Natural Selection

First published Wed Sep 25, 2019

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Peter Gildenhuys replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Charles Darwin and Alfred Wallace are the two co-discoverers of natural selection (Darwin & Wallace 1858), though, between the two, Darwin is the principal theorist of the notion whose most famous work on the topic is On the Origin of Species (Darwin 1859). For Darwin, natural selection is a drawn-out, complex process involving multiple interconnected causes. Natural selection requires variation in a population of organisms. For the process to work, at least some of that variation must be heritable and passed on to organisms’ descendants in some way. That variation is acted upon by the struggle for existence, a process that in effect “selects” variations conducive to the survival and reproduction of their bearers. Much like breeders choose which of their animals will reproduce and thereby create the various breeds of domesticated dogs, pigeons, and cattle, nature effectively “selects” which animals will breed and creates evolutionary change just as breeders do. Such “selection” by nature, natural selection, occurs as a result of the struggle for existence and, in the case of sexual populations, the struggle for mating opportunities. That struggle is itself the result of checks on the geometric population increase that would occur in the absence of the checks. All populations, even slow-breeding ones such as those of elephants, will increase in size in the absence of limitations on growth that are imposed by nature. These checks take different forms in different populations. Such limitations may take the form of limited food supply, limited nesting sites, predation, disease, harsh climactic conditions, and much else besides. One way or another, only some of the candidate reproducers in natural populations actually do reproduce, often because others simply die before maturity. Owing to the variations among the candidate reproducers, some have better chances of making it into the sample of actual reproducers than do others. If such variations are heritable, the offspring of those with the “beneficial” traits will be likely to produce especially many further descendants themselves. To use one of Darwin’s own examples, wolves with especially long legs that allow them to run more quickly will be more likely to catch prey and thereby avoid starvation and so produce offspring that have especially long legs that allow them, in turn, to breed and produce still more long-legged descendants, and so on. By means of this iterative process, a trait conducive to reproduction that is initially found in one or a few population members will spread through the population.

Multiple bouts of Darwin’s process involving different traits, acting sequentially or in concert, may then explain both how speciation and the evolution of complex adaptations occur through the gradual evolution (change over time) of natural populations. Darwin aimed to convince his audience that even such structures as the vertebrate eye, which at first seem explicable only as the product of design, could instead be explained by incremental, directional evolution, a complex but still naturalistic process (Darwin 1859: ch. 6). What is initially a light sensitive patch may be transformed into an eye by means of a great many bouts of selection that gradually improve and enhance its sensitivity. Showing that something is explicable is importantly different from explaining it (Lennox 1991); still, a theory must be an explanatory sort of theory for it to accomplish either task. After Darwin, the appearance of novel species in the geological record and the existence of designed-appearing adaptations cannot be used as grounds for invoking supernatural causes as a matter of last explanatory resort.

1. Two Conceptions of Natural Selection

Natural selection is chiefly discussed in two different ways among contemporary philosophers and biologists. One usage, the “focused” one, aims to capture only a single element of one iteration of Darwin’s process under the rubric “natural selection”, while the other, the “capacious” usage, aims to capture a full cycle under the same rubric. These are clearly alternative, non-competing uses of the term, and distinct philosophical controversies surround each one. This section distinguishes these two uses and the following two sections are dedicated to the debates that surround each one. Sections 4 and 5 consider how natural selection connects to explanation and causation.

In Darwin’s wake, theorists have developed formal, quantitative approaches to modeling Darwin’s process. The “focused” usage of natural selection finds its home as an interpretation of a single term in some of these formalisms (and only some of them). Below, we will consider two formal approaches, type recursions and the Price Equation, elements of which have been interpreted as quantifying selection. In the Price Equation, the covariance of offspring number and phenotype is interpreted as quantifying selection; in type recursions, fitness variables (or, equivalently, selection coefficients) are interpreted as quantifying selection. What makes these interpretations focused is that they quantify only a single element of Darwin’s process using the notion natural selection; other facets of Darwin’s process are handled in other ways. So, in type recursions for instance, type frequency variables quantify how the population varies, and “spontaneous” variations are quantified by mutation parameters. Similarly, in the Price Equation, inheritance is captured by a different term than the term that is interpreted as quantifying natural selection. The point is that each formal apparatus as a whole is understood to capture Darwin’s process, while only a single element of that apparatus is said to refer to natural selection.

Some philosophers’ definitions of natural selection are clearly intended to capture this focused usage of the term. Millstein, for instance, characterizes selection as a discriminate sampling process (Millstein 2002: 35). Otsuka identifies natural selection with the causal influence of traits on offspring number in causal-graphical models (Otsuka 2016: 265). Okasha interprets the covariance of offspring number and offspring phenotype as quantifying the causal influence of selection (Okasha 2006: 28) Clearly, these uses of “natural selection” are meant to capture only an element of Darwin’s process; they make no mention of inheritance or replication. As discussed further below, controversies over the focused notion of selection have to do with whether the focused notion of selection can be distinguished from that of drift (section 3), and whether selection, in the focused sense, should be counted as a cause (section 5).

The alternative, “capacious”, usage of the notion of natural selection is to capture Darwin’s process in its entirety, rather than a single contributor to it. Because Darwin’s process is cyclical, specifying what is sufficient for a single cycle of it, a single instance of, say, replication of genes for long legs caused by long-legged wolves making narrow captures, is sufficient to specify a process that may explain adaptation and speciation. This is true, anyway, when it is added that the process gets repeated. The capacious notion, capturing a cycle of Darwin’s process, is used by Lewontin and later authors working in the same vein, who put forward conditions for evolution by natural selection: these include variation, inheritance, and reproduction. While falling within the scope of “natural selection” in the capacious sense used by Lewontin, these elements of Darwin’s process are treated as distinct from natural selection when that notion is used in its focused sense.

