that the craftsmen, poets, and politicians cannot defend themselves from his questions. He does not show, one might argue, that the poets, politicians, and craftsmen have unjustified beliefs. Since we gain very little insight into the details of the conversation in this dialogue, it would be unfair to dismiss this interpretation on these grounds. Perhaps Socrates did show, through his intense questioning, that the craftsmen, poets, and politicians formed and held their beliefs without adequate evidence or formed and held them through unreliable belief forming processes. Socrates only reports that they did not know all that they professed to know. Since we do not get to witness the actual questioning as we do in Plato’s other dialogues, we should not reject (EA2) as an interpretation of Socrates’ view of wisdom in The Apology.

Regardless of whether (EA2) is Socrates’ view, there are problems for (EA2) as an account of what it means to be wise. Even if (EA2) is exactly what Socrates meant, some philosophers would argue that one could be justified in believing a proposition, but not realize that she is justified. If that is a possible situation for a wise person to be in, then she might be justified, but fail to believe she has knowledge. Could a wise person be in such a situation, or is it necessary that a wise person would always recognize the epistemic value of what he or she believes?[1] If this situation is impossible, then this criticism could be avoided. There is no need to resolve this issue here because (EA1) and (EA2) fall prey to another, much less philosophically thorny and controversial problem.

(EA1) and (EA2) suffer from a similar, and very serious, problem. Imagine a person who has very little knowledge. Suppose further, that the few things she does know are of little or no importance. She could be the sort of person that nobody would ever go to for information or advice. Such a person could be very cautious and believe that she knows only what she actually knows. Although she would have accurate beliefs about what she does and does not know, she would not be wise. This shows that (EA1) is flawed. As for (EA2), imagine that she believes she knows only what she is actually justified in believing. She is still not wise. It should be noted, however, that although accuracy theories do not provide an adequate account of wisdom, they reveal an important insight. Perhaps a necessary condition for being wise is that wise people think they have knowledge only when their beliefs are highly justified. Or, even more simply, perhaps wise people have epistemically justified, or rational, beliefs.

3. Wisdom as Knowledge

An alternative approach to wisdom focuses on the more positive idea that wise people are very knowledgeable people. There are many views in the historical and contemporary philosophical literature on wisdom that have knowledge, as opposed to humility or accuracy, as at least a necessary condition of wisdom. Aristotle (Nichomachean Ethics VI, ch. 7), Descartes (Principles of Philosophy), Richard Garrett (1996), John Kekes (1983), Keith Lehrer & Nicholas Smith (1996), Robert Nozick (1989), Plato (The Republic), Sharon Ryan (1996, 1999), Valerie Tiberius (2008), Dennis Whitcomb (2010) and Linda Zagzebski (1996) for example, have all defended theories of wisdom that require a wise person to have knowledge of some sort. All of these views very clearly distinguish knowledge from expertise on a particular subject. Moreover, all of these views maintain that wise people know “what is important.” The views differ, for the most part, over what it is important for a wise person to know, and on whether there is any behavior, action, or way of living, that is required for wisdom.

Aristotle distinguished between two different kinds of wisdom, theoretical wisdom and practical wisdom. Theoretical wisdom is, according to Aristotle, “scientific knowledge, combined with intuitive reason, of the things that are highest by nature” (Nicomachean Ethics, VI, 1141b). For Aristotle, theoretical wisdom involves knowledge of necessary, scientific, first principles and propositions that can be logically deduced from them. Aristotle’s idea that scientific knowledge is knowledge of necessary truths and their logical consequences is no longer a widely accepted view. Thus, for the purposes of this discussion, I will consider a theory that reflects the spirit of Aristotle’s view on theoretical wisdom, but without the controversy about the necessary or contingent nature of scientific knowledge. Moreover, it will combine scientific knowledge with other kinds of factual knowledge, including knowledge about history, philosophy, music, literature, mathematics, etc. Consider the following, knowledge based, theory of wisdom:

Wisdom as Extensive Factual Knowledge (WFK):
S is wise iff S has extensive factual knowledge about science, history, philosophy, literature, music, etc.

