Zhu Xi

First published Thu Sep 3, 2015; substantive revision Mon Aug 31, 2020

Zhu Xi, the preeminent Neo-Confucian (daoxue) master of the Southern Song (1126–1271), is generally ranked as second only to Confucius (551–479 BCE) in influence and as rivaling Zhuangzi (fourth century BCE) in philosophic acumen in the Chinese philosophical tradition. A leading scholar and classicist as well as sharp intellect and devoted practitioner, Zhu Xi worked out a philosophically compelling synthesis of the ideas of the Northern Song (960–1126 CE) masters Zhou Dunyi (1017–73), Zhang Zai (1020–77), and the brothers Cheng Yi (1033–1107) and Cheng Hao (1032–85). Intriguingly, his idea of a holistic synthetic approach itself may have been inspired in part by Huayan Buddhism (Ivanhoe 2000: 47–49).[1] Over time, Zhu Xi’s Neo-Confucian synthesis proved to be a potent philosophic catalyst for his intellectual supporters and opponents alike, until the fall of Imperial China in 1911 and beyond. His influence gradually extended to Korea, Japan, and Vietnam, as well, each of which adapted his thought along with the Confucian classics and traditions in its own distinctive way. Besides synthesizing key Northern Song Neo-Confucian ideas, Zhu researched and reflected on the received Five Classics (Changes, Odes, History, Rites, and Spring and Autumn Annals), and compiled, edited, and commented on a compendium of essential Confucian texts, the Great Learning (Daxue), the Analects (Lunyu) of Confucius, the Book of Mencius (Mengzi), and the Doctrine of the Mean (Zhongyong), titled the Four Books (Sishu). He also prepared an edition of the Songs of the South (Chuci) to be appended to the Odes.

Notably, from the Great Learning Zhu adapted and distilled the methodology of investigating things to extend knowledge while from the Mean he stressed attuning oneself to attain utmost propriety. Investigating things incorporated reading and classical studies but ensured one’s practical grasp of and personal resonance with the pulse of life: nature and phenomena as well as society and human relations and concerns (Gardner 1986, 1990). Attuning oneself involved reverent concentration and mindful reflection and practice. A century later, Yuan dynasty (1271–1368) officialdom adopted Zhu Xi’s edition of the Four Books as the basis for the Imperial Examination System, in effect canonizing it until the termination of the imperial examination system toward the end of the Qing dynasty (1644–1911) in 1908. The change from the Five Classics to the Four Books as the basis of the imperial examination system resulted in a reform and renewal of the Confucian tradition and outlook. It effected a restoration of Confucius’ original concern with personal ethical cultivation, realization, and practice from the more bureaucratic, careerist approach taken by many Confucians of the succeeding Han and Tang dynasties (206 BCE–905 CE) that had weakened the tradition spiritually. Zhu Xi’s spirit and thought were deeply rooted in the original teachings of Confucius and his early school, as well as in the seminal ideas of the Northern Song masters, and exerted a profound influence in China and around East Asia for centuries.

1. Life and Works

Zhu Xi was born in Youqi in Fujian in October 1130. Many anecdotes attest that he was a highly precocious child. It was recorded that at age five he ventured to ask what lay beyond Heaven, and by eight he understood the significance of the Classic of Filiality (Xiaojing). As a youth, he was inspired by Mencius’ proposition that all people could become a sage. In Zhu Xi’s childhood, his father Zhu Song (1097–1143) arranged for several old friends to educate Zhu Xi after his passing. Consequently, Zhu Xi was educated by several eclectic scholars who had delved into Daoism and Buddhism as well as Confucianism, and inclined him to be deep and wide-ranging in his intellectual predilections and cultural interests. Later he studied Chan (Zen) Buddhism with the monk Dao Qian of the Kaishan Temple, and reputedly met with the Chan master Da Hui (Dahui Zonggao, 1089–1163).[2] Traces of Huayan’s holistic thought can also be discerned in the formation of Zhu Xi’s system (Makeham 2018). Remarkably, Zhu passed the official jinshi exam (the “presented scholar” exam) at just nineteen, drawing on Chan Buddhism in his answers.[3] He continued to pursue Daoism and Buddhism until he met the Neo-Confucian master Li Tong (1093–1163) a decade later, and formally became his student in 1160. In fact, Zhu’s father had recommended that he conduct his advanced studies under Li Tong, but Zhu postponed seeing Li for years until he finally admitted to himself that he was no longer making progress in his eclectic cultivation and suffered spiritual doubts. Li Tong was a master in the southern Yang Shi (1053–1135) lineage of the Cheng brothers’ school, partial to the teachings of Cheng Yi. Importantly, Li Tong convinced Zhu of the cogency and superiority of the Confucian Way and cultivation. Meanwhile, having passed the jinshi examination, Zhu was eligible to hold office, and had been assigned to several prefectural administrative posts. But, since he disagreed with central court policy on several major issues, he preferred to hold temple guardianships, which gave him the leisure to conduct Confucian studies and cultivation in earnest, and shielded him from the ruthless court politics. Having chosen this career path, Zhu Xi had the leisure to study and reflect, so over time he made numerous contributions in classical studies, historical inquiries, literary studies, and philosophic reflections. He moreover developed into a man of letters and wrote subtle prose and elegant verse.

A renowned teacher in later life, Zhu taught the classics and Neo-Confucian thought and practice to hundreds if not thousands of students. His oral discourses and discussions are preserved in the Classified Dialogues of Master Zhu (Zhuzi yulei), and his poetry, essays, correspondence, and other prose works are collected in the Collected Works of Master Zhu (Zhuzi wenji). He also published critical, annotated editions of several classics, including the Book of Change (Yijing) and the Book of Odes (Shijing), essential works of Neo-Confucianism, including by Zhou Dunyi, Zhang Zai, and the Cheng brothers, and a vital Neo-Confucian anthology, Reflections on Things at Hand (Jinsilu). He also edited and annotated an important early text of inner alchemy Daoism; the Cantong qi (Unity of the Three) by Wei Boyang (3rd cent. CE), which combines the cosmology of the Yijing and the Daoist teaching of wuwei (non-intentional action) with inner alchemy. Zhu Xi remained devoted to his spiritual and intellectual work virtually to his last breath, pondering and discussing problematic passages in the Great Learning during the last several days of his life. Throughout his life, Zhu Xi sought to reestablish the fundamental concepts and values of Confucianism to restore China’s cultural and political integrity as a Confucian society, especially since people in search of spiritual guidance and solace were increasingly looking to Daoism and Buddhism rather than Confucianism, which was perceived as a state ideology and orthodoxy and had lost spiritual and ethical purchase. Moreover, Zhu believed that the empire needed the spiritual élan of Confucius’ original ethical ideas and values to meet the challenge of barbarian encroachments. His own sincere patriotism, commitment to the tradition, and devotion to learning and scholarship have remained an inspiration to this day in East Asia and throughout the world.

2. Philosophy of Human Nature and Approach to Self-Cultivation

Zhu Xi developed a theory of basic human propensities (nature, xing) to account for both the possibility of human evil and that of human goodness and perfectibility. On this theory, while (following Mencius, 372–289 BCE) insisting that people are basically good (well intended and sensitive to the sufferings of others), he accepted that the manner in which a person’s basic disposition is manifested is conditioned and at times contained by their specific qi endowment (native talents and gifts, qizhi), family and social environment, and other factors. Such factors together yield their empirical personality, intelligence, and aptitude for spiritual-ethical cultivation. Zhu accepted that there are real differences in individual disposition, character, as well as aptitude for ethical self-cultivation and realization, owing to individual variations in qi endowment, environment, etc. Furthermore, he argued that people can become bad or evil due, for example, to a coarse or sensual qi endowment, the bad influence of ruthless kin or friends, a selfish or harsh social environment, a cruel streak, etc. Nonetheless, following Mencius, he firmly believed that anyone who was sincerely committed to moral self-cultivation and was fervent in their moral practice would surely make progress in achieving moral realization if not sagehood.

