“Africana philosophy” is the name for an emergent and still developing field of ideas and idea-spaces, intellectual endeavors, discourses, and discursive networks within and beyond academic philosophy that was recognized as such by national and international organizations of professional philosophers, including the American Philosophical Association, starting in the 1980s. Thus, the name does not refer to a particular philosophy, philosophical system, method, or tradition. Rather, Africana philosophy is a third-order, metaphilosophical, umbrella-concept used to bring organizing oversight to various efforts of philosophizing—that is, activities of reflective, critical thinking and articulation and aesthetic expression—engaged in by persons and peoples African and of African descent who were and are indigenous residents of continental Africa and residents of the many African Diasporas worldwide. In all cases the point of much of the philosophizings has been to confer meaningful orderings on individual and shared living and on natural and social worlds while resolving recurrent, emergent, and radically disruptive challenges to existence so as to survive, endure, and flourish across successive generations.
The emergent third-order work defining the field has been focused on identifying for research and teaching, and for further refinements and new developments of, instances of philosophical articulations and expressions regarding what has been, and is, of thoughtful, aesthetic significance to persons African and of African descent. This work has produced educative catalogings and critical surveys of particular ideas and idea-spaces; intellectual and aesthetic expressive agendas, practices, and traditions; and networks of individuals, organizations, and institutions serving philosophizing in African and African-descended life-worlds.
- 1. The Concept of Africana Philosophy
- 2. Philosophizings Born of Struggles: Conditions of Emergence of Africana Philosophy
- 3. Africana Philosophy: Continental Africa
- 4. African Philosophy: Contributions
- 5. Africana Philosophy: The African Diaspora
- 6. African American Philosophizings Born of Struggles
- 7. 1600–1860
- 8. 1860–1915
- 9. 1915–2000
- 10. 1950–Present: Professional Philosophers of African Descent
- 11. Publishing and Professional Africana Philosophy
- 12. Africana Philosophy: Contributions
- 13. Future Developments
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
There are significant challenges to the viability of the concept Africana philosophy as well as to an effort to map out an encyclopedic overview of the extended and still expanding range of endeavors covered by the term. Foremost are the challenges to ordering through a single concept the geographical, historical, socio-political, and cultural differences and complexities that have defined and continue to define the realities of life of the many persons and peoples identified as “African” and “of African descent” in many locales throughout the world. Yet, the viability of the concept is grounded on several centuries of continuous, linked, complicated histories during which Black peoples of Africa, and their descendants, have been regarded as and engaged with, and more or less have come to regard themselves, as “African” peoples, as persons and peoples “of African descent.” The long histories of this regarding, by others and by themselves, have thus conditioned substantively the history-makings, the socio-political lives, the culture-makings and culture-mediations, intellectual productions and philosophizings included, of persons and peoples African and of African descent.
On these socially constructive historical groundings rest several key heuristic presumptions that are central to Africana philosophy as a metaphilosophical organizing concept of intellectual praxes. First, the presumption that there are sufficient distinguishing anthropological, historical, and other commonalties and similarities that are shared, more or less, by the many bio-cultural groupings of human beings who have been identified, and who subsequently generally have come to identify themselves, as, in part, “African” or “of African descent” to warrant ordering under a general heading particular instances of philosophically articulate thought expressed by persons in these groupings and shared with and debated by others within and beyond the groupings. These identifications are consequences of the imposition on the peoples of the continent named “Africa” of an attempted homogenizing racializing ontology by peoples of nation-states on another continent that was named “Europe” in an aspiration for geo-political and anthropological unification. Many “Europeans” came to believe that beneath their many formidable differences there was a foundational commonality through shared raciality and other constitutive virtues that was definitive of their anthropological and historical superiority as harbingers of a theologically and philosophically sanctioned destiny to achieve global predominance. It was out of this toxic mix of convictions and aspirations that particular Europeans set about constructing racialized, rank-ordered philosophical anthropologies through which they construed a continent of diverse peoples as a single “race” of “Africans” or “Negroes.” The outcomes of the histories of these inventive forgings through complex, centuries-long struggles of European imposition and adaptive endurance of colonization and dispersing enslavements by persons and peoples African and African-descendant provide the warrant for the presumption of commonalties embraced by the concept Africana philosophy when considering the philosophizings of people African and African-descended subsequent to encounters with people(s) of Europe and European Diasporas.
This first presumption is tempered by a second: namely, that the bio-cultural groupings of peoples African and of African descent are not homogeneous, racially or otherwise, neither individually nor collectively, but are constituted by differences and dissimilarities as well as by similarities and commonalties. All the more so as consequences of the various groups having created differing life-worlds in differing geographical, political, and historical locations prior to and as a consequence of impositions and disruptions fostered by Europeans and others on one hand; and, on the other, while living interactions and cultural exchanges with other peoples, Europeans included, which have given rise to differences in individual and group genomes, histories, cultures, interests, and aspirations. Furthermore, identified shared similarities and commonalties are understood to be contingent, thus neither necessary nor inherent and fixed and thus the same for all persons African or of African descent. This presumption rules out any ahistorical, a priori claims regarding supposedly definitive “natural” characteristics of “the” thought of African and African-descended peoples assumed as non-contingently widely and generally shared across extended historical times and geo-cultural spaces. Africana philosophy as an ordering concept, then, is neither the promise of, nor an aspiration for, a unifying philosophy already shared, or to be shared, by all properly thoughtful persons African and/or of African descent. Judgments regarding the always-contingent distinguishing features of philosophizing thought and expression by persons African and of African descent, and of the extent to which such features are shared—to what degree, under what circumstances, to what ends—are to be achieved by way of combined efforts of philosophical anthropology, sociology of knowledge, and intellectual histories: that is, by way of historically and socio-culturally situated comparative studies of instances of philosophizing.
A third presumption: Africana philosophy should not be regarded as normatively prescriptive for philosophers identified as African or of African descent, as setting requirements for what their philosophizing must have been, or must be, about and to what ends because of their racial/ethnic identities. Such identities neither confer nor require particular philosophical commitments or obligations. Substantive differences among African and African-descended thinkers have been, and must continue to be, acknowledged and taken into account in the ordering of the field and setting agendas for Africana philosophy. There have been, are, and will likely continue to be persons African and of African descent for whom their identities as such are of no import for their philosophizing.
Of particular importance, work in Africana philosophy is also conditioned by the presumption that contributors need not be persons African or of African descent. This presumption rests on the understanding that the conditioning circumstances, motivations, modes, agendas, and importance of the philosophically articulate thought and aesthetic expressions of persons African and of African descent can be identified, understood, researched, taught, commented on, and taken up with respectful competence by persons neither African nor of African descent. By virtue of their competencies such persons may be identified appropriately as, for example, “Africanists” or “Afro-Caribbeanists” or “African Americanists.”
