Chauncey Wright

First published Fri Jul 2, 2004; substantive revision Tue Feb 24, 2015

Chauncey Wright was an American philosopher of science of the second half of the nineteenth century and an early proponent of Darwinism in the United States. Sometimes cited as a founder of pragmatism, he is more appropriately remembered as an original thinker in the tradition of David Hume and John Stuart Mill.[1] Wright's primary interest and originality lay in philosophy of science, but his insights and influence carried over to other venues, including philosophy of education and theory of meaning. Wright exercised a great influence at a crucial time in American cultural life — in the 1860s and 70s, when the force of religious piety and Transcendentalism was waning. He was a tireless critic of metaphysics and the natural theology he believed it served, but he was also a discriminating interpreter of principles in science and philosophy. He wrote little and his influence was exerted by means of conversation and philosophical discussion with the circle of intellectuals and academics centered in Cambridge, Mass. from 1850–75. This circle included Charles S. Peirce, William James, and Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr., all of whom acknowledged Wright's influence.[2]

Wright accepted Hume's rejection of rational a priori knowledge and, following the positivist Auguste Comte (1789–1857), he applied Hume's lesson to theory in science. Wright regarded theory as a grammar or logical template for organizing sense experience, which was the only true origin of knowledge. As such, theory was a labor-saving device and usually mathematical in character. Some theoretical entities were real, but it is extremely difficult to settle upon any as surely real, given the method of science. That method is verification. Wright used the term verification to mean the testing of theories by deducing from them consequences that can be confirmed by direct perception, the “undoubted testimony of the senses” (PD 47). What are verified are predicted consequences of theory. This commitment to the sensory base of ideas both at the beginning and end of scientific investigation reinforced Wright's belief that utility is what makes both nature and human affairs intelligible. The principle of utility informed his understanding of Darwin's Origin of Species as offering not axioms for deduction but descriptive principles, in particular natural selection, that encompassed a wide range of disparate causes of change in organisms. From this vantage point on science, Wright became a penetrating interpreter and a brilliant defender of Darwinism in its introduction into the United States. In what follows, Wright's philosophy of science will be presented, highlighting the character of his empiricism as it is revealed through his understanding of induction. The influence of Mill's utilitarianism will be evident in his interpretation of Darwin, which is presented next. The nature of his positivism and his views on cosmology and natural theology are followed by a general characterization of his scientific philosophy.

1. Biographical Sketch

Chauncey Wright was born in Northampton, Massachusetts, in 1830, where his family had lived since colonial times and where his father had been a merchant and deputy-sheriff of the county. In 1848, he entered Harvard College. His education there included two years of advanced study in natural sciences. Graduating in 1852, he took employment with the Nautical Almanac office in Cambridge as a computer. This work constituted his livelihood throughout his life. He concentrated his work for each year into the last three months of the year, devoting the rest of the time to his own studies in the logic of science and metaphysics.

The first philosophical influence on Wright was the Scottish realist, Sir William Hamilton, whose works formed the curriculum for Francis Bowen's teaching of philosophy at Harvard. Wright was, however, greatly influenced by John Stuart Mill's criticism of Hamilton, and the influence of Mill is evident in Wright's views on utility in science and ethics. The great conversion of his life came, however, with his reading of Darwin's Origin of Species, published in 1859. Wright became an American defender of Darwin against his religious antagonists and also, like Harvard's Asa Gray, against Darwin's scientific critics in America.

Wright taught for a short time at Harvard, but was not successful as a lecturer. He was an intellectual conversationalist and through his participation in a succession of study groups in Cambridge, influenced Charles S. Peirce, William James, and Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr., among others. In spite of his perspicacity and his dispassionate logical approach to discussion, he also had a gentle, sometimes angelic, temperament. Children liked him and he was willing to spend time entertaining them. He was close to Charles Eliot Norton and his family and exchanged many letters with Norton's sisters. When his friends were away for extended periods, Wright's spirits and health suffered. He endured two bouts of deep depression from which his friends roused him. Among his friends Wright counted both William and Henry James. William James said of Wright, “Never in a human head was contemplation more separated from desire.” Wright died of a stroke in Cambridge, Massachusetts, in 1875, at the age of 45.[3]

2. Wright's Philosophy of Science

2.1 Verification

Wright's writings are contained in two volumes, Philosophical Discussions, a collection of his articles published in American and British periodicals of the time, and Letters, collected shortly after his death by his friend James B. Thayer.[4] Two fundamental epistemological themes are prominent throughout his work: 1) sense perception provides the only evidence whose authority all humankind acknowledges, and 2) sense experience alone can produce the conviction and permanence that we believe knowledge should have. The first point addresses the problem of the diversity of truth claims, the second the expectation that genuine truth claims not be superseded. He said:

All observers not laboring under hallucinations of the senses are agreed, or can be made to agree, about facts of sensible experience, through evidence toward which the intellect is merely passive, and over which the individual will and character have no control. Such evidence is not the only kind which produces belief; though positivism maintains that it is the only kind which ought to produce so high a degree of confidence as all minds have or can be made to have through their agreements. (L 96)

Conviction should be accompanied by consensus, and only sense perception can claim consensus among honest investigators. Wright often acknowledged there were legitimate sources of belief besides sense perception — faith or rational introspection for instance — but none of them were adequate as sources of knowledge. Wright did not analyze sense experience into sense data, preferring to trust the holistic character of ordinary experience and most scientific observation. He introduced no theory of perception nor did he address the possible contamination of sense experience by preconceived notions. He rather placed the weight of conviction upon the employment of verification, which he allied at different times with scientific method, the philosophical doctrine of induction, and Comte's positivism. He said that the ancients did not make more progress in science because “they did not, or could not, verify their theories” (PD 45). Furthermore, all that really distinguishes metaphysics from science in the modern era is that metaphysics lacks method and “well-grounded canons of research and criticism” (PD 366).

Wright, then, regarded the nature of verification as evident and without problems of interpretation. Verification was part of the solution to the problems that beset theory-making and explanation, e.g., the competing claims about what theoretical entities exist, and what factors should militate for or against acceptance of any theory or cosmology. Asserting the priority of verification as the judge of theory, Wright said that discussion of the origin of theories or any claim for their a priori character is of no moment in science, “which maintains strict neutrality toward all philosophical systems” (PD 47). He said that the only difference between theories and facts is that theories are more complex and less directly testable (PD 44). Unlike later logical positivists, however, Wright did not hold that terms or descriptions for theoretical entities were meaningless or to be resolved only into propositions stating their verifiable consequences. The unobservables postulated by science are “for the purpose of giving a material or visual basis to the phenomena and empirical laws of life in general” (PD 164–65), and some of them will be proven to exist. In this regard, he likened Darwin's gemmule theory to Newton's corpuscular theory of light and the molecular theory of matter. In alluding to the difficulty of representing the extremely small size of molecules as measured by Thomson, Wright said:

But there is no reason to doubt that in every such molecule there are still subordinate parts and structures; or that, even in these parts, a still finer order of parts and structures exists, at least to the extent of assimilated growth and simple division. Mr. Darwin supposes such growths and divisions in the vital gemmules. (PD 166)

The important thing about hypothesized unobservables is that they be related to actual phenomena in such a way as to have verifiable consequences.

Even at this, unobservables should not be specialized natures or forces taken to account just for certain phenomena. This was, according to Wright, the problem with scholastic substantial forms (PD 166–67). His criticism of metaphysical concepts was that they are empirically poor; they do not link different phenomena and do not generate predictions that can be verified at the level of the tangible and visible. Unlike early modern critics of scholastic metaphysical concepts, Wright did not claim that scientific concepts are by comparison clear and simple. Indeed, theoretical entities in modern science can be hard to represent to ourselves because of the limitations of our conceptions to perceptible forms and properties (PD 166). Wright speculated that there were “orders of forces” between the physico-chemical and the vital, just as there are intermediate phenomena between the vegetative functions of an animal and sensibility, i.e., sensation and perception. But since sensibility presents the elements from which conceptions of size and movement must come, our conceptions of forces and hidden elements are limited to the sensible (PD 167). There are thus areas of nature we would investigate that are largely inaccessible to us because of empirical limitations. Wright did not resort to reductionism to bridge this gap in our knowledge. He said, “Can sensibility and the movements governed by it be derived directly by chemical synthesis from the forces of inorganic elements? It is probable, both from analogy and direct observation, that they cannot” (PD 167). To determine what theoretical entities are real is difficult but is nevertheless the task of science, which always concerns itself with facts.[5]

Given the realist tendency of his treatment of unobservables, indirect verification is an important part of Wright's conception of the empirical basis of all knowledge. The theory of gravity, which Wright takes to be proven, “fails to become a fact in the proper sense” because it can never be verified by direct and immediate sensory activity. Its truth must be verified indirectly. He said:

Modern science deals then no less with theories than with facts, but always as much as possible with the verification of theories, — if not to make them facts by simple verification through experiment and observation, at least to prove their truth by indirect verification (PD 45).