Zhu Xi’s teacher, Li Tong, and friend, Zhang Shi (1133–1180), presented him with different approaches to cultivation based on the premise of basic still and active mindsets, respectively. But, Zhu found that both of these approaches were one-sided and flawed. How is one to leap from quiet-sitting and stillness to making timely moral responses? When does one have the composure to introspect morally when their mind is constantly active and engaged? If neither the meditative approach nor the active approach to cultivation and practice were efficacious, what path remained open to Zhu Xi? Recent research shows that Zhu Xi embarked on a careful reading of the works of Zhou Dunyi during this period of spiritual-philosophical crisis in the course of which he rediscovered Zhou’s doctrine of “the interpenetration of stillness and activity” for the human mind and spirit (Adler 2014). With this idea, Zhou Dunyi was advocating that whereas the states of action and rest are mutually exclusive in the case of physical objects, such states interpenetrate and are mutually implicative in the case of human mental and spiritual phenomena (Adler 2014). This doctrine piqued Zhu Xi’s interest, and he came to see it as offering a way out of the dilemma between Li Tong’s stress on stillness and Hu Hong’s stress on activity in cultivation and practice, and their respective shortcomings. Zhou Dunyi’s doctrine was particularly exciting to Zhu Xi for it highlighted the distinctness and potential religiosity of the human mind and spirit, which Zhou describes as not subject to the same limitations and restrictions as are physical phenomena. Zhou Dunyi moreover associates this idea with a vital and well integrated model of human mind and spirit, self-cultivation, and cosmos. Inspired by Zhou Dunyi’s doctrine of the interpenetration of stillness and activity and related ideas, Zhu Xi worked out a twofold cultivation effort that incorporated at once nurturing one’s feeling of reverence (jing) to purify mind while investigating things to discern their determinate or defining patterns (li). Cultivation of reverence, originally a religious virtue associated with ancestor worship and ceremonial rites, as described in the classics and taught by Confucius (551–479 BCE), serves to purify the mind, attune one to the promptings of the original good nature, and set one to act with appropriateness (yi). Moreover, by grasping the defining patterns (li) of relationship and intercourse that constitute the world, society, people, and proper conduct, one gains the master key to acting with utmost propriety (zhongyong). The mind that is imbued with reverence and comprehends these patterns will develop into a good will (zhuzai) dedicated to acting appropriately and with utmost propriety. Since jing takes on connotations of focus, concentration, and alertness, as well as reverence in Zhu Xi’s discourses, mindfulness has been suggested as the English translation that covers the fullness of the term jing (Kalton 1988) in Zhu Xi’s thought.

In later life, Zhu started to regard this twofold approach to cultivation and realization as too complicated, gradual, and difficult to carry out in practice. Like Confucius before him and anticipating Wang Yangming after him, Zhu Xi came to accept that the sincere Confucian adept must, on embarking on his or her project of ethical self-cultivation, first strive to establish his or her sincere determination (lizhi) to realize the cardinal Confucian virtues and become an exemplary person (junzi), that is to say, a master of appropriateness in interpersonal conduct and human affairs generally.

3. Ethical Philosophy

Zhu Xi’s methodology for achieving perspicacity (ming) in ethical judgment and “appropriateness” (yi) in practice can be summed up in his call to investigate things to extend knowledge (gewu zhizhi). Zhu advocated this methodology to stress the need for people, as prospective moral agents, to notice the fine details, the distinguishing features of particular situations and to fashion on that basis the most discerning, appropriate response. These distinguishing features can suggest alternative moral considerations to be weighed (Pincoffs 1986). This call lay behind Zhu’s promotion of the Great Learning (Daxue) and call for life-long learning and moral reflection in a bid to achieve a modicum of objectivity and break free of the moral intuitionism and resultant subjectivism typical of Neo-Confucians of his generation.

3.1 Investigating Things for Ethical Discernment and Practice

Throughout his career, Zhu Xi focused on the twin problems of 1) determining the conditions of moral agency, and 2) setting forth a viable program of moral self-cultivation on that basis. Zhu saw moral agency as the expression of a moral will, which he understood to be the achievement of an inner self-mastery (zhuzai) that forms the core of a person’s moral character, perceptivity, cognizance, and responsiveness. On this view, self-cultivation that is aimed at nurturing self-mastery must include forming a concentrated, reverential mind-set (jing) and a discerning sense of appropriateness. Early on, Zhu had emphasized the need to attain a working knowledge of the constitutive patterning (li) of reality and society in the light of which the norms and ritual action (li) prescribed for proper interpersonal relationships and intercourse are devised. He later found that establishing the determination (lizhi) to seek self-realization and conduct oneself appropriately counted for as much as the long-term cultivation process itself, during which one can lose sight of one’s purpose and be side-tracked (see Qian Mu 1986: 123–127). Moreover, while still maintaining the importance of the norms and ritual action for character-building and the social order, Zhu began to emphasize the need to build up a sympathetic but realistic grasp of the warp and woof of real daily human life viewed in the perspective of such broad Confucian ethical ideals as humaneness (ren) and fairness (gong). He understood that, although the norms and ritual action are broadly applicable and reliable, many situations call for specifically tailored responses.[4]

Consequently, against the moral intuitionism prevalent at the time in Neo-Confucianism, as espoused by his teacher Li Tong (1093–1163), his intellectual rival Lu Jiuyuan (1139–1193), and others, Zhu argued that intuitionism is inadequate for dealing effectively with the complex human affairs that people are apt to encounter in their lives.[5] Rather, he advocated dedicating oneself to the observation and study of the patterning/patterns (li) of relationship, interaction, and change among all things, among human beings in particular. He regarded “investigating things to extend knowledge” as the surest way to deepen and broaden one’s discernment of the patterns that constitute the lived-world. Such knowledge, importantly, would sharpen one’s sense of appropriateness by attuning oneself to the actual, subtle, distinguishing features of particular situations.

Again, Zhu Xi conceived the world as a patterned (li) totality made up of a cosmic vapor (qi) that under various conditions condenses and solidifies into countless permutations, from the purest transparent yuanqi (primordial qi), to the Yin-Yang poles modulated by the primal taiji (supreme polarity) pattern, to the wuxing (five phases), each of which bears an identifying inner pattern and set of propensities (xing) that involve interconvertability and recombination with the other four phases, and finally to the phenomenal world: Heaven, Earth, and the myriad things (tiandi wanwu).[6]

For Zhu Xi, the world presents a vital tapestry of relationships, cycles, processes, events, and things that are spontaneously arrayed in aesthetic order. In the nexus of these arrays, li are manifested three dimensionally and present different faces from different angles (Graham 1986a: 148; Qian Mu 1986: 133). Li are inherently perspectival. Zhu adopts metaphors of the grains in wood, the lines in jade, the “veins” in a leaf, the lines in marble, and even the sinewy texture of beef, to stress that li are manifested immanently rather than abstractly, and thus are to be sought concretely by observing phenomena in the world, not by pure, disengaged, abstract ratiocination (Needham 1956a: 473). Moreover, li are never presented in their putative optimal pure form. They always appear conditioned by the degree of purity of the qi through which they are manifested and of the environing conditions (Wade 2003).

Li also structure the human mind, thought, and language, such that human beings are predisposed to grasp and attempt to respond appropriately to the things and situations they encounter.[7] Objective learning on this view can be understood as a facet of self-learning: indeed, by the principle of continuity, objective understanding enhances self-understanding, for by comprehending the warp and woof of the outer li of things, one gains insight into the inner li constituting one’s mind and character (Qian Mu 1971: II 31–38). For Zhu Xi, while li structure the mind, thought, and language, this is not just at the cognitive level: li also structure the inner patterning (xing) and basic impulses that predispose us to have characteristically human emotions (qing), relationships, and responses (ganying) under various sets of conditions (Graham 1986a: 152–154; Qian Mu 1971: II. 25–30). In Zhu’s Confucian view, li and xing predispose one to be sensitive and responsive; metaphorically, they provide the hardware of human nature. Self-cultivation and moral reflection are the means by which one actively conditions and fine-tunes these predispositions of sensitivity and response. They thus function as indispensable software for cultivating personhood.

These are the contours of Zhu Xi’s approach to moral self-cultivation and interpersonal ethics. The standard ethical norms work well in standard situations, normal families, good communities, and ordinary social circumstances. But, Zhu also understood that people are richly complicated and that human affairs often become complex, get out of hand, and go awry. Life is just not that ideal, not that simple. We sometimes encounter ethically anomalous situations to which the standard sets of feelings and responses as prescribed by the received norms and ritual actions simply do not fit. In many instances, standing on the norm and being moralistic simply would make matters worse. Zhu himself said that one must have ample experience and self-cultivation so that,

If, by chance, an anomalous affair should come up, one could comprehend it. One wants to be in a position to grasp such affairs thoroughly in order to understand their unfamiliar aspects. (YL: ch. 19)

Zhu Xi considered how to tailor responses appropriate in problematic situations under the rubric of quan (weighing things up, discretion, expedient means).[8] He noted several kinds of situations in which recourse to discretion and expedient means might be advisable: 1) extraordinary situations that cannot be covered by the standard norms and ritual actions, 2) urgent situations that require a direct violation of the received norms and ritual actions to be satisfactorily resolved, and 3) situations in which it would be more humane and prudent not to observe the relevant norms and ritual actions (see Wei 1986). Situations of the first kind include those that call for a disruption of the given human order, for example the removal of an evil authority figure, such as a psychotic parent or a sociopathic tyrant. For situations of the second kind, Zhu had in mind emergencies when one would have to violate a norm in order to perform an emergency action, such as grasping the hand of a drowning sister-in-law, or shoving an old lady out of the path of a runaway oxcart.[9] Finally, the third kind of situation includes those in which it would be more compassionate to waive or overlook the ritual prescriptions, such as in cases of condoning the remarriage of a widow who would otherwise be destined to isolation and destitution.