Finally, the extent to which these heuristic presumptions are cogent and effective in guiding work in Africana philosophy is a matter that is to be continuously explored and tested in the agora of disciplined, ethical scholarship and thus confirmed or disconfirmed, to whatever extent appropriate, in accord with proper methods of critical review properly deployed.
The metaphilosophical efforts to map out and order a complex discursive field of articulations and practices as Africana philosophy are, indeed, emergent disciplinary ventures of the late twentieth century. However, many of the instances of thoughtful articulation and aesthetic expressiveness that are being identified and explored as instances of philosophizing were neither produced nor guided by norms and agendas of the discipline of academic philosophy as institutionalized for centuries in various countries of Western European and North America. The same is true for the needs, motivations, objectives, and many of the principal intellectual resources that motivated and oriented those instances of articulation and creative expression and the formation of the networks of idea-spaces and discursive communities that nurtured them. For African and African-descended peoples were of little or no philosophical or anthropological significance to those who have been the designators, historians, practitioners, and mediators of the discipline's institutionalized canons of issues, figures, agendas, conceptual and methodological traditions, problem-sets, texts or text-analogs, organizations, and institutions. The pre-Modern histories of African and African-descended peoples; the centuries-long colonized, enslaved, and otherwise utterly dehumanizing unfreedom of Black peoples throughout the continents of Africa, Europe, the Americas, and the Caribbean; the rapacious unjust exploitation of their bodies, lands, resources, and life-opportunities—all of these went mostly without explicit comment in the discipline of Philosophy, not even as a focus of protest, notwithstanding all of the vaunted concern within the discipline for conceptions of freedom, justice, equality, human nature, and human well-being generally. Even as European and European-descended philosophes of the eighteen, nineteenth, and twentieth centuries fashion decidedly new philosophical anthropologies, socio-political philosophies, and philosophies of histories into complex Enlightenments to ground and guide quests to realize the global instantiation of Modernities in which reason-guided freedom and justice would be foundational to the spread of the racialized, capitalist civilizational projects of Eurocentrism (Amin 1989), there was almost total silence about the intended and unintended consequences for peoples African and of African descent—except for claims that colonization and enslavement would bring them much needed “civilizing.”
Evolving academic, and subsequently professionalized, philosophy thus aided and abetted, and was a substantial institutionalized beneficiary of, these projects well into the twentieth century when the various forms and movements of resistance of African and African-descended peoples to dehumanization were made more challenging while animated by motivating declarations of their claims to their humanity and their rights to freedom, justice, and full citizenship. By the middle of the twentieth century, throughout Africa, the Caribbean, and the Americas these movements had won major victories of liberation from the oppressive regimes of Eurocentric racial apartheid and exploitation. The movements were also contributing to progressive transformations of these regimes that helped to open them to substantive measures of real freedom and justice not only for persons and peoples African and of African descent, but for other persons and peoples of color and, even, for women of European descent.
These historic movements and developments provided contemporary pioneers of Africana philosophy rich, exemplary ideas, idea-spaces, agendas, and social networks on which to draw for motivations, missions, and other resources to forge intellectual agendas and strategies and social networks needed for philosophizing in the interests of people African and of African descent. Hence, the twentieth-century emergence of Africana philosophy as an international field of and for discursive intellectual and expressive aesthetic work with a distinctive mission: to gather up and explore critically thoughtful articulations and aesthetic expressions by and about persons and peoples African and of African descent as instances of philosophizing; and to fashion revised or new articulations and artful expressions in keeping with, and as aids to, quests for freedom, justice, and human dignity by and for these persons and peoples.
Examples of such mission-driven creative intellectual and expressive work in service to the liberation and redemption of Black peoples were already at hand in several other disciplines: in history and sociology, music and literature, art and dance, religion and theology. Moreover, outside of academic disciplines, many among several generations of fiercely independent, extraordinarily formally and informally educated (and in some instances self-taught) socially, politically, and aesthetically engaged female and male black intellectuals and artists, who devoted much of their lives to service as uplifters of Black peoples, had pursued their often very highly productive, and certainly very influential, intellectual and expressive work without ongoing affiliations with institutions of higher education, and without the assistance of sources of support for articulation and expression, that were dominated and controlled by Europeans and people of European descent. This independence was crucial to the production of their seminal reflections, articulations, and artistic creations and expressions. Many of them helped to found and were affiliated with and supported by religious and educational institutions, character-building women's and men's clubs and literary societies, international missionary ventures, benevolent and political organizations, publishing and commercial enterprises, and with local, regional, and international anti-colonial and libratory organizations founded and operated by and devoted to the uplift, freedom, and well-being of African and African-descended peoples. As inspiring role models, much of their work became resource-reservoirs for new generations of women and men determined to continue the quests for liberation and justice for Black peoples. A matter of significant influence was that many of these important figures had become internationalists in understanding the similarities and commonalties of the plights suffered by African and African-descended peoples due to the shared agendas for racialized oppression and exploitation forged and fostered by White peoples of various nation-states. Consequently, more than a few of the new generations of twentieth-century African and African-descended fighters for freedom and justice cultivated internationalist, “Pan African” understandings (Geiss 1974) of and aspirations for what would be needed in the way of intellectual resources and strategies to assist with claiming and realizing the full humanity of and just freedom for African and African-descended peoples.
Many of the contemporary disciplinary pioneers of the philosophizings that are now being gathered under the umbrella of Africana philosophy, though participants in institutionalized, professional philosophy, have also been intellectual and spiritual members of the new generations of freedom fighters or otherwise substantially influenced by them. Thus, many have drawn their motivations, aspirations, and resources for philosophical work from beyond the canonized motivations and traditions of thought institutionalized in the discipline. Energized and emboldened by the legacies of the role models and liberatory movements, they have taken on the work of challenging the discipline in order to create room within its intellectual and organizational structures and processes wherein they could pursue agendas of giving consideration to matters of philosophical import to persons and peoples African and of African descent, and of particular import to themselves as persons African and of African descent engaged in philosophizing formally and professionally.
Among the challenges was the need, first, to reconsider long-prevailing defining assumptions regarding the nature of properly “philosophical” thought: namely, that such thought is characterized by a loving quest for wisdom pursued by persons who have the most highly cultivated forms of disciplined thought, and whose lives are materially conditioned such that they have the leisure to devote substantial amounts of their time and energy to reflective thought and to working out their thinking for articulate, systematic expression in writing.
