Count Paul Yorck von Wartenburg

First published Mon Mar 19, 2012; substantive revision Fri Sep 8, 2023

Count Hans Ludwig Paul Yorck von Wartenburg (1835–1897) was a German philosopher. He is primarily known for his long collaboration with his friend Wilhelm Dilthey (1833–1911) and for his impact on Martin Heidegger (1889–1976) and Hans-Georg Gadamer (1900–2002). Together with Dilthey, Yorck was the first philosopher to elaborate the specific concept of historicity [Geschichtlichkeit] as a defining characteristic in the ontology of human beings. In particular, Yorck emphasized the generic difference between the ontic and the historical, i.e., the difference between what is seen or conceptualized (or aesthetically contemplated) as permanent nature, or essence, or idea, and the felt historical rhythm of life, i.e., life’s immersion in and belonging to the overarching and always changing waves of history. In contradistinction to Dilthey’s epistemological endeavors to clarify the foundations of the historical sciences vis-à-vis the natural sciences, Yorck aimed exclusively at the ontology of historical life, particularly the historical band (syndesmos) and effective connection (virtuality) that unites generational life. Based on the primacy of historical life, Yorck adopted a decidedly anti-metaphysical stance, rejecting all claims of knowledge sub specie aeternitatis. He combined this with a Christian, particularly Lutheran, conception of a historical and personal but entirely transcendent God, relative to whom each individual person, in inescapable singularity, defines his or her own life story. Yorck’s ideas were first made public in the form of a posthumous volume of his Correspondence with Dilthey in 1923 (Yorck 1923). Through this publication he influenced not only Heidegger (see Farin 2016, Fagniez 2013, Dastur 2011, Ruin 1994) and Gadamer (1990), but also Misch, Rothacker, Scholem, Bultmann, Marcuse, and others. Between 1956 and 1970 various unfinished fragments of Yorck’s writings were published (see Bibliography). They contain the outline of Yorck’s systematic psychology of history and history of philosophy, as well as extensive reflections on the partial negation or suppression of temporality in thought and metaphysics (due to the inherently spatial character of representation and thought as such). These later works have not received as much attention as his earlier views in his Correspondence with Dilthey.

1. Yorck’s Life

Count Paul Yorck von Wartenburg was born in Berlin on March 1, 1835. His grandfather was the famous Field Marshal Hans David Ludwig Yorck von Wartenburg. (The Field Marshal’s courageous signing of the Convention of Tauroggen, originally unauthorized by the king and thus in effect treasonous, started the Prussian War of Liberation against Napoleon in 1813. It made the Field Marshal Yorck a national hero.) Paul Yorck’s father, Ludwig David Yorck von Wartenburg, managed the family’s estate at Klein-Oels in Silesia (near Breslau, today Wrokław) where Paul Yorck grew up. Paul Yorck’s parents were well-connected to a number of literary, philosophical, and artistic circles in Berlin and elsewhere. They were acquainted with Friedrich Schleiermacher, Ludwig Tieck, Bettina von Arnim, Alexander von Humboldt, Karl August Varnhagen, Johann Gustav Droysen, Karl Friedrich Schinkel, and Ernst von Wildenbruch, to name but a few. The family Yorck von Wartenburg belonged to the dominant elite in Prussia and the German Empire. Yorck’s life-long enthusiasm for history and historical reality must be seen against this biographical background.

In 1855 Paul Yorck began his university studies in law at Bonn, but soon moved to the university at Breslau where he also enrolled in philosophy courses. After passing the second law exam, Yorck published his exam essay “The Catharsis of Aristotle and Sophocles’ Oedipus of Colonus” (Yorck 1866), the only publication by him during his lifetime. When his father passed away in 1865 Yorck took over the management of the family estate at Klein-Oels. He also assumed his father’s hereditary seat in the Prussian Upper Chamber [Herrenhaus] where he participated in political debates. He took part in the Franco-Prussian war (1870–1871); and he was present at the Proclamation of the German Empire in the Hall of Mirrors at the Palace of Versailles in 1871.

In the same year Yorck met Dilthey, who had been called to the University at Breslau. They quickly became friends and Dilthey was a frequent guest at Klein-Oels, often staying for prolonged working holidays. The posthumously published Dilthey–Yorck Correspondence (Yorck 1923) is an impressive testimony to this friendship.

From the early 1890s Yorck worked on a manuscript on Heraclitus (Yorck 1896/97) and a book about the Stances of Consciousness and History (Yorck 1892–1897).[1] Before his death, Yorck declared the two works unfinished and not ready for publication. Published only posthumously, they are, in the words of Karlfried Gründer (1970, 55), “sketches” of first drafts for “great philosophical books.” Paul Yorck died at Klein-Oels, September 12, 1897. His grandson, Count Peter Yorck, who had studied Yorck’s unfinished works, was a leading member of the Kreisauer Circle, the German resistance cell responsible for the failed attempt to assassinate Hitler on July 20, 1944.

2. Correspondence with Dilthey

When in 1923 the Correspondence between Yorck and Dilthey (Yorck 1923) (abbreviated hereafter as CR) was published as “a memorial” to their philosophical friendship (CR, VI), it established Yorck not only as an equal to Dilthey and a faithful interlocutor and eager co-worker on Dilthey’s project(s),[2] but also as a philosopher and keen observer of his times in his own right.