Clearly, such considerations lead us into unmapped ethical terrain. How far can one justifiably take such sidestepping of the received applicable norms and ritual actions? What qualifications and restrictions might apply? For his part, Zhu Xi mentioned at least two qualifications: a weak qualification that the expedient adopted not be otherwise ethically objectionable, and a stronger qualification stipulating that the expedient adopted be in compliance with the Way, i.e., that it satisfy some basic moral value, at least as basic as the values expressed in the relevant received norm and ritual action. Thus, any exercise of discretion that is undertaken in light of one’s sense of appropriateness (yi), if exercised with sufficient probity and care, should satisfy the moral values embodied in the Way more adequately than would a routine observance of the standard norm. Humaneness is the core moral value that was invoked most often in such cases, but there are a number of others: filial piety, fraternity, fidelity, empathy, compassion, appropriateness, etc. Famous examples from the Confucian tradition include Mencius’ reminder that one should overturn the propriety of not grasping the hand of a member of the opposite sex in order to rescue a drowning sister in law (Mencius 4A.17), and Cheng Yi argued for an exception to the impropriety of widows remarrying on the basis of filial piety (Rosenlee 2006: 134). Similarly, Socrates showed that Justice is not always realized by observance of the proprieties of truth-telling and faithfully returning a friend’s property (Plato Republic 331c).

Nonetheless, ever cognizant of temptation and moral weakness, Zhu insisted on the well established probity and integrity of anyone who would venture to use discretion and exercise expedient means. He stated:

Intending to weigh up a situation carefully [in order to exercise expedient means], one must have cultivated the inner root daily, so that one’s mind is sensitive, perspicacious, pure, and integrated; [even in that case,] one still must naturally weigh up such situations most carefully. As Cheng Yi (1033–1107) said: Be reverent in order to straighten oneself within; practice appropriateness in order to square situations without. One’s sense of appropriateness comprises the moral fiber which one expresses through sincere ritual action (YL 37, 37:6a, par. 36).

Only those who have extensively “investigated things to extend knowledge”, and who are conversant with the subtle patternings of the human heart and human affairs would be qualified to consider exercising expedient means over simply following the norms. (Zhu knew that this ethical knowledge is as much a matter of practical experience as of book learning. At times, he told his occasionally priggish students that well-disposed people, even if morally untutored, can be more discerning and have better discretion than are some academicians!)

While Zhu stressed making careful observations in situations in order to tailor the most fitting responses in context, at the same time he envisioned a cultivation process whereby one discerns ever more fundamental and yet far-reaching patterns (li) that shape nature and moral value. That is, Zhu sometimes construed the project of investigating things to extend knowledge as an ascendant movement whereby the learner finally arrives at the pinnacle—taiji (supreme polarity) that embraces and subsumes all derived patterns. To Zhu, grasping taiji in this sense was tantamount to grasping the master key, for it represented to him the apex of being and value, and bestowed realization and sagehood on those who sincerely and authentically comprehended and embraced it.[10] While this conception charts an ideal path to the pure, compassionate mind-set of sagehood, it obscures Zhu Xi’s usual emphasis on fine-tuning and sharpening one’s moral discernment and responsiveness in the midst of things—in full view of the situatedness of people in their daily life. This conception also neglects Zhu’s equal emphasis on the claim that patterns as inborn propensities (xing) are manifested only in concrete specific qi formations, and thus that 1) patterns are to be discerned in their fine particularity, that 2) the moral impulses are to be nurtured in the stream of human life, and that 3) the emotions, when not obscured by desires or obsessions, for the most part are immediate expressions of the basic natural impulses.

How, too, to square this broad vision of probing inquiry and deep understanding with the potentially constrictive Confucian moral psychology constructed tightly round the virtues of humaneness, appropriateness, ritual propriety, and wisdom, and their attendant emotions? Zhu Xi likely realized that these virtues functioned as thematic foci for cultivation as one establishes ones moral orientation and bearings and a balanced interpersonal stance. One needs to go through an initial stage of mastering these basic virtues in order to 1) reinforce one’s altruistic impulses and curtail the egoistic ones, 2) be inclined to seek principled rapport and harmony in interpersonal affairs, and 3) be moved by a sense of oneness with others and all things. Subsequently, the more ethical human phenomena one observes and considers in advanced level learning and cultivation, the more one feels a broad sympathy for others that transcends the narrowly-graded love, the so-called love with distinctions that is attributed to the notion of ren (humaneness) in Confucianism (see Mencius, 1A.7, 3A.5, and 7A.45). The more one observes the nuances of human affairs and the springs of human action, the more one will express deference and respect in ways that do not necessarily coincide exactly with the general prescriptions of the norms and ritual actions. In this way, one will build up a repertoire of conduct that reflects one’s personal ethical discernment and discretion, which expresses one’s personal ethical attainment and style.

Zhu Xi on occasion modeled his ethical conception of observing situations and fashioning the most appropriate response naturalistically on the butcher character, Cook Ding, portrayed in the Zhuangzi as a skilled artisan: just as the sure blade of Cook Ding’s cleaver goes straight to the cartilage between the bones, the cultivated sense of appropriateness (yi) of Zhu Xi’s moral adept strikes right at the heart of interpersonal situations (see Thompson 1988: 39–40). A.C. Graham once contrasted Zhu’s perception/response model (gan-ying) of ethical action with that of Zhuangzi by suggesting that Zhu’s notion of appropriate response was informed by rigorous adherence to rules and principles, whereas Zhuangzi’s was relatively intuitive and spontaneous (Graham 1986a: 143–145). This apparent contrast can be resolved by separating the stages of cultivation and mastery: Zhuangzi’s skilled artisans, such as Butcher Ding, all had to undergo prolonged periods of rigorously controlled apprenticeship before they could “forget” the “knowing that” in an integrated, spontaneous process of “knowing how”. For his part, Zhu Xi knew that the years of learning and practice—one’s moral apprenticeship—culminates in a responsive moral agent who can operate as intuitively and spontaneously in his or her personal and social ethical sphere as do Zhuangzi’s skilled artisans in theirs.[11] Zhu’s moral adept is in effect an artisan of interpersonal intercourse. Zhu could rightfully claim Confucius as a prime model for this view. After decades of cultivation, Confucius could say, “At sixty, my ear was attuned. At seventy, I could give my heart free rein and without overstepping the mark” (Analects 2.4).

Viewed as a quest for knowledge as responsive pattern (li) discernment, enhanced by association, analogical reasoning, and generalization, Zhu Xi’s approach to inquiry dovetails with recent studies on strategies for learning for effective, ethical living. Neuroscientist and gerontologist Daniel J. Levitin writes concerning intelligence and wisdom,

Humans excel at... making associations, taking information... and seeing how it interacts with other information. Whenever we encounter new information, our brains place it in a conceptual frame and then seek to associate it with other things we have experienced. The brain is a giant pattern detector…. Our brains add to that the ability to form analogies, … [to perform] analogical reasoning. The wisdom we find in older adults follow[s] from … these four things: association, experience, pattern recognition, and the use of analogies. And, this is why we we gain more and more wisdom as we age. Wisdom comes from the accumulated sets of things we’ve seen and experienced, our ability to detect patterns in those experiences, and our ability to predict future outcomes based on them. (And what is intelligence if not that?) Naturally, the more you have experienced, the more wisdom you are able to tap into…. [Old-timers] have been witness to so many things that seem to cycle around again and again. Wisdom enables you to handle some problems more quickly and effectively than the raw firepower of youth. [In sum, m]aking associations underpins learning. To assimilate new information we need to associate it with what we’ve seen before. Life experience gives us more associations to make, more patterns (li) to recognize. (Levitin 2020, pp. 119–120)

On the surface, it appears that while Zhu Xi’s method of inquiry is specialized and prescriptive, Levitin’s presentation is merely descriptive of normal human learning. However, Levitin is describing the optimal learning strategies of people who remain sensitive, alert, discerning, and responsive throughout mature life, traits that some people nurture going forward and that others ought to make efforts to cultivate themselves in order to be more vital, understanding, and effective human actors and lead more fulfilling lives.

Zhu Xi’s appropriateness approach to ethics has several distinct features. First, one is to be well-versed in the received norms and rituals that circumscribe interpersonal relationships and prescribe proper behavior in family and society. Second, one is to have made ample observations and responses in real life situations. Third, one is to have examined and reflected on ways in which others act and respond in situations, for reference. Fourth, through extensive observation and experience, one is to be cognizant of the range of considerations that come into play in real life situations: moral principle, utility, fairness, sympathy, compassion, and so forth.[12] Fifth, one is to remain flexible and open-minded as well as avoid making surmises, being insistent, stubborn, or self-centered (Analects 9.4). According to this view, while observing the ethical norms and rules of thumb in his or her community, the moral adept possesses a store of personal ethical sensitivity, responsiveness, and resourcefulness, by which to fashion the most fitting responses to situations.