According to (WFK), a wise person is a person who knows a lot about the universe and our place in it. She would have extensive knowledge about the standard academic subjects. There are many positive things to say about (WFK). (WFK) nicely distinguishes between narrow expertise and knowledge of the mundane, from the important, broad, and general kind of knowledge possessed by wise people. As Aristotle puts it, “…we think that some people are wise in general, not in some particular field or in any other limited respect…” (Nicomachean Ethics, Book 6, 1141a).

The main problem for (WFK) is that some of the most knowledgeable people are not wise. Although they have an abundance of very important factual knowledge, they lack the kind of practical know-how that is a mark of a wise person. Wise people know how to get on in the world in all kinds of situations and with all kinds of people. Extensive factual knowledge is not enough to give us what a wise person knows. As Robert Nozick points out, “Wisdom is not just knowing fundamental truths, if these are unconnected with the guidance of life or with a perspective on its meaning” (1989, 269). There is more to wisdom than intelligence and knowledge of science and philosophy or any other subject matter. Aristotle is well aware of the limitations of what he calls theoretical wisdom. However, rather than making improvements to something like (WFK), Aristotle distinguishes it as one kind of wisdom. Other philosophers would be willing to abandon (WFK), that is, claim that it provides insufficient conditions for wisdom, and add on what is missing.

Aristotle has a concept of practical wisdom that makes up for what is missing in theoretical wisdom. In Book VI of the Nicomachean Ethics, he claims, “This is why we say Anaxagoras, Thales, and men like them have philosophic but not practical wisdom, when we see them ignorant of what is to their own advantage, and why we say that they know things that are remarkable, admirable, difficult, and divine, but useless; viz. because it is not human goods they seek” (1141a). Knowledge of contingent facts that are useful to living well is required in Aristotle’s practical wisdom. According to Aristotle, “Now it is thought to be the mark of a man of practical wisdom to be able to deliberate well about what is good and expedient for himself, not in some particular respect, e.g. about what sorts of thing conduce to health or to strength, but about what sorts of thing conduce to the good life in general” (Nichomachean Ethics, VI, 1140a–1140b). Thus, for Aristotle, practical wisdom requires knowing, in general, how to live well. Many philosophers agree with Aristotle on this point. However, many would not be satisfied with the conclusion that theoretical wisdom is one kind of wisdom and practical wisdom another. Other philosophers, including Linda Zagzebski (1996), agree that there are these two types of wisdom that ought to be distinguished.

Let’s proceed, without argument, on the assumption that it is possible to have a theory of one, general, kind of wisdom. Wisdom, in general, many philosophers would argue, requires practical knowledge about living. What Aristotle calls theoretical wisdom, many would contend, is not wisdom at all. Aristotle’s theoretical wisdom is merely extensive knowledge or deep understanding. Nicholas Maxwell (1984), in his argument to revolutionize education, argues that we should be teaching for wisdom, which he sharply distinguishes from standard academic knowledge. Similar points are raised by Robert Sternberg (2001) and Andrew Norman (1996). Robert Nozick holds a view very similar to Aristotle’s theory of practical wisdom, but Nozick is trying to capture the essence of wisdom, period. He is not trying to define one, alternative, kind of wisdom. Nozick claims, “Wisdom is what you need to understand in order to live well and cope with the central problems and avoid the dangers in the predicaments human beings find themselves in” (1989, 267). And, John Kekes maintains that, “What a wise man knows, therefore, is how to construct a pattern that, given the human situation, is likely to lead to a good life” (1983, 280). More recently, Valerie Tiberius (2008) has developed a practical view that connects wisdom with well being, requiring, among other things, that a wise person live the sort of life that he or she could sincerely endorse upon reflection. Such practical views of wisdom could be expressed, generally, as follows.

Wisdom as Knowing How To Live Well (KLW):
S is wise iff S knows how to live well.

This view captures Aristotle’s basic idea of practical wisdom. It also captures an important aspect of views defended by Nozick, Plato, Garrett, Kekes, Maxwell, Ryan, and Tiberius. Although giving an account of what it means to know how to live well may prove as difficult a topic as providing an account of wisdom, Nozick provides a very illuminating start.

