Modesty and Humility

First published Wed Oct 31, 2018

Picture someone who constantly boasts about their accomplishments, thinks they know it all, and, even when they’re not talking, exudes an off-putting smug self-satisfaction. Such a person seems to have an ethical shortcoming; what they’re missing, you might think to yourself, is a bit of modesty or humility. Modesty and humility are ways that we relate to ourselves, to our own goodness and limitations. It involves placing ourselves among others and in the world at large. Immodest people have, among other things, an inflated sense of themselves, their accomplishments, and their place in the world.

Philosophers have been particularly drawn to the seemingly paradoxical aspects of modesty and humility. Saying “I’m modest” sounds like a self-undermining joke in a way that saying “I’m compassionate” does not. If it is a virtue, it seems like realizing that you have it somehow spoils it. This raises a range of questions about whether there are special requirements governing how we relate to our own states, traits, or achievements.

The first section discusses conceptions of modesty and humility and their key features and gives a brief historical overview of debates about whether or not they’re really virtues at all. The second section discusses theories of modesty and humility that root them in the presence or absence of particular beliefs. The third section covers a wide range of recent accounts that appeal to non-doxastic states such as emotion, desire, and attention. The final section considers related phenomena in epistemology: rational limits on self-ascription of error, attitudes to disagreement, and openness to alternative views.

1. Modesty and Humility

The feature of modesty and humility that has most captivated philosophers is its elusive nature. It seems as though knowing that you’re modest somehow spoils it; the modest person, it seems, must be unaware of their own modesty. Modesty can seem to be, as Sorensen (1988) puts it, a kind of ethical blindspot: If you have it you won’t know it (and if you seem to know you have it, you probably don’t really!)

The fact that knowing about your own modesty seems to spoil it suggests what seems, to some at least, to be a troubling tension between epistemic and moral goods. Can there really be something morally good about forming biased beliefs about your own goodness? Many imagine that perfect moral virtue must be compatible with perfect knowledge. An extreme version is Plato’s identification of virtue and knowledge in the Meno, but even less extreme views can find the idea that moral virtues might require epistemic defects to be troubling, or at least interesting.

This raises a few general issues. The first is what, if any, special requirements there are regarding how we relate to ourselves. Perhaps forcing myself to skip lunch to finish the job is not morally different from forcing someone else to skip lunch to finish the job, but they certainly feel different. This suggests that we cannot always relate to ourselves in the same way as we relate to others.

These issues are related to debates about what makes modesty or humility morally virtuous at all. Debates about modesty and humility are often battles in larger wars about the nature of virtue more generally.

1.1 Varieties and Distinctions

Philosophical work on modesty and humility brackets several senses of these terms. Philosophical accounts typically do not aim, for example, to capture uses of ‘modest’ that apply to objects as when we say “He lives in a modest house” or “She has a modest income”. The sexual sense of modesty, involving dress and behavior that presents a non-sexual image, is typically also bracketed (see Driver 1989, Statman 1992, Bommarito 2013), though some accounts aim to capture this use of the term as well; see Schueler (1997, 482), McMullin (2010, 785–786), and Wilson (2014, 79).

There is disagreement about both terms and concepts. Many theorists treat the terms ‘modesty’ and ‘humility’ as interchangeable. Hare (1996), Schueler (1997), Hurka (2001), Raterman (2006), Garcia (2006), Kellenberger (2010), and Um (forthcoming), to name just a few, all treat the terms as referring to more or less the same phenomenon. Others take the different terms to refer to very different concepts. There is some historical precedent for this; Aquinas, for example, considers both modesty and humility to be types of temperance (see Summa Theologica 2.2 Q.160 and Foley 2004).

Among those who do draw a distinction between the concepts, there is little agreement about what exactly the difference is. For some, the difference is between public and private domains. Statman (1992, 438n45) claims that modesty has an external domain while humility does not and Sinha (2012, 265) says that modesty is public while humility is private. For others, they have different epistemic requirements: Ben-Ze’ev (1993, 240) and Nuyen (1998, 101) claim that humility involves underrating oneself, while modesty does not. Driver (1998, 378f5), however, claims the opposite making modesty involve underrating and humility not. This article will take both terms to refer to a general response to one’s own goodness or achievements and will use the term that the author under consideration uses when discussing particular views.