3.2 Moral Cosmic Synthesis

In his watershed essay, A Treatise on Humanity (Renshuo), Zhu Xi discourses on the classical Confucian teaching of humanity (ren) in a unified cosmic and human perspective. In concluding, he criticizes alternative accounts of humanity, i.e., Confucius’ spirit of humaneness, on various conceptual and ethical grounds.[13] Following the early Han tradition, Zhu opens by associating humaneness with cosmic creativity. In its most basic manifestation, humaneness is characterized as the impulse of “heaven and earth” (the cosmos) to produce things. By extension, this impulse yields the cycle of seasons and the pervasive fecundity of nature. Advocates of this doctrine had found confirmation in the rich, productive Chinese soil and temperate climate, which supported their assumption that nature was generally fertile and afforded the right conditions for human flourishing. Pervasive, the impulse to produce appears in each and every one of the myriad creatures while in human beings it is refined into the virtue of “humaneness”, which, when fully realized, involves one’s caring attitude and dedicated responsibility toward others. Zhu Xi moreover correlates “origination, growth, flourishing and firmness”, the fourfold initial stages of creativity and production in the cosmos and human nature first mentioned in early commentaries on the Book of Change, with humaneness, appropriateness, ritual conduct and wisdom, the four cardinal virtues enunciated by Confucius. Zhu Xi thus portrays the fully cultivated person as at once a complement to heaven and earth, a vital participant in cosmic creativity, and a catalyst for the flourishing and self-realization of others. On this basis, he goes on to formulate the definition of ren (humanity, humaneness) for the subsequent tradition: “the essential character of mind” and “the essential pattern of love”. The virtue of humaneness thus grounds the disposition of mind as commiserative and describes the core of moral self-realization as love for others (other-directed concern), to be appropriately manifested.

In the closing argument of the Treatise on Humanity, Zhu Xi stresses that while the stillness and activity phases of the emotions provide emotive stage setting for one’s dedicated cultivation, realization, and practice of humaneness, what is crucial is the profound insight that,

If one could but truly practice love and maintain it (italics added), one would possess the well-spring of all virtues and the root of all good deeds. (based on Chan 1963, 212–227, edited)

Under this premise, Zhu cites Confucius’ advice to Yan Hui, “Master the self by practicing ritual propriety” (Analects XII.1). For Zhu Xi, one masters oneself to rein in one’s naïve self-centeredness by paying ritual respect to others, which in turn spurs a change in the axis of one’s moral concern to other people, especially those with whom one is related and daily interacts. What is important, then, is the moral-ethical axis of one’s motivations. But, how is one to sustain and manifest this humanity consistently in attitude and practice? Zhu Xi does not appeal to philosophic reflection but recommends mindful (jing) daily cultivation and practice, i.e., being calm and focused, respectful in personal life, diligent in conducting affairs, and dedicated to upholding interpersonal relations.[14] Moreover, he considers that the emotions play a fundamental role in ethical cultivation and performance. After stressing serving one’s parents with filiality and one’s elder brother with fraternal respect, Zhu Xi urges: “Be loving in dealing with all things”, which goes well beyond standard filtered and restrained “graded” Confucian love.

Humaneness is not just a matter of being thoughtful and considerate and paying one’s due respect to others ; Zhu Xi underscores the rigors of conducting oneself sincerely and authentically with humaneness, citing Confucius’ examples of not only ministers who had declined official posts to maintain their integrity but of times when the exemplary person is willing to sacrifice his or her own life to fulfill humanity (Analects 15.8). Nonetheless, the animating spirit of Zhu Xi’s Treatise remains: “love people gently and benefit things”, as reflected in Mencius’ four incipient ethical impulses and Confucius’ four cardinal virtues.[15]

4. Natural Philosophy

4.1 Investigating Things for Natural Knowledge and Action

While Shao Yong and Cheng Yi in the Northern Song had introduced and sketched out the idea of observation in terms of guanwu (observing things), fanguan (reflective perception), and gewu (investigating things), Zhu Xi not only discussed the idea of observation but offered a multitude of actual observations of celestial and terrestrial phenomena. In addition, his penchant for hierarchy and systemization led modern commentators in the twentieth century to draw comparisons with Plato, Aristotle, and even Thomas Aquinas. Around the mid-twentieth century, Joseph Needham vividly presented Zhu’s system in terms of process philosophy as bearing organismic patterns of conceptualization and distinct parallels with scientific thinking:

I am prepared to suggest, in view of the fact that the term Li always contained the notion of pattern, and that Chu Hsi himself consciously applied it so as to include the most living and vital patterns known to man, that something of the idea of ‘organism’ was what was really at the back of the minds of the Neo-Confucians, and that Chu Hsi was therefore further advanced in insight into the nature of the universe than any of his interpreters and translators, whether Chinese or European, have yet given him credit for. (Needham 1956a: 474)

Soon thereafter, after undertaking a careful study of Zhu’s dialogues (Zhuzi yulei), Hu Shih presented Zhu’s method of inquiry, gewu zhizhi (investigate things to attain knowledge) as essentially a process of “hypothesis and verification by evidence” (Chan 1989: 566), consistent in spirit with a scientific approach to inquiry. Needham and Hu effectively cast Zhu’s thought and method in a new light, as more creative, scientific, holistic, and practical than previously thought. Since then, many have discussed Zhu as a process thinker, but little has been written to consider the extent to which his system could accommodate a scientific worldview, and the extent to which his method of inquiry was consistent with a scientific approach. Yung Sik Kim offers an in-depth inquiry into the extent to which Zhu Xi anticipated genuine scientific methods of observation and conceptualization in The Natural Philosophy of Chu Hsi (2000).

Zhu from childhood displayed a genuine interest in natural phenomena and in raising speculative questions. Later he tended to rein in this interest, for example by relating features of observed natural phenomena to human analogues for didactic purposes and by refraining from pressing his speculations very far, i.e., beyond the scope of verifiable knowledge and applicability. Zhu lived during a tumultuous period in Chinese history when Neo-Confucian scholars tended to draw upon the resources of their own tradition to revitalize the empire, an effort in which Zhu’s ouvre constituted a watershed. He sought to wed the objective and subjective trends of the earlier movement into a practical synthesis in which objective inquiry played a key role in subjective cultivation. Subsequently, however, as his disciples refined his thought into a scholastic doctrine, subjective cultivation began to prevail over objective inquiry, which was increasingly redirected into the narrow limits of reading and interpersonal conduct.

A Neo-Confucian master of the Ming dynasty, Wang Shouren (Yangming; 1472–1529), spurned Zhu’s method of inquiry altogether after he made a futile attempt to observe the li (patterning) in the bamboo outside his gate. Holding that facts are obvious to a perceptive observer and do not require endless further investigation, Wang went on to formulate an idealist pragmatism that became influential. Intending to counter the scholasticism and careerism of his day, Wang, a military man, stressed volitionism and activism and spurned the sort of careful objective inquiry Zhu thought necessary to making balanced judgments and appropriate responses.

Zhu conceptualized nature and natural phenomena in terms of li (pattern, patterning) and gewu (the investigation of things), qi (primal vapor), yin-yang, wuxing (five phases), shu (number, probability, ratio), xiang (images); figures from the Book of Changes), ghosts and spirits (gui-shen), heaven and the sage (tian-shengren), stimulus-response (ganying), and transformation and change (bianhua). In this context, it was important to treat li matter-of-factly as the intrinsic patterning of things and events. While the li involved with the identities of things are those facets of intrinsic patterning that pertain to their basic interactive propensities and functions, the li of a concrete thing form “a gestalt totality” (Kim 2000), nearly as complex as the thing itself. Thus, whereas scholars tend to take Zhu’s assertion that “for a certain (kind of) thing to exist, there first must be that li” or “there must be this li for there to be that (kind of) thing” as indicative of a metaphysical principle of sufficient reason, in this context li simply affirm that things of identifiable kinds bear identifying patterns (xing) that make them what they are and interact as they do. Li indicate reference points for identities of things that influence their typical patterns of interaction with other things. Li thus conceived do not amount to principles of explanation and are more involved with definition, so references to the li of phenomena do not add anything cognitive or scientific.[16] At times, Zhu did present the idea of investigating things in chapter 5 of the Great Learning (Daxue) as involving a step-by-step approach, with an eye to discerning ever higher levels of commonality among the myriad li (patterns), aiming at an ultimate comprehension of the most basic form of pattern, taiji (supreme polarity). Although this approach lacks the rigor of a logical categorical system, when viewed together with Zhu’s comments on Zhou Dunyi’s Diagram of the Supreme Polarity (Taiji tu), it is suggestive for viewing phenomena and forms in a developmental, almost evolutionary context. As Needham comments:

Chu Hsi [Zhu Xi] wrote:

If one peers into the mystery, the thai chi [taiji, supreme polarity] seems a chaotic and disorderly wilderness lacking all signs of an arranger…, yet the Li (fundamental pattern) of motion and rest, and of Yin and Yang, is fully contained within it.