Wright did not elaborate upon the difference between direct and indirect verification in actual practice. He had much more to say about differences in method between science and philosophy. He believed that all branches of knowledge had to follow the method of verification belonging to science. The “philosophy of method” is incomplete, however, in that it cannot say what constitutes verification in all the departments of knowledge. Because there is no “complete inventory of our primary sources of knowledge,” there can be disagreement as to what constitutes a legitimate appeal to observation or what is a real verification (PD 45). Platonists or rationalists claim verification for their theories because they have made an observation of what reason reveals to them. In fact, they have made an induction from rational introspection (PD 46). The positivists' claim, which Wright endorsed, is simply that “verification by reason settles nothing” and that only data from sensible experience are reliable enough to admit ideas into the range of what is held to be true.

Wright added to this that verification means empirical judgment made upon deduction of consequences, not induction either from sense data or examination of self-consciousness (PD 47). Nevertheless, even science that aims at a complete empiricism must admit some “ideal or transcendental elements.” In every case, however, these elements must yield consequences that are testable, either by themselves or in conjunction with empirically derived notions (PD 47). For example, from Wright's standpoint, the cosmological theory that the universe is developing, not just changing, might be a plausible interpretation of the data available to astronomers of his day. But he thought the notion of development relies implicitly on the idea of an end or culmination. So this “development theory,” which he calls “transcendental,” must still submit to empirical test (PD 17, 118). He denied Kant's division of knowledge into “data of experience and conditions of experience” and so did not admit the transcendental in the sense of the rational a priori (L 106).

2.2 Induction

Despite Wright's distinguishing verification from induction, the latter, nevertheless, played an important role in his philosophy of science. Induction is relevant to his views of what makes for a rigorous science and what constitutes truth in science. Wright did not think it informative to contrast intuition and induction, because they do not refer to different ultimate grounds of belief (PD 373). Intuition is “rapid, instinctive judgment, whether in the objective sensible perception of relatively concrete matters, or in the most abstract” (PD 372). Intuition is properly contrasted to inference, i.e., reasoning, whether inductive or deductive. ‘Inductive,’ then, refers to the a posteriori source of reasoning, i.e., from evidence. It does not refer to a procedure for generalizing from evidence. He said, “In their primary signification and in this connection the terms ‘induction’ and ‘inductive’ refer directly to evidences, and not to any special means and processes of collating and interpreting them” (PD 372). So, induction may begin from a variety of sources. What philosophers, either Platonist or Cartesian, usually call intuition he understood to be induction from the data of self-consciousness.

Even induction from sense experience is not of one type. It may start with evidence taken from different levels of perceptual and experiential complexity and is at work at different stages of an investigation. This approach to induction is guided by the character of scientific knowledge itself, which Wright understood to be the relating of particular facts to more general ones (PD 205–206). But it also follows the character of natural phenomena. In biology in particular, the new science of evolution concerns the “external economy of life” and thus must investigate an accumulation of related facts of observation at the level of secondary causes (PD 99–100). Induction may come from ordinary experience, experiment, or the inspections of the field naturalist. He said, “Inductions are still performed for the most part unconsciously and unsystematically…. But when and however ideas are developed science cares nothing, for it is only by subsequent tests of sensible experience that ideas are admitted into the pandects of science” (PD 47).

For Wright, no axioms of science can be absolute. He said:

But all that is really implied in the name [axiom] is that truths when called axioms are used for the deductive proof of other truths, and that their own proof is not involved in the process. This does not deny, however, that they may be, as truths, the conclusions of other processes; to wit, the inductions of experience. If they are, then the only ultimate truths are the particulars of concrete experience, and no postulate or general assumption is inherent in science until its proceedings become systematic, or the truths already reached give direction to further research (L 109).

In this passage, axioms are not foundational in an epistemological sense. We seek simple principles of physical reality but must be wary of taking them as foundations in the sense of ultimate simple facts. The only ultimate in knowledge is recourse to the empirical in verification. Though verification depends on deduction, it does not depend on absolutely true starting points of deduction to yield reliable knowledge. This part of Wright's view reflects his assimilation of the positivist understanding of science as a taxonomy of practical experience with nature.

2.3 Positivism

Several issues were involved in the view of science as a taxonomy or grammar. The influential French positivist, Auguste Comte, along with scientific positivists like Mach, distrusted theoretical concepts in science because they saw that these concepts rely on elements of practical experience.[6] A prime example was the relation of the concept of gravity to the experience of weight on the surface of the earth. Comte said that gravitation is a “general fact” which is itself “a mere extension of [a fact] which is perfectly familiar to us, and which we therefore say that we know; — the weight of bodies on the surface of the earth” (Comte 28–29). Positivists believed we cannot avoid the anthropomorphic origin of theoretical concepts. It had, however, become clear to positivists who were actually engaged in the practice of science that the structure of a science is what sustains prediction, not the meaning of the theoretical terms of the science. A system of principles constitutes a logical form of explanation, and the ability of the system of principles to link disparate phenomena, more than concepts, is the truth in science. As a result, descriptions of the logical character of a science come to the fore in discussions of theory.