2. Evolution and the Conditions for Natural Selection

Philosophers and biologists have been concerned to state the conditions for evolution by natural selection, many because they take it that there is a single theory, evolutionary theory, that governs Darwin’s process. In many ways, the attempt to state the conditions for natural selection is a typical philosophical undertaking. We know, for instance, that confirmatory evidence may be used to raise our confidence in what it confirms and this recognition spawns a debate over what, exactly, should count as confirmation (see entry on confirmation). Similarly, Darwin’s theory shows how some natural phenomena may be explained (including at least adaptations and speciation), and thus it is a similar philosophical concern to state exactly when the deployment of the theory is licensed. Such a statement would then issue in a verdict on what, beyond the phenomena targeted by Darwin, is equally explicable using his theory. Such a verdict could be used to arbitrate whether the spread of cultural variations, “memes”, is genuinely explicable using the theory, as Dawkins (1982) suggested. The mammalian immune system may equally involve dynamics that are explicable as selection processes (see section 4.1 of the entry on replication and reproduction). Zurek (2009) has even defended using the theory to explain phenomena in quantum mechanics.

Here are the three principles that form the “logical skeleton” of “Darwin’s argument”, according to Lewontin (1970: 1):

  1. Different individuals in a population have different morphologies, physiologies, and behaviors (phenotypic variation).
  2. Different phenotypes have different rates of survival and reproduction in different environments (differential fitness).
  3. There is a correlation between parents and offspring in the contribution of each to future generations (fitness is heritable)

Lewontin’s principles invoke, implicitly or explicitly, a number of causal processes, including development, reproduction, survival, and inheritance. Though it is controversial whether Lewontin succeeds, clearly his three principles aim to capture at least what is sufficient for a cycle of evolutionary change by natural selection, something which, if repeated, could be used to explain adaptation and speciation.

Lewontin’s 1970 statement of the requirements for selection should be contrasted with a similar statement in a later work, in which that author once again states that “the theory of evolution by natural selection” rests on three principles:

Different individuals within a species differ from one another in physiology, morphology, and behavior (the principle of variation); the variation is in some way heritable, so that on the average offspring resemble their parents more than they resemble other individuals (the principle of heredity); different variants leave different numbers of offspring either immediately or in remote generations (the principle of natural selection). (Lewontin 1978: 220)

This later statement is in many ways similar to the earlier one, but there are some crucial differences in the formulations. According to the later article, the different individuals must be within the same species, and it is phenotypic variations, rather than fitness, that must be inherited. Many authors have echoed Lewontin’s influential principles (see Godfrey-Smith (2007) for a thorough review); for markedly different approach to formalizing the theory, see Tennant (2014)).

Lewontin’s conditions have been criticized from many directions. For one thing, they make no mention of the populations in which selection occurs, and though the second set of conditions refers to species, all the members of a single species may not form a single population for the purposes of applying selection theory. Populations must be appropriately circumscribed for some of the key vocabulary of evolutionary theory (focused selection, drift) to be deployed in a non-arbitrary fashion (Millstein 2009). Lewontin’s formulations also make no mention of the struggle for existence, a seminal notion for Darwin (see discussion in Lennox & Wilson 1994). The principles have also been subject to counterexamples. On the one hand, authors put forward cases of evolving populations that fail to meet Lewontin’s conditions. Earnshaw-White (2012) puts forward a population in which offspring do not inherit their parents’ traits, but whose members exhibit differential survival such that the population will evolve to a stable equilibrium. Equally, differential heritability may lead to evolutionary change without differential fitness (Earnshaw-White 2012; but see Bourrat 2015). Despite failing to meet Lewontin’s conditions, populations will evolve that feature variants that differ not in average offspring number, but only in generation time, such that one variant reproduces twice as fast as the other (Godfrey-Smith 2007: 495). On the other hand, authors put forward cases of systems that fail to evolve despite meeting Lewontin’s conditions. A system exhibiting stabilizing selection, such that it tends to evolve toward an equilibrium state where multiple variants remain within the population, may meet either set of Lewontin’s conditions despite failing to evolve (Godfrey-Smith 2007: 504). Counterexamples of these sorts depend upon the assumption that we can tell whether a system is undergoing selection without applying any set of criteria for doing so (see Jantzen 2019 for a discussion of how a Lewontin-style approach to whether a system undergoes selection is question-begging).

Okasha makes an important point about the intransitivity of covariance that is relevant to Lewontin’s principles. Okasha writes that Lewontin’s last two conditions essentially require covariance between offspring number and parental character (Principle 2), along with covariance between parental character and offspring character (Principle 3). (Here, Okasha is interpreting “fitness” in Lewontin’s conditions as offspring number rather than as a variable in a formalism quantifying selection in its focused sense.) Both those last two covariances might be positive without the system exhibiting an evolutionary response (as would occur if some of the parents with a given character have especially many offspring that do not especially resemble them, while other parents with the same character have offspring that especially resemble them but do not have especially many of them). For a system to exhibit an evolutionary response, Okasha requires that the covariance between parental offspring number and average offspring character be positive (2006: 37).

Okasha’s alternative condition is intended to replace a pair of Lewontin’s principles. Interestingly, Okasha further differs from Lewontin in allowing that systems that do not evolve may meet his requirements. A system in which selection is exactly offset by transmission bias will not evolve but will undergo natural selection, according to Okasha (2006: 39).

2.1 Replicator Selectionism

An alternative approach to stating conditions for natural selection involves attention to replicators, of which genes are the paradigm instance. This approach was motivated by the discovery of genetic variations that spread despite not being conducive to the reproduction of the organisms that bear them, for instance, genes that exhibit meiotic drive. Replicator selectionism, which makes genes/replicators the units of selection, was developed in contrast with the Lewontin-style approaches, which make larger entities, organisms and even species, units of selection (see entry on units and levels of selection).

Dawkins defines replicators as anything in the universe of which copies are made (1982: 82). Hull has a similar definition: a replicator is an entity that passes on its structure largely intact in successive replications (Hull 1988: 408). Germ-line replicators have the potential to have indefinitely many descendants; they contrast with somatic replicators, the genes found in body cells, which produce copies only as part of mitosis and whose lineages of descendants end when the body dies. Active replicators have some causal influence on their probability of being copied in contrast to inactive, “neutral” ones, which do not have any effects on development. Natural selection will occur wherever we find active germ-line replicators (Dawkins 1982: 83). Dawkins distinguished replicators from vehicles, his notion meant to replace and generalize that of organism. Hull proposed the notion of interactor as a similar complement to the notion of replicator. Neither notion, however, is meant to further delineate the circumstances in which selection occurs, or to narrow the scope of application of evolutionary theory (for further discussion of these notions, see entry on units and levels of selection). This is evident, for Hull at least, insofar as genes may be both replicators and interactors (1988: 409).