Innumerable smaller organisms were also contained within it, and indeed composed it. Some of them more highly organized than others. In fact, the world was no more undifferentiated for the Neo-Confucians than for modern organic philosophy; it manifested a series of integrative levels of organization, wholes at one level being parts on the next. A clear statement of this conception appears in the ninth paragraph of the Thai chi Thu Shuo [Explanation of the diagram of the supreme polarity], which indicated the inapplicability of categories outside the level to which they belong. (Needham 1956a: 466)

For Zhu, investigating things to attain knowledge involves arriving at a grasp of their constituent li; “knowing” or “understanding” such phenomena, thus, is a matter of grasping their li. While Zhu often speaks of knowing or comprehending something in terms of the metaphor of seeing it clearly, of having a clear discernment of it, which is nothing like rigid propositional knowledge, he does recognize several forms or levels of knowing, and regards the basic steps of learning in analytical propositional terms and the higher levels in more synthetic insight terms. That is, one first learns facts about the building blocks of the world and human life, e.g., what things are, what they mean, how they fit together; then, gradually, one gains insights into the broader patterns of relationship and intercourse that comprise the world and human life and that eventually afford sensitive glimpses of the inner root as well as the larger picture. Zhu’s discourses are as full of detailed accounts of phenomena as they are of synthetic insights, which should be expected given that Zhu gives equal status and value to the various sorts of qualities that the Western tradition divides into primary (quantitative), secondary (qualitative), and tertiary (qualitative effects).

As noted, Zhu drew on notions of qi, yin-yang, the five phases, shu (numbers, probablilities), and images as conceptual and categorical resources for classifying, characterizing, and understanding the world, especially cycles, processes, and particular things and events. Chinese thinkers, especially during the Han dynasty, used such notions to arrange categories of reality and compile lists of qualities for each category. While some of the associated qualities are directly or causally linked, many of them are arbitrary—perhaps assigned in light of long forgotten events or decrees. These sets of categories were compiled as systematic indices for grasping things and events in terms of categorical associations and imputations. Inevitably, these sets of categories bore a strongly cultural stamp and bias but were applied equally to natural phenomena, as if the natural world were an extension of the human world, not vice versa.

Zhu often classified a natural phenomenon in terms of these categories and associations, and left it at that, unconcerned that the categories were haphazard and the associations arbitrary and inexplicable. Likely Zhu recognized that these categories and associations often were arbitrary and not particularly informative regarding physical reality but did not find it necessary or practical to pursue the matter. He presumably contented himself with assigning phenomena to these culturally colored sets of categories and associations because in those speech contexts those associations were more significant and interesting than the probing of purely physical categories and explanations would have been. These sorts of examples reflect the cultural common sense and conditions of common speech of his age.

The question arises whether these sets of categories and associations were more a help or a hindrance to the development of science in traditional China. On the one hand, their loose criteria and arbitrary design allowed for easy classifications and “accounts” of phenomena that would have stymied serious scientific investigation while, on the other, the associations thus attributed to these phenomena sometimes might have yielded expectations or hypotheses of sorts, thus stimulating further inquiry. Interestingly, Zhu often sidestepped these sets of categories altogether in his serious thinking about natural phenomena and judged them by what he took to be the deciding factors in the cases themselves, often in light of analogies. Striking cases of this are Zhu’s discussions on the structure of the cosmos (heaven and earth) and insightful explanations of phases of the moon and eclipses of the sun and moon. For example, Zhu often said that the earth was floating on water; both below the earth and surrounding its four sides were water, but he also said that qi surrounded the earth. And, he also spoke of vortices, centrifugal forces, and occasionally of the earth’s motion. Zhu was interested in these accounts of the formation of the world, but saw no way to confirm any of them. He perhaps thought it was important to present such accounts as representative of an objective approach to a question that was more amenable to mystical or religious approaches.

Zhu’s notions of stimulus-response and transformation and change are noteworthy, for they are counterparts to the concepts of causation and change in Western science. Construing phenomena as resonant and sensitive, perhaps perceptive in a rudimentary sense, the notion of stimulus-response reinforces the interdependence of things. Assuming a resonance among things in terms of parallelisms among their forms, and affinities among their qi, this notion presents phenomena on a biological model and conduces to an ecological rather than a mechanical outlook. While providing an interactive way of talking about phenomena, it doesn’t open the way or impel the inquirer to uncover the nuts and bolts of causation and change. Also, since the idea of stimulus-response was usually tied to the aforementioned sets of categories and associations, it was often vague and applied in arbitrary and superstitious ways. As might be expected, Zhu’s notions of transformation and change also reflected biological and human-life models, with transformation indicating gradual change, as in the growth of a child or the passage of summer, and change indicating a sudden transformation, as from a caterpillar to a butterfly or from summer to winter and life to death. From the standpoint of developing science, by making change seem to be natural and inevitable, these notions of transformation and change tended to make further inquiry appear to be unwarranted. In contrast, Western ideas of eternal substance and inert matter, for example, made the observed changes on the earth and in the skies problematic and in urgent need of further inquiry and explanation. More pragmatic in spirit, the Chinese were concerned mainly with registering and grasping the observed patterns and sequences of change in and around them so as to be able to adapt their lives to the ever-changing circumstances. (The Book of Changes was a guide to making such adaptations.)

Zhu Xi posits an ontological and causal continuity between the celestial and terrestrial realms, as well as between the animal and plant species and humanity. Indeed, there is no categorical difference between human beings and other life forms. Against this backdrop, Zhu carefully observed anomalies and sketched explanations based on the general ideas available to him. For example, when observing fossils of seashells atop a mountain, Zhu noted that the area had once been a seabed and hypothesized that the earth formerly was softer and more fluid and that, through wave motions, this seabed later rose to become a mountain top. Meanwhile, the entire earth dried as it grew older. While this explanation was not rigorous or determinate enough to count as a scientific hypothesis; Zhu appealed only to naturalistic concepts and principles in his comments. Zhu also made quantitative measurements of plant growth. Zhu once heard about a monk’s claim that oould see evidence of the nourishing powers of “night vapor” by observing bamboo sprouts, which grow twice as fast at night as during the day. Later, during a stay at a Buddhist residence on Jade Mountain, Zhu observed that the bamboo sprouts there displayed the “same rate of growth day and night, exactly the opposite of the monk’s claim”. Qian Mu observes that Zhu’s practice of gewu (investigating things) was fruitful because he made observations with questions or hypotheses in mind, adding that Wang Shouren’s observations of bamboo had been fruitless and in vain because he had no question or hypothesis in mind to test. Wang was just undertaking bland looking (Qian 1986: 215f, 219).

In contrast to analytical Western concepts used in studying the natural world, including matter, material quality, motion, and change, Zhu Xi adopted a holistic approach to understanding the physical world and phenomena. He drew upon received notions of li (pattern) and qi (cosmic vapor) to describe and account for the material, dynamic, and formal features of perceived phenomena. Li (pattern) refer to the inner patterns of both interaction and identifying form. As noted, li are not general overarching principles, but inner patternings implicated in things and events, from the discernible textures—grains in wood, veins in leaves—to the postulated identifying forms, xing, of things. In terms of dynamic interaction, li structure the primal yin-yang intercourse as taiji, and the intercourse among the five phases as their constitutive identifying forms. Zhu thus conceived of the cosmos as emerging from incipient yin-yang interaction in the initially formless primal qi (yuanqi). Yin-yang interaction and further permutations give rise to the five phases, which bear the full range of material and perceptual qualities and whose interaction gives rise to heaven, earth, and the myriad things, i.e., the cosmos.

The Chinese system of five phases differs from traditional Western atomism on several counts. As qi (yin-yang) operates in essentially a wave-like manner, the world is manifested as a field of interacting qi forces. Change is a function of the attunement of forms and resonance of qi, and transformation is viewed according to chemical and biological models. That is, not only are the five phases derived from yin-yang interaction; they are divisible and inter-convertible. Moreover, while Western atoms bear only primary qualities in themselves, each of the five phases exhibits a range of perceptual qualities and effects, and the tradition attributes a plethora of qualities and associations to yin and yang. These flexible and adaptable concepts do not create the sorts of problems, the kinds of conflicts with observation, that prompt rethinking and further, more precise investigations of phenomena. Because perceptual properties of all sorts are propagated from the formation of the five phases, Zhu Xi and others in his tradition did not draw the critical distinction between primary and secondary qualities that formed a crucial linchpin in physical analysis in the West from antiquity. To be sure, Zhu spoke of a threshold between perceptible and imperceptible phenomena in terms of the expressions “above forms” (xing er shang) and “within forms” (xing er xia). “Above forms” refers not to general principles or primary qualities but essentially to the immanental moral underpinnings of nature and humanity, i.e., the inner roots of order and harmony, ecologically conceived, primary examples of which are dao and li. Characterizing these fundamental notions as “above forms”, Zhu insisted that people needed to comprehend them in light of their manifestations in perceived phenomena “within forms”. Lacking the critical distinction between primary and secondary qualities, Zhu treated perceptual qualities, such as color and taste, as equally basic, innate, and real in material substances as any other, and as such he did not look to underlying principles, causes, or mechanisms in terms of which to explain these manifest qualities.