Wright's emphasis on verification, his pluralism about induction, and his focus on the logical character of scientific principles together show that he had absorbed important aspects of scientific positivism. He often highlighted scientific theory as classificatory (PD 363) and emphasized the relating of higher and lower levels of generality as the hallmark of science. He referred to the positivists often and to Comte in particular. In a passage that parallels Auguste Comte, Wright said that every scientific distinction is of value in classification and “must coincide with and be of use as a sign of other distinctions — that is, be a mark of the things distinguished by it” (PD 370).[7]

This passage points to Wright as a link between Comte's positivism and C.S. Peirce, who believed that concepts are indexical signs. Although he had no semiotic theory, Wright's view of scientific discourse as a device substituting for useless thought made him sensitive to the role of signs (PD 280). Wright also identified the objective value of science with its use. He meant by this “its relatedness or ulterior value, whether as leading to other and wider ranges of knowledge, or as a discipline of the mind, or even as leading to ‘bread and butter’” (PD 282). Peirce, as is well-known, insisted that the meaning of a concept is its use or effect. In contrast, Wright believed theoretical statements have meaning other than their effects, but the truth of the statements is judged by whether predicted effects or results are verified.[8]

His own approach to signs is evident in his speculation, undertaken at the urging of Darwin, about the origin of self-consciousness. Here Wright treated concepts as images. He traced the emergence of self-consciousness in terms of human awareness of different kinds of signs (usually vocal, he said) that recall images in thought. The images themselves act as signs when a human being reasons, but “with reference to the more vivid outward signs, they are, in the animal mind, merged in the things signified, like stars in the light of the sun” (PD 209). The conscious awareness of the difference between outward and inward signs is crucial to human awareness, he believed. This awareness may have come with the “consciousness of simultaneous internal and external suggestion” and the recognition of the outward sign as a substitute for the inward sign (PD 210). The key to rationality is the outward sign itself, i.e., elements of language, being made the object of attention (PD 206).[9]

It is worth noting that, in a letter of 1869, Wright used the term consilience to explain the advantages of positivism over the “older philosophy.”[10] Positivism, he said, is a system of “universal methods, hypotheses, and principles” founded on the sciences. It is not a universal science itself but must be “coextensive with actual knowledge, and exhibit the consilience of the sciences” (L, 141). Consilience was a term used by William Whewell in 1858 to describe the coherence and mutual consistency of different scientific disciplines as they develop. This coherence, for Whewell, was a test of the truth of the sciences.[11]

In summary, Wright's understanding of science and its method are distinguished by (1) his refusal to theorize about sense data and his consequent grounding of empiricism in the type of data available to everyday perceiving, (2) his nuanced treatment of induction, which rejects Cartesian starting points, and (3) his combination of verification with methodological realism about theoretical entities.

3. Interpretation of Darwin

Wright was in advance of his contemporaries in his understanding of Darwin's change in organisms and species, in part because he applied the foregoing interpretation of science to Darwin's theory. Wright highlighted the overall structure of the theory of evolution, which he believed illustrated the principle of utility. He also characterized evolutionary change in terms of different levels of causative and explanatory principles. Natural selection is a descriptive principle that unifies these other principles in a comprehensive account. It is a template, a form of explanation, by which an investigator may be guided in finding how more basic explanatory principles — the principles of chemistry and the laws of inheritance, for instance — issue in features of living things observable by direct perception.

Wright said that natural selection is a manifestation of the all-pervasive principle of utility, which governs adaptation. Utility he characterized in this way: “Let the questions of the uses of life, then, be put in this shape: To what ascertainable form or phase of life is this or that other form or phase of life valuable or serviceable?” (L 274–75). Features or parts of a living thing are forms or phases of life that serve the organism's more general functions and its survival. Perception of colors, for instance, serves to avoid the effects of dispersion of light in perception and to make possible definition of objects in vision through limits in sensibility (L 279). Using teleological language without teleological intent, he said, “Colors were invented by Nature to avoid the confusing effects of dispersion” (L 279). The physical laws of optics in this case lend themselves to an adaptation useful to living things.

Theorists of evolution are sometimes criticized for offering ‘just so’ stories of adaptation. How a given serviceable feature might have evolved is taken as tantamount to how it actually did evolve. There is, however, a valuable insight about the nature of evolutionary science to be gleaned from the practice of giving likely stories of evolution. The general form of explanation by utility is more important than which particular explanation by natural selection is advanced to explain a feature or structure. At this very early stage of reception of Darwin's theory, Wright had already realized this. In correspondence with Darwin, Wright said, “The inquiry as to which of several real uses is the one through which natural selection has acted for the development of any faculty or organ … has for several years seemed to me a somewhat less important question than it seemed formerly and still appears to most thinkers on the subject” (L 335). Wright thought there might be a plurality of uses for the same feature in the history of an organism. Sometimes these uses are contemporaneous; at other times they succeed one another in the course of evolution. Wright believed that thinking in terms of natural selection would shed light on physiological questions and connect chemical and physical explanations to the more complicated phenomena of life (PD 296). He realized that natural selection promised to be a research program for investigation that would unify biological science.