It became apparent to many—though by no means to all—of the contemporary pioneers of Africana philosophy within academic philosophy that this image of the ideal philosopher was not appropriate for respectfully identifying or characterizing many of the philosophically thoughtful and expressive persons African and of African descent, those, especially, who lived several centuries ago. Certainly, throughout the centuries of radically disruptive and dehumanizing encounters between peoples African and of African descent and peoples of Europe and of the Euro-Americas, and others, the philosophizing efforts of Black people have, indeed, been “born of struggle,” as the philosopher Leonard Harris has so aptly noted. The experiences, thus the philosophizing, of many of these persons—and of generations of millions who were their contemporaries, millions more who came before them, and millions more who came after them—were conditioned profoundly by racialized and gendered exploitative occupational colonization in their homelands; for others by racialized and gendered capture, relocation, enslavement, and oppression in The New World thousands of miles from their or their ancestors' homelands; and in all such cases by racialized and gendered imperialist encroachments on the very core of their being by which they were forced to become and to be colonized “natives” and slaves, ontologically as well as socio-economically. Survival and endurance of such conditions by those who managed to do so required coordinated efforts of recovery and retention, or the recreation, of the integrity of personhood and peoplehood, even of basic humaneness, thus required thoughtful ontological and political work of the most fundamental significance. So, too, crucial intellectual efforts of the kinds designated moral, ethical, epistemological, social, religious, theological, and aesthetic.
Thus, survival and endurance of conditions of racialized and gendered colonization, enslavement, and oppression—not conditions of leisured freedom—compelled more than a few African and African-descended persons to philosophize. Almost daily, even on what seemed the most mundane of occasions, oppressed Black people were compelled to consider the most fundamental existential questions: Continue life during what would turn out to be centuries-long colonization and enslavement, of brutal, brutalizing and humiliating gendered and racialized oppression? Or, seek “freedom” in death? Suffer despair until mad? Or, find resources for continued living through surreptitiously nurtured appreciations of the sacred and beautiful, of irony and tragic comedy, while cultivating hope and patience aided by discoveries and creations of beauty and humaneness in the midst of the physical and soul-distorting psychological brutalities of enforced impoverishments of conditions that were not in any way “mundane” living? Die at one's own initiation? Or, capitulate to dehumanization? Or, struggle to find and sustain faith and hope for a better life, on earth as well as in the afterlife, through creativity and beauty in speech, dance, and song while at work and rest; in thought and artistry; in finding and making truth and right; in seeking and doing justice; in forging and sustaining relations of family and community when such relations were largely prohibited; in rendering life sacred?
For centuries, persons African and of African descent, for themselves as well as for their associates and successors, have had to ponder the most fundamental questions of existence as a direct consequence of their life-constraining, life-distorting encounters with various self-racializing and other-racializing peoples of Europe, the Euro-Americas, and elsewhere. And in choosing to live and endure, peoples African and of African descent have had to forge, test out with their lives, and then refine and further live out explicit strategies by which to avoid being broken by brutality and humiliation and succumbing to fear, despair, or the soul-devouring obsession with vengence. They have had to share with their associates, and those succeeding them, their creative and sustaining legacies for infusing life with spirit-lifting artfulness and their articulated ponderings and strategies for surviving, living, and enduring with hope despite the circumstances. They have had to philosophize, and to share their philosophizings, in order to forge the cross-generational bonds of respectful, extended-family, community-sustaining love and mutuality without which neither survival nor endurance would have been possible.
Indeed, endurance of gendered and racialized colonization, enslavement, and oppression that would be continued for centuries required very compelling, sustaining, persuasive beliefs and nurtured investments in finding and creating soul-nurturing art and experience-verified praxis-guiding thoughtfulness. These beliefs and aesthetic considerations had to be articulated and communicated for sharing, sometimes surreptitiously, in order that persons and peoples endure. And enduring required that the brutalities and humiliations had to be countered that were directed, first and foremost, at the defining core of their very being—that is, at their foundational notions of themselves as persons and as distinctive, racialized peoples—so as to bring about their cross-generational living of social death (Patterson 1982). This particular persons did, throughout Africa and African Diasporas, and without either the guidance or sanction of academic philosophy and the discipline's most canonical practitioners even as some among the latter subjected African and African-descended peoples to their ontological racism.
It has been instances of such compelled, articulated thoughtfulness that contemporary proponents of Africana philosophy have brought into the discipline of academic philosophy as the initial historic instances of philosophizing constituting the new field. The identification and careful exploration of and commentary on the forms and efficacies of this growing collection of works of thoughtful articulation and aesthetic expression are now principal forms of endeavor in Africana philosophy. The creation and expression of new articulations and expressions of thoughtfulness by persons African and of African descent, and by other philosophers not African or of African descent, on these works as well as on old, continuing, or emergent issues pertinent to Africans and people of African descent make for other forms of endeavor in Africana philosophy.
These efforts of recovery, exploration, commentary, and critique constitute an ongoing project-of-projects with several agendas. A first agenda involves, as just noted, the identification and recovery of instances and legacies of the ‘philosophizings born of struggles’. Another very important agenda is the identification and recovery of philosophizings that were engaged in long before the centuries-long struggles with peoples of Europe began. A third agenda is to learn from the philosophizings the lessons of the considerations that governed or substantially conditioned the organization and living of life in the various circumstances in which peoples of Africa forged their evolutionary adaptations. Another agenda: to understand and appreciate fully those philosophizings that nurtured endurance in the face of brutalizing assaults on peoples' being in order to learn from the life-affirming, very passionate intellectual and emotional endeavors of those among severely abused peoples who have been, and continue to be, those who work at gathering themselves, their peoples, and even those who have abused them into humane integrity, individually and collectively. It is to learn how and why it was and is that from among peoples abused and degraded for centuries in conditions of continuous terrorism there have been steady successions of persons who have spared substantial portions of the emotional and intellectual energies they managed to preserve and cultivate, along with nurtured senses of their sacred humanity, to devote to quests for freedom and justice, hardly ever to quests for vengeance.
Yet another agenda is to compare the philosophizings of persons African and of African descent intra-racially and inter-racially, as it were—that is, to seek out the similarities and differences in the various instances and modes of thought and expression of persons situated in similar and different times and places in order to learn more about the forms and agendas of human species-being as manifested in philosophizing. An important consequence of pursuing this agenda should be significant contributions to inventories of thoughtfulness and aesthetic expression in the storehouses of human civilizations, contributions to the enlargement and enrichment of canons of Philosophy and to revisions of histories and of historiography in the discipline.