Zhu Xi didn’t feel the need to formulate a theory of motion as such either, because the factors were glossed in his commonsense grasp of the world and he didn’t see any advantage in explicating them. Importantly, he couldn’t conceive of their theoretical ramifications or especially of their practical implications, such as for engineering and technology. At the same time, Zhu did have a grasp of inertia and the relativity of motion, keys to solving the problems of motion, but it was not adequate to the task. The capacity to imagine ideal cases and relationships would have been necessary: for example, Galileo had to conceive of the paradigmatic case of motion in terms of an object moving in a straight line on a frictionless plane at a constant velocity, something that can never occur in nature, for any actual object inevitably will be environed and influenced by a variety of forces, such as gravity and friction. Essential, too, was the mathematical plotting of motions in nature that approximate the paradigmatic motions, such as Kepler’s plotting of planetary motion and Galileo’s plotting of the trajectories of projectiles, to produce precise representations of near-paradigmatic motions. Necessary, too, was an awareness of the possibility of mathematical calculation and precise predictions. Zhu’s philosophy involved viewing all things interactively in relative context. If he had had a notion of paradigmatic (perpetual) motion, it would have been something like wave motions in the sea or the cyclical pumping action of the traditional Chinese waterwheel used for irrigation with rising full troughs of water complemented by the falling empty troughs (receptacles), which he had used to depict the yin-yang operation of taiji. Zhu also lacked the necessary notions of precise mathematicization, measurement, and calculation in terms of which to make the theory of motion bear fruit. Consequently, it is hardly to be expected that Zhu or any one else in his intellectual circle should have had occasion to formulate anything like a scientific theory of motion.

Several features of Zhu Xi’s thought and his notion of observation discouraged him from forming a genuinely scientific theory or making scientific observations. Zhu was loath to investigate the sorts of fundamental abstract concepts, such as element, compound, infinity, space, time, void, causality, and law, that were necessary for making breakthroughs in the scientific revolution. Because of the Confucian commonsense approach to things, Zhu was disinclined to pursue or investigate such abstract, intangible, and seemingly ephemeral notions. He tended to think that focusing on concepts like void, nothingness, infinity, and space would draw people away from the world of human affairs and ultimately incline them toward pointless introspection. Zhu’s concern with the real world itself stymied his investigations into the very abstract concepts necessary for constructing a better grasp of this so-called real world.

Zhu Xi had a “particularistic” tendency to investigate each phenomenon on its own terms, without attempting to relate it to more general explanatory principles, as in his treatment of inertia and the relativity of motion. In another case, he discussed the difficulty of boiling rice atop a particular mountain in terms of the characteristics of the qi (cosmic vapor) of that mountain, without relating the phenomenon generally to characteristics of qi (as air pressure) at high altitudes. Inevitably, this ignoring of general principles made Zhu less sensitive to the contradictions that arose when he offered more than one explanation of a single phenomenon.

Why did Zhu Xi go to the trouble of constructing his elaborate system and making and discussing all these observations if they didn’t carry him beyond common sense to a deeper and more accurate perception and account of reality, to go beyond the details of particular cases to more general principles and truths? Zhu’s ultimate purpose was pragmatic rather than epistemic; that is, he was laying out the concepts, framework, and practices that he deemed most conducive to self-cultivation, self-realization, and ethical practice, rather than formulating objectively accurate concepts, systems, and methods for ascertaining objective truths about the world. So, he did not have a practical interest in pushing his inquiries in purely scientific directions. But, this way of putting it is not completely right because Zhu had considered a variety of philosophic positions and did think he had selected the best and most accurate of the concepts and systems at his disposal. And, he did attempt to render his ideas in a manner that was faithful to reality, the devotion to which was one of his core cultivation themes.[17] Clearly, he did not have the requisite concepts, framework, or style of thinking through which to conceive the world under overarching scientific principles and abstract generalities.

Zhu Xi’s working concepts and thought were typified by immanental patterns (li) rather than by transcendental principles. He regarded reality, the world, not in terms of logical order, but as manifesting aesthetic order. Reality for him was not composed of independent atoms operating under general laws; rather it formed a field in which particulars appeared as foci determined in context. To Zhu, ours is not an absolute, objective universe in which particular individuals are subsumed under generalities and behave according to universal laws; rather, the world unfolds before us in light of our increasing, expanding perception of the arrays of particular phenomena around us. The world we experience is a function of, a field manifested as, the tapestry formed through the resonance among the foci making up that field. Consequently, the task of investigating things is a process of unfolding (rather than an inductive process), an exhausting of the li constituting particular things and events, from their gestalt forms, such as the symmetrical bilateral forms of most biological entities, to their identifying forms to their functions and typical patterns of interaction. Proceeding in this way, we seek not the most general laws or principles governing particular atomic individuals, but rather the most basic or common patterns of interaction and formation among particulars as foci in fields. Consequently, for example, the ultimate pattern in Zhu’s thought, taiji, the supreme polarity, is not an abstract ideal like a platonic form or a law of nature; it is an immanental pattern that is realized ubiquitously but distributively, not overarchingly or generally. Zhu was not working toward a scientific conception of the world, of reality, as constituted on general principles and abstract equations; he was traversing an alternative route by eliciting the formations of things and events in ecological context in a way that would open one’s mind to the intimate resonance and intercourse among particulars as foci in fields. At the same time, by stressing the expression “gewu qiongli” (investigate things to exhaust their li), Zhu maintained a measure of analyticity in his insights to ensure that the knowledge people gleaned was nuanced and textured enough to contribute to life understanding and appropriate conduct.

4.2 Philosophic Synthesis

Zhu Xi erected a philosophical synthesis that has been compared broadly to the systems of Plato, Aristotle, Thomas Aquinas, Whitehead, and others. These “Great Chain” systems are hierarchical and rooted in the distinction between form and matter. Recent immanental readings of Zhu Xi’s thought have stirred comparisons with Spinoza and even Husserl (Choi 1999; Yeo 2013). Zhu Xi preserved the immanental character of his hierarchy by incorporating Zhou Dunyi’s conception of world (and self) as shown in the Diagram of the Supreme Polarity (Taiji tu), as a way to combine the Cheng brothers’ concept of li (pattern) with Zhang Zai’s notion of qi (cosmic vapor) as organically integrated in a holistic system. In Zhou’s treatise, Explanation of the Diagram of the Supreme Polarity (Taiji tu shuo) (Adler 2014), Zhu discerned a viable account of the formation of the world in stages from the original unformed qi, to yin and yang, the five phases, earth, wood, fire, water, and metal, and on to heaven, earth and the ten thousand things. Zhu blended this conception with ideas from the Book of Change and its commentaries in setting forth a comprehensive philosophy of cosmic and human creativity and providing philosophical grounds for the received Confucian concepts of human nature and self-cultivation.

Zhu Xi’s penchant for thinking in polarities, li and qi, in particular, has continued to stir critics to regard him as a dualist who used two fundamental concepts to explain reality. For his part, any viable account of the complexity of phenomena must involve two or more facets in order to register their complexity, variety, and changes. Zhu generalized the organic understanding of li and qi implied in Zhou Dunyi’s Explanation under a principle of complementarity, inspired by Cheng Hao’s observation that all things have their complement (discussed in the next section). At first, Zhu thought this principle only governed qi phenomena as patterned by li, but eventually he admitted that not only were yin and yang paradigmatic polar complements but that the supreme polarity (taiji) complemented the yin-yang polarity, and inferred that li and qi, as the references of taiji and yin-yang, respectively, too had to be complements. This meant that li and qi were functionally on a par and mutually implicative. Zhu still felt the need to prioritize li ontologically and ethically, however, for the reason that li underwrites both the possibility of qi ordering (to yield a world and phenomena) and the possibility of moral feelings and norms (to yield ethics and a system of rites). Treating li and qi as full ontological complements would quite possibly entail a Daoist conception of nature as pure spontaneity and ethics as just perspectival while prioritizing qi over li would be inadequate for understanding the world and phenomenal orders, and reduce ethics to the received norms.

5. Complementarity between li and qi, and among related terms

Recognizing li and qi as complements serves to underscore their unity in difference and their implicatedness in not just the forms but in the flow of events comprising the world.[18] This complementary relationship, moreover, underscores the basic holism and power of Zhu’s thought regarding the formation of the world and things.