Wisdom is not just one type of knowledge, but diverse. What a wise person needs to know and understand constitutes a varied list: the most important goals and values of life – the ultimate goal, if there is one; what means will reach these goals without too great a cost; what kinds of dangers threaten the achieving of these goals; how to recognize and avoid or minimize these dangers; what different types of human beings are like in their actions and motives (as this presents dangers or opportunities); what is not possible or feasible to achieve (or avoid); how to tell what is appropriate when; knowing when certain goals are sufficiently achieved; what limitations are unavoidable and how to accept them; how to improve oneself and one’s relationships with others or society; knowing what the true and unapparent value of various things is; when to take a long-term view; knowing the variety and obduracy of facts, institutions, and human nature; understanding what one’s real motives are; how to cope and deal with the major tragedies and dilemmas of life, and with the major good things too. (1989, 269)

With Nozick’s explanation of what one must know in order to live well, we have an interesting and quite attractive, albeit somewhat rough, theory of wisdom. As noted above, many philosophers, including Aristotle and Zagzebski would, however, reject (KLW) as the full story on wisdom. Aristotle and Zagzebski would obviously reject (KLW) as the full story because they believe theoretical wisdom is another kind of wisdom, and are unwilling to accept that there is a conception of one, general, kind of wisdom. Kekes claims, “The possession of wisdom shows itself in reliable, sound, reasonable, in a word, good judgment. In good judgment, a person brings his knowledge to bear on his actions. To understand wisdom, we have to understand its connection with knowledge, action, and judgment” (1983, 277). Kekes adds, “Wisdom ought also to show in the man who has it” (1983, 281). Many philosophers, therefore, think that wisdom is not restricted even to knowledge about how to live well. Tiberius thinks the wise person’s actions reflect their basic values. These philosophers believe that being wise also includes action. A person could satisfy the conditions of any of the principles we have considered thus far and nevertheless behave in a wildly reckless manner. Wildly reckless people are, even if very knowledgeable about life, not wise.

Philosophers who are attracted to the idea that knowing how to live well is a necessary condition for wisdom might want to simply tack on a success condition to (KLW) to get around cases in which a person knows all about living well, yet fails to put this knowledge into practice. Something along the lines of the following theory would capture this idea.

Wisdom as Knowing How To, and Succeeding at, Living Well (KLS):
S is wise iff (i) S knows how to live well, and (ii) S is successful at living well.

The idea of the success condition is that one puts one’s knowledge into practice. Or, rather than using the terminology of success, one might require that a wise person’s beliefs and values cohere with one’s actions (Tiberius, 2008). The main idea is that one’s actions are reflective of one’s understanding of what it means to live well. A view along the lines of (KLS) would be embraced by Aristotle and Zagzebski (for practical wisdom), and by Kekes, Nozick, and Tiberius. (KLS) would not be universally embraced, however (see Ryan 1999, for further criticisms). One criticism of (KLS) is that one might think that all the factual knowledge required by (WFK) is missing from this theory. One might argue that (WFK), the view that a wise person has extensive factual knowledge, was rejected only because it did not provide sufficient conditions for wisdom. Many philosophers would claim that (WFK) does provide a necessary condition for wisdom. A wise person, such a critic would argue, needs to know how to live well (as described by Nozick), but she also needs to have some deep and far-reaching theoretical, or factual, knowledge that may have very little impact on her daily life, practical decisions, or well being. In the preface of his Principles of Philosophy, Descartes insisted upon factual knowledge as an important component of wisdom. Descartes wrote, “It is really only God alone who has Perfect Wisdom, that is to say, who has a complete knowledge of the truth of all things; but it may be said that men have more wisdom or less according as they have more or less knowledge of the most important truths” (Principles, 204). Of course, among those important truths, one might claim, are truths about living well, as well as knowledge in the basic academic subject areas.

Moreover, one might complain that the insight left standing from Epistemic Accuracy theories is also missing from (KLS). One might think that a wise person not only knows a lot, and succeeds at living well, she also confines her claims to knowledge (or belief that she has knowledge) to those propositions that she is justified in believing.