1.2 Key Features

Modesty has several key features that theoretical accounts aim to capture. These are explicitly stated in Driver (1989 and 2001) and are taken up in most work on modesty since then.

Dependent Virtue: Slote (1983, 61ff) notes that modesty is a dependent virtue. One is modest about something else that is good, about their success or intelligence. In this sense, modesty requires the existence of another good quality. This is typically taken to be something objectively good rather than simply something that the person thinks is good, though most views can accommodate either intuition. Most views assume that the good quality in question is a good quality of the person who is modest, though Bommarito (2013, 94) broadens the scope to allow modesty about the good qualities in others when they reflect on us, as when one is modest about the achievements of their child, nation, or local sports teams. Others, such as Ben-Ze’ev (1993) and Um (forthcoming), go further and deny that modesty is a dependent virtue at all.

False Modesty: Theories of modesty also need to be able to distinguish modesty from false modesty. That is, some people who are not modest can act as if they are. This rules out accounts of modesty that are entirely behavioral. If being modest is simply a matter of certain external behaviors, then there would be no way to distinguish modesty from false modesty. Modesty and humility require certain mental states in addition to overt behaviors.

Self-Attribution Strangeness: Self-predications of modesty and humility are, at least in general, self-undermining. This is highlighted by Sorensen (1988, 120ff) and Driver (1989, 375) who note that the sentence “I am modest” is a distinctly immodest thing to say. Though Raterman (2006, 232) and Bommarito (2013, 113) describe contexts in which saying “I am modest” is not self-undermining, self-ascriptions of modesty are, in general, self-undermining. It is important to note that this need not be about public utterances; a person seems less modest for thinking about how modest they are. Bernard Williams, for example, writes that “… it is a notorious truth that a modest person does not act under the title of modesty” (1993, 10). That is, a modest person does not think of themselves as acting modestly, while a just person typically does think of themselves as acting justly.

1.3 Normative Status

In addition to the descriptive features outlined above, accounts of modesty and humility also aim to explain its normative status—why does modesty or humility count as a virtue? Most contemporary work assumes that modesty and humility are genuine moral virtues. Of course, not all philosophers have agreed. Aristotle and David Hume in particular are often singled out as denying that modesty or humility really are virtuous.

Raterman (2006, 222) and Brennan (2007, 112) both claim that Aristotle denies that modesty is a virtue, as he thinks that a virtuous person is justified in making claims about their own merit. Some have also had a hard time squaring virtues like modesty and humility with Aristotle’s ideal of the great-souled man (megalopsuchos), who deserves honors and knows it (see Nicomachean Ethics IV.3). Those working in a religious context influenced by Aristotle have to balance these competing ideals; see Foley (2004, 407ff.) and McCloskey (2006, 183). Some passages used to support the idea that Aristotle denies modesty is a virtue (Nicomachean Ethics 1108a32 and 1128b10–35) concern the Greek term aidōs, which is sometimes translated as ‘modesty’ but also commonly rendered as ‘shame’. Some modern interpreters have drawn from Aristotle to support the idea that modesty is a virtue: Driver (1989, 380) notes that Aristotle says the truthful person is inclined to understate the truth (Nicomachean Ethics 1127b4–8), Winter (2012) draws heavily from Aristotle in defending modesty as a virtue, and Hazlett (2012) defends intellectual humility as an Aristotelian mean state between dogmatism and timidity. Whatever Aristotle’s view of modesty, other Greek philosophers use the term aidōs to name a virtue. Epictetus, for example, uses it to refer to a good quality that involves taking other people’s point of view into consideration; see Epictetus: Appropriate Other-Concern and the discussion in Kamtekar (1998).

Hume is another historical figure who at least doubted whether modesty is a virtue. Hume includes modesty in his list of “monkish virtues”—various non-virtuous traits associated with self-denial that masquerade as virtues. Other examples of monkish virtues given by Hume include celibacy, fasting, silence, and solitude. According to Hume these pseudo-virtues “… stupefy the understanding and harden the heart, obscure the fancy and sour the temper” (Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals sec. IX). Elsewhere, however, Hume seems more positive about modesty as when he writes:

But its [modesty’s] most usual meaning is when it is opposed to impudence and arrogance, and expresses a diffidence of our own judgement, and a due attention and regard for others. In young men chiefly, this quality is a sure sign of good sense; and is also the certain means of augmenting that endowment, by preserving their ears open to instruction, and making them still grasp after new attainments. But it has a further charm to every spectator; by flattering every man’s vanity, and presenting the appearance of a docile pupil, who receives, with proper attention and respect, every word they utter. (Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals sec. VIII)

Hume takes virtues to be qualities that are useful or agreeable but seems to have had mixed feelings about modesty at least. Davie (1999) and Reed (2012) have argued that the so-called monkish virtues may count as virtues even by Hume’s standard.