Zhu Xi was inspired by Cheng Hao’s formulation of the principle of complementarity, which he placed prominently in sec. 1 of the authoritative Neo-Confucian anthology, Reflections on Things at Hand (par. 25):

Master Cheng Hao said: The li of heaven, earth and the myriad things is that nothing exists in isolation; everything certainly has its opposite/complement. This is spontaneously so and not artificially arranged. When I reflect on this truth late at night, I feel delighted as if my hands were waving and my feet were dancing. (based on Chan 1967, edited)

Zhu Xi regarded this complementary pattern as describing the most fundamental ordering tendency of cosmos, phenomena, and self. Notably, this is li (pattern) in a new sense, now more as a pattern of creative intercourse than just as inherent patterning or order. It generalizes the significance of taiji, though it prima facie lacks taiji’s insistent implication of li into qi intercourse and derived phenomena. Zhu remarks that Cheng Hao felt delighted about his insight into this li because,

Once he had grasped deeply the truth that, “nothing exists in isolation but certainly has its opposite/complement,” it seemed to him marvelous and joyous. (based on Chan 1967, edited)

Zhuzi yulei (Classified Dialogues of Master Zhu), juan 95, contains Zhu’s discussions with students on this Cheng Hao quotation. As mentioned, Zhu usually construes this as a li pattern underlying the complementary relationships among qi phenomena, which li itself transcends, hence implying a vertical bifurcation between li and qi. When a disciple asks Zhu whether the complements have to be “things” or whether, “Li too could have a complement?” The Master replies,

As to the categories of above and below, small and great, clear and turbid, they also pertain to things. But, if we were to say, “having the above, there must be the below; having the large, there must be the small”, that would be purely a matter of li, that is to say it has to be like this, as a sort of logical necessity. For example, in nature’s production of things, there cannot only be yin, there must also be yang; there cannot only be yang, there must also be yin. These [yin and yang] are mutual complements. The contexts of these complements are not themselves complementary li. Rather, the li are the very reason by which there are these complements. (trans. by the author)

Zhu also applies this li pattern creatively to number, speech, objects, and games. According to this pattern, “One complements two”, “above forms” complements “within forms”. Any word will bear its semantic complement within.[19] And, this object before your eyes has its complements of back, front, top, and bottom. Moreover, each side has its complement…. Any single thing bears its complement within.[20] For example, the paths on a checkerboard form series of complementary pairs. In the end, when only one path remains open and it seems that no other complement remains, this very path still complements the 360 other paths.[21] This is called a ‘one-many complement’, like the ‘Way-implement complement’ (Zhuzi yulei, juan 95).

At the same time, Zhu hesitates to accept that li and qi themselves are complementary, but this primarily reflects his ethical concerns.[22] On the ontological side, he eventually does affirm that li and qi are complementary by saying:

As to what would be the complement of taiji, it is said that taiji is wuji (free of polarity)…. Taiji also complements yin-yang…. [Regarding] the Way above forms and… utensil within forms… these are ‘horizontal oppositions’…. (trans. by the author)

This is just like,

Having the tranquility of the pre-aroused emotions of pleasure and anger, grief and joy, there is the harmony of these emotions when aroused in due degree. (trans. by the author)

Taiji and wuji are opposed, apparently contradictory, expressions. Signifying the most basic complementarity, namely, that between yin and yang, taiji is the most primitive and original form of li. It is quintessential li, or elementary form (patterning). Signifying something unbounded and free of polarity, wuji describes the unformed primal qi whence yin and yang emerge through the taiji impulse. It is quintessential qi, pure potentiality. Hence, Zhou Dunyi’s proposition, “Wuji er taiji” (Free from polarity, and yet the supreme polarity), expresses the identity of opposites (li and qi) that gives rise to the initial impulse of phenomena.[23] In the next step of this impulse, yin and yang are formed. They complement taiji as pure energy to pure form, thus expressing another dimension of the li-qi complementarity.

Although the distinction between “above forms” and “within forms” does not strictly mark the distinction between li and qi; nevertheless, as the way is correlated with li, and implement is embodied qi, their “horizontal complementarity” implies a similar pattern for li and qi. Strikingly, whereas those who take this above-below forms distinction as “metaphysical” and “physical” would have to describe the opposition as “vertical”, Zhu says plainly that it is horizontal, thus imputing a closer, more interactive relationship between these complements than could obtain had their relationship been strictly vertical.

A final reason why Zhu Xi’s ideas of li and qi ought to be taken as horizontal and not vertical complements, that is, as a complex unity and not as a metaphysical duality, is found when Zhu makes two seemingly contradictory claims about li and qi: (1) Li is prior to qi. 2) Li is not present apart from qi formations. Whereas 1) is usually regarded as a positive metaphysical claim, it means rather that li in this sense refers to “permanent possibilities of qi formation”. For example, for any particular qi formation to have come about, it had to have been possible for the qi constituents to combine in that particular way to yield those properties and capacities.[24] Whereas (2) is often taken to mean that li subsist until instantiated, it means rather that li are the patterning of real processes and things; they exist immanently in processes and things, though they can be analyzed and discussed separately from their real contexts. This is why, methodologically, Zhu insists that learners acquaint themselves with the li of things, processes, affairs, ethics, etc., by examining actual things, processes, phenomena, etc. He regards the study of li in abstraction from phenomena to be wooden, hollow, empty, etc. Hence, Zhu’s claims (1) and (2) and his methodological strategy all indicate that, for him, the relation of complementarity between li and qi is essentially horizontal.

The “li” pattern in the Cheng Hao quotation thus turns out to be a “meta-liabout the dynamic li-qi complements that originate and comprise the world and its constituents, that is, as a second-order abstraction from the li and qi that are actually implicated in phenomena. Again, this meta-li confirms the basic unity and dynamism of Zhu’s li-qi system. It reveals the pulse of life at the heart of li and affirms the possibilities of form in the vagaries of qi movement. It enlivens Zhu’s system and makes it flexible and conceptually adaptable to experience and thinking.

We may reflect that Zhu’s original notion of li as pattern involves restrictions that conflict with experience or expression, so he reconfigures it in light of Zhou Dunyi’s Explanation of the Diagram of the Supreme Polarity and the Cheng Hao quotation.[25] To work as intended, li has to tolerate and express simultaneous assertions of “contradictory” complementary terms. At the same time, this reconfiguration marks a step away from primarily immanental aesthetic pattern of the li conception to a more abstract, more self-consciously meta-pattern.

6. Major Interpreters of Zhu Xi

Zhu Xi was an active scholar-intellectual who held discussions and disputes with other scholars, both in correspondence and in person. His thought can be understood by contrast with the thought of his intellectual rivals as well as through his positive views. For example, his series of letters with Zhang Shi on the topic of self-cultivation and moral psychology, preserved in the Collected Writings of Master Zhu (Zhuzi wenji), provides an illuminating record of these two dedicated Confucians’ quest for a well-grounded, efficacious approach to self-cultivation. He debated with Lü Zuqian (1134–1181) on the nature of education. Zhu focused on the Confucian Way and moral practice in education while Lu argued for a broader-based humanities approach. Zhu held a series of debates with Lu Jiuyuan (Xiangshan: 1139–93) on the nature of realization and moral conduct. Whereas Zhu advocated regimens of study, reflection, observation, and practice, Lu spoke simply of reflecting on self and clarifying the mind, considering that once the mind was clear one would know spontaneously what to do in any situation. Zhu also corresponded with the “utilitarian” Confucian scholar Chen Liang (1143–94), who disputed Zhu’s focus on individual moral realization and the received “Way” with a broader institutional approach that was more sensitive to empirical facts and conditions. Zhu generally eclipsed all of the other scholars of his day, partly because he outlived them and had so many students but mainly because his system was so compelling. It was comprehensive yet nuanced, tightly reasoned yet accommodating of individual differences. It preserved the essential Confucian Way, yet ramified it to meet the challenges of Buddhism and Daoism as spiritual teachings. Zhu’s influence rose at the end of the Southern Song dynasty and became decisive during the Yuan dynasty when his edition of the Four Books was adopted as the basis of the imperial examination system arranged by scholars trained in his approach.

While raising his standing in pedagogy, this focus on the Four Books came at the expense of Zhu’s deeper, more nuanced texts and dialogues, and opened the door to undue philosophic criticism. The schematic presentation of Zhu’s broad theory of li pattern and qi cosmic vapor that lay in the background of his commentary to the Four Books easily opened him to charges of dualism and of reading abstract categories into the down to earth, essentially practical ancient texts. Because his commentary was focused on reading and understanding the meaning, intent, and cultivation message of the Four Books, critics generalized that Zhu and his method were essentially scholastic and would be myopic and stilted in facing real situations. Anyone who peruses the corpus of Zhu’s writings and dialogues, however, will find that his ontology is not a crude dualism but a holism built of complementary, mutually implicative elements that never exist in separation. Also, his reflections are always informed by knowledge of history, current events, practical observation, and personal reflection, as his method of observation applies generally to objects (and self) and phenomena while respecting texts, which he took to be handbooks of ethical insight and practice, after all. Even Zhu’s comments on Confucius and Mencius often refer back to the person and the speech context, and thus are not entirely scholastic. His method of observation opened the door to breakthroughs beyond the “verities” of the classics, though he was careful not to play up this fact because most of his intellectual colleagues primarily sought the truth in the texts, thinking empirical facts were distractions from the essential Natural-patterning (tianli) that was reflected most adequately in the canonical texts.