In 1892 Yorck writes to Dilthey:

Our time portends something of an end of an epoch. A token of this is the disappearance of the elemental pleasure in historical realities. The feeling that everything passes [Gefühl der Vergänglichkeit] haunts the world once again. (CR, p. 140)

Dilthey clearly shares this sentiment. In a more extensive note about the same topic Yorck writes:

It is my growing conviction that today we stand at a historical turning point similar to the one of the 15th century. In contradistinction to the scientific-technological progress, which consists in increased abstraction and isolation, a new formation comes into being because the human being in his entirety [der ganze Mensch] once again takes a stand and faces the problems of life. Every time it is a new stance towards life [Lebensstellung] and a new conception of it that ushers in a new epoch, not any old discovery or invention, even if it is of the greatest import. The thread on which science hangs has become so long and spun ever so thin, that now it is snapping in the face of the impetuous question: What is truth? (CR, p. 128)

In yet another letter, Yorck claims that, since the Renaissance, science and knowledge—abstracted from feeling and volition—have followed an eccentric trajectory, in which they have lost sight of man, resulting in profound self-alienation:

The ripple effects caused by the eccentric principle, which ushered in a new age more than four hundred years ago, seem to me to have become exceedingly broad and flat; knowledge has advanced to the point of nullifying itself, and man has become so far removed from himself that he no longer catches sight of himself. ‘Modern’ man, that is, man since the Renaissance, is fit for the grave. (CR, p. 83)

The general thrust of these reflections and the language used are reminiscent of Nietzsche’s descriptions of the “uncanniest of all guests,” nihilism. In fact, it is the usually so cautious Dilthey who, in one of his last letters to Yorck, remarks that the true but “horrible word about the age has been announced” by no one other than Nietzsche (CR, p. 238). There is no reason to believe that Yorck would have disagreed.

Yorck’s and Dilthey’s awareness of an epochal shift, written some twenty years before World War I, could not fail to impress the generation of students who, in the aftermath of this European catastrophe, their predicament exacerbated by continued economic hardship and hyperinflation, returned to studying philosophy in the early 1920s. This may explain why, much later, in the 1980s, Gadamer would still speak of the enormous significance of the publication of the Dilthey–Yorck correspondence in 1923, calling it an “epoch-making moment” in its own right (Gadamer 1995, p. 8).

According to Yorck, the analysis and evaluation of the contemporary intellectual-historical situation is integral to philosophy—all the more so if philosophy self-reflexively grasps its ineluctably historical nature, which in itself is one of Yorck’s main philosophical interests. The basic idea for the historicity of philosophy is fairly straightforward. For Yorck, as for Dilthey, philosophy is “a manifestation of life” [Lebensmanifestation] (CR, p. 250), a product or an expression in which life articulates itself in a certain way. But all life is intrinsically historical. Life is inconceivable without its historical development. Yorck writes:

The entire given psycho-physical reality is not something that is, but something that lives: that is the germ cell of historicity. And self-reflection, which is directed not at an abstract I, but the entirety of my own self, will find that I am historically determined, just as physics grasps me as determined by the cosmos. Just as I am nature, I am history. And in this decisive sense we have to understand Goethe’s dictum of [our] having lived [Gelebthaben] for at least three thousand years. Conversely, it follows that history as a scientific discipline exists only as psychology of history. (CR 71/72)

For Yorck, as for Dilthey, human life is incorrectly understood if it is subsumed under the generic catch-all category of “existence.” The first point is that human life is inconceivable without temporal and historical development, movement, and change; life always transcends itself, hence it never simply “is.” The mode of being for humans is “life,” not “existence.”[3] And life, unlike existence, is intrinsically historical. Precisely this distinction is brought home by Yorck’s demand to always observe “the generic difference between the ontic and the historical” (CR, p. 191). The ontic is what is simply “there” without inner life, temporality, or history. It includes the physical entities in the world, as well as abstract objects, numbers, essences, ideas, etc. The “ontic” is toto caelo other than “the historical.” Yorck’s second point is that all history is a development of human powers or human psychology, where psychology does not mean some inert or fixed “nature,” but the constant play of forces, the ever shifting configurations between understanding, affectivity, and volition. (See Section 3.1 below.)

In addition, Yorck emphasizes the “virtuality” or “effectivity” of history, i.e., the cumulative effects and results of individual persons exerting power and influence in transmitting the possibility and conception of life to their descendants. Successor-generations develop their own stance towards life in response to what they have inherited from the individuals and generations preceding them. History is the ongoing transmission of life’s potentiality, including the transmission of power, ideas, and material conditions.

The child gains through the mother’s sacrifice, her sacrifice benefits the child. Without such virtual transmission of power [Kraftübertragung] there is no history at all. (CR, p. 155)

Yorck does not refer to some anonymous bio-power or power structures, as discussed in contemporary philosophy, but to the authority, sacrifice, and direct action and communication through which an individual person or groups of persons form and shape the lives and behaviours of coming generations. It is for this reason that Yorck insists that “person” is the key historical category (CR, p. 109). History is the history of historical, individual agents, projecting their power and authority into the future.

Since Yorck understands history as a connecting band of ideas and conditions passed on from one person to another, and indeed from one generation to another, his position must not be associated with historicism. For Yorck, there is one continuous and common line of historical life—a living syndesmos. Past generations and past persons are not “outside” a present horizon in a past world of their own. Rather, they live on, as it were, in their descendents. Moreover, because of this connecting band, one can go “backwards” by way of what Yorck calls “transposition” (CR, p. 61), transposing oneself into the lives of others and thus “re-enacting,” as Dilthey would say, the positions towards life that have been lived by one’s predecessors. That life is historical means that each person is always already outside his or her own individual “nature” and placed within the historical connection to predecessor- and successor-generations. For Yorck, living self-consciousness is, to use Hegel’s fortuitous phrase, “the I that is we and the we that is I” (Hegel 1807, p. 140).