The view that evolutionary theory is a theory that applies to active germ-line replicators has come under fire from a multitude of directions. Genes need not be germ-line to undergo selection, as it is at least arguable that the immune system exhibits selection processes (Okasha 2006: 11). Copying is beside the point, since only similarity across generations, rather than identity, is necessary for evolutionary change (Godfrey-Smith 2000, 2007 and entries on units and levels of selection and replication and reproduction). For his part, Hull seems to agree with this last point, as he allows that organisms might well count as replicators, at least in cases in which they reproduce asexually (Hull 2001: 28–29).

Despite the bevy of attacks on replicator selectionism, replicator selectionists have not, to my knowledge at least, been criticized for being too permissive and allowing that systems that do not evolve count as undergoing selection. But germ-line replicators may exert a causal influence on their probability of being copied without spreading in a natural population as a result, as in some cases of frequency-dependent selection of systems already at equilibrium. In cases of frequency-dependent selection, variant genes cause their own reproduction, but the extent of influence on reproduction is a function of their frequency. Suppose each type spreads when it is rarer. At 50% frequency, the influences of each gene on reproduction cancel each other out, and a stable intermediate frequency is the result (for a case of a natural system that behaves this way, see Hori 1993). Because causing replication may not lead to differential replication in these and other cases, replicator selectionists do not effectively take evolution to be necessary for selection while Lewontin and those who follow his basic approach typically do do so.

2.2 Is Evolution Necessary for Natural Selection?

One natural way to arbitrate the issue of whether systems that undergo selection must evolve is to attend to the point of statements of principles of natural selection, or statements of the requirements for selection. Many theorists take it that the point of these principles is to set out the scope of a theory in the special sciences that deals with selection and evolution, evolutionary theory. Lewontin claims that the theory of evolution by natural selection rests on his three principles (1978: 220). Equally, Godfrey-Smith claims that statements of conditions for evolution by natural selection exhibit the coherence of evolutionary theory and capture some of its core principles (2007: 489). Finally, Maynard-Smith (1991) offered a statement of conditions for selection that include evolution as a necessary component, calling the theory so delineated, “Darwin’s theory”. For these writers, the (or at least a) point of the principles seems to be to capture the domain of application of the theory we have inherited from Darwin.

Darwin would have been surprised to hear that his theory of natural selection was circumscribed so as to apply only to evolving populations. He himself constructed an explanation of a persistent polymorphism, heterostyly, using his own theory. Plants exhibiting heterostyly develop two, or sometimes three, different forms of flower whose reproductive organisms vary in a number of ways, principally length. Some plants exhibit different forms of flower on the same plant, while some are dimorphic and trimorphic, with only one sort of flower per plant. Darwin interpreted the flower variations as conducive to intercrossing, which he thought was beneficial, at least for many organisms. Populations should not evolve directionally such that a single form of flower spreads throughout the population; instead, multiple variants should be retained, a polymorphism. Darwin thinks it clear that heterostyly is an adaptation:

The benefit which heterostyled dimorphic plants derive from the existence of the two forms is sufficiently obvious [….] Nothing can be better adapted for this end than the relative positions of the anthers and stigmas in the two forms. (Darwin 1877: 30; thanks to Jim Lennox for this reference)

Even though the population is not evolving, but instead remaining the same over time, it exhibits an adaptation that consists in this persistent lack of change, an adaptation that Darwin thought explicable using his theory. For a more recent and especially compelling case of a selectionist explanation of a polymorphism, see Bayliss, Field, and Moxon’s selectionist explanation of a fimbriae polymorphism produced by contingency genes (Bayliss, Field, & Moxon 2001).

Darwin thought his theory could explain a lack of evolution, and Darwinists in Darwin’s wake have explained not only stable polymorphisms, but unstable ones, cyclical behaviors, protected polymorphisms, and a variety of other behaviors that differ from simple directional evolution. These sorts of behaviors result from specific assignments of values for theoretical parameters in many of the very same models that are used to explain simple directional selection (where a single variant spreads throughout a population, as in the wolf case discussed in the introduction). The point is that systems seemingly governed by evolutionary theory exhibit a variety of different sorts of dynamics, and this variety includes both different sorts of evolution, including at least cyclical and directional, as well as a lack of evolution at all, as in cases of stabilizing selection.

Consider in particular how the difference between stabilizing and directional selection in the simplest deterministic models of diploid evolution lies in the value of a single parameter in the genotypic selection model, heterozygote fitness:

\[ \begin{align} p' & = \frac{w_{D}p^{2} + w_{H}pq}{w_{D}p^{2} + 2w_{H}pq + w_{R}q^{2}}\\ q' & = \frac{w_{R}q^{2} + w_{H}pq}{w_{D}p^{2} + 2w_{H}pq + w_{R}q^{2}}\\ \end{align} \]


  • \(p'\) is the frequency of one allele (the \(A\) allele) in the next generation
  • \(q'\) is the frequency of the alternative allele (the \(a\) allele) in the next generation
  • \(p\) is the frequency of \(A\) alleles in this generation
  • \(q\) is the frequency of \(a\) alleles in this generation
  • \(w_{D}\) is the fitness of the organisms bearing 2 \(A\) alleles
  • \(w_{H}\) is the fitness of the organisms bearing 1 \(A\) allele and 1 \(a\) allele
  • \(w_{R}\) is the fitness of the organisms bearing 2 \(a\) alleles.

In the above simple, “deterministic” models, if we set the fitness parameters such that \(w_{D} > w_{H} > w_{R},\) the \(A\) allele spreads throughout the population, together with whatever traits it causes. Suppose we include within the purview of Darwin’s theory models of this sort, together with the systems they (approximately) govern. If we change the value of the fitness coefficients such that \(w_{D} < w_{H} > w_{R},\) the system will exhibit a different sort of dynamics. It will evolve to an equilibrium point, where there exist some \(A\) alleles as well as some \(a\) alleles in the population, and remain there, resulting in a stable polymorphism. If we hold evolution as a condition for selection, we will issue the curious ruling that a system governed by the first sort of model falls within the scope of evolutionary theory while a system governed by the second sort of model only does so up until it reaches a stable intermediate state but then no longer. Moreover, populations exhibiting stable polymorphisms resulting from heterozygote superiority, or overdominance, are just one case among many different sorts of systems that equally exhibit stable polymorphisms.