4. Hybrid Theory

One way to try to accommodate the various insights from the theories considered thus far is in the form of a hybrid theory. One such idea is:

S is wise iff
  1. S has extensive factual and theoretical knowledge.
  2. S knows how to live well.
  3. S is successful at living well.
  4. S has very few unjustified beliefs.

Although this Hybrid Theory has a lot going for it, there are a number of important criticisms to consider. Dennis Whitcomb (2010) objects to all theories of wisdom that include a living well condition, or an appreciation of living well condition. He gives several interesting objections against such views. Whitcomb thinks that a person who is deeply depressed and totally devoid of any ambition for living well could nevertheless be wise. As long as such a person is deeply knowledgeable about academic subjects and knows how to live well, that person would have all they need for wisdom. With respect to a very knowledgeable and deeply depressed person with no ambition but to stay in his room, he claims, “If I ran across such a person, I would take his advice to heart, wish him a return to health, and leave the continuing search for sages to his less grateful advisees. And I would think he was wise despite his depression-induced failure to value or desire the good life. So I think that wisdom does not require valuing or desiring the good life.”

In response to Whitcomb’s penetrating criticism, one could argue that a deeply depressed person who is wise, would still live as well as she can, and would still value living well, even if she falls far short of perfection. Such a person would attempt to get help to deal with her depression. If she really does not care at all, she may be very knowledgeable, but she is not wise. There is something irrational about knowing how to live well and refusing to try to do so. Such irrationality is not compatible with wisdom. A person with this internal conflict may be extremely clever and shrewd, one to listen to on many issues, one to trust on many issues, and may even win a Nobel Prize for her intellectual greatness, but she is not admirable enough, and rationally consistent enough, to be wise. Wisdom is a virtue and a way of living, and it requires more than smart ideas and knowledge.

Aristotle held that “it is evident that it is impossible to be practically wise without being good” (Nicomachean Ethics, 1144a, 36–37). Most of the philosophers mentioned thus far would include moral virtue in their understanding of what it means to live well. However, Whitcomb challenges any theory of wisdom that requires moral virtue. Whitcomb contends that a deeply evil person could nevertheless be wise.

Again, it is important to contrast being wise from being clever and intelligent. If we think of wisdom as the highest, or among the highest, of human virtues, then it seems incompatible with a deeply evil personality.

There is, however, a very serious problem with the Hybrid Theory. Since so much of what was long ago considered knowledge has been abandoned, or has evolved, a theory that requires truth (through a knowledge condition) would exclude almost all people who are now long dead, including Hypatia, Socrates, Confucius, Aristotle, Homer, Lao Tzu, etc. from the list of the wise. Bad epistemic luck, and having lived in the past, should not count against being wise. But, since truth is a necessary condition for knowledge, bad epistemic luck is sufficient to undermine a claim to knowledge. What matters, as far as being wise goes, is not that a wise person has knowledge, but that she has highly justified and rational beliefs about a wide variety of subjects, including how to live well, science, philosophy, mathematics, history, geography, art, literature, psychology, and so on. And the wider the variety of interesting topics, the better. Another way of developing this same point is to imagine a person with highly justified beliefs about a wide variety of subjects, but who is unaware that she is trapped in the Matrix, or some other skeptical scenario. Such a person could be wise even if she is sorely lacking knowledge. A theory of wisdom that focuses on having rational or epistemically justified beliefs, rather than the higher standard of actually having knowledge, would be more promising. Moreover, such a theory would incorporate much of what is attractive about epistemic humility, and epistemic accuracy, theories.

5. Wisdom as Rationality

The final theory to be considered here is an attempt to capture all that is good, while avoiding all the serious problems of the other theories discussed thus far. Perhaps wisdom is a deep and comprehensive kind of rationality (Ryan, 2012).

Deep Rationality Theory (DRT):
S is wise iff
  1. S has a wide variety of epistemically justified beliefs on a wide variety of valuable academic subjects.
  2. S has a wide variety of justified beliefs on how to live rationally (epistemically, morally, and practically).
  3. S is committed to living rationally.
  4. S has very few unjustified beliefs and is sensitive to her limitations.

