Notes to Count Paul Yorck von Wartenburg

1. For the dating of the manuscripts, see Fetscher (1991, XLIX/L).

2. Dilthey had dedicated his first book Einleitung in die Geisteswissenschaften (1883) to Yorck. The dedication reads as follows:

To Count Paul Yorck von Wartenburg. In one of our first conversations I developed for you the outline of this book, which at that time I still dared to call a Critique of Historical Reason. In the wonderful years since then I have had the singular fortune of sym-philosophizing with you on the basis of the kinship of our sentiments, oftentimes in daily conversations. How could I wish to single out from the whole of thought, which I put forward here, that which it owes to you? Accept this work, now that we are separated by distance, as a sign of my steadfast loyalty. The best reward for the long hours in which this work came into being will be the friend's approval. (Dilthey, 1959, p. IX)

A posthumously published piece in which Dilthey describes a fictitious “discussion” with a “friend” is another memorial to Yorck. See Dilthey, “Der Moderne Mensch und der Streit der Weltanschauungen,” in Weltanschauungslehre, (Gesammelte Schriften, Vol. VIII), Stuttgart: B.G. Teubner, 1960, pp. 226–235.

3. It is important to note that what Yorck calls ‘life’ is precisely what Kierkegaard, Heidegger, Jaspers, and Sartre mean by ‘existence.’

4. In contrast to Goethe's earth spirit, Yorck speaks of the “spirit of history.” He writes:

I also enjoy the silent soliloquy and communion with the spirit of history. This spirit did not appear to Faust in his study, or even to the great Goethe. The spirit of history would never have frightened them away, no matter how serious and compelling the form taken by it. After all, the spirit of history is a brother and relative in a different, deeper sense than the denizens of bush and field. This effort is like Jacob's wrestling, a sure gain for the wrestler himself. But that is what matters in the first instance. (CR, 133)

5. The word Geschichtlichkeit, historicity, so liberally used by Yorck and, to a lesser degree, Dilthey, was actually coined by Hegel, who used it in two instances as the study by Leonhard von Renthe-Fink (1968, 20–35) shows. The two instances are in Vorlesungen über die Geschichte der Philosophie, Volume I, Hermann Glockner (ed.), Stuttgart: Fr. Fromanns Verlag, 1959, p. 189–190 and Vorlesungen über die Geschichte der Philosophie, Volume III, Hermann Glockner (ed.), Stuttgart: Fr. Fromanns Verlag, 1959, p. 137. Neither Yorck nor Dilthey seem to be aware of this Hegelian origin. Gadamer also never refers to Hegel in this regard.

6. Dilthey and Yorck avoid all references to Marx & Engels. But Marx's and Engels’ systematic recourse to “life” in its historicity is certainly close enough to Dilthey's and Yorck's to warrant some further clarification. For instance, in The German Ideology, Marx and Engels write:

We know only one science, the science of history. History can be viewed from two sides: it can be divided into the history of nature and that of man. The two sides, however, are not to be seen as independent entities. As long as man has existed, man and nature have affected each other. The history of nature, so-called natural history, does not concern us here at all. But we will have to discuss the history of man, since almost all ideology amounts to either a distorted interpretation of this history or a complete abstraction from it. (Karl Marx, Selected Writings, Lawrence H. Simon (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994, p. 107)

7. It remains unclear whether Yorck's recourse to transcendence reinserts a supra-historical point of reference into historical life. For instance, Yorck himself says that “the Christian” stands “above history” (CR, 70). That would hardly make the Christian standpoint a fitting reference-point for a thoroughly historical life. Walter Schulz has argued, clearly with Yorck among others in mind, that the attempt to advance a counter-concept to Greek metaphysics and modern objectivism by starting from the fact of historical life can be successful only on the condition that “the basic Christian approach” and particularly “the idea of transcendence” is abandoned, because it is “ahistorical” (Walter Schulz, Philosophie in der Veränderten Welt, Pfullingen: Neske, 1972, p. 480).

8. In recent years, Charles Bambach has forcefully argued that Yorck's rejection of groundlessness [Bodenlosigkeit] amounts to the de facto claim for the rootedness of authentic thought in the “native earth,” the soil of the homeland (Heidegger's Roots: Nietzsche, National Socialism, and the Greeks, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2003, p. 18). According to this reading, Yorck's project is an attempt to vindicate the dependency of thought on the earth, autochthony [Bodenständigkeit], a more or less reactive move against the massive waves of modern urbanization and the growth of cosmopolitanism. There is no question that, on the socio-political level at least, Yorck looks askance at the “ground-less” or “property-less” situation [boden-loser Status] of the modern city dweller (CR, 20). Yorck claims that “the alienation from the ground” takes away the necessary centre of gravity in people. Bereft of the ties to the ground, people achieve only “an unstable balance,” and they become liable to great fluctuations in their behaviours, thoughts, etc. (CR, 20). Coupled with Yorck's anti-bourgeois, anti-democratic, and anti-Semitic sentiments with which he tends to lace his comments in the Correspondence with Dilthey, one can easily picture the intellectual physiognomy of Yorck as a member of the landed nobility, defending the interests of the Prussian Junker class by validating the “stability” and “necessity” of landed property as a precondition for authentic thought. On the other hand, an early critic of Yorck, the philosopher Fritz Kaufmann, has pointed out that in the Correspondence Yorck never uses the term Bodenständigkeit, autochthony (1928, 40). The “ground” on which thinking is to be based is the ground of consciousness or life, which for Yorck always means the living self-consciousness of an individual person in the context of his or her historical reality and the felt relation to the transcendent God. The evidence found in one's own life (considered in its entirety) provides what Yorck calls “the legitimating ground” [Rechtsgrund] for all claims (CR, 66). However, in his philosophical manuscripts (see section 3 below) to which Kaufmann had no access in 1928, Yorck once directly relates “groundlessness” or Bodenlosigkeit—taken as the physical lack of a home—to the particular shape of thought of the Hebrew people. Yorck writes about their exile:

It has been remarked that the landlessness [Landlosigkeit] over many years of the exiled caused the groundlessness [Bodenlosigkeit] of the Jewish consciousness of God. (Yorck 1892–97, 16)

However, Yorck immediately continues by contesting this view: “Yet, events of this sort have an effect only if the psychological preconditions are in place” (16). Hence, Iring Fetscher comments that for Yorck “landlessness” as such is “not a sufficient condition” for “groundlessness” because only a preceding historical stance of consciousness—a stance of life—can be the effective ground for it (1991, 197, note 23).

9. Therefore, immersion in self-consciousness also constitutes the ground from which all philosophy springs, because all philosophy is an experiment of life. Yorck begins the fragment with the following paragraph:

“Self-reflection opens up [eröffnet] epochs of philosophy, so Socrates, so Descartes. This reflection signifies the reaction of life [Lebendigkeit] against a style of thought which no longer satisfies the need for insight. Philosophical progress happens by way of this stepping back into the fullness of life.” (ST, 3)

Continuing this line of thought a bit later in the manuscript, Yorck insists that philosophy “begins empirically” and “is experimental in its method” (ST, 8). In the Correspondence, Yorck had observed:

“Philosophy is an action, which raises life, i.e., the subject in its relations, as living, to consciousness and thinks it through to its end” (CR, 247).

10. Yorck writes: “The word [i.e., representation or logos] is as unable to grasp life, as is the deed” (ST, 54). That is to say, each particular function of life grasps only a partial aspect of life and cannot stand for the whole of life.

11. Yorck, who with Fichte believes the silly story that German and Greek are the pre-eminent “philosophical languages” (ST, 117), points out that the German and the Greek word for “knowledge” or “cognition,” Vorstellung and episteme respectively, already refers to an outer realm “into” which the object of knowledge is “put” or “posited” (ST, 147).

12. Elaborating on the inner-outer relation in feeling, Yorck writes:

“But the other does not become something independent [Selbständiges], [but, rather, it] remains an element of the self, and is, therefore, in the field of sensibility, the lived body in contradistinction to the body.” (ST, 72)

13. According to Yorck, the attempted projection or externalization of time is effected through the will, the desire to hang on to something present (which opens up the past) or to prolong a satisfaction (which opens up the future) (cf. ST, 22).

14. Yorck remarks that “only an abstract and superficial thinking” construes the feeling of mortality as the result of a “probabilistic inference” (ST, 90).

15. This letter was posthumously published for the first time in Gründer (1970, 356).

16. If the most comprehensive or radical notion of “historicity” [Geschichtlichkeit] requires that history is no longer seen as the “counter-concept” to the eternal (see Gadamer 1958, 1496), it follows that Yorck already employs that notion of historicity.

17. Yorck writes:

Just as individuals are talented in different ways, albeit within the same range of basic characteristics, so differently talented peoples occur in the course of history. But only those whose aptitude is the effect of a radical division [of primary life] can lay a claim to historicity. Only those are the heroic peoples [Heldenvölker]. (ST, 26)

18. In fact, Yorck points out that in Greek philosophy, particularly the Stoa, affective bonds are understood as detrimental to the seeking of truth. They have to be suppressed “in order to make room for the energy of cognition” (ST, 122).

19. While Yorck claims that the particular centre of gravity for Greek consciousness is “ocularity” (ST, 55), he does not imply that it is limited to the Greek world alone. The privileged place of plasticity [Gestaltlichkeit] and ocularity informs all subsequent “aesthetic-scientific” endeavours (ST, 32). For instance, Yorck sees the detached ocularity very much alive even in modern historiography, particularly Ranke (see CR, 60).

20. Yorck sees life as inherently historical or developmental in the sense that earlier stages are incorporated and remembered in the ongoing process (CR, 71). The more this “existence” of life is foregrounded, in opposition to what “is” fixed and objectively “there,” the more “historically” will life be conducted.

21. Cf. Yorck's signature formula: “Transcendence contra metaphysics” (CR, 42).

22. Yorck has a very keen sense of the numbing effect of public opinion and the modern submission to it. To Dilthey he once writes:

One of the state's key pedagogical tasks should be to undermine elemental public opinion and, as far as possible, educate people to see and observe in an individual way. This would enable the conscience of the individual—conscience, in other words—to come to the fore once again, rather than so-called public conscience—which is the total externalization of conscience. (CR, 249/50)

23. In a letter to Dilthey, Yorck writes:

But you know my fondness for the paradoxical, which I justify by the fact that paradox is a property of truth, and that, as an elementary precipitation of generalizing half-truths, the communis opinio has nothing in common with the truth. Its relationship to truth is like the sulphurous fumes left behind by lightning. Truth is never elemental. (CR, 249)

24. Independently of Yorck, Heidegger held similar reservations concerning Dilthey's harnessing of Christian historical life for the Geisteswissenschaften in the wake of Kant and Schleiermacher. See Martin Heidegger, Phänomenologie des Religiösen Lebens, (Gesamtausgabe, Volume 60), Frankfurt: Vittorio Klostermann, 1995, p. 164 and Heidegger, Phänomenologie der Anschauung und des Ausdrucks, (Volume 59), Frankfurt: Vittorio Klostermann, 2007, pp. 163–168.

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