Consider further that it is more realistic for systems’ dynamics to be a function of effective population size in the binomial sampling equation, as well as fitness. The above models are deterministic, while the dynamics of natural systems are to some extent random. A more realistic systems of equations, one capturing the randomness involved in evolutionary change, would feed the \(p'\) value issued by the above equations into the binomial sampling equation by making \(p' = j\):

\[ x_{ij} = \frac{(2N)!}{(2N - i)! i!} \left(1-\frac{j}{2N}\right)^{2N-i} \left(\frac{j}{2N}\right)^{i} \]

where \(x_{ij}\) is the probability of \(i\) \(A\) alleles in the next generation given \(j\) \(A\) alleles in this generation, and \(N\) is effective population size. A system governed by both the deterministic equations and the binomial sampling equation is said to undergo drift; all natural systems do so. (For more on drift, effective population size, and randomness in evolutionary theory, see entry on genetic drift). A system exhibiting heterozygote superiority whose dynamics are a function of the binomial sampling equation will not simply rest at its stable intermediate frequency but will hover around it, in some generations evolving toward it, more rarely evolving away, and in some generations exhibiting no evolution at all. Which of these cases are cases in which the system undergoes natural selection in the capacious sense? That is, which cases are cases in which the system falls within the purview of evolutionary theory? A natural answer is all of them. To answer in this way, however, we must not make evolution necessary for natural selection. If we do make evolution necessary, we issue the verdict that systems governed by the above systems of equations sometimes fall within this purview of evolutionary theory and sometimes fall outside it, on a generation to generation basis, despite being governed the whole time by a single same system of equations, ones undeniably developed as an outgrowth of Darwin’s initial theorizing.

This last pattern of argument can be extended. Indeed, given that every natural system undergoing selection also undergoes drift, evolutionary theory is arguably applicable also to systems that undergo drift even in the absence of selection (in the focused sense). Gradually reduce the importance of focused selection in the above system of equations, that is, gradually reduce the differences between \(w_{D}\), \(w_{H}\), and \(w_{R}\). Is the point at which the values equalize so momentous that it marks the point at which systems governed by the equations cease to fall within the purview of one theory and instead fall within the purview of another? Does Kimura’s neutral theory of genetic polymorphism belong in a different theory than does Ohta’s (1973) competing nearly neutral theory? Brandon (2006) argues that the principle of drift is biology’s first law, writing that neutral evolution is to evolutionary theory what inertia is to Newtonian mechanics: both being the natural or default states of the systems to which they apply. If Brandon is right, then conditions for the application of evolutionary theory must not even include conditions for selection in the focused sense, much less conditions for evolutionary change.

The point of stating conditions for evolution by natural selection need not be to state the conditions of deployment of a particular theory in the special sciences. Godfrey-Smith mentions that the principles may be important to discussions of extensions of evolutionary principles to new domains. Statements of the conditions for evolution by natural selection might have value for other reasons. But evolutionary theory is, despite the name, at least arguably a theory that is applicable to more systems than just those that evolve, as the replicator selectionists would have it.

3. Natural Selection as the Interpretation of a Component of a Formalism

One of the two chief uses of the notion of natural selection is as an interpretation of one or another quantity in formal models of evolutionary processes; this is the focused sense distinguished above. Two different quantities are called selection in different formal models widely discussed by philosophers. On the one hand, fitness coefficients are said to quantify selection in type recursion models of selection; the \(w\)’s in the above genotypic selection model are fitness coefficients. This is standard textbook usage (Rice 2004; Hedrick 2011). The recursive structure of these models is important. They can be used to infer how a system will behave into the future (though of course only if causes of the variables in the system do not change their values in dynamically-relevant ways that are not explicitly modeled in the recursive equations). At their simplest, type recursions make system dynamics a function of fitness coefficients weighting type frequencies/numbers together with effective population size (quantifying drift), as in the genotypic selection model discussed above. More complex variants of type recursions include frequency-dependent selection models, for cases in which population members’ fitness is a function of the type frequency variables; density-dependent selection models, for cases in which fitness is a function of population size; spatially and temporally variable selection models, for cases in which fitness varies as a function of a varying environmental variable that interacts with type differences, and many more. Writers working with type recursion models have developed explicit interpretations of their theoretical terms, including the fitness variables quantifying selection. So, for instance, Beatty and Millstein defend the view that the fitness coefficients representing selection in type recursions should be understood as modeling a discriminate sampling process, while drift, controlled by effective population size, should be understood as indiscriminate sampling (Beatty 1992; Millstein 2002).

Philosophers have also contended that particular terms in models of systems featuring the formation of groups (or collectives) should be understood as quantifying the influence of selection at different levels. So, some type recursions of systems involving groups feature “group fitness” or “collective fitness” parameters, ones analogous to individual or particle fitness parameters. Kerr and Godfrey-Smith (2002) discuss one such system of recursions; Jantzen (2019) defends an alternative parameterization of group selection as part of different system of equations. (See also Krupp 2016 for causal-graphical conceptualization of the notion of group selection.) For much more on multi-level selection, see entry on units and levels of selection.

The other formal model of particular interest to philosophers is the Price Equation. The Price Equation represents the extent of evolution in a system with respect to a given trait across a single generation using statistical functions:

\[ W\Delta Z = \textrm{Cov}(w_i,z_i)+\mathrm{E}(w_i \Delta z_i) \]


  • \(z_i\) denotes the character value of the \(i\)thpopulation member
  • \(\Delta Z\) is the change in average character value in the population
  • \(w_i\) denotes the number of offspring produced by (the fitness of) the \(i\)thpopulation member
  • \(W\) is the average number of offspring produced by population members
  • E is expectation
  • Cov is covariance

In the Price Equation, selection is associated with the first right-hand side quantity, while the second represents transmission bias.