Modesty’s status as a virtue has been liminal for other figures too. Benjamin Franklin initially excluded humility when drawing up a list of virtues he wished to develop. He added it only after a Quaker friend mentioned that Franklin was often overbearing and insolent in conversation (1771/1982, 84). His description of humility reads simply: “Imitate Jesus and Socrates” (77). This anticipates contemporary discussion of intellectual humility and its role as both a moral and epistemic virtue.

Again, the bulk of contemporary work assumes that modesty and humility are virtues and sees the main challenge as explaining why. For many it was seen as valuable because of its theological role: Aquinas says that humility is important because it makes one open to God’s grace (see Summa Theologica 2.2 Q.161 and Keys 2003). Others have found it virtuous because of the non-religious good effects it produces, like combating jealousy and making social interactions run more smoothly. Others locate the source of its virtuousness in the underlying attitude it manifests, things like kindness and concern for others. Still others argue that it is virtuous because it is a fitting response to certain morally relevant features of the world like the equal moral status of all people. What modesty is and why it is valuable are related questions and the following sections will give an overview of contemporary views on both questions.

The following presentation of the various contemporary views of modesty and humility will focus on presenting only the positive accounts and not objections to the various positions. The dialectic of the literature typically takes the form of examples and counter-examples, many of which require a good deal of description to be compelling. So in the interest of space, the descriptions of the various views will focus on presenting only the positive accounts.

2. Doxastic Accounts

Doxastic accounts explain modesty and its value by appeal to the presence or absence of certain beliefs. The relevant beliefs are typically self-evaluations, beliefs about our own value, skill, or goodness. The content of the relevant beliefs is sometimes taken to be comparative and sometimes not—think of the difference between thinking that you’re really great and thinking that you are better than others.

Ignorance accounts explain modesty by appeal to states that are epistemically defective in some way; the modest person either lacks certain beliefs about their own goodness or has false beliefs that involve underrating themselves. Accuracy accounts, on the other hand, aim to remove any tension between epistemic and moral virtue and so explain modesty via beliefs that are epistemically good. On these views, modesty is at its heart about getting it right about one’s place in the world. Strong accuracy accounts make modesty incompatible with ignorance. For these views modesty is essentially about having accurate beliefs. Weak accuracy accounts deny that modesty requires an epistemic defect, but leave it open whether moral virtue is compatible with epistemic vices.

2.1 Ignorance

Julia Driver’s account of modesty kicked off a modern revival in work on the virtue. For Driver (1989 and 2001), the modest person is someone who is ignorant of their own good qualities in certain ways. This was hinted at, but not developed, by Henry Sidgwick: “humility prescribes a low opinion of our merits: but if our merits are comparably high, it seems strange to direct us to have a low opinion of them” (1907/1981, 334). He later denies that there is anything virtuous about having a low self-opinion, but Driver develops this idea and discusses a range of moral virtues that require ignorance: blind charity (seeing the good in others while remaining ignorant of the bad), impulsive courage, certain refusals to hold grudges, some types of innocence, and of course, modesty.

Driver’s account is sometimes called an ‘ignorance’ account and other times an ‘underestimation’ account as the modest person need not be completely ignorant of their own good qualities, just underestimate them. As she points out (1999, 828), this need not require a low estimation as one can underestimate a good quality while still thinking it pretty good overall. The modest person, on this account, is someone who wrongly believes that they are not as good as they really are in some respect. This is taken to explain the key features of modesty: it is a dependent virtue since there is another quality one is ignorant of, it is not purely behavioral so allows for false modesty, and it recognizes self-attribution strangeness, since modesty itself is a good quality.