Still another agenda is to make of Africana philosophy a collection of resources that inspire philosophizing, now and in the future, and that guide such philosophizings by the best lessons found in the collection, among them lessons in how to gain and sustain integrity of body and soul, of person, of womanhood and manhood, of childhood and young-adulthood, of family and community, of “racial” and cultural being, of belief in the sacred sanctity of truth, of justice, and of freedom through the exercise of faith and hope-sustaining, pragmatically focused reasoning and creative aesthetic expression in cross-generational conditions of dehumanizing brutality. Among the lessons to be relearned: how not to abuse persons and peoples, how not to rationalize abuse, how not to live massive lies and contradictions and lives of hypocrisy.
What follows are brief surveys of several historically contextualized developments of philosophizing now being explored as instances of the philosophizing constitutive of the field of “Africana Philosophy.” The survey is not meant to be exhaustive, but one that provides examples and solicits additional contributions in order to make the account more comprehensive and accurate.
The various peoples on the continent that came to be called “Africa” had constructed a variety of more or less complex societies of varying scale and scope many generations before fifteenth century encounters with acquisitive explorers and adventurers from the varying configurations of polities, regions, cities, and states that have been identified as Europe and form elsewhere. Several of these ancient societies—the kingdoms of Mali and Ghana and the royal dynasties of Kemet (Ancient Egypt), for example—had evolved complex social strata that included persons of accomplished learning. Some of these persons were stationed in institutions devoted to the production and distribution of knowledge and creative expression and to the preservation of that knowledge and expression in written and artistic works stored in libraries and other repositories and, in the case of works of art, incorporated into the ontologically-structured routines of daily life. Others, in social orders in which advanced knowledge was produced and mediated via oral literatures and traditions, were selected and trained to be griots, that is, persons with rigorously structured memories who thus became the living repositories, guardians, and mediators of a people's and/or a political community's genealogies and intellectual legacies, their keepers of wisdom. And in order to preserve shared, adaptive life across generations in all of the various social orders, it was socially necessary to construct and maintain interpretive orderings of natural and social realities, as well of creatively imagined origins and genealogies and constructed histories, by which to meaningfully order individual and shared life.
The production of these interpretive and expressive orderings, the working out of the norms by which to structure, justify, and legitimate the interpretations so as to order personal and social life, were, indeed, “philosophical” endeavors: that is, labors devoted to the production of successful, time-tested, enduring thought-praxis and aesthetic strategies by which to resolve emergent and recurrent challenges to transgenerational survival and flourishing. These were experience-conditioned thoughtful means by which to provide knowledge to guide the ordering of meaningful individual and shared life integrated across generations past, present, and future. Such efforts are as old as the peoples now routinely referred to as “Africans.” And the efforts were not destroyed by the holocausts of imperialist colonization and domination, nor by racialized enslavement and apartheid-oppression, fostered by Europeans and others. Still, the philosophizing efforts were disrupted and distorted to various degrees in many instances, were creatively adaptive in many others.
For example, during twentieth century anti-colonial and decolonizing struggles to regain freedom from the domination and authoritative jurisdiction of white racial supremacy over the lives, lands, and resources of African peoples, the disruptions and distortions would compel reinvigorated and determined adaptive creativity on the part of African peoples who endeavored to recover and repair old and/or to invent new agendas and strategies for living in keeping with their will to endure. There is a long history of efforts by scholars African and of African descent to reclaim Egypt from the intellectual annexation to Europe that was urged by Hegel in his The Philosophy of History. It is still the case that many people throughout Europe and the United States regard Egypt as being in “the Middle East” rather than constituting the northern portion of the African continent. This costly mis-education of popular imaginations persists, as well, in historical accounts of various areas of thought (though increasingly less so in historiography related to Africa). The systematic production of ignorance and distorted, unethical “knowledge” of the peoples of Continental Africa persists in academic philosophy, especially in the training of new professionals, in the writing of canonical histories of the discipline, and in the construction of disciplinary curricula though progressive change has begun. Few in academic philosophy not engaged in the work of Africana philosophy are likely to know of a long tradition of scholarship contesting the claims of the Greco-Roman “origins” of Philosophy, an example of which is the controversial work by George G.M. James, Stolen Legacy (James 1954), in which he argues, as the title declares, that Greek thinkers “stole” Egyptian intellectual legacies that have since been attributed erroneously to Greek thinkers as their creations.
A provocative and controversial argument, indeed. Still, widespread disciplinary ignorance regarding the histories of ancient peoples and civilizations other than those stipulated as being ancestors of European White peoples is a direct and continuing consequence of racism in the formation, organization, and practices of communities of discourse and scholarship and the development of racially segregated idea-spaces, intellectual traditions and networks, and scholarly organizations throughout Europe and North America. For example, few academic philosophers and workers in other disciplines who are neither African nor of African descent are likely to know of the Association for the Study of Classical African Civilizations, an international organization of scholars and intellectuals African and of African descent who are determined to “rescue and rehabilitate” the histories, intellectual traditions, and wisdom philosophies of Ancient Africa. Thus, few academic philosophers are likely to know of the scholarship of various persons in the Association such as Maulana Karenga (1986) and Jacob H. Carruthers (1984). Both scholars have contributed additional research and scholarship to studies devoted to reclaiming Egyptian thought-traditions as African traditions of thought. These scholars' efforts and works are paradigmatic examples of the determined production and mediation of new knowledge of African and African-descended peoples by African and African-descended, and other, scholars who have deliberately worked independently of the mainstream organizations of academic professionals in Philosophy and other disciplines.
With little to no evidence in much of the canonical literature and curricula of academic philosophy that Western philosophers have focused attention on questions of historical relations between Egyptian and Greco-Roman thinkers, or on African thinkers and traditions of thought, a number of the pioneers of Africana philosophy have turned to independent, often controversial figures and scholarly projects outside of academic, professional philosophy for their inspiration and for intellectual resources and strategies in taking on the challenges of creating intellectual spaces in academic philosophy for “matters African.” A major resource and intellectual mentor continue to be works by and the person of Cheikh Anta Diop, the intellectually daring and pioneering Senegalese scholar who, in The African Origin of Civilization: Myth or Reality, published in the early 1970s, argued for the reality of the African origin. Diop had begun the challenging work of reclaiming African heritages decades earlier by arguing in a dissertation submitted for the Ph.D. at the University of Paris that ancient Egyptian civilization was a black African civilization. His explorations in support of his claims have enormous implications for revisions to histories of the origins of Western philosophy. Similarly, Martin Bernal's loudly and heatedly contested multi-volume Black Athena: The Afroasiatic Roots of Classical Civilization is by far the most widely read, and intensely debated, work in this vein to which many have turned. However, Bernal's work, which acknowledges a long line of African and African-descended scholars who are his precursors, Diop included, has raised hardly a ripple in academic philosophy. The discipline has thus long been overdue for a spirited and disciplined critical reconsideration of the possibilities and realities of informing Greco-Roman and African Egyptian contributions to the histories of emergence and development of philosophical thought that has been canonized as foundational to the genealogy of Western Philosophy. Africana philosophy has been forged as a novel context of provocations for such critical reconsiderations.