Identities among algebraic functions of statistical functions make possible the mathematical manipulation of the Price Equation such that it may feature a variety of different quantities. As with type recursions, quantities in various transformations of the Price Equation are equated with selection at different levels for different systems; Okasha, following Price, treats the covariance of the fitness of collectives with the phenotype of collectives as collective-level selection, while the average of the within-collective covariances between particle character and particular fitness is identified with particle-level selection. The persistence of altruistic variants in natural populations has been explained as the result of the stabilizing conflict between selection at these different levels (Sober & Wilson 1998; and again see entry on units and levels of selection. The Price Equation can equally be manipulated to yield distinct notions of inheritance; Bourrat distinguishes temporal, persistence, and generational heritabilities and argues for the temporal notion as appropriate for the purposes of stating conditions for evolution by natural selection (Bourrat 2015).

The distinction between type recursions and the Price Equation is important, because selection is interpreted differently in each. The two formalisms will issue in different verdicts about whether, and the extent to which, focused selection operates within a single system. If we fix upon a single natural system, and ask how selection operates within it, we will get different answers if we associate selection with fitness variables in type recursions rather than \(\textrm{Cov}(w_{i},z_{i})\) in the Price Equation. To see this, consider how type recursions are structured such that inferences about dynamics over multiple generations may be made by means of them. If fitness coefficients in these models quantify selection, and these take fixed values (as they do in the genotypic selection model considered above and a great many others), then the extent of selection will remain the same over the time period governed by the model: the fitness variables remain at fixed values so selection remains an unchanging influence. But, in just the same cases, the value of \(\textrm{Cov}(w_{i},z_{i})\) in the Price Equation will change across generations as the system evolves: the covariance function in the Price Equation will be highest at intermediate frequencies, when evolution proceeds quickly, and lowest at liminal ones, when evolution goes more slowly. Consider, for instance, the extent to which the population evolves, according to the genotypic selection model above, when the following values are plugged into the model:

\[ p = 0.9, q = 0.1, w_{D} = 1, w_{H} = 0.8, w_{R} = 0.6 \]

In that case, the frequency of the \(A\) alleles moves from 0.9 to 0.92 across a single generation; there is some covariance between \(A\) types and reproduction. Inputting \(p = 0.5,\) and \(q = 0.5,\) the frequency change is greater, \(A\) types go from being half the population to frequency 0.56, and the covariance between offspring production and being an \(A\) type is correspondingly greater as well.

To see even more starkly how what is called selection in the Price Equation differs from what is called selection in type recursions, consider a system exhibiting heterozygote superiority like the one from earlier, where \(w_{D} = w_{R} < w_{H}.\) Recall that a system of this sort will evolve to a stable equilibrium (provided drift is idealized away). Using the recursive equations above, the reader can input values that meet the constraint that heterozygotes have the highest fitness, set \(p' = p,\) and compute the stable equilibrium value for \(p\), the frequency of the \(A\) alleles. If we understand selection as quantified by the fitness coefficients in this sort of set-up, then the whole time, selection operates in a constant fashion, since the fitness coefficients remain fixed. In particular, the operation of selection is the same when the system is evolving toward its stable equilibrium as when it remains at that stable equilibrium. By contrast, the covariance term in Price Equation model of the system will diminish in value until it reaches zero as the system evolves to its equilibrium state. When selection is identified with the covariance between type and reproduction, the frequency of the different types matters to the extent of selection. When selection is identified with fitness variables in type recursions, the frequency of different types has no influence on the extent of selection in the system. Thus, the different interpretations of selection that correspond to different quantities in different formal models are actually incompatible. We should expect, then, at least one of these interpretations of selection to fail, since focused selection cannot be two different things at once, at least if what counts as natural selection is non-arbitrary.

One way to reconcile these competing interpretations of selection is to make first right-hand side term in the Price Equation quantify the extent of the influence of selection in a system. If we assume that focused selection accounts for whatever covariance exists between parental offspring number and phenotype, then we may treat the first right-hand side term of the Price Equation as a measure of the extent of the influence of focused selection, at least at a given type frequency (see Okasha 2006: 26). This approach puts the logical house in order, allowing for a univocal concept of selection, but it does so at the expense of other commitments. To note just one, the Price Equation will no longer be causally interpretable, since its quantities may no longer be said to represent causes (but instead measure the extents of their influences given further limiting assumptions). There exists a sizable literature on which of multiple alternative manipulations of the Price Equation represents the actual causal structure of different sorts of system (see Okasha 2016 and section 5 below for more on this issue).

It was noted earlier that if what counts as selection is non-arbitrary, then it cannot be the case that what is quantified by the \(w\)’s in type recursions and the covariance of offspring number and phenotype both count as selection. A substantial debate has arisen over the question of whether what counts as selection is indeed non-arbitrary. In particular, some philosophers dubbing themselves “statisticalists” have challenged the non-arbitrary character of the distinction, claiming that it is model-relative (Walsh, Lewens, & Ariew 2002; Walsh 2004, 2007; Walsh, Ariew, & Matthen 2017). (For more on the arbitrariness of the selection/drift distinction, see entry on genetic drift). A related issue, discussed in the subsequent section, concerns the causal interpretability of the theory: Advocates of the non-arbitrary character of selection also typically treat selection and drift not only as non-arbitrary quantities, but also as causes, while those who allege that the distinction is arbitrary typically equally challenge the treatment of selection and drift as causes.

There exists very little discussion of formal models in statisticalist writings; various toy scenarios are put forward instead, and these are not analyzed using the techniques of formal population genetics (Matthen & Ariew 2002; Walsh, Lewens, & Ariew 2002; Walsh 2007; Walsh, Ariew, & Matthen 2017). When biologically realistic scenarios are discussed, systems of equations for inferring how such systems behave are not made part of the discussion (for more on population genetics, see entry on population genetics). We consider next a case they discuss because it provides a way of contrasting how the contrast between selection and drift is made in type recursions and how it is made in the Price Equation. There is a sort of arbitrariness here, but it emerges only from analysis of a hypothetical system using population genetics modeling techniques.