Consequently, Yorck rejects from the start the transcendental method in philosophy as insufficient for grasping lived historical reality. Transcendental philosophy reduces historical life to the merely “subjective,” which misses the genuine characteristic of Geist, spirit or mind, namely its real, historical extension and connection. As Yorck puts it, “the transcendental method” merely suspends or sublates “the realm of the objective,” but it fails to “extend the region of Geist” (CR, p. 194). Insisting that “the character of subjectivity does not even reach the realm of Geist” (CR, p. 194), Yorck clearly implies that the “realm of history” is the proper domain for Geist. It follows that, despite his criticism of the narrow confines of transcendental and/or subject-centred philosophy, Yorck’s philosophical conception of history is still inscribed within the confines of Geist-philosophy. Following Hegel, who argues that everything hinges on the understanding that “substance is subject” (Hegel 1807, p. 19), Yorck agrees that everything hinges on the understanding that “substance is history” or “substance is historical spirit.”[4]

Yorck’s primary category of historical life does not only challenge transcendental philosophy as too-narrow a foothold for philosophy. A fortiori, it also challenges the entire metaphysical tradition, which presupposes or searches for an ultimate objective reality (being, idea, substance, and so on), divorced from the ground of the always shifting historical life. Yorck rejects claims to “knowledge” sub specie aeternitatis. For Yorck, metaphysics is a flight from the historical reality ‘on the ground.’ By making historical life primary, Yorck effectively aims to dismantle the predominance of Greek metaphysics, including the modes of thought of modern science derived from it.

But Yorck is not content with just opposing metaphysics and transcendental philosophy. Instead, he attempts to instill and to cultivate historical awareness in philosophy itself, based on the principle that all productions of life are as historical as life itself. He writes: Since “to philosophize is to live,” “there is no real philosophizing which would not be historical” (CR, p. 251). More radical than Dilthey, Yorck calls for the “historicization” [Vergeschichtlichung] of philosophy:

Just as physiology cannot abstract from physics, so philosophy—especially if it is critical—cannot abstract from historicity [Geschichtlichkeit]. After all, the uncritical Critique of Kant’s can be understood historically only, and thus be overcome. [Human] behaviour and historicity are like breathing and air pressure—and—this may sound somewhat paradoxical—the failure to historicize philosophizing appears to me, in methodological respects, a metaphysical remnant. (CR, 69)

It is therefore not surprising that, unlike Dilthey, Yorck specifically appreciates the emphasis on historicity [Geschichtlichkeit][5] in Hegel and some of his followers, despite his rejection of Hegel’s speculative or ontical superstructure (CR, 59).[6]

In light of the historical nature of philosophy, Yorck draws two decisive methodological inferences. First, he rejects as too rigid and untenable the opposition between theoretical or systematic philosophy and the history of ideas (CR, p. 251), because, as an ongoing historical development, philosophy always requires both a genetic and historical clarification, as well as a systematic and theoretical account. Instead of a mutually exclusive relation, Yorck sees a mutually productive combination. Second, because Yorck always includes the present situation within the domain of history, he calls for a “critical,” and not “antiquarian,” or quietistic mode of philosophizing (CR, p. 19). Speaking for Dilthey and himself, Yorck argues that this critical work of philosophy lays the groundwork for the practical intent or the historical vocation of philosophy:

The potential for practical application is of course the real justification for any science. Yet mathematical praxis is not the only kind. In practical terms, our standpoint is pedagogical in intent, in the broadest and deepest sense of the word. It is the soul of all true philosophy and the truth of Plato and Aristotle. (CR, pp. 42/ 43)

In the condensed and all too general format of the Correspondence with Dilthey, Yorck develops the practical “application” of philosophy in only the most fragmentary fashion. Its most important part is the actual clarification of the contemporary situation, the determination of the given historical possibilities, and the avenues for implementing some of them. Yorck holds that since the Renaissance and through the works of such thinkers as Galileo, Descartes, and Hobbes, the self-interpretation of life has found its centre of gravity in the cultivation of the theoretical understanding [Verstand]. The primacy accorded to theoretical understanding and what it projects as objective, unchangeable, and ultimate reality (metaphysical & physical) has ushered in “the natural sciences,” “nominalism,” “rationalism,” and “mechanism,” (CR, pp. 68, 63 & 155). But this has come at the exclusion of the full thematization, expression, and appreciation of human affectivity [Gefühl], including the underlying feeling of human connectivity through a shared life in history. Blocked-out are questions which affect the temporal, historical and personal existence of human beings, or what Yorck once calls “existential questions” [Existenzialfragen] (CR, p. 62), which relate to the life-goals human beings strive after, the recognition of dependency, and the awareness of human mortality, finitude, and death (CR, p. 120). The relative sidelining of these aspects in the psychology of human beings lies at the bottom of Yorck’s diagnosis of the increasing self-alienation of modern man and the crisis of his time.

With Dilthey, Yorck attempts to highlight the “full human being” [den ganzen Menschen] (CR, p. 157), as opposed to the rationalistically reduced, one-dimensional individual that has preoccupied modern philosophy and shaped modern culture. The historicization of philosophy belongs to this project, as does the acknowledgment of transcendence. According to Yorck, transcendence (CR, pp. 120, 144) facilitates the withdrawal from the world in its objective reality (as represented by thought and metaphysics). It lets human life pivot around the personal, historical, and affective dimension, foregrounding personal responsibility and accountability to the transcendent God. Against the theoretical-metaphysical stance directed at an ever present objective reality, Yorck insists on the primacy of the personal, historical relation to the transcendent God. Yorck’s dictum “Transcendence contra metaphysics!” expresses not only a very strong leitmotif in his philosophical thought (CR, p. 42); it is actually the very capstone.[7] For this reason, Yorck has been interpreted as a religious existentialist (Kaufmann, 1928). This sets him apart from Dilthey. Yorck’s conception of Christianity is heavily biased in favour of Luther’s theology. According to Yorck, Luther’s anti-metaphysical, historical stance towards transcendence remains a historical task for the future development of philosophy (CR, pp. 144 & 145).

Since Yorck frequently and conspicuously uses the term Bodenlosigkeit [groundlessness], or bodenloses Denken [groundless thought] to describe the one-sided intellectualism of the scientific-technological civilization since the Renaissance (CR, pp. 39, 103, 250, 230, 143), questions have been raised about Yorck’s preference for autochthony [Bodenständigkeit] and the political implications thereof.[8]

3. Philosophical Fragments on History and Psychology

More than half a century after his death, three philosophical fragments by Yorck—originally written in the last six years of his life—were published between 1956 and 1970 (see the Bibliography). The most important is entitled Bewusstseinsstellung und Geschichte [“Stances of Consciousness and History”] (abbreviated hereafter as ST). It addresses the sources and the development of human history, providing the philosophical underpinning and more detailed exploration of views that Yorck had mentioned in his Correspondence with Dilthey. The following section presents the major points of this systematic fragment.