This account is set against the background of a more general account of virtue. Driver defends a consequentialist account of virtue where traits are virtuous when they, in general, produce good effects (Driver, 2001). This view of virtue makes it easy to accommodate morally virtuous traits that involve epistemic defects since some epistemic defects might turn out to produce better effects in the long run. Accounts of virtue inspired by Aristotle, however, make virtue a matter of practical wisdom which makes moral virtue incompatible with epistemic defects. It’s important to note that while Driver’s early work makes modesty require ignorance, the weaker claim that moral virtue is compatible with ignorance is enough to make problems for Aristotelian accounts of virtue (see Driver 1999). Accuracy accounts of modesty and humility are largely responses to Driver that are typically motivated to deny the idea that moral virtue can require, or even be compatible with, ignorance and false belief.

2.2 Strong Accuracy

Strong accuracy accounts not only deny that modesty is compatible with ignorance, but defend the idea that modesty is, at its heart, about having certain true beliefs. On some views, humility does involve underestimation, but only as a means to accurate self-assessment. Foot (1978/2002, 9) and Slote (1983, 61–62) both note that humility is a corrective to a general human tendency to think too highly of ourselves. No evidence is offered in support of this empirical claim, but its truth will require considering how self-evaluation works in different contexts, skill levels, cultures, and temperaments.

Many strong accuracy accounts are called ‘egalitarian’ or ‘equitable’ views. These accounts make modesty a matter of a particular kind of correct belief. Drawing on Kantian ideas about the equal moral status of all rational agents, these views root modesty in a the accurate recognition of people’s equal moral status. So for Ben-Ze’ev (1993) modesty is a matter of knowledge of the equal moral worth of everyone and accurately seeing that particular good qualities do not affect this worth. Hare (1996, 240) distinguishes one’s “moral worth as a person” (a static and invariable value) from one’s “worth as a moral person” (a value that can be affected by good qualities) and sees modesty as rooted in a recognition of the former.

Since modesty is a matter of knowing the equal moral worth of all people, defenders of this view sometimes deny that modesty is a dependent virtue since one can have the relevant knowledge while lacking any good qualities oneself (see Ben-Ze’ev 1993). They also sometimes deny that immoral people, or people who deny the equal moral worth of everyone, can ever be modest at all; see Nuyen (1998, 107) and Statman (1992, 434).

Another type of strong accuracy view appeals to different scales of evaluation. This type of view is defended by Brennan (2007), who attributes it to Adam Smith (see Theory of Moral Sentiments 6.3.22–23; it is also considered and rejected by Sidgwick 1907/1981, 334–5). On this view, modest people evaluate themselves relative to an ideal but evaluate others relative to practical norms. So modest people rightly think of themselves as not very good (compared to an ideal like a saint), and can rightly think of other people as being good (relative to how good most people actually are). Having two scales allows the modest person to make accurate assessments of themselves and others, albeit with regard to different evaluative standards. (See also asymmetry accounts below).

A third type of strong accuracy account requires accuracy about both our own good qualities and how those qualities are received by others. McMullin (2010) defends this type of account, requiring that the modest person acknowledge both the legitimacy of public standards and that one’s worth is not fully defined by them. Though she also requires tendencies to foster the welfare of others (as in kindness accounts below), these are rooted in an accurate understanding of oneself and one’s place in the social world.

Strong accuracy accounts, by explaining modesty and humility by appeal to knowledge, not only deny that modesty requires ignorance or false belief, but make modesty incompatible with it. 

2.3 Weak Accuracy

Weak accuracy accounts are typically motivated by the wish to deny that moral virtues can require epistemic defects like ignorance or false beliefs. They differ from strong accuracy accounts, however, in that they strictly speaking allow that modesty or humility is compatible with epistemic defects. For most defenders of these views, however, the ideal case will be of moral virtue without any ignorance or false belief.

Non-overestimation accounts deny that modesty or humility requires underestimation and instead claim that all that is required is not overestimating one’s own good qualities. Flanagan (1990) defends this kind of account for modesty and Richards (1988) for humility. This kind of account allows that the modest or humble person can have accurate self-knowledge. It also makes the virtue compatible with ignorance since one way of not overestimating one’s good qualities is to underestimate them, though Flanagan claims that “ideally” this will not happen (1990, 427).

Another type of weak accuracy account is the de-emphasis account. Defended by Ridge (2000) this account makes modesty a matter of de-emphasizing one’s good qualities for the right reasons. De-emphasizing here includes things like not going out of your way to stress the significance of your good qualities. This kind of account allows modesty to be compatible with accurate self-knowledge, though de-emphasis is also compatible with inaccurate self-assessment too.