In a recent paper, Walsh, Ariew, and Matthen put forward a case of temporally variable selection and claim that it could be treated as a case either of selection or of drift (2017). The case is of a discrete-generation system with yearly reproduction in which each of two types of organisms produce different numbers of offspring depending on whether the year is warm or cold, with each type of year being equally probable: the H types produce 6 offspring in warm years while the T types produce 4, and the reverse holds for cold years. The authors take the position that the system “looks like” both a case of selection and a case of drift, but without consideration of any formal model of it. Instead, we are invited to think it is a case of selection because the fitnesses of the different types vary year-to-year; we are invited to think it is a case of drift because, allegedly, over long stretches of time the two types have equal fitnesses and we should, allegedly, predict no net increase in frequency for either type (Walsh, Ariew, & Matthen 2017: 12–13).

The scenario is illuminating because it involves randomness that cannot be quantified by effective population size in a type recursion but can be quantified as such by the drift parameter in Price Equation. When deploying type recursions, we must treat cases of temporally variable selection as cases of selection, but we are under no similar constraint when it comes to the Price Equation.

The dynamics of the warm/cold system cannot be inferred from a type recursion in which fitness coefficients are set equal and next-generation frequencies are determined entirely by the “drift” term, effective population size in the binomial sampling equation. When fitnesses are equal, the frequency of each type is determined solely by the binomial sampling equation above (since post-selection frequency, the input to the sampling equation, is just pre-selection frequency). Such a determination makes next-generation frequency a normal, bell-shaped distribution whose mean is the initial frequency of the types in the system. The distribution of next-generation frequencies in the warm/cold system does not look like this. The type recursions for the warm/cold system must be calculated using a temporally variable selection model:

\[ p' = \frac{w^{t}_{w} p}{w^{t}_{w}p + w^{t}_{c}q} \]


  • \(p\) is the frequency of warm types
  • \(q\) is the frequency of cold types
  • \(w^{t}_{w}\) is the fitness of warm types in year \(t\)
  • \(w^{t}_{c}\) is the fitness of cold types in year \(t\)

What is inputted into the binomial sampling equation, \(p'\), when the dynamics of the system are calculated using the temporally variable selection model is never the same as what is inputted into the binomial sampling equation when the dynamics of the system are treated as solely a function of drift. In the latter case, the input into the equation is just \(p\). But since the temperature always favors one or another type, post-selection frequency, \(p'\) is never equal to pre-selection frequency, \(p\). Treating a system of warm/cold type that undergoes temporally variable selection as though it undergoes drift would lead to making false inferences about its dynamics. Cases of temporally variable selection of the warm/cold sort simply must be modeled using type recursions in which fitness parameters are a function of time; the pioneering analysis of such systems was done by Dempster (1955). The above point generalizes: what is quantifiable as selection and drift in type recursions is made definite by how fitness variables and effective population size function in those models.

The story is different, however, with the Price Equation, owing to how randomness is handled in that formalism. A version of the Price Equation in which both selection and drift are represented is this (Okasha 2006: 32):

\[ W\Delta Z = \textrm{Cov}(w_{i}^{*},z_{i}') + \textrm{Cov}(\mu_{i}, z_{i}') \]


  • \(\Delta Z\) is the change in average character value in the population
  • \(W\) is the average number of offspring produced by population members
  • \(w_{i}^{*}\) is the expected fitness of the \(i\)th population member
  • \(z_{i}'\) is the average character value of the \(i\)th population member’s offspring
  • \(\mu_{i}\) is deviation from expectation of the \(i\)th population member’s offspring production

Here, the second term quantifies change due to drift (Okasha 2006: 33). Note how the \(\mu_{i}\) parameter quantifies deviation from expectation, and hence drift is a function of how the expectation is determined. Nothing about the Price Equation formalism constrains such determinations. In the warm/cold population, whether a given year’s evolution is quantified by the first right-hand side term, and hence constitutes change due to selection, or the second one, and hence constitutes change due to drift, will be determined by whether the theorist treats the weather as contributing to expected fitness. If, for instance, she is ignorant of how the weather changes year to year, she may treat the weather as drift; if she can predict it, she may not do so. Deployment of the Price Equation is compatible with both treating the weather as contributing to expected fitness and treating it as causing deviation from expectation.

The result is that a theorist deploying the Price Equation may treat as drift (that is, quantify as deviation from expectation) what a theorist deploying type recursions must treat as selection (quantify by fitness variables). It is possible to make assumptions using the Price Equation such that the drift term quantifies what is quantified by the drift term in type recursions, but nothing about the Price Equation proper forces one to do this, and indeed proponents of the Price Equation, such as Grafen (2000), tout how the drift term in the Price Equation may quantify all sorts of randomness, explicitly including randomness that is not quantifiable as drift in type recursions.

As noted earlier, selection and drift are construed in logically distinct fashions in type recursions and the Price Equation. What is called is selection in type recursions is one sort of definite thing: it’s whatever it is that must be quantified by fitness variables. What is called selection in the Price Equation is another thing, and this will be determined by researchers’ understanding of the system, in particular how they generate expectations about fitness. Ultimately, the conflict between the two modeling approaches with respect to what counts as selection may be resolvable in at least a couple of ways. Perhaps one modeling approach is simply wrong about what selection is. Alternatively, something having to do with selection is arbitrary here. In particular, whether some or another form of randomness should be treated as selection or drift is a function of one’s choice of which modeling approach to use, where distinct approaches provide logically distinct understandings of “selection” and “drift”. Once one chooses to model the system using type recursions, one’s hand is forced: the temperature must be modeled as selection. Once one chooses to model the system using the Price Equation, one’s hand remains free: one may treat the changing temperature as relevant to expected fitness, and hence treat it as selection, or instead treat it as producing deviation from expectation, and thereby treat it as drift. According to this second way of resolving the conflict, the choice between the two modeling approaches is not dictated by nature, and is thus at least metaphysically (if not pragmatically) arbitrary.

4. Natural Selection and Explanation

As noted above, evolutionary theory cannot do its job unless it has an explanatory structure. Philosophers have contended selection explains a variety of things in a variety of ways.