Yorck’s main aim is to provide an analysis of the underlying psychology of human life, which he considers the basis for all historical development. According to Yorck, particular configurations in the psychology of man, or stances of consciousness, determine the dominant shape of historical epochs. In other words, certain positions adopted on the level of “primary life” [primäre Lebendigkeit], the stances taken by consciousness within life, determine “historical life” [historische Lebendigkeit] at large and can define entire epochs (ST, p. 5; also pp. 52, 53). Therefore, Yorck speaks of the “psychology of history” and, the “philosophic history of philosophy” (which traces the stances of consciousness through empirical history) (ST, p. 10).

All this is predicated on the supposition of our intuitive access to psychological or primary life through “self-reflection” [Selbstbesinnung]. Yorck interprets Dilthey’s insight that one cannot go beyond life to mean that one cannot surpass or transcend “the empirical givenness of self-consciousness,” which entails that philosophy is “empirical,” not speculative (ST, pp. 8, 3). Evidence can only be found in self-consciousness. What does not pass the test in one’s own life cannot count as a valid expression of life: The seat of all necessary truth is “self-experimentation” (ST, 9, also 54).[9]

Not unlike Husserl, Yorck pursues, albeit without an elaborate set of methodological rules, a “re-duction” of all objectivity to self-consciousness, where self-consciousness is a living and historical structure that cannot be restricted to knowing or any other particular function of life. As Gadamer (1990, pp. 246–269) has pointed out, despite his critique of transcendental philosophy, Yorck may be read as actually expanding the transcendental focus, which traditionally used to be on knowing, so as to include the entire gamut of human experiences and their necessary conditions in human life. Following Dilthey, Yorck sees human consciousness as a living structure where the emphasis lies on its “aliveness,” Lebendigkeit, which includes not only outward-directed intentionality towards objectivity (representation and volition), but also self-awareness, and self-feeling of inner life. Close to Schleiermacher, Yorck even specifies that “the ultimate datum” in self-consciousness is “the feeling of life” [Lebensgefühl] itself (ST, p. 11).

3.1 Psychology of Life

According to Yorck, life is divided and articulated in itself, namely as an ongoing process of self-differentiation relative to others and the environment. Yorck writes:

The primary and exclusive datum is self-consciousness, which, although divided [dirimiert] into self and other, soul and lived body [Leib], I and world, inner and outer, is nonetheless, polarity [Gegensätzlichkeit] and articulateness [Gegliedertheit] in one. But self-consciousness experiences itself in the play and counter-play of its constitutive factors, that is, as something alive [ein Lebendiges]. This aliveness is the basic constitution. (ST, p. 8)

But there is no way that this aliveness can ever be grasped in its purity outside the fundamental differentiation. The antithetical division in “self” and “other” is so fundamental that one cannot go back behind it.

The separation [Trennung] of self and other, I and world, soul and lived body [Leib] is such an early separation, indeed, the first act of life, as it were, such that these derivatives appear as absolute, autonomous, and self-sufficient. (ST, pp. 11/12)

Yorck concludes: “The self is only through the other, just as the other is only through the self” (ST, p. 11).

Yet “life” remains the primary datum for Yorck. Reminiscent of German Idealism, particularly Hegel and Hölderlin, Yorck understands life as “differentiated unity” [differenzierte Einheitlichkeit] (ST, p. 38). Life explicates itself in form of an inner division and polarity. Each stance of life is a particular configuration of life’s original division [Urtheil or Urtheilung] (ST, p. 25). Yorck writes:

Observation shows that primary life manifests a double diremption into [1] polarity [Gegensätzlichkeit] and [2] difference [Verschiedenheit], such that the character of polarity permeates and determines the elements of the articulation. (ST, p. 10)

Life articulates or expresses itself differently in three “functions” or “comportments” [Verhaltungen], as life is lived in [1] “feeling” [Empfinden] or affectivity, [2] “willing” [Wollen], and [3] “cognizing” [Vorstellen] (ST, 32). Life is divided between the two antithetical or opposite poles of spontaneity and dependence (ST, p. 9), which, applied to the different comportments or functions of life, yields [1] the tension between motivation and spontaneity in volition, [2] the opposition in cognition between objective, matter-of-fact representation [Sachlichkeit] and spontaneous projection of formed images [Bildlichkeit] as the object of knowledge, and [3] the polarity between dependence on others versus ownness [Eigenheit] in the domain of affectivity (ST, p. 32).

Yorck claims that the three psychological “functions” or comportments circumscribe the fixed and unalterable “natural ground” [Naturboden], or the parameters within which all human history is played out (ST, p. 26). There is no history without such fixed reference points. The economy of the three functions is not fixed (unlike the functions as such), but is always open to the play of shifting configurations and imbalances (ST, p. 24 & 54). More specifically, the three functions are neither reducible to each other nor derivable from another source, making them in effect equiprimordial. However, they stand in a variable and inverse relationship to each other, where the relative preponderance of one function is offset by the relative subordination of the remaining ones, but at no time can any particular function be cancelled out altogether (ST, p. 98). This inverse relationship, coupled with the internal polarity within each function, accounts for “the restlessness of primary life” (ST, p. 32). Since life does not exist in some generality, but only as a particular configuration or alignment of its functions, the overall “totality” of the shape of a particular life is always determined by a pre-dominant position of one of its functions (ST, p. 55). This onesidedness, which necessarily fails to express life in its “entire fullness”[10] (ST, p. 54), results in the instability of each particular shape of consciousness. Each real configuration of consciousness and its particular bias to one function, as well as one of the antithetical poles within, lends itself to a new transformation, without ever reaching a stable or final state. Since “historical life” is nothing other than “primary life” writ large, Yorck holds that this inbuilt instability and restlessness in primary life also constitutes the “motor of history” (ST, 33). (See Section 3.2 below.)