Meanwhile, for several decades academic philosophers in Africa, and elsewhere, have been involved in intense debates and discussions that have prompted reconstructions of disciplinary enterprises of Philosophy (departments in educational institutions as well as national and international organizations of professional philosophers). The initial focal question at the center of the debates and discussions was whether or not there were proper instances of Philosophy in traditional (i.e., pre-Modern) Sub-Saharan Africa, in particular. The publication in 1945 of Placide Tempels' La Philosophie Bantoue triggered much of the debate.
The historical context in which the debates and discussions emerged and in which they were waged was conditioned thoroughly by European colonial domination and exploitation of African peoples rationalized through rank-ordering racial characterizations. This rationalizing work was aided significantly by the intellectual efforts of canonical European philosophers. David Hume, in a footnote in his “Of National Characters,” philosophized about the “natural inferiority” of Negroes to White people (Hume 1742) and was supported by Immanuel Kant (1764), who elaborated his own theory of inferior and superior racial types in his writings on anthropology (Kant 1798). Since successive generations of European and Euro-American White people had been educated into widely-shared common senses of their racial superiority to inferior Africans by such supposedly philosophically well-reasoned, science-verified, and theologically sanctioned teachings, the claim that there were Africans capable of producing thought of the caliber of Philosophy was regarded by most of them as utterly preposterous.
At the core of the controversy was the pressing question whether African persons were fully and sufficiently human and capable intellectually in comparison to the model human par excellence: the man of Europe, the White Man, the avatar for all White people and for humanity proper, whose defining characteristics were capacities for reasoning and articulate speech (logos). Consequently, the claim of Bantu Philosophy made by Placide Tempels, a Belgium priest engaged in missionary work in the then-called Belgium Congo, that Bantu Africans (related ethnic groups identified by the dominant language group, Bantu, spoken by the related groups) had an indigenous philosophy was a serious challenge to the racialized philosophical ontology-cum-anthropology that undergirded colonial domination and exploitation. However, Tempels tempered the unsettling implications of his claim by also claiming that Bantu Africans did not have conscious knowledge of their philosophy. Rather, he claimed, it was he who was able, using the tools at his disposal by virtue of his training in Philosophy, to engage in a hermeneutic of the practices and language of the Bantu and extract the constitutive epistemology and axiology structuring the operative, behavior-guiding philosophy at work in their linguistic practices and normative actions.
Nonetheless, the impact of Bantu Philosophy was substantial. Of particular consequence, the debates it prompted helped to direct the attention of researchers and scholars in several disciplines (anthropology, ethnology, history, religion, philosophy) to the identification and exploration of the articulate systems of thought of various groups of “traditional” Africans. A number of European scholars and researchers who had spent years studying and living among various African peoples were pleased to find confirmed in Tempels' book their own positive assessments of Africans' thought-systems, social organization, and artistic creativity. Others, however, disagreed and challenged Tempels' claims, in a particular case criticizing him for mistaking an “impetus for” philosophy in the language and behavior of Bantu-speaking Africans as evidence of a developed capacity for articulating a proper philosophy. This critic concluded that Bantu-Africans had not yet fulfilled the conceptual conditions for “taking off” into philosophizing properly (Crahay 1965). Other scholars engaged in comparative explorations of thought-systems of various African peoples countered the criticism by providing accounts of a number of such systems that gave clear evidence of their very capable and developed rationality (Forde 1954; Fortes 1965).
The subsequent decades of debates (mid 1940 through the 1980s) regarding the possibility of African philosophy and disclosures of the long-developed rationality and humanity of African peoples were significant consequences for intellectual agendas and practices of revolutionary developments in political arenas manifested in anti-colonial struggles throughout the African continent, and in efforts to construct new political, economic, social, and cultural orders after the successes of those struggles. A significant number among new generations of African intellectuals—many of them educated in institutions in Africa, many of which were administered by persons of European descent, and more than a few of them educated further in the most elite institutions of the colonizing “Mother Country”—became radicalized in their opposition to racialized colonial domination and exploitation of African peoples and resources. A number of these engaged intellectuals regarded Tempels and similarly oriented European and Euro-American thinkers as allies in their struggles against the dehumanizing rationalizations that supported European colonialism. Some regarded Bantu Philosophy as a defense, even a vindication, of Africans as rational human beings quite capable of managing their own lives and therefore capable of independence from colonial rule. Others, however, thought Tempels' claims, and similar offerings by others, were misguided and misleading candidates for proper instances of philosophical thought by Africans. For these dissenters such candidates were really more ethnological studies of African peoples than philosophical articulations by them, and their proponents were more misguided in seeming to attribute unconscious, unwritten, and widely shared putative philosophical systems to all of the persons in the particular groups under discussion. These dissenters disparaged such accounts as “ethno-philosophy.”
African and African-descended intellectuals involved in and otherwise supporting anti-colonial liberation struggles and post-colonial efforts to rehabilitate and further development new African nation-states found in these raging debates intellectual weapons with which to reclaim, reconstruct, and redefine the histories, personhood, peoplehood, needs, and future possibilities of African peoples. Life under exploitative, dehumanizing colonialism compelled intellectual and artistic engagements with prevailing conditions and spurred the nurturing of imaginative visions of possibilities of liberation and of how liberation might be achieved, whether and how modes and agendas of life before the holocausts might be recovered, restored, or adapted to new circumstances as thinkers and practitioners of the religious and theological, creative, expressive artists of literature, music, sculpture, dance, and painting all grappled with the profound existential challenges of the loss of personal and communal integrity through the violent imposition of the conflicts of Tradition and Modernity and the need for liberation and freedom. Twentieth-century struggles on the African continent have thus had significant consequences for, and impacts on, creative intellectual and expressive work in and with regard to continental Africa, and the African Diaspora generally, in giving rise to widespread, prolific, and in many cases especially important articulations of social, political, ethical, and expressive aesthetic thought and feeling. These articulations and expressions have become important object-lessons as well as inspiring resources of agendas and critiques drawn on to forge distinctive disciplinary enterprises of academic philosophy and have become, as well, the focus of informative critical thought for a number of philosophers focusing on “matters African.”