Finally, Raterman (2006) defends a reluctance account of modesty. On this account a person is modest when they are reluctant to evaluate themselves in terms of their good qualities. This allows the modest person to have accurate self-knowledge as long as they are reluctant to evaluate themselves through the lens of their good qualities. Though it does not require ignorance, various inaccurate self-assessments are compatible with being reluctant to self-evaluate in these ways. This account has the benefit of providing a more nuanced view of when self-ascriptions of modesty are self-undermining; Raterman points out that his account allows that saying “I am modest” in a quiet conversation with a close friend need not be self-undermining (2006, 232).

3. Non-Doxastic Accounts

Non-doxastic accounts do not attempt to explain modesty or humility by appeal to beliefs or belief-like states at all. For these accounts the virtue may be compatible with ignorance or it may not be—it’s not about one’s beliefs at all. There is a wide range of such accounts and they see modesty or humility as being rooted in very different kinds of states and relations.

How compatible these various views are is an interpretive issue. Read as highlighting a key feature of modesty or humility, many do not rule the others out; attention, proportion, and kindness can all be critical features of modesty. They may also be read, and often are intended, as describing the fundamental feature that explains all others and in this sense they are genuine rivals that rule each other out.

3.1 Proportion

Hurka (2001, 110–111) sees modesty and humility as virtues of proportion. For him, attitudes should be proportionate to the absolute goodness of their object. This involves a denial of an asymmetry that some (Maes 2004) see as central to modesty; one’s responses should track absolute goodness regardless of whether the object is our own good qualities or those of another. Though he acknowledges that this will involve some cognitive states, what must be proportionate for Hurka are positive responses like pleasure or enjoyment. This account requires accuracy in the sense that one’s responses must be accurately proportioned to the goodness of the object, but not in the sense that it requires accurate beliefs about one’s own good qualities.

3.2 Indifference

Many theorists have seen modesty as rooted in a special kind of indifference. Typically this is an indifference to praise, the high ranking relative to others, or positive evaluation by others. Schueler (1997), for example, sees modesty as being indifferent to being evaluated highly on the basis of one’s good qualities. Though he assumes that the modest person will have an accurate self-image, this is not entailed by his account. A similar account is given by Arpaly and Schroeder (2014, 245–250) who see being modest as not caring about how you are ranked relative to others. Often, they note, this will have ignorance as a side effect, but what is essential to modesty is a kind of indifference.

Roberts and Wood (2003) give a similar account of humility, opposing it to the vices of vanity and arrogance. For them, lacking vanity means being unconcerned with the opinions of others and lacking arrogance means being unconcerned with entitlements that come along with social recognition of good qualities. Again, this is not doxastic but instead discussed as a kind of emotional insensitivity (2003, 261).

Though not explicitly discussing modesty or humility, many Buddhist thinkers defend virtues rooted in a similar kind of indifference. To oppose pride or arrogance (Sanskrit māna), Buddhist thinkers often advocate for a kind of equanimity that involves a kind of indifference to external resentment and approval as it counteracts forms of self-attachment that are thought to produce suffering. See Buddhaghosa’s Path of Purification IX.91, chapter seven of Śāntideva’s Training Anthology, and the discussion in McRae (2013 and 2016, 101ff.).

3.3 Asymmetry

Asymmetry accounts explain modesty not in terms of particular states, but in different norms governing self and other. Maes (2004) emphasizes differences between what we can acceptably say or think about ourselves and others. So, for example, saying “I deserve a standing ovation” is very different from “She deserves a standing ovation” (2004, 489). Utterances and thoughts about ourselves have special norms that are different from those concerning others.

This is in stark contrast with views that see modesty rooted in attitudes that apply to everyone, like egalitarian accounts. Modesty on this view is not about seeing some features of the world that apply to everyone, but instead seeing how different norms apply to self-references. What explains modesty’s self-attribution strangeness on this view is a more general difference in self-regarding attitudes; Maes (2004, 490ff.) also discusses, for example, gift-giving and receiving compliments in this way too.

3.4 Kindness

Many accounts see modesty or humility as a special type of benevolence or kindness. On these views, it is a way of valuing and promoting the wellbeing of others. These views make modesty not merely a trait of an individual, but deeply social in nature. So Woodcock (2008) sees modesty as about balancing one’s own welfare with the welfare of others. Wilson (2014) describes it as a type of kindness, a sensitivity to the well-being of others when presenting our own good qualities. Sinha (2012, 261) makes a similar claim about humility describing “public humility” as not claiming credit out of concern for the feelings of others.