Yorck holds that two functions of life, willing and cognition, are “eccentric;” they pursue objects that are projected outside the felt interiority of self-consciousness (ST, p. 120). Concerning representation or cognition, Yorck writes:

Self-reflection reveals representation [Vorstellen] as an act of exteriorization, as a projection, which therefore is primarily marked by its opposition to feeling. The feature of projection, [i.e.,] expulsion from within [innere Entfernen], being the characteristic element of all representation, is spatialization [Verraümlichung] as such. (ST, p. 70)

Spatialization is thus necessary for representation or the work of the understanding, thought. By contrast, temporality (located in affectivity) is not at all necessary for cognition or representation:

Thought can abstract from temporality. Indeed, every act of thought contains […] an abstraction from [temporality], inasmuch as thought involves an expropriation [of inner feeling]. By contrast, spatiality is the precondition of all thought.[11] (ST, p. 147)

All thought is inherently spatial, representing objects at a distance in space: “Spatiality is the basic character of all thought” (ST, p. 119). According to Yorck, thought or cognition may abstract from particular characters of space, such as “direction” and “place,” but it cannot do without the projective opening of spatiality as such (ST, p. 100). And Yorck suggests that it is the inherent spatiality in all thought which, within the intellectualist tradition of the West, has rendered “space” an unsurpassable “metaphysical” reality, or transcendental condition of reality as such (ST, p. 100). Since thought or cognition is an achievement of life in abstraction from temporality and feeling, space itself appears as eternal, neutral exteriority.

Yorck emphasizes that cognition of objects in space amounts to an act of “liberation,” because what has been “placed” at a “psychological distance” in the realm of an eternal, and neutral objectivity has lost its power over the representing subject, has no impact on the person’s affectivity, and can no longer excite the feeling that everything passes away (ST, p. 74).

There is thus a positive correlation between cognition and volition. Cognitive projection is already an attempt to gain a foothold relative to “the flight of impressions, appearances, and strivings,” and the fixation of an object in space goes hand in hand with the search for self-constancy and “self-affirmation” [Selbstbehauptung] (ST, p. 66). Therefore, Yorck holds that philosophy and science, as cognitive comportments in life, are rooted in the striving for self-affirmation. He thus attributes an eminent ethical impetus to them. “Freedom” and “autonomy” are the psychological motivation for philosophy and science (ST, p. 42).

In contrast to cognition and volition, which are “eccentric” and directed towards the “outer,” feeling or affectivity [Gefühl or Empfindung] is the awareness of inwardness or interiority. Yorck writes: “The essence of the inner [des Innen] is feeling [Empfindung]” (ST, p. 71). At the limit, feeling is object-less and an immersion in subjective life. As Yorck explains, feelings are only secondarily attached to objects. Pain or pleasure, for instance, has no “representational content” [Vorstellungsinhalt]. Yorck writes: When “I feel, I stay within me” (ST, 71)—chez moi, bei mir. Feeling is only minimally projective. However, since polarity permeates all psychological functions, Yorck is quick to recognize “a relation” to the other, for there is no “inner” without an “outer.”[12] But the centre of feeling or affectivity is the sphere of one’s own, pure interiority, not as representation, but as something felt. Therefore, it is the actual seat of “all things personal” [alles Persönliche], the innermost centre of personal life (ST, p. 85). It is the “central” and immediate pulse of life, antecedent to the objectifications by cognition and volition (ST, p. 14). Yorck writes: “The relation of self to feeling is more immediate” than the subject’s relation to representation (ST, p. 99). Since the personal is something felt in the interiority of one’s life, and not something thought or represented and projected outwards, Yorck concludes that self-relation is not cognitive in the first place; it is not “knowledge” (ST, p. 72). Therefore, Yorck also finds it a misguided effort “to grasp natural and historical communities by means of representation,” because it misses the felt personal attachment, which alone lends reality to the historical connectivity and relation (ST, p. 72). Already in the Correspondence, Yorck had stated that “historical reality is a reality of feeling [Empfindungsrealität]” (CR, p. 113).

Next, Yorck also claims that “time originates in feeling” (ST, p. 135). But as feeling is non-projective, it follows that, originally, “temporality” is not “objective”[13] (ST, 146). Yorck distinguishes between the feeling of transitoriness, i.e., that everything passes away [Vergänglichkeitsgefühl] (ST, p. 33), and the feeling or awareness of one’s own mortality [Sterblichkeitsgefühl][14] (ST, p. 90). Acquiescence into one’s own mortality constitutes the opposite pole to self-affirmation: “self-renunciation” [Selbsthingabe] (ST, p. 14), which is thus distinct from and even antithetical to the ethical impetus in philosophy and science. Yorck argues that the inversion of volitional and cognitive projection in feeling and its concentration in pure, passive interiority amounts to a “religious comportment” and the feeling of dependency (ST, 121). To the extent that the religious concentration of life in interiority is inversely related to projective representation, Yorck understands religious life in terms of its “freedom from the world” or Weltfreiheit (ST, p. 81 & 112). Psychologically, freedom from the world is the precondition for the consciousness of a world-transcendent God, or the consciousness of transcendence (ST, p. 105). Yorck only hints at the projection sui generis involved in transcendence. But it is a projection that has no cognitive or volitional content: God is intended without becoming “an object,” and willing becomes a “non-willing,” albeit without loss of energy (ST, 104).