Wright strongly criticized Herbert Spencer's philosophy of evolution, both because of its excessive claims for the range of evolution and because of Spencer's understanding of evolution as a force or operative cause. There is no Law of Evolution applicable to nature and civilization. Spencer's examples drawn from the history of civilization are not truly scientific and are “liable to the taint of teleological and cosmological conception.” (PD 73). Wright said, “To us Mr. Spencer's speculation seems but the abstract statement of the cosmological conceptions, and that kind of orderliness which the human mind spontaneously supplies in the absence of facts sufficiently numerous and precise to justify sound scientific conclusions” (PD 73). In a review of a collection of essays by Alfred Wallace, the co-discoverer of the principle of natural selection, Wright said:

Strictly speaking, Natural Selection is not a cause at all, but is the mode of operation of a certain quite limited class of causes. Natural Selection never made it come to pass, as a habit of nature, that an unsupported stone should move downwards rather than upwards. It applies to no part of inorganic nature, and is very limited even in the phenomena of organic life (PD 108).

Wright held that three different “classes of causes” are involved in natural selection. The first has to do with the external conditions of the life of a living thing, its relation to other organisms and the non-organic world. Second are physical laws; he mentions specifically principles of mechanics, optics, and acoustics. These are the best known and most basic of all the principles of science. They are the principles by which means come to be fitted to ends, the fulfilling or supplying of the needs of the organism. They are the laws in accordance with which an arm or wing, an eye or ear, can be of use. Third are the causes introduced by Darwin, “the little known phenomena of variation, and their relations to the laws of inheritance” (PD 142). He said there are several divisions within this third class, distinguishing in particular diversities always existing in a population from abnormal or unusual variations. In responding to St. George Mivart's criticism of natural selection, he said that diversities existing normally in a population are the source of evolutionary change more than “unusual and monstrous variations” (PD 144). Wright made this point both to highlight the level at which natural selection operates and to drive home the role of natural selection as an alternative to teleological explanations of the usefulness of adaptations. Variations in inherited characteristics in individuals are not themselves the direct causes of changes in species. Natural selection is a complex general fact of which utility is the organizing principle.

Wright's study of Mill's utilitarianism undoubtedly influenced his understanding of Darwin. Although he rejected Spencer's application of the principle of evolution to history and civilization, he thought many aspects of human behavior and psychology could be treated by the principle of natural selection. Utilitarian ethics provided a model for him. He used the way humans make moral choices as an analogy for unconscious selection in the change of human language over time. Utility is not the motive of moral decision-makers. In the moral agent thinking rightly according to his principle of virtue, conscience will display the utilitarian principle. Similarly, there may be a variety of motives for adoption of a change in linguistic form or behavior: authority, ease of pronunciation, or distinctness from other utterances. The adoption of the change is what concerns natural selection. Natural selection shows the utility implicit unconsciously in selection by the agency of one of these motives (L 244). In commenting on moral behavior itself, Wright in effect based ethics on human nature, because of the importance he accorded to habit in human behavior:

The pains of disconcerted or frustrated habits, and the inherent pleasure there is in following them, are motives which nature has put into our wills without generally caring to inform us why; and she sometimes decrees, indeed, that her reasons shall not be ours. So that, practically, we find ourselves acting the more reasonably and more for the real ends of nature, in proportion as these are not our immediate motives, but give place to more completely devoted, single-purposed, and therefore effective powers, or to instincts and habits (L 242).

We see in this passage the separation of immediate causes of action, namely pleasure and pain, from the pattern of action serving nature's real end, namely utility. Wright thought utilitarianism needed, as a supplement, a developed philosophy of habit. In a way similar to his explanation of natural selection, he separated (1) the conditions militating toward habit, (2) immediate motives for choosing action, and (3) the larger principle governing selection of action.[12]

Wright labored in his essays and review articles to make Darwin's theory understandable to the educated American public by countering the questions about what kind of explanation natural selection offered. Realizing that utility as a principle provided the logical form for Darwin's theory, he insisted that natural selection could not submit to requirements of demonstration. It could not serve as an axiom from which deduction starts. Indeed, it should be compared to the principle of gravitation not as this concept figured in celestial mechanics or even in the laboratory but as gravitation is manifest “in the concrete courses of outward nature, in meteorology and physical geology.” Natural selection could be compared to the fundamental laws of political economy, as these laws actually emerge in the fixing of value and prices through demand and supply (PD 137). Here we see both the influence of utilitarianism and Wright's belief in the interdependence of different levels of explanatory principles.