In condition (1), DRT takes account of what is attractive about some knowledge theories by requiring epistemically justified beliefs about a wide variety of standard academic subjects. Condition (2) takes account of what is attractive about theories that require knowledge about how to live well. For example, having justified beliefs about how to live in a practically rational way would include having a well-reasoned strategy for dealing with the practical aspects of life. Having a rational plan does not require perfect success. It requires having good reasons behind one’s actions, responding appropriately to, and learning from, one’s mistakes, and having a rational plan for all sorts of situations and problems. Having justified beliefs about how to live in a morally rational way would not involve being a moral saint, but would require that one has good reasons supporting her beliefs about what is morally right and wrong, and about what one morally ought and ought not do in a wide variety of circumstances. Having justified beliefs about living in an emotionally rational way would involve, not dispassion, but having justified beliefs about what is, and what is not, an emotionally rational response to a situation. For example, it is appropriate to feel deeply sad when dealing with the loss of a loved one. But, ordinarily, feeling deeply sad or extremely angry is not an appropriate emotion to spilled milk. A wise person would have rational beliefs about the emotional needs and behaviors of other people.

Condition (3) ensures that the wise person live a life that reflects what she or he is justified in believing is a rational way to live. In condition (4), DRT respects epistemic humility. Condition (4) requires that a wise person not believe things without epistemic justification. The Deep Rationality Theory rules out all of the unwise poets, politicians, and craftsmen that were ruled out by Socrates. Wise people do not think they know when they lack sufficient evidence. Moreover, wise people are not epistemically arrogant.

The Deep Rationality Theory does not require knowledge or perfection. But it does require rationality, and it accommodates degrees of wisdom. It is a promising theory of wisdom.


  • Aristotle, Nichomachean Ethics, in The Basic Works of Aristotle, Richard McKeon, New York: Random House, 1941, pp. 935–1112.
  • Garrett, R., 1996, “Three Definitions of Wisdom,” in Lehrer et al. 1996, pp. 221–232.
  • Descartes, R., Meditations on First Philosophy, in The Philosophical Works of Descartes, Volume 1, E. Haldane and G. Ross (trans. and eds.), London: Cambridge University Press, 1979, pp. 131–199
  • Descartes, R., Principles of Philosophy, in Philosophical Works, E. Haldane and G. Ross (trans. and eds.), London: Cambridge University Press, 1979, pp. 201–302.
  • Kekes, J., 1983, “Wisdom,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 20(3): 277–286.
  • Lehrer, Keith, B. Jeannie Lum, Beverly A. Slichta, and Nicholas D. Smith (eds.), 1996, Knowledge, Teaching, and Wisdom, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers
  • Lehrer, K., and N. Smith, 1996, “Introduction,” in Lehrer et al. 1996, pp. 3–17.
  • Maxwell, N., 1984, From Knowledge to Wisdom, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Norman, A., 1996, “Teaching Wisdom,” in Lehrer et al. 1996, pp. 253–265.
  • Nozick, R., 1989, “What is Wisdom and Why Do Philosophers Love it So?” in The Examined Life, New York: Touchstone Press, pp. 267–278.
  • Plato, The Apology, in The Collected Dialogues of Plato, Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns (eds.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1978, pp. 3–26.
  • Plato, The Republic, in The Collected Dialogues of Plato, Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns (eds.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1978, pp. 575–844.
  • Ryan, S., 1996, “Wisdom,” in Lehrer et al. 1996, pp. 233–242.
  • –––, 1999, “What is Wisdom?” Philosophical Studies, 93: 119–139.
  • –––, 2012, “Wisdom, Knowledge, and Rationality,” Acta Analytica, 27(2): 99–112.
  • Sternberg, R., 2001, “Why Schools Should Teach for Wisdom: The Balance Theory of Wisdom in Educational Settings,” Educational Psychologist, 36(4): 227–245.
  • Tiberius, V., 2008, The Reflective Life: Living Wisely With Our Limits, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Whitcomb, D., 2010, “Wisdom,” in Routledge Companion to Epistemology, S. Bernecker and D. Pritchard (eds.), London: Routledge.
  • Zagzebski, L., 1996, Virtues of the Mind, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Other Internet Resources

The Wisdom Page http://www.wisdompage.com/

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2013 by
Sharon Ryan <sharon.ryan@mail.wvu.edu>

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