Drawing on Dilthey and Schleiermacher, Yorck argues that the immediate and indubitable reality of life is exclusively “guaranteed” through volition and affectivity alone. Yorck writes: “That which opposes me or that which I feel, I call real,” because I cannot doubt what resists my will or affects my personal life, whereas it is always possible to doubt objects neutrally represented in space outside me (ST, p. 89). What is thought and grasped as an unchanging, stable and self-same object in the space of thought does not affect me or solicit a desire. For Yorck, cognition, in abstraction from feeling and volition, is the realm of pure “phenomenality,” which is always open to doubt in virtue of its being merely represented or thought (ST, p. 88). Because “the category of reality is a predicate of feeling and willing” alone (ST, p. 128), Yorck concludes that it is an “utterly uncritical” and self-contradictory undertaking to attempt to prove “the reality of the world” by means of the understanding (ST, p. 129). What Yorck writes to Dilthey in a more general vein is also applicable to this particular problem:

Thinking moves in circles and the people appear to me like flies which always bump into the window pane when they try to get out into the open. Someone has got to open the window, but much work and leisure is required for that.[15]

3.2 History of Life

According to Yorck, the characteristics of human psychology and the economy of primary life delimit the course of history, since historical life merely repeats or amplifies the primary stances of consciousness. Although there is thus a natural ground for history, Yorck is at pains to emphasize that the three psychological functions outline “possibilities” only, without any inbuilt teleology or fixed equilibrium, or a relation to “an unchanging ordo” as a permanent backdrop for history (ST, p. 4). Against such approximations of history to nature, Yorck argues for a thoroughly historical conception of the historical: “History has nothing of the isolation [Selbständigkeit] of the natural [order]” (ST, p. 6), but rather, in each of its phases, history is self-reflexively involved in its own historicity—“as the ferment of its aliveness”—and thus opens itself to the ever new “historical contrapposto” (ST, p. 6). Nothing is exempt from historical change. Philosophical categories through which the world is understood are historical products of life and hence inextricably bound up with the historicity of humankind. For instance, Yorck explicitly claims that the category of “being” is itself “a result of life” (ST, p. 8). This liberates history from all relation to an unchanging, fixed point of reference outside historical life.[16]

Although Yorck provides only an unfinished sketch of the empirical course of the history of life, he marks three decisive turning-points: (1) The breakthrough to philosophy and science on the basis of the dominant stance of the psychological function of representation or cognition, primarily in ancient Greece and India; (2) the predominance of willing in the Roman and Jewish stance towards the world; and (3) the focal centrality of feeling and interiority in Christianity, particular in the Reformation, i.e., Luther. Somewhat like Hegel, Yorck holds that history unfolds through particular primary stances towards life which then become dominant in particular historical peoples.[17]

3.2.1 The Greek World

According to Yorck, in Ancient Greece consciousness displayed a particular configuration of the primacy of cognition. For the Greeks, the stance of consciousness towards the world is pure looking. It is through looking that reality is understood. Affectivity (feeling) and volition are not countenanced as functions that disclose the world as such.[18] Truth lies in the beholding eye alone; contemplation, theoria, and intuition take centre stage.

It is as if the clear-sighted eye is expressed in words. On the basis of this condition of consciousness, the function of looking [Anschauung], ocularity [Okularität], becomes the organ of all free work of the mind, particularly of philosophy. (ST, p. 30)

Yorck finds evidence for the prevalence of ocularity or the aesthetic attitude, which is centred on plasticity [Gestaltlichkeit], in Homer, Pythagoras, Plato, and Aristotle, among others.

Form and content constitute the aesthetic dichotomy which governs Greek thought in its entirety, the result of the liberation of ocularity from all other sensuality, the aesthetic liberation, which strikes a chord in everyone who has entered the threshold of Greek life. Looking is the essential comportment; hence, Gestalt or Form [qualifies as] ousia or substance.[19] (ST, p. 31)

That Greek metaphysics seeks the unchangeable and impassable is the result of the relative suppression of feeling and willing latent in all cognition, which abstracts from desires, feelings, and temporality (ST, p. 42). Put differently, the structural timelessness of thought as such is intensified in metaphysical thought where it becomes “absolute” (ST, p. 42). Yorck emphasizes that “negation of temporality” marks “the decisive metaphysical step” (ST, p. 66). Metaphysics constitutes the counter-move against the feeling of temporality (that everything passes away), as well as the liberation from the dependence on objects desired by the will. According to Yorck, the escape from temporality and attachment determines the entire metaphysical tradition up to and including Hegel (because even Hegel “ontologizes” life and renders it ontic) (ST, p. 83).

3.2.2 The Roman & Jewish World

The breakthrough to a form of life predominantly lived through striving and volition is, according to Yorck, characteristic of the Jewish and Roman world. Concerning the former, Yorck writes:

Whereas the Greek, metaphysical cast of mind abstracts from temporality, temporality is the determining element [in the Hebrew world], as the non-aesthetic character of the Jewish way of thought is already expressed in Genesis where time takes precedence over space. Yet the moment of time is here placed in some metaphysical distance, is, as it were, projected into the future, the realization of which is the prerogative of God. Thus, the stance of consciousness is one of hope. The messiah, who does not fulfil the law, but, rather, delivers on the promise, is hoped for. (ST, p. 20)

Thus, the feeling of time is here aligned with volition and its projective exteriorization. Relative to the Greek contemplation of the everlasting presence of the cosmos, the intensive expectation of the future reality in the Jewish world is “a-cosmic.” Comparing the Greek to the Jewish world, Yorck writes:

Here, contemplative, eternal presence; there, intense hope for an invisible futurity. Here, knowledge and science; there, coupled with a radical devaluation of the object of knowledge, faith as personally grown postulate. Here, pleasant expansion and the fullness of existing objectivity; there, formless energy directed at the reality anticipated. (ST, p. 22)

The unfinished character of Yorck’s manuscript is apparent especially in these passages, for there is no further exploration or exposition of the Jewish world (let alone anything like a justification for the juxtaposition of the Jewish world with the Roman period). Yorck’s comments concerning the Roman world are likewise very sketchy at best. Although Yorck positions the Romans as a world-historical people of the will, he does not do much more than to refer to the popular notion of the “imperialist drive of the Romans” (ST, p. 30). Once, in a letter to Dilthey, Yorck emphasizes that the Roman pursuit of power locks life into pure immanence, without temporality and transcendence: “Might is everything,” he writes (CR, p. 120). Yorck continues by contending that the proverbial epithet of Rome as the “Eternal City” is by no means a mere saying. Rather, for Yorck, it captures something of the ostentatious display of Rome’s imperial power—its splendid oblivion of time. Yorck writes: “Rome does not, just as no Roman ever does, comprehend—death” (CR, p. 120). By way of historical contraposition, Yorck then describes, in the same letter, the “mute, simple crosses” scratched into the walls of the underground Carcere Mamertino by imprisoned early Christians. Yorck characterizes these crosses as “light-points on the underground sky [of the prison], signs of the transcendence of consciousness” (CR, p. 120). The immanence of a life lived for power and might is contrasted with the interiority of a conscious feeling of transcendence.