In addition to making modesty or humility more strongly social in nature, these accounts make modesty compatible with epistemic defects but do not require them. One can exhibit the kindness and concern for others these accounts associate with modesty regardless of the accuracy of one’s self-assessments.

3.5 Attention

Attention accounts of modesty see it as rooted in patterns of motivated conscious attention. Bommarito (2013) argues that being modest is a matter of motivated inattention to one’s own good qualities and attention to external factors that brought them about. It’s not that the modest person doesn’t know about their good qualities, it’s that they don’t think about them very often. And when they do think about them, they tend to emphasize the role of situational factors in bringing them about, emphasizing things like having good teachers, supportive parents, or fortunate circumstances. A similar proposal is hinted at by Hastings Rashdall when he describes immodesty as “… habitual dwelling with satisfaction upon one’s own capacities or one’s own merits” (1907, 205).

Such habits of attention are compatible with, but do not require ignorance. This view allows Bommarito (2013, 113) to highlight cases where uttering the sentence “I am modest” does not seem self-undermining as when others are publicly discussing one’s modesty and only an admission will allow the conversation to move on to other topics. He later discusses modesty as an “inner virtue” that can be involuntary and lack any outward behavioral expression; see Bommarito (2018, 160–169).

3.6 Executive

Some have seen modesty as being essentially related to the execution of other virtues. Statman (1992, 435) calls modesty a “will-power” virtue and likens it to courage, self-control, and patience. These virtues help one to overcome inclinations that are contrary to virtue and so serve to help one overcome moral obstacles.

Various philosophers have seen modesty as functioning as a brake on certain bad tendencies. Iris Murdoch, for example, sees humility as a brake on pride; see Milligan (2007) for a detailed discussion of humility in Murdoch. Foley (2004) highlights a similar strand in Aquinas, who describes modesty and humility as moderating desires for personal excellence. Kant sometimes describes humility as moderation not of our personal desires, but of our demands on others (Doctrine of Virtue 6:462). While Sidgwick (1907/1981, 335) describes the function of humility as, in part, repressing certain emotions of self-admiration.

Um (forthcoming) sees modesty as an “executive virtue”—one that, like courage, helps to promote the ends of other virtues. Though on this account modesty itself has no positive aim, he highlights that this does not mean that modesty has merely a negative function; it is not merely a brake on inclinations, but has a positive role of promoting the ends of other moral virtues.

4. Epistemology

Modesty and humility concern how we relate to our own good qualities. In an epistemic context, they concern how we relate to the truth or rationality of our own beliefs rather than good qualities more generally. Discussions of intellectual humility or modesty involve how we relate to our own beliefs, views and judgements. Though sometimes discussed in a purely epistemic context, these often blur the line between moral and epistemic virtues, as in the case of open-mindedness.

4.1 Anti-Expertise

To be an anti-expert about a topic is to be reliably wrong about that topic. Egan and Elga (2005) distinguish being unreliable, as when a compass does not point north when facing north, from being anti-reliable, as when a compass points south when facing north. They also give the example of directions while driving: When someone is an anti-expert about directions, whenever they think they should go left they should really go right and whenever they think they should go right, they should really go left.

Sorensen (1988) argues that one’s own anti-expertise is a blindspot; it is a true proposition that one cannot rationally accept. He argues that one cannot rationally believe that their own beliefs are false since the anti-expert’s belief in something counts as evidence against believing it. Egan and Elga (2005) also argue that one cannot rationally believe oneself to be an anti-expert. So in the driving case, they say that one should withhold belief about which way to go.

But suppose that whenever the person withholds, it turns out they should go left. In this case, withholding does not escape the problem. Like modesty, there are special issues with self-ascription; one can accept that others are anti-experts with no problems, but self-ascription seems self-undermining. In this sense, it can be seen as a limit on epistemic modesty—rationality prohibits one from thinking that their own faculties are anti-reliable. So, in the more difficult directions example, Sorensen (1987, 308ff.) claims one cannot rationally believe that one is in such a situation. Gilbert (1971) makes a similar claim in the moral domain, arguing that there are rational limits on the self-ascription of moral vices.