His understanding of induction figures also in his defense of Darwin. In a review essay of 1870, he commented on the almost universal acceptance of Darwin's theory by the scientifically minded and attributed its success to “the skillful combination of inductive and deductive proofs with hypothesis.” This combination must rely, however, on a preceding simpler induction, he said. The near simultaneous discovery by Wallace and Darwin of the principle behind biological evolution testifies to their ability as naturalists to appreciate “the force of obscure and previously little studied facts” (PD 99). In this context, he also insisted upon the importance to science of investigating principles operating at a level in nature comparable to the level of political economy. He said that to fail to investigate a principle operating at the level of the whole organism or at the level of populations would go against the “Aristotelian” tendency of mind of the scientific culture. The scientific mind cannot regard the intricate system of adaptations in nature as arbitrary and is not satisfied “so long as any explanation, not tantamount to arbitrariness itself, has any probability in the order of nature” (PD 100).

In responding both to friends and enemies of Darwin's evolution, Wright sought to keep clear the minimal meaning of natural selection in scientific terms. In this way, he did great service to Darwin. Like a good positivist, he was protecting the new theory of evolution from annexation into cosmological speculation or alliance with the final causality that was always a part of natural theology.[13]

4. Cosmology and Argument Against Natural Theology

Wright had interesting and original views about the origin of the universe and changes in the heavens.[14] He saw no evidence in astronomical data or known scientific law for ascribing purpose or direction to the evolution of the cosmos as a whole. He believed it most likely that the universe is eternal, constituting “an order without beginning and without termination” (PD 4). It is governed by the principle of “counter-movements,” which he believed was manifest already in biological phenomena in the cycle of life and death, nutrition and decay. Gravitation and heat were the chief forces involved in counter-movements. Geology manifests the principle, in the relation of forces producing elevations, compressions, erosion, and deposits, and it is even more markedly evident in meteorological phenomena. Wright believed that changes in interstellar space constituted, in a way similar to meteorology, “cosmical weather” (PD 10). He was concerned that the nebular hypothesis of the origin of solar systems, presented as a plausible scientific hypothesis by Laplace and supported by the observations of Herschel, was too readily taken in support of a “developmental hypothesis” about the universe, namely that the universe was created and had evolved toward an end congenial to supporting human life. For Wright, teleological notions in science were always anathema. He accepted the nebular hypothesis in terms of the physical laws that yielded the developmental hypothesis, both in astronomy and biology. But he called it the “derivative hypothesis” to connote the fact that “in several classes of phenomena hitherto regarded as ultimate and inexplicable, physical explanations are probable and legitimate” (PD 17). He meant by this that scientific cosmology need entertain no extra-scientific principles as fundamental: “the constitution of the solar system is not archetypal, as the ancients supposed, but the same corrupt mixture of law and apparent accident that the phenomena of the earth's surface exhibit” (PD 9).

Wright was aware that the second law of thermodynamics militated against his cosmology of cosmic weather continuing in an endless succession of phenomena in infinite time. But he believed the “tendency to diffuse the mechanical energies of nature” that was characteristic of the laws of heat was considered too narrowly by Thomson and others. There was a “round of actions” in the complex interactions of heat and gravitation through space that set up the counter-movements of continuous change (L 177). To the scientific Aristotelian mind that Wright claimed to have, the theory of “wasting” raised more questions than it answered, and so he deferred his own full acceptance of it (PD 87). Wright's approach to this issue illustrates his penchant, evident also in his acute and ready understanding of natural selection, to focus on large-scale effects of natural law as making sense of nature. In this, his mind worked against the reductionist tendencies of philosophers who had less experience with and sympathy for science itself. He was interested in the persistent patterns evident to sense perception set up by the operation of natural law at levels inaccessible to perception.

A constant theme for Wright is the rejection of natural theology. He did not believe that there could be philosophical arguments, starting from natural phenomena, whether motion or the intelligible forms of living things, that prove the existence of a deity. He also believed it was impossible to identify in nature genuine final causes, ends present naturally that are always prior to the subordinate causes that bring about those ends. He said:

By what criterion … can we distinguish among the numberless effects, that are also causes, and among the causes that may, for aught we can know, be also effects, — how can we distinguish which are the means and which are the ends? (PD 36).