3.2.3 Christianity

For Yorck, the Christian life is the breakthrough to a fully historical life. Unencumbered by the projection of objective knowledge (Greek metaphysics and ocularity) and freed from the expectation of a messiah (hope for the promised future), the Christian lives the temporality of “absolute aliveness” [absolute Lebendigkeit] in the depths of inwardness or interiority[20] (ST, p. 4). Since Christian consciousness has its dominant focus in interiority and feeling, it is free from the cognitive and volitional bonds to any objectivity, but free for the rhythm of temporality and history. The Christian “freedom from the world” [Weltfreiheit] (ST, p. 81) is at the same time freedom for history and transcendence, i.e., the world-transcendent God, and the personal, felt relationship to him, which is based on the personal responsibility for one’s historical life before God. Yorck writes:

Through Christianity an essentially transcendent stance of consciousness is achieved, namely by way of the basic factor of feeling. This is a transcendent stance, in contradistinction to a metaphysical one,[21] because feeling [Gefühl]—the focal point of aliveness [Lebendigkeit]—is here turned inwards, even turned against itself and hence free of all givenness [Gegebenheit]. (ST, pp. 13/14)

The release from cognitive and volitional projection facilitates an inversion of life’s tendency; it leaves behind the goals of “certainty and security” (CR, p. 143) and grounds life in the personal and intrinsically historical relationship to God.

On the one hand, Yorck emphasizes the absolute focus on inner life and individual conscience, and the entirely unpredictable and historical relationship to God, this side of all objective worldly realities and public opinion.[22] The individual person is singled out in his relationship to God. On the other hand, Yorck also holds that the Christian inversion of the projective tendency of life ultimately results in “self-renunciation” [Selbstaufgabe], which expresses the religious pole, opposite to ethical self-affirmation through philosophy and science. But precisely through this self-renunciation, life is lived as life, instead of being lost in the preoccupation with that which is merely intended through life—the objectively known and desired world. With reference to Matthew (10:39), Yorck writes:

He who finds his life, will lose it, he who loses it, will find it. This word of the Lord describes the law of life itself, the basic condition of all life. Death is a mark of life and the radical transcendence of the deepest, the Christian standpoint postulates life as a mark of death. (ST, p. 58)

Yorck’s well-known love for paradox has its definitive origin here.[23]

Freed from the bonds to objective representation and the objective world, Christian religion realizes the most concentrated or enhanced form of living life as life; it is “supreme aliveness” [höchste Lebendigkeit] and thus supreme historicity (ST, p. 104; CR, p. 154). The Christian life is not distracted by the aims of cognition (objectivity) or the ties to objects of desire within the world (in the past, present, or future). Accordingly, Yorck holds that the historical “origin” and “supreme” manifestation of life—fully lived as historical life—lies in Christianity.

In his Einleitung in die Geisteswissenschaften (1883), Dilthey had made a similar, but by no means identical, point, arguing that “historical consciousness” first came into existence through the Christian freedom from the outer world (the cosmos) and the newfound centre of life in inwardness (Dilthey 1959, p. 254). Dilthey writes:

For the Greek mind, knowledge was the depiction [Abbilden] of something objective, [given] to intelligence. Now [after the emergence of Christianity], lived experience [Erlebnis] becomes the centre point of all interests for the new communities; but this is nothing other than the simple, inner awareness [Innewerden] of what is given to the person in self-consciousness. (Dilthey 1959, p. 251)

Yet Dilthey sees this as the first potential breakthrough to a new science, the science of inner experience and the historical disciplines, the Humanities or Geisteswissenschaften. According to Dilthey, Augustine’s fateful dependence on Greek conceptuality made it impossible to fully articulate the new Christian sense of inwardness and history (Dilthey 1959, p. 264). Only through the work of Schleiermacher and Kant has there been progress in articulating the original Christian insight into inwardness and historicity of life (Dilthey 1959, p. 267). Not only does Dilthey fully accept that the meaning of the original Christian experience is thus adequately comprehended and harnessed for the understanding, but he also sees his own work on the logic of the historical sciences as a continuation and fulfilment of this same project.

By contrast, Yorck eschews all cooptation of the Christian breakthrough to supreme historical aliveness and historicity for the establishment of a science, fearing that this would not only conceptualize life as something “ontic,” always present and available for the understanding, but also ignore the vital consciousness of transcendence, or bury it in a new scholasticism.[24] Yorck, who always regarded Luther’s work as the vital re-affirmation of the early Christian historical life, suggests, therefore, that instead of Kant and Schleiermacher, a return to Luther’s conception of life is the more fruitful way of safeguarding and cultivating the breakthrough to historical life. Acknowledging this difference, Yorck writes to Dilthey:

You will not agree when I say that Luther should and must be more topical to the present time than Kant, if this present time is to have a historical future [historische Zukunft]. (CR, p. 145)