For example, the Tempels-inspired debates over the possibilities for and nature of philosophizing by persons African became focused, for a time, on discussions of the nature and anthropological distributions of modes of rationality unique to philosophizing, discussions that quickly prompted intense debates about the universality or relativity of “reason,” whether there were cultural (or racial or ethnic) differences in the nature or the exercise of reasoning, by persons African in particular historical and cultural contexts in particular. Positions taken in these and other focal debates were developed from the resources of a variety of traditions and schools of academic philosophy and other disciplines, including analytic philosophy, phenomenology, hermeneutical, and existential philosophizings, various modes of social and political philosophy, and Afrocentrism.
Today there are a significant and still growing number of formally trained African philosophers throughout the world who draw on and contribute to the discipline and profession of Philosophy. Explicit developments of discursive formations, within and beyond the discipline, that are distinguished as being “African” have been unfolding through efforts by persons African, African-descended, and not of African descent to identify, reconstruct, and create traditions and repositories of literate African thought and artistic expression—oral, written, and in iconic forms of art—as forms of philosophizing. An important development has been the taking on for serious consideration the expressed articulate thought of particular persons past and present who were and are without formal training or degrees, in academic Philosophy especially, but who have engaged in and articulated more or less systematic reflections on various aspects of life, and the inclusion of instances and traditions of such expressed articulate thought in revised and new canons of African philosophical thought. An important leading example of efforts along these lines has been the groundbreaking work of deceased Kenyan philosopher H. Odera Oruka on the philosophical thought of traditional African sages. Engaging in actual field work in Kenya, Oruka interviewed and conversed with several locally recognized and respected sages and amassed a substantial body of transcribed, critically edited, and now published texts that are the focus of critical studies as well as motivations for more refined work of the same kind in numerous places on the African continent. Other philosophers, a number of them from other countries and not of African descent, have taken up Oruka's lead and continue to explore the articulate thought of indigenous sages while incorporating the sages' articulations into their research, scholarship, and course-offerings. “Sage philosophy” has thus become a subfield of energetic work in Africana philosophy in continental Africa (Oruka 1990b).
The Tempels-inspired debates over whether African or African-descended peoples have philosophies or can philosophize have been resolved—or are no longer taken seriously—and given way to explorations of other concerns. Both the anti-colonial struggles and the challenges of sustaining post-colonial successes and resolving setbacks and failures have prompted much academic philosophizing. The evidence is the development of programs of study leading to advanced and terminal degrees in philosophy with strong emphasis, in a number of instances, on African philosophy in a significant number of institutions of higher education in several countries (Kenya, Nigeria, Peoples Republic of Congo, Ivory Coast, Republic of Benin, Senegal, South Africa); the appearance of a variety of journals and other published (and unpublished) philosophical writings and other modes of articulate expression (literary works, especially); the development of national organizations (in Ghana, Kenya, Nigeria, Egypt, and elsewhere) and international organizations (the Inter-African Council of Philosophy and the Afro-Asian Philosophy Association, the latter with headquarters in Cairo, Egypt, with members from throughout North Africa, Sub-Saharan Africa, Turkey, Europe, and elsewhere) of professional philosophers and other knowledge-workers; and the organization of national, regional, and international conferences devoted to explorations of topics and issues explicitly characterized as philosophical.
The continuing maturation of these developments is evident in the emergence of different philosophical orientations, agendas, and foci that have, in turn, prompted several thinkers to endeavor to develop critical, metaphilosophical overviews of developing schools or trends that account for their emergence and implications, their similarities and differences. H. Odera Oruka (1990a) provided one such overview and distinguished what he termed four “currents” in African philosophy. One of these, already mentioned, he joined others in labeling and characterizing as ethno-philosophy: that is, second-order works that purport to identify and engage in an exegesis of the philosophical schemes and significances of articulated thoughts and expressions, acts, and modes of behavior shared by and thus characteristic of particular African ethnic groups. Another current, previously mentioned as having been initiated by Oruka, he termed philosophic sagacity to distinguish what he regarded as the rigorous and critically reflective thought of independent-minded indigenous thinkers who were not formally educated in modern schools. Nationalist-ideological philosophy for Oruka was constituted by the articulations of persons actively engaged in political life, especially those who led or otherwise contributed substantially to struggles for African independence and sought to articulate conceptions by which to create new, liberatory social and political orders. His designation for a fourth current, professional philosophy, was reserved for work by academically trained professional teachers and scholars of academic philosophy and their students.
Other nuanced characterizations and examinations of trends in philosophizing on the African continent have been developed. O. Nkombe and Alphonse J. Smet (1978) identified an ideological trend, quite similar in characterization to Oruka's “nationalist-ideological current,” that includes several very rich lines of articulate socio-political thought devoted to reconstructing the political and cultural situations of African peoples that were consequences of European imperialism, enslavement, and colonization: African personality; Pan-Africanism; Négritude; African humanism; African socialism; scientific socialism; Consciencism; and African “authenticity.” A second trend, the traditionalist, includes efforts that are quite similar to Oruka's sage philosophy in that the efforts are focused on identifying philosophizing practices by traditional Africa thinkers, exploring the philosophical aspects of manifestations of these practices, and examining just how these practices resulted in the development of repositories of wisdom and esoteric knowledge. Nkombe and Smet identified a third trend: the intellectual orientations and practices of critical thinkers characterized by these thinkers' critiques of the projects of persons grouped in the ideological and traditionalist trends structuring their critiques by norms and strategies drawn from familiar Left-critical (Marxist), Liberal Democratic, and creative appropriations of other traditions of European thought. Thinkers in the critical group applied the label “ethno-philosophy” to a number of the instances of thought in the traditionalist trend to set apart the latter modes of thought, as previously noted, as more akin to ethnology than proper philosophizing. Finally, Nkombe and Smet labeled a fourth grouping the synthetic trend, one characterized by the use of philosophical hermeneutics to explore issues and to examine new problems emerging in African contexts.
Still other scholars have attributed somewhat different characterizations to these and other traditions or modes of philosophizing in Africa and, importantly, identified newer developments. An example of the latter is the pathsetting metaphilosophical and anthologizing work of Emmanuel Chukwudi Eze, the deceased philosopher from Nigeria who pioneered bringing into several idea-spaces and discursive communities of academic philosophy in the United States and Africa the interdisciplinary writings of contemporary scholars and artists from across Africa, African Diasporas, and other countries all of whom are significant contributors to postcolonial philosophizings. These are critical explorations of the challenges and opportunities facing Africans and people of African descent in various national and transnational situations defined by configurations of conditions after colonialism in which political liberation has not ended the suffering of African peoples, resolved long-running problems of individual and social identity, or settled questions regarding the most appropriate relations of individuals to communities, of appropriate roles and responsibilities of women and men and their relations to one another, of justice and equity after centuries of injustice and dehumanization, or of the most appropriate terms on which to order social and political life (Eze 1997).
