Notes to Zhu Xi

1. Huayan posits a complex conceptual structure juxtaposing li (reality, emptiness) and shi (events, phenomena) (Chang 1970; Cook 1976).

2. Da Hui, a leading Chan master, opposed silent illumination Chan and stressed concentrating on gongans (koans), thematic discussions, and practice.

3. This was the advanced examination, akin to the Ph.D. nowadays.

4. Zhu Xi said, for example, “The norm just preserves the general, upright li. But, in subtle, complicated situations, the norm is not directly applicable. Thus, one needs to weigh things up (discretion) to do what is most fitting and fulfill the intended function of the norm” (YL: 10a, par. 49).

5. For discussions, see Qin Mu 1986: 105–109 and 138–146.

6. Zhou Tunyi (1017–1073) articulated this conception in Diagram of the Supreme Polarity Explained (Taijitu shuo). For discussion, see Joseph Needham 1956a: 455–472, and A.C. Graham 1986a: 147–149.

7. This an extention of Mencius’ idea that human beings are disposed to be good and are actuated by four incipient impulses.

8. Confucius mentions quan in the Analects 9.30, 18.8, and 20.1. Zhu Xi discusses quan in YL 37 and in his commentary on the Analects.

9. By ritual custom, siblings-in-law of the opposite sex could not have physical contact in traditional Chinese culture, not even a handshake.

10. See Zhu’s Supplement to Daxue, Chapter 5 (Gardner 1986: 104–105).

11. This was not to fall into the moral intuitionism that Zhu had sought to avoid by stressing ”investigating things to extend knowledge,” as well as reflection and practice in real life. In this case, the moral adept’s impulse is to examine the situation in depth to catch its objective moral nuances and respond in the most appropriate way.

12. On moral considerations, see Edmund Pincoffs 1986: 53–70.

13. ”Humaneness” captures ren as an animating impulse of commiseration and concern, and proper conduct exercised in that spirit. ”Humanity” captures ren as a moral theme or vision.

14. Reverence captures the original meaning of jing. Kalton 1988 insightfully suggests ”mindfulness” to capture the fullness of Zhu Xi’s notion of jing cultivation.

15. The four beginnings include the four impulses of compassion, shame, courtesy and modesty, and right and wrong (Lau 1984). The four cardinal virtues are humaneness, appropriateness, ritual propriety, and wisdom (Adapted from Ames and Rosemont 1998).

16. In Zhu’s philosophical sense, ”li”as pattern, patterning refers to formations of natural and organic structures, and formative cycles, complements, oppositions (Wade 2003). It also pertains to the appropriateness of interpersonal relationships and interactions. While fixed, artificial patterns, such as clothing patterns and cookie cutters, which are two dimensional and rigid, might be described in terms of li, they differ from the unfolding, developmental li of nature and the world.

17. Zhu highlights the proposition that, ”The student must devote himself to reality,” in Reflections on Things at Hand (Chan 1967: 67, #62).

18. B.W. van Norden traces the idea of “Opposition in Chinese Philosophy,” with examples, from the Neolithic era until the Qing dynasty (see Other Internet Resources). Jiang Guozhu (1993) gives examples of the principle of complementarity in Song Neo-Confucianism, as in the thought of Zhang Zai (122–132 CE), Wang Anshi (169–173 CE), and Zhu’s friend, Lü Zuqian (411–417 CE). However, Cheng Hao’s formulation of the principle is the most general and embraces opposition and complementarity both.

19. The understanding was that since words differentiate, they have complements. This idea is also expressed in Laozi, chapter 2.

20. Doesn’t each one of us have a Doppelganger? This set of complements coincides with the holistic, perspectival quality of li patterning discussed above.

21. Hence, the endgame paradoxically implies a new game.

22. That is to say, Zhu thinks that, besides registering the way things stand and flow with the qi; more importantly, people need to uphold the harmony-engendering li of a cultivated, mindful life while sensing and responding to affairs appropriately.

23. Needham notes acutely, “The particle [er 而] is a copula expressing not temporal succession but paradoxical identity…. Zhu Xi himself reaffirms the identity, saying that the wuji is not something outside or beyond the taiji…. Ji was from of old the technical term for the astronomical pole. Around the pole star all man’s universe revolved” (Needham 196a: 464).

24. On one hand, this looks like a tautology, but on the other hand, it inclines us not only to investigate the li of actual phenomena but to test new qi combinations to yield new properties or capacities, such as flight.

25. In this regard, some philosophers posit dialetheistic principles in order to accommodate features of things that ordinary consistent sets of principles could not capture adequately, such as Zhou Dunyi’s “Free of polarity and yet the supreme polarity.” Graham Priest also views propositions in the Heart Sutra and Nagarjuna in this light (2006: ch. 16).

Copyright © 2015 by
Kirill Thompson <>

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