Primary Literature

Works by Paul Yorck von Wartenburg

  • 1866, Die Katharsis des Aristoteles und der Oedipus Coloneus des Sophokles, Berlin: Verlag von Wilhelm Hertz, Bessersche Buchhandlung, reprinted with the title Examsarbeit von 1865 in Karfried Gründer, 1970, Zur Philosophie des Grafen Paul Yorck von Wartenburg, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Rupprecht, pp. 154–186.
  • 1891, Das Fragment von 1891, in Karfried Gründer, 1970, Zur Philosophie des Grafen Paul Yorck von Wartenburg, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Rupprecht, pp. 308–353.
  • 1892–1897, Bewusstseinsstellung und Geschichte [Stances of Consciousness and History]. in Iring Fetscher, 1991 (2nd edition), 1956 (1st edition), Hamburg: Felix Meiner, pp. 3–156. [Abbreviated as ST in the article above.]
  • 1896/97, Heraklit, Iring Fetscher (ed.) in Archiv für Philosophie, 9 (1959): 214–289.
  • 1923, Briefwechsel zwischen Wilhelm Dilthey und dem Grafen Yorck v. Wartenburg [Correspondence between Wilhelm Dilthey and Count Yorck von Wartenburg], with a preface by Sigrid v. d. Schulenburg, Erich Rothacker (ed.), Halle (Saale): Max Niemeyer. [Abbreviated as CR in the article above.] [A photo-mechanic reproduction of the 1923 edition has come out in 2011, Bremen: Europäischer Hochschulverlag.]
  • 1939 (2nd edition), 1927 (1st edition), Darmstadt, Italienisches Tagebuch, Sigrid von der Schulenburg (ed.), Leipzig: Koehler & Amelang.

Other Primary Literature

  • Hegel, G.W.F., 1952 (1807), Phänomenologie des Geistes, Hamburg: Felix Meiner.
  • Heidegger, Martin, 1977, Sein und Zeit (Gesamtausgabe, Volume 2), Frankfurt: Vittorio Klostermann.
  • –––, 2004, Der Begriff der Zeit (Gesamtausgabe, Volume 64), Frankfurt: Vittorio Klostermann.
  • Dilthey, Wilhelm, 1959, Einleitung in die Geisteswissenschaften (Gesammelte Schriften, Volume I), Stuttgart: B.G.Teubener.

Secondary Literature

  • Dastur, Françoise, 2011, "Paul Yorck von Wartenburg, penser de l’historicité," in C. Bouton and B. Bégout (eds.), Penser l’histoire. De Karl Marx au sciècles catastrophes, Paris: Editions de l’éclat, pp. 11-32.
  • Donadio, Francesco, 2008, L’onda Lunga Della Storicità: Studi sulla religione in Paul Yorck von Wartenburg, Napoli: Bibliopolis.
  • Fagniez, Guillaume, 2013, "Comprendre l’historicité: Heidegger et la correspondance de Dilthey et Yorck," in T. Keiling (ed.), Heideggers Marburger Zeit: Themen, Argumente, Konstellationen, Frankfurt: Vittorio Klostermann, pp. 269-288.
  • Farin, Ingo, 2016, “The Different Notions of History in Heidegger’s Work” in Michael Bowler and Ingo Farin (eds.), Hermeneutical Heidegger, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, pp.23–69.
  • Fetscher, Iring, 1991 (2nd edition), 1956 (1st edition), “Einleitung” in Graf Paul Yorck von Wartenburg, Bewusstseinsstellung und Geschichte, Iring Fetscher (ed.), Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag, pp. xix–xlvii.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1958, “Geschichtlichkeit” in Die Religion in Geschichte und Gegenwart. Handwörterbuch für Theologie und Religionswissenschaft. Vol. II, Kurt Galling (ed.), Tübingen: J.C. Mohr (Paul Siebeck), pp. 1496–1498.
  • –––, “Der Begriff des Lebens bei Husserl und Graf Yorck,” 1990 in Wahrheit und Methode: Grundzüge einer philosophischen Hermeneutik, Tübingen: J.C.B.Mohr (Paul Siebeck), pp. 246–258.
  • –––, 1995, Hermeneutik im Rückblick (Gesammelte Werke, Vol. 10), Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr.
  • Grosse, Jürgen, 1997/98, “Metahistorie statt Geschichte” Dilthey Jahrbuch, XI: 203–237.
  • Gründer, Karlfied, 1965, “Entsehungsgeschichtliche Voraussetzungen für Yorcks Frühschriften” in Colloquium Philosophicum: Joachim Ritter zum 60. Geburtstag, Basel-Stuttgart, pp. 58–71.
  • –––, 1970, Zur Philosophie des Grafen Paul Yorck von Wartenburg, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Rupprecht.
  • Hünermann, Peter, 1967, Der Durchbruch Geschichtlichen Denkens im 19. Jahrhundert: Johann Gustav Droysen, Wilhelm Dilthey, Graf Paul Yorck von Wartenburg. Ihr Weg und ihre Weisung für die Theologie. Freiburg: Herder.
  • Jünger, Friedrich Georg, 1962, “Graf Paul von Wartenburg,” in Sprache und Denken, Frankfurt Am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, pp. 162–212.
  • Kaufmann, Fritz, 1928, “Die Philsophie des Grafen Paul Yorck von Wartenburg” Jahrbuch für Philosophie und Phänomenologische Forschung, IX: 1–149.
  • –––, 1930, “Yorck’s Geschichtsbegriff” in Deutsche Vierteljahresschrift für Literaturwissenschaft und Geistegeschichte, 8: 306–323.
  • –––, 1959, “Wiederbegegnung mit dem Grafen Yorck,” Archiv für Philosophie, 9: 177–213.
  • Krakowski, Jerezy & Scholtz, Gunter, 1996, Dilthey und Yorck: Philosophie und Geisteswissenschaften im Zeichen von Geschichtlichkeit und Historismus, Wrocław: Wydawnictwo Uniwersytetu Wrocławskiego, Acta Universitatis Wratislaviensis No. 1788.
  • Renthe-Fink von, Leonhard, 1968, Geschichtlichkeit: Ihr terminologischer und begrifflicher Ursprung bei Hegel, Haym, Dilthey und Yorck, Göttingen: Van Den Hoeck & Rupprecht.
  • Ruin, Hans, 1994, “Yorck von Wartenburg and the Problem of Historical Existence,” The Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology, 25(2): 111–130

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