That the universe has a purpose or that the forms of living things given by nature have an inevitability or natural priority to them can be believed on grounds of faith but can in no way be disclosed or supported by scientific investigation of nature. Perhaps judging from the state of philosophy and theology in the American institutions of higher learning in the mid-nineteenth century, Wright believed that metaphysics had no other purpose than the service of natural theology. He was never precise about what he meant by metaphysics, but he said that the motives for theological and metaphysical speculation come from “the active emotional life of man” (PD 49–50). He seemed to equate metaphysics and philosophy. He continued, “The questions of philosophy proper are human desires and fears and aspirations — human emotions — taking an intellectual form” (PD 50). A spirit of inquiry free of these influences motivates science, but it is “necessarily, at all times, a weak feeling” and could have little effect on civilization until a body of scientific learning had been developed. He said, “And we owe science to the combined energies of individual men of genius, rather than to any tendency to progress inherent in civilization” (PD 51). Philosophy belongs with the fine arts and religion. Its attainments are not great but its motives are noble (PD 52). This ad hominen argument against philosophers — that their enterprise is not rational and disinterested — would have found ready reinforcement in Comte's rejection of metaphysics in favor of scientific method. Wright never followed Comte, however, in Comte's recommendation of a religion of humanity to take the place of religion for the masses. Although Wright's own thinking is highly philosophical, the rejection of metaphysics and philosophy together is fundamental for him and lies in the background of all his pronouncements in philosophy of science.

5. Consciousness, Evolution, and Philosophy

Wright's philosophical position is a type of naturalism, though not a naturalism endorsed by most twentieth century philosophers who have used that term. Given his view of philosophy, he resisted skepticism, idealism, and realism, regarding them all as defects of thought. Nevertheless, compared to twentieth century philosophies of science, his own philosophy of science is decidedly realist. He believed scientists discover structures and features of natural things, and previously unknown hidden entities, as well as phenomenal laws that govern the behavior of natural things. In this respect, his positivism is methodological and precautionary, a preparation for scientific realism. In treating the origin of consciousness, he said that idealism and natural realism are the two philosophical positions to issue from taking sense data and emotions as the primarily real. In idealism, the conscious subject is immediately known through his perceptions, i.e., the phenomena, and the existence of an external world can only be an inference from the phenomena known to belong to the self (PD 230). He rejected this but also rejected natural realism, which holds that “both the subject and object are absolutely, immediately, and equally known through their essential attributes in perception.” This view, he says, “is more than an unlearned jury are competent to say” (PD 231).

According to Wright, the immediacy of sensible qualities to consciousness entails that there is no way to separate subject and object in consciousness. But, he continued:

All states of consciousness are, it is true, referred to one or the other, or partly to each of the two worlds [subject and object]; and this attribution is, in part at least, instinctive, yet not independent of all experience, since it comes either from the direct observation of our progenitors, or, possibly, through the natural selection of them; that is, possibly through the survival of those who rightly divided the worlds, and did not often mistake a real danger for a dream or for an imagined peril, nor often mistake a dream of security for reality. If. . . we mean by immediacy such an instinctive attribution, independent of repeated connections of attributes in their subject through the individual's own experiences, then “natural realism” is most in accordance with our view. (PD 231)

In this quotation, Wright suggests that the division of subject from object may constitute “rightly dividing the world” as indexed by survival value. A division made in these terms, rather than by an individual's experiences of himself and the world, is a reasonable basis for natural realism. Wright's view in this passage is consistent with the position of Hume that human beings by nature make connections between ideas and the world and that skepticism about these connections is useless and idle. In this regard, Wright's position anticipates that of P.F. Strawson, a twentieth-century logical analyst. Strawson said our beliefs, e.g., in the existence of bodies, “are not grounded beliefs and at the same time are not open to serious doubt” (Strawson 1985, 19). Wright here articulates a similar point couched in terms of natural selection of beliefs. Also like Strawson, Wright took for some purposes ordinary experience as what is primarily real, while for other purposes he took the entities and properties given in physical theory as the real. This pluralistic approach came from Wright's acceptance of different levels of experience as equally valid starting points for science. Also evident in this passage, however, is the way Wright made biological evolution the basis for all other accounts of nature and human psychology. In this respect, his approach is a forerunner of John Dewey's philosophy of nature.


Primary Literature

  • Wright, Chauncey, 1866, “Mill on Comte”, Nation II, 21 (Jan. 4, 1866).
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1877, Philosophical Discussions, New York: Burt Franklin, reprinted 1971.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1878, Letters of Chauncey Wright, with Some Account of his Life, James Bradley Thayer (ed.), privately published, reprint American Biography Series.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1958, Philosophical Writings of Chauncey Wright: Representative Selections, ed. Edward Madden, New York: Liberal Arts Press.
  • Ryan, Frank X. and Edward Madden, eds., 2000, The Evolutionary Philosophy of Chauncey Wright, Sterling, VA: Thoemmes Continuum. Volumes 1 and 2.