Others have argued that it is possible to self-ascribe anti-expertise. Conee (1987) does this by suggesting that one can believe the premises of a valid argument but not its conclusion and Richter (1990) claims that one can believe general claims without believing particular instances of it. Bommarito (2010) highlights cases where the most rational option for non-ideal agents is to self-ascribe anti-expertise.

4.2 Disagreement

Anti-expertise highlights the limits of what attitudes we can take to our own epistemic states and faculties. Disagreement raises similar issues in a social context by considering how one should respond to disagreement with others who have similar evidence and faculties as you. For conciliation views, the disagreement itself is a type of higher-order evidence that warrants you to be less confident in your own position (see Christensen 2010). For steadfast views, such disagreement should not alter your confidence in your own view (see Kelly 2005 and 2010).

Like modesty, the epistemology of disagreement in part turns on whether or not we have a special relationship with our own states aside from more general agent-neutral considerations (see Christensen 2007, 335ff.). This affects how we should relate to our own beliefs and how to respond when such beliefs conflict with those of others. This is relevant to responding to rival philosophical views; see Barnett (forthcoming).

4.3 Intellectual Humility

Intellectual humility concerns similar issues as modesty more generally, but in the epistemic domain. Roberts and Wood (2003) defend an account that roots intellectual humility in low concern for status due to a high concern for epistemic goods. Like the indifference views described in 3.2, on this view the intellectually humble person doesn’t care about the social status of intellectual activities or the social status of believers.

Whitcomb et al. (2015) defend a “limitations-owning” view. On this view the intellectually humble person attends to and owns their own limitations. Rushing (2013) defends a similar view of humility in a Confucian context arguing that it is about learning and facing one’s own limitations. These accounts tend to presume that there is something special about our own limitations that warrant special attitudes beyond concern for epistemic limitations more generally.

Other views defend more doxastic accounts of intellectual humility, making it about particular higher-order epistemic states and not about general abilities or attitudes. Hazlett (2012) sees intellectual humility as having proper beliefs about the status of first-order beliefs and Church (2016) sees it as accurate tracking of the non-culpable positive epistemic status of one’s own beliefs. 

These views treat intellectual humility as an epistemic virtue. Dalmiya (2016, 115ff.), however, sees it as deeply linked with moral virtue. Drawing on Indian philosophy and ethics of care, she sees humility as both a disposition to embrace others as partners in cognitive activity and an awareness of our own ignorance and limitations. This makes intellectual humility strongly relational as it involves not only a single person’s beliefs and awareness but a focus on the epistemic agency of others. This gives intellectual humility both epistemic and moral aspects.

4.4 Open-Mindedness

Open-mindedness raises similar issues to modesty and humility in that it involves taking a special attitude to oneself. Some deny this; Hare (1985), for example, argues that open-mindedness is nothing more than treating evidence in an impartial way. Others take it to be strongly related to one’s own epistemic position: Adler (2004) sees it as a way of responding to counter-evidence to one’s own beliefs, Riggs (2010) sees it as a type of self-knowledge and self-monitoring, and Baehr (2011) sees it as involving a detachment from one’s default point of view because one wants to get to the truth.

Though it is often talked about as an epistemic view (see Zagzebski 1996), it is also discussed as a moral virtue too. Arpaly (2011) sees it as a disposition to change our beliefs without being opinionated out of moral concern. McRae (2016) also sees it as involving moral concern but also a willingness to consider alternate self-narratives, linking it with equanimity in the Buddhist tradition. This casts open-mindedness as a freedom from certain mental habits involving the self and its place in the world.

5. Conclusion

Modesty and humility touch on a variety of more general issues in philosophy. It relates to moral issues about self and other: Whether there are special moral requirements regarding our self-orientation and if so, what underlies them?

It also touches on a variety of debates within virtue theory: What kinds of self-attitudes enable the exercise of virtue? What features of the self are salient to a virtuous person? What features make the states associated with modesty and humility virtuous in the first place?

Finally, it involves questions that arise at the intersection of ethics and epistemology: Are there moral or rational limits on the kinds of goodness or badness I can attribute to myself? Can moral virtue be compatible with, or even require, epistemic failings? Careful theorizing about the nature of modesty and humility helps to shape and inform these larger questions in ethics and epistemology.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


Thanks to Sungwoo Um, Irene McMullin, and Mark Timmons for helpful comments.

Copyright © 2018 by
Nicolas Bommarito <>

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