The heuristic value of the concept of postcolonial is not to be underappreciated, for the various instances in which the successes of defeating the classical, directly administered colonial ventures in Africa of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries have been compromised by situations of indirect rule, or neocolonialism, effected through economic control of the new African nation-states by Western European and U.S. American transnational capitalist enterprises and multinational organizations and agencies supposedly providing advice and aid. These compromises must be fully appreciated in order to understand the prospects for full national independence and self-determination in the areas of economic, political, social, and cultural life generally. Of decisive issue is on what terms, via which strategies, African countries will contend with emergent challenges, some of which are of magnitudes and character neither encountered nor imaginable by “traditional” African thinkers, or, even, by senior contemporary thinkers. Foremost are the challenges from the scourge of HIV AIDS, which are proving to be as impactful demographically, thus in other areas of life, as were depletions of populations during the centuries of export enslavement though with consequential differential impacts on age groups. Likewise challenging are questions of the priority and efficacy of armed struggle and the terms of engagement in light of recent and ongoing histories of such ventures on the African continent, too many of which involve conscripting children into armies as armed warriors. Still other challenges: the terms and practices of political governance, at the level of the state especially, as many African nations struggle against collapse or debilitating dysfunction due to corruption, crippling economic exploitation, massive underdevelopment of human capital—of females especially, food and other vital resource scarcities, and genocides as ethnic affirmations ‘go imperial’.
Scholarly efforts to develop informative and critical metaphilosophical overviews of African philosophical trends, currents, and schools of thought, in part to forge new conceptions through which to take up these and other pressing challenges, are confirmation of the rich diversity of formal philosophizing by academic philosophers and other intellectuals and artists that emerged on the African continent during recent decades, and of the continuing maturation of their efforts. A significant number of these intellectual workers, philosophers among them, have cultivated international relationships with other scholars and artists and their organizations, and some of them have spent several years in, or even relocated to, the United States, Canada, France, Germany, Great Britain, and other countries for both formal education and to work in institutions of higher education. In the process of doing so many have also developed the professional relations, practices, and levels of accomplishment and recognition that have led to the publication of works that are continuing to attract wider critical attention in various discursive communities and are being added to course and seminar readings. These movements, relocations, cultivations of transnational relationships, and expansion of the literature of published works have enriched the development of new idea-spaces, the circulation of ideas, the formation of new discursive communities, and thereby contributed substantially to the development of Africana philosophy. There are now histories of African philosophy and major collections of writings in the subfield by professional African, African-descended, and other philosophers published by major, transnational publishing firms covering a still-expanding list of subject-matters organized, in many instances, by themes long established in academic philosophy: historical studies; issues of methodology, logic, epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, and aesthetics; philosophy of religion; political and social philosophy (Hallen 2009; Kwame 1995; Mosley 1995; Wiredu 2004). In several noteworthy instances these philosophizings are conducted by way of deliberate explorations of articulations of the settled thought structuring the life-worlds of particular ethnic groups. Such explorations are being conducted in increasing numbers and, in the process, are rehabilitating and giving new meaning and heuristic direction to the once disparaged notion of “ethno-philosophy” by establishing the legitimacy and resourcefulness of culturally and ethnologically contextualized studies of articulated thought. As well, such studies will prove important for comparative studies of philosophizing (Bell 2002). Hopefully these efforts will motivate similar studies in other parts of the world to be brought into comparisons that will enhance our understanding of philosophizing globally and end practices of making false generalizations in some modes of philosophical discourse, as, for example, generalizing the thought-endeavors of canonical Greek and European thinkers as “universal” in defining features or salience while being silent about the racial/ethnic, cultural, and gendered characters of the thinkers on the pretext that such matters are of no consequence for the thinkers' “philosophy.”
As an ongoing project-of-projects, it would be unwise to attempt a comprehensive and definitive catalog and assessment of the thematic foci across the full range of articulations and discussions still being gathered and explored under the heading of “African philosophy” even as new discussions are emerging. Still, a number of developments are worth noting.
Several canonical subfields of academic philosophical discourses stand to be enriched by the inclusion of explorations of subject-matters within African contexts. As already noted, historical accounts of “Philosophy,” in the so-called “West” especially, are being reconsidered in light of critical explorations of more recently disclosed relations between and among peoples and places in Africa and “the West” or Europe, among Greece, Rome, and Egypt definitely, and in light of further explorations of the impact of such relations on even canonical thinkers in Europe. In general, the discussion of “the origin of philosophy” in Ancient Greece must be replaced by comparative explorations of the emergence of philosophizing in various settings around planet earth, including pre-colonial North Africa, Ethiopia (home of Zera Yacob and Walda Heyat, two seventeenth century philosophers (Sumner 1976–78)), and places on the continent in which Arabic was a principal language.
As well, new questions should be posed and explored, among these the following: How are canonical figures and subject-matters of the European Enlightenments to be understood in light of the extensive involvements of European nation-states—and of canonical figures—in colonial imperialism and the enslavement of African peoples? How did the centuries-long institutionalization of enslavement affect the philosophizing of various European thinkers with regard to notions of freedom, the person, the citizen, justice, of manhood and womanhood? What was the impact on canonical European thinkers of the presence among them of the articulated thought and the persons of such figures as Anton Wilhelm Amo (c. 1703–1758), a native of Ghana who, at age three, was transported to the Netherlands to be educated and baptized in keeping with colonial Dutch efforts to Christianize Africans? Amo settled in Germany and became a highly educated and influential teacher-philosopher. As more research and scholarship on such figures are completed understandings of eighteenth century intellectual communities in Germany and elsewhere in Europe will have to be revised; so, too, notions of the meanings and influences of notions of race and their impacts on intellectual productions as well as on social life.