4.1 Explanatory Scope

There exists a longstanding debate among both scientists and philosophers over exactly what natural selection can explain, one begun by Sober and Neander who were concerned with what natural selection can explain (Sober 1984, 1995; Neander 1988, 1995). In a recent expansive treatment, Razeto-Barry & Frick 2011 distinguish between the creative and non-creative views of natural selection. On the non-creative view, natural selection merely eliminates traits while doing nothing to create new ones; the latter phenomenon is the result of mutation. Proponents of the creative view see natural selection as a creative force that makes probable combinations of mutations that are necessary for the development of at least some traits. While Razeto-Barry and Frick grant that natural selection cannot explain the origin of traits that arise by a single mutation, they argue that it can explain the occurrence of sequences of phenotypic changes that would otherwise be wildly unlikely to occur without selection operating to cause the spread of the changes prior to the final one in the sequence. Additionally, it is disputed whether natural selection can explain why an arbitrary individual has the traits it has (Walsh 1998; Pust 2004; Birch 2012). On the positive view, selection affects the identity of individual organisms, and it is part of the identity of an individual to have been produced by the parents that produced it, so natural selection explains why individuals have the traits they do. On the negative view, the explanatory scope of natural selection is limited to population level properties. Razeto-Barry and Frick further consider the question of whether natural selection can explain the existence of individuals, ultimately arguing against it.

4.2 Challenges to Explanatoriness

The capacity for natural selection to explain has come under fire from several directions. An important challenge to the explanatory power of selection was made by Gould and Lewontin who impugn the veracity of selectionist accounts of the origin of traits whose correctness is pinned on nothing more than their plausibility and capacity to explain (Gould & Lewontin 1979: 588). Gould and Lewontin offer several examples of traits for which such “just so” stories are easy to construct but nonetheless taken to be true on the basis of little or no evidence beyond the plausibility of the accounts and their consistency with the theory. Lennox argues that, when not taken as even purportedly true, “just so stories” can play a genuine, if modest, role in the evaluation of scientific theories as thought experiments used to assess the explanatory potential of the theory (see also Mayr 1983; Lennox 1991; entry on adaptationism). In the debate over Darwin’s theory, thought experiments of this sort were deployed by both Darwin and his critics in ways both legitimate and rhetorically effective (Lennox 1991).

Another attack, or set of attacks, on the ability of natural selection to explain have to do with the threat that selectionist explanations are circular. This sort of problem with a would-be explanation arises when one must already know what one means to explain in order to construct one’s (thereby failed) explanation of it. This problem surfaces, in different ways, in the contexts of Lewontin’s requirements, type recursions, and the Price Equation.

Lewontin’s requirements for evolution by natural selection contain an ambiguity. “Fitness” could refer either to offspring number or to fitness variables of the sort found in the genotypic selection equation above (the \(w\)’s). Godfrey-Smith, in noting that some formalisms do not feature fitness variables at all, is using the term in the latter sense (2007: 496), while Okasha’s treatment of Lewontin’s requirements uses fitness in the former sense. Suppose fitness means offspring number and suppose further that the requirements play the role of determining under what circumstances evolutionary theory may be deployed. If these things hold, then the circularity problem arises: we must know that the variants in the system have different numbers of offspring in order to apply Lewontin’s requirements to deploy the theory that would explain the very same offspring production despite such production serving to license the theory’s deployment in the first place.

Consider type recursions next. Suppose we must know actual reproduction rates to assign relative fitnesses values in type recursions. Were this so, an alleged explanation of the extent of evolutionary change in the system that makes crucial use of type recursions would be circular. The circularity problem does not come up for practicing biologists deploying type recursions, as those workers rely upon fitness estimates that are inferred from statistical facts about a target system during the estimation phase in order to assign values to variables in type recursions that are then deployed over the system during the projection phase. What such biologists mean to explain, the behavior during the projection phase, is different from what they use to construct the explanation, the behavior during the estimation phase (Mills & Beatty 1979; Bouchard & Rosenberg 2004; the estimation/projection phase contrast is due to Glymour 2006).

That the scientists largely agree about the practice of statistical estimation shows that they largely share some tacit concepts of selection and fitness, ones it would be an advance for philosophers to define. Philosophers have developed definitions of fitness. Brandon was the first to defend the propensity interpretation of fitness and it has earned much discussion since (Brandon 1978; Mills & Beatty 1979; Rosenberg 1982; Brandon & Beatty 1984; Brandon 1990; Sober 2000). Rosenberg and Bouchard have developed a recent definition of fitness based on the relationships between an individual and its environment that contribute to the individual’s success (Bouchard & Rosenberg 2004; for more on “fitness” see entry on fitness).

Turning finally to how the tautology problem surfaces in the context of the Price Equation, consider how that equation formally represents the extent of evolution across some time period in which reproduction occurs. Assigning values to its statistical functions requires information that spans that time period, such as information about the offspring number of the parents and the phenotypes of the offspring. The deployment of the Price Equation does not involve any estimation/projection period contrast. It cannot be used a source of new information about some time period that remains otherwise unexamined. The Price Equation could not, for instance, be used to make a prediction about the dynamics of some system into the future in the same way that type recursions can do. This is because “an application of the Price equation for the purpose of prediction would presuppose the very information you want to predict with it” (Otsuka 2016: 466). For this reason, Otsuka claims that the equation is not explanatory (2016: 466).

Another difficulty faced by selectionist explanations has to do with their reliability. Glymour has argued against the reliability of explanations constructed using type recursions: “population genetics models evolving populations with the wrong variables related by the wrong equations employing the wrong kinds of parameters” (Glymour 2006: 371). Glymour demonstrates that exogenous fitness variables cannot be used to quantify environmental causes of reproduction that change in their influence during the projection period. Fitness cannot be a kind of summary variable that abstracts away from the causal details of the natural population while also functioning to reliably predict and explain the dynamics of the systems to which type recursions apply. Gildenhuys (Gildenhuys 2011) provides a response to Glymour, acceding that his arguments are valid but contending that there are a variety of ways to complexify type recursions to formally handle the influence of environmental causes; Glymour (2013) provides a reply.