Secondary Literature

  • Chambliss, J.J., 1960, “Natural Selection and Utilitarian Ethics in Chauncey Wright”, American Quarterly, 12(2): 144–159.
  • Cohen, Felix S., 1948, “The Holmes-Cohen Correspondence”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 9(1): 3–52.
  • Comte, August, 1853, The Positive Philosophy of Auguste Comte, freely translated and condensed, trans. Harriet Martineau, London: J. Chapman. Abridged from Cours de philosophie positive, Paris: Bachelier, 1830–42, 6 vols.
  • De Groot, Jean, 2004, “Homegrown Positivism: Charles Darwin and Chauncey Wright”, 53–71, in Nature in American Philosophy, edited by Jean De Groot, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press,
  • Fiske, John, 1885, Darwinism and Other Essays, New York: Houghton, Mifflin and Co.
  • Gershenowitz, Harry, 1979, “Chauncey Wright's Views on Lamarck”, Indian Journal of History of Science, 14(1): 16–24.
  • Giuffrida, Robert, 1978, “Chauncey Wright's Theory of Meaning”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 16: 313–24.
  • –––, 1980, “Chauncey Wright and the Problem of Relations”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, 16: 293–308.
  • Gregoriev, Serge, 2012, “Chauncey Wright: Theoretical Reason in a Naturalist Account of Human Consciousness”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 73(4): 559–592.
  • Holmes, Oliver Wendell, Jr., 1953, Holmes-Laski Letters: The Correspondence of Mr. Justice Holmes and Harold J. Laski, 1916–1935, Mark DeWolfe Howe (ed.), 2 vols., Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Hull, David L., “Darwin's Science and Victorian Philosophy of Science”, 168–191, The Cambridge Companion to Darwin, edited by Jonathan Hodge and Gregory Radick, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • James, William, 1875, “Chauncey Wright”, Nation, 21: 194.
  • –––, 1987, Essays, Comments, and Reviews, intro., Ignas K. Skrupskelis, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Kennedy, Gail, 1935, “The Pragmatic Naturalism of Chauncey Wright”, Studies in the History of Ideas, ed. Department of Philosophy of Columbia University, New York: Columbia University Press, vol. 3.
  • Mach, Ernst, 1960, The Science of Mechanics: a critical and historical account of its development, trans. Thomas J. McCormack LaSalle, Ill.: Open Court Pub. Co., 1960, 6th ed. (= Die Mechanik in ihrer Entwicklung; historisch-kritisch dargestellt).
  • Madden, Edward, 1953, “Pragmatism, Positivism, and Chauncey Wright”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 14 (1): 62–71.
  • –––, 1963, Chauncey Wright and the Foundations of Pragmatism, Seattle: University of Washington Press.
  • –––, 1964, Chauncey Wright, New York: Washington Square Press.
  • –––, 1972, “Chauncey Wright and the Concept of the Given”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, 8: 48–52.
  • –––, 1993, “Cosmic Doing and Undoing Without End: Chauncey Wright's Idea of Ultimate Reality,” Ultimate Reality and Meaning, 16: 27–44.
  • Menand, Louis, 2001, The Metaphysical Club, New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux.
  • Misak, Cheryl, 2011, “Presidential Address: American Pragmatism and Indispensability Arguments”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, 47(3): 261–273.
  • Peirce, Charles Sanders, 1923, Chance, Love, and Logic, New York: Harcourt, Brace & Co.
  • –––, 1960, Collected Papers, Charles Hartshorne and Paul Weiss (eds.), 6 vols., Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Perry, Ralph Barton, 1935, The Thought and Character of William James, Boston: Little, Brown and Co., 2 vols.
  • Privitello, Lucio A., 2005, “Introducing the Philosophy of Education and Pedagogy of Chauncey Wright”, Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, 41(3): 627–649.
  • Ratner, Sidney, 1936, “Evolution and the Rise of the Scientific Spirit in America”, Philosophy of Science, 3: 104–122.
  • Ryan, Frank X. and Edward Madden, eds., 2000, The Evolutionary Philosophy of Chauncey Wright, Sterling, VA: Thoemmes Continuum, 3 vols.
  • Schneider, Herbert, 1946, A History of American Philosophy, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1950, Review of Evolution and the Founders of Pragmatism by Philip Wiener, Journal of the History of Ideas, 11: 241–45.
  • Strawson, P.F., 1985, Skepticism and Naturalism: Some Varieties, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Todhunter, Isaac, 1873, The Conflict of Studies and Other Essays on Subjects Connected to Education, London: MacMillan and Co.
  • Wiener, Philip, 1945, “Chauncey Wright, Darwin and Scientific Neutrality”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 6: 19–45.
  • –––, 1949, Evolution and the Founders of Pragmatism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1950, “Comment”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 11: 246–47.

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