Whereas early generations of Zhu’s followers were acquainted with his broad learning, incisive style, and open spirit, Confucians of the Ming and Qing dynasties knew him mostly through his edition of the Four Books, through which they targeted their criticisms of his thought. Zhu’s most eminent critic was the Ming scholar-official Wang Yangming (1472–1529). He rejected Zhu’s approach to observation as too objective and open-ended, as outward and diffuse and neglectful of concentration and inwardness. It could be said that, in his criticisms, Wang was reacting more to the scholastic attitudes fostered by the examination system than to Zhu Xi himself. Wang ultimately respected Zhu and went on to compile a text in which he argued that, in later life, Zhu’s thought had taken a a subjective, practical turn that anticipated Wang’s approach.

Scholars of the late Ming through the early Qing period (mid-seventeenth to early eighteenth century), notably, Wang Fuzhi (1619–92) and Dai Zhen (Tai Chen, 1723–77), disputed Zhu on philosophical and textual grounds. Whereas Zhu had allegedly insisted on the priority of “pattern” over qi, (roughly, form over matter), Wang and Dai followed the Northern Song thinker Zhang Zai in affirming the priority of qi, viewing patterns as a posteriori evolutionary realizations of qi interactions. They thought this account dissolved the threat of any hint of dualism in cosmology, ontology, and human nature. For his part, Zhu Xi would have responded that, fundamentally, “pattern” is implicated in the very make-up and possible configurations of qi, which is why the regular a posteriori patterns can emerge. Li “patterning” provides for the standing orders and processes, based on the steady interactions of yin-yang, five phases, etc., that give rise to the heaven-earth world order, with its full complement of ten thousand things. The fundamental a priori patterns are necessary to the world order and provide the fecund context in which the a posteriori forms emerge continuously. Wang and Dai’s qi-based view could not account for existence and the variegated yet systematic given world order in this sense. At the same time, Zhu did not think that “patterns” were absolutely determinative. They just set certain “possibilities of order” that are realized when the necessary qi conditions obtained. For the most part, he registered the range of randomness and free flow in qi activity that is best exemplified in the randomness of weather systems and seismic events.

As to textual grounds, Wang and Dai argued that Zhu was so enamored of his metaphysics of pattern and qi that he constantly read them into the classical texts. For example, Dai said Zhu blandly associated Confucius’ term tian (heaven) with his own notion of li (pattern), quoting Analects 11:9 where Confucius, in sorrow over the death of his disciple Yan Hui, cried that “Heaven has forsaken me”. Da questioned how Zhu Xi could reasonably claim that Confucius was crying that li had forsaken him? Critics tend to find this counter-intuitive example of Dai’s against Zhu’s approach to be compelling. However, consulting Zhu’s original commentary, we find that he noted that this phrase was not literally about heaven but rather expressed Confucius’ utmost sorrow, that Confucius felt Yan Hui’s death as if it was his own son’s, without mentioning “pattern”. This example does not support Wang and Dai’s claim in the least. It illustrates that Zhu’s commentary was nuanced and sensitive to pragmatic, situational usages despite his penchant to see his own notion of “pattern” in some of Confucius’ usages of “heaven”. Moreover, as the intellectual historian Daniel Gardner shows, Zhu’s commentary was not intended as simply a glossary with comments. It was intended as a guide to self-cultivation. Hence, Zhu sometimes recast passages in the Analects more generally to show their broader implications for self-cultivation and realization, often with the isolated countryside student in mind. Gardner shows how Zhu had effectively enriched the text as a tool for self-cultivation whereas earlier commentaries of the Han and Tang dynasties had just given glosses necessary for answering examination questions.

Known in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries in the West through the work of Jesuits in China, Zhu Xi’s thought and texts were made more widely available to western scholarship in the late nineteenth century. Notably, James Legge (1815–1897) based his translations of the Chinese Classics on Zhu Xi’s commentaries, which he quoted and discussed at length in his footnotes to the texts. Early in the twentieth century, a Chinese student of John Dewey (1859–1951) at Cornell, Hu Shi (1891–1962), initially followed the empirical, textual Qing scholars in viewing Zhu as a scholastic metaphysician. But, after reading Zhu’s Dialogues for himself in old age, Hu contended that Zhu’s method of observation was not scholastic but essentially scientific in nature. J.P. Bruce, who translated a book of Zhu’s collected writings in the 1920s, viewed Zhu’s notion of li (pattern; principle) in light of Stoic natural law. From the 1930s, the eminent historian of Chinese philosophy, Feng Youlan, interpreted li along the lines of platonic Forms making Zhu Xi appear to be an idealist and abstract thinker. In the 1950s, Carsun Chang naturalized the notion of li by aligning it with the Aristotelian “nature” or “essence”, thereby locking Zhu’s thought into a sort of rigid descriptive metaphysics.

From the 1960s, Mou Zongsan interpreted and criticized Zhu’s ontology and ethics on Kantian grounds, claiming Zhu had erected an a priori framework but then illicitly sought to derive further a priori knowledge (of patterns) by a posteriori means (observation). In the 1970s, the intellectual historian, Qian Mu examined and explained Zhu Xi’s thought directly in traditional indigenous terms, without reading western concepts and logical patterns into his system. Scholars wanting to read Zhu Xi on his own terms, largely unmediated by western thought, turn to the five volume Zhu Xi anthology edited by Qian Mu as a rich starting point.

In 1956, Joseph Needham, a chemist, made a significant breakthrough by interpreting Zhu’s system in terms of a process philosophy, Whitehead’s organic naturalism. Needham successfully recast much of Zhu’s language in naturalistic rather than metaphysical terms. The cultural, moral dimension of Needham’s account has been developed by Cheng-ying Cheng and John Berthrong while the scientific dimension has been examined by Yung Sik Kim. In the 1980s, A.C. Graham offered the most insightful and apt account of Zhu’s terminology and pattern of thought in, “What Was New in the Ch’eng-Chu Theory of Human Nature?” and other writings. Graham showed decisively that the term li refers to an embedded contextual “pattern”, rather than to any sort of abstract form or principle. He reminded us that the term li never figures in propositions or logical sequences, as would be natural for “principle”. Rather, li are always conceived as structuring, balancing, modulating, guiding phenomena, processes, reflection and human discernment and response. For example, one never finds moral syllogisms in Zhu Xi’s writings. Many of Zhu’s discussions thus concern moral emotional intelligence: attunement, sensitivity, discernment, and response. Joseph Adler views li as indicative of an “ordering” tendency that may be manifested as “pattern” or as “principle” in differing contexts. (We might say that people devise principles in the light of observed patterns.) Adler also examines the key roles played by the Book of Change and Zhou Dunyi in the formation of Zhu’s thought, and joins Thomas Wilson and Hoyt Tillman in showing the extent to which Zhu Xi re-visioned, revised, and recast the Confucian Way. Adler shows how Zhu Xi made Zhou Dunyi a pivotal figure in the succession of the Confucian Way while Wilson is interested in Zhu’s account of the Way as a sort of educational-ideological revision, and Tillman is interested in how Zhu’s account of the Way eventually outlasted other competing versions that might have offered more practical and liberal openings in late imperial China.

Advances continue to be made in Zhu Xi studies in the present century. On the one hand, intellectual historians, such as Yingshi Yu, examine Zhu Xi’s historical, political, and cultural backgrounds, as well as his intellectual milieu. Other intellectual historians, such as Hoyt Tilman and Hans van Ess study Zhu Xi’s intellectual collaborators and rivals. Still others, such as Chun-chieh Huang and his colleagues examine the differing receptions and adaptations of Zhu Xi’s thought by Confucian scholars around East Asia. On the other hand, philosophical interpreter Brook Ziporyn has developed a “coherence” reading of li (pattern). Drawing on the parallel model of li and shi in Huayan Buddhism, he views Zhu Xi’s li as the organizing, cohering element in qi phenomena, writ large and small. Given the intimate connection between li and truth in Zhu Xi’s thought, the coherence account of li recalls the coherence theory of truth in 20th century Western philosophy. While “coherence” is an apt and suggestive account of the organizing and cohering function of li, it cannot serve as a direct translation of the term li. Ethicists, such as Stephen Angle, Yong Huang, and Justin Tiwald examine Confucian ethics in general and Zhu Xi’s ethics in particular as species of virtue ethics, as conceived in recent Anglo-American ethical thought. They have identified overlaps and similarities between these ethical approaches. Other scholars, such as Ming-huei Lee and the present author have identified Kantian elements in Zhu Xi’s efforts to justify Confucian ethics and cultivation. Finally, Shui Chuen Lee and others find support in Zhu Xi’s system of thought for a viable Confucian approach to environmental ethics.

In summary, the depth and range of Zhu Xi’s thought were unparalleled in the Chinese intellectual tradition and around East Asia. Zhu Xi studies globally continue to be vital, wide-ranging, and contentious, and continue to attract increasing interest around the world.


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