4.3 Natural Selection as a Mechanism

Philosophers interested in explanation have recently turned their attention to mechanisms: “mechanisms are sought to explain how a phenomenon comes about or how some significant process works” (Machamer, Darden, & Craver 2000: 2). One way to secure explanatory status for selection would be to show that it functions as a mechanism. Whether natural selection qualifies as a mechanism is controversial. Skipper and Millstein gainsay the position: natural selection not organized in the right sort of way to count as a mechanism, exhibits a lack of productive continuity between stages, and further lacks the requisite sort regularity of operation (Skipper & Millstein 2005: 335). Barros (2008) has argued that natural selection may be characterized as a two-level mechanism, with a population-level mechanism and an individual-level mechanism working together. Havstad (2011) responds that the account Barros offers is too general and so includes any selective process, not just natural selection. Moreover, the parts/entities and activities/interactions that supposedly make-up the mechanism of selection can only be specified by the roles in the selective process, whereas mechanistic explanation works by associating these roles with specific phenomena (Havstad 2011: 522–523). Matthews (2016) offers a case study of the debate over selection as a mechanism, while DesAutels (2016) provides a defense of a mechanistic view.

5. Causation

Godfrey-Smith makes the point that some character could fit Lewontin’s conditions for evolution by natural selection by mere chance. Parents with a particular trait could have more offspring than parents without it, even though the trait does not causally influence offspring number (Godfrey-Smith 2007: 511). In such cases, Lewontin would rule there is evolution by natural selection, provided that the trait is heritable, since individuals with it have a de facto higher rate of survival and reproduction, if only by chance. Equally, a trait could spread by hitchhiking and meet Lewontin’s requirements for selection (or Okasha’s for that matter). A hitchhiking trait is correlated with one that causes reproduction, and as a result, individuals with the trait exhibit increased reproduction, despite the trait not causing reproduction at all. But, for Godfrey-Smith, there is no natural selection, at least in the focused sense, on the trait in these sorts of cases because differences in the character had no causal role in producing variation in offspring number (Godfrey-Smith 2007: 513).

As noted earlier, theorists working on type recursions who defend the view that selection is a distinct quantity from drift typically defend the view that it is also a distinct cause. Forber and Reisman explicitly invoke the interventionist account of causation and argue that natural selection (and drift) qualify as causes (Reisman & Forber 2005). They do so on the basis of an examination of experimental work in which selection (and drift) are manipulated to produce changes in population-level behavior. “Causalists” working with type recursions must confront the natural philosophical challenge of stating, precisely, what cause or causes count as selection, that is, what exactly fitness coefficients quantify. The Beatty/Millstein interpretation of selection as discriminate sampling is explicitly causal. Equally, Otsuka’s position that fitness coefficients should be interpreted as linear path coefficients from phenotype to offspring number in causal graphs is clearly causal as well.

The Price Equation may be deployed for some system without regard to what causal relationships hold within it. Okasha argues that variants of the equation may constitute causally adequate representations under special circumstances. It is important to distinguish this contention from the contention that the Price Equation is causally interpretable. The right-hand side terms of the Price Equation are (algebraic functions of) statistical functions, while, in causally interpretable equations, causes are variables (Woodward 2003: 93). A causally interpretable system of equations is one that one features causal variables on its right-hand side and effects on the left: \(a = b\) is causally interpretable if \(b\) causes \(a\) but not if the reverse. Okasha does not call any formulation of the Price Equation causally interpretable. However, the notion of causal adequacy he does deploy seems to have been developed solely in the context Okasha’s discussion of the Price Equation and thus risks being about causation in name only.

Okasha’s basic approach is to assess whether some formulation of the Price Equation as a causally adequate representation in terms of whether the statistical functions in the equation take positive values while their arguments are causally related (2016: 447). In a multi-level, causally adequate version of the Price Equation,

\[ W\Delta P =\textrm{Cov}(W_{k},P_{k}) + \mathrm{E}_{k}[\textrm{Cov}(w_{jk},p_{jk})] \]


  • \(W\) is average offspring number
  • \(\Delta P\) is change in average character value
  • \(W_{k}\) is the average fitness of the individuals in the \(k\)th group
  • \(P_{k}\) is the average character value of the individuals in the \(k\)th group
  • \(\mathrm{E}_{k}\) is the average across groups
  • \(w_{jk}\) is the offspring number of the \(j\)th individual in the \(k\)th group
  • \(p_{jk}\) is the character value of the \(j\)th individual in the \(k\)th group

Okasha proposes a test for causal adequacy that works this way: if the first term takes a positive value, then \(W_{k}\) and \(P_{k}\) must be causally related, or else the equation is not causally adequate. Equally, a version of the Price Equation is not causally adequate if its statistical functions take a positive value despite their components failing to be causally related, or if its statistical functions take value zero when their components are causally related. Whether a version of the Price Equation is causally adequate is thus a function of the causal relationships among the variables in the system. On this approach, the concept of causal adequacy means something different than causal interpretability does for equations that exhibit dependencies between variables that represent causes.

6. Conclusion

This entry initially distinguished two usages of “natural selection”, the focused and the capacious one, the focused one picking out a single formal element of the process captured by the capacious sense. There are some intermediate cases. Brandon offers this definition of selection: selection is differential reproduction that is due to differential adaptedness to a common selective environment (Brandon 2005: 160). This definition does not attempt to capture the entirety of Darwin’s process: while it identifies natural selection with a type of reproduction, there is no mention of inheritance or replication. Repeat a process specified to fit Brandon’s definition as often as you like and we still might not have something that makes adaptation or speciation explicable. But neither is Brandon’s definition of selection appropriate as an interpretation of a theoretical term in any formalism. Instead, that definition connects with an effort to develop a Principle of Natural Selection which would serve a seminal role in a qualitative version of Darwin’s theory. The Principle is formulated using probability talk along with the notion of fitness. The historical development of the Principle of Natural Selection, beginning with Brandon together with Beatty and Mills (Brandon 1978; Mills & Beatty 1979), has been guided by debates over the interpretation of probability and fitness addressed elsewhere (Brandon 1990: ch. 1; Sober 2000; Campbell & Robert 2005; entry on fitness).

“Natural selection” has been used to pick out one, or multiple, or all the elements of a single cycle of the recursive process that we learned from Darwin. Seemingly, there is arbitrariness in how one decides to deploy the term natural selection, such that any part of Darwin’s recursive process could be treated as the natural selection part. It is difficult to say that either Brandon, or Okasha, or Otsuka, or Millstein is wrong in their characterizations of selection, even though the characterizations are superficially logically incompatible. The several definitions pick out genuine elements of genuine processes, each with their own significant theoretical importance.


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