Work in Africana philosophy in general, and African philosophy in particular, compels comparative studies. No longer can it be presumed, certainly not taken for granted, that many canonical notions, even so-called “perennial” or “universal” issues, have the salience or global significance these issues have long been assumed to have. Conceptions of personhood in several indigenous African schemes of thought (of Akan and Yoruba peoples, for example) invite comparisons and rethinking of notions of personhood long sanctioned in some legacies of Western European and North American philosophizing. For example, Kwasi Wiredu (1987) of Ghana has argued persuasively that in the indigenous conceptual-ontological schemes of the Akan it would not be possible, in the normal course of matters, to generate the “mind-body problem” so central to the philosophizing of René Descartes. Explorations of matters of logic, epistemology, philosophy of mind, and metaphysics in Akan and other schemes of thought will illuminate the extent to which Western European and North American inventories of philosophical “problems” will have to be revised. Likewise for explorations in the areas of religion, aesthetics, politics, and the meaning of social life.
While there are near daunting challenges being faced by African peoples and other citizens of the continent's nation-states that compel problem-solving philosophizing for enhanced living, there are, too, example-lessons of such engaged philosophizing that warrant close and appreciative study. One such example is the transformation under way in South Africa from the White Racial Supremacy of racial apartheid to a multiracial, multiethnic democracy. A crucial factor conditioning the transformation has been the soul-wrenching work of the Truth and Reconciliation Commission (TRC), which sponsored public hearings during which victims of the evils of apartheid, and perpetrators of the evils, disclosed the truths of their suffering and of their dehumanizing aggression, respectively. Grounding premises of the TRC project were that disclosures of the truths of suffering and of abuse were necessary in order to achieve restorative justice, not just compensatory or retributive justice; and that restorative justice is in keeping with philosophical notions such as ubuntu—love, generosity, forgiveness—that are foundational to communal life at its best, thus are essential to the rehabilitative healing that must be lived through in forging new persons for a new and democratic South Africa (Bell 2002, Chapter 5, “African Moral Philosophy II: Truth and Reconciliation,” pp. 85–107). Here, then, a case-study in the articulation and testing out of a new conception of justice, of ethics more generally, in an African context, a case-study that should already be substantively instructive. Such comparative work in academic philosophy that engages seriously and respectfully philosophical articulations of African and African-descendant thinking has only just begun…
The centuries of enslaving-relocations of millions of African peoples to the New Worlds of colonies-cum-nation-states created by European and Euro-American settler-colonists beginning in the sixteenth century, and the subsequent centuries-long continuations of descendants of these African peoples in, and migrations of others to, these locales, occasioned the formation of new peoples of African descent in the Americas, the Caribbean, Europe, and elsewhere. Individuals and groupings of these peoples developed and perpetuated shared creative responses to the impositions of various forms of systematized racialized oppression and class exploitation motivated and rationalized by White Racial Supremacy, and further complicated by considerations of sexuality and gender. In the New Worlds, as had become the case in Africa after the colonizing and enslaving incursions of acquisitive peoples from Europe and the Arabian peninsula, the recurrent and decisive foci of life in the racialized crucibles were the struggles to endure while resolving mind- and soul-rending tensions that threatened and otherwise conditioned self- and community-formation and living.
There were several major sources of these tensions. One, the traumas of the radical dislocations experienced by the millions of persons kidnapped and purchased into relocation to enslavement through terrifying transport across thousands of miles of ocean during which many thousands died. Another, the soul and psyche-taxing ambiguities and ambivalences of being compelled to become and be, in important senses, both New World “African” and “American,” “Canadian,” “Brazilian,” “Puerto Rican,” “Trinidadian,” “Haitian,” “Jamaican,” “French,” “British,” etc., while, as slaves, being denied full access to the resources of the prevailing meanings and practical realizations of the defining identities of the most highly valued anthropological categorizations and social positions in the socio-political orders of the new states and locales as well as to the material resources crucial for realizing lives of well-being and denied full retention of and access to the self-and community-defining resources of their natal cultures.
How the various African-descendant persons and communities resolved these tensions conditioned the formation of new identities, life-agendas, and praxes for living. Fundamental were the recurrent and varied quests to survive and endure. With whatever success there followed other fundamental recurrent and varied endeavors. Among the most compelling were quests to define and secure freedom, quests that were profoundly affected by the absence of any recourse to protections of law and by severe limitations imposed on Black peoples' participation in what has come to be called “the public sphere.” Participation in this sphere with protection of laws—for example, to articulate one's case for impartial and fair recognition and respect as a human being, particularly as a woman or man of a despised race—was hardly ever allowed in slave-holding polities, and very infrequently even in locales where slavery had been abolished as invidious discrimination against persons of African descent continued. When speaking out or otherwise expressing oneself on one's or one's people's behalf was prohibited or strenuously circumscribed and could be punished by beatings, imprisonment, or death with no legal protection, the tensions were indeed wretched.
The variety of reasons for and means of coping in such circumstances, and the variety of conceptions of life to be lived and of freedom to be achieved in the various New World locales, were approached differently by activist thinkers of African descent, conditioned by adaptive continuations—more or less—of some Old World African cultural practices. The efforts gave rise to developments of different traditions of thought guiding the formation and pursuit of what would become, over time, a variety of agendas, foci, objectives, and strategies of intellectual and practical engagement. It is these variegated, historically conditioned, socially grounded, imperatives-driven thought and praxis complexes, immersed in and growing out of concerns and struggles for survival, endurance, and human dignity in freedom, that are being recovered and studied as the earliest instances of philosophizing by diasporic persons of African descent and form the bases of the unfolding of several subfields of Africana philosophy.
The United States of America is one of several New World diasporic contexts of focus for these recovery and study efforts that are being conducted under the heading of “African American philosophy.” What follows is a historically contextualized discussion of several instances of the emergence of philosophizings born of struggles. However, it would be an ethical travesty and a case of epistemological presentist imperialism to require that thoughtful, critically reflective articulations by African Americans considered as instances of philosophizing worthy of the critical attention of professional philosophers first meet rigorous, formal standards for “right reasoning” settled on by professionals in the discipline during the late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries. For the contexts in which folks of African descent were compelled to reflect on and reason about their first-order lived experiences were substantially conditioned by the agendas and social logics of projects of White Racial Supremacy and constitutive invidious anthropologies of raciality, ethnicity, and gender, not agendas governed by the academic logics of abstract formal reasoning. The pressing exigencies of daily, cross-generation life under racialized enslavement and oppression were what compelled reflective thoughtfulness, not leisured, abstractive speculation. Again, what has to be witnessed and appreciated across the historical and hermeneutical distances of centuries of history and life-world experiences structured by contemporary personal and social freedoms are the natures of the lived experiences and situations of those whose articulations, whose philosophizings, are considered as having been born of struggles.
Much psychic energy had to be expended by New World African and African-descended peoples contending with the institutionalization of their enslavement and oppression otherwise that was racialized, thereby naturalized, and thoroughly sanctioned and justified by every enterprise of deliberate, normative thought and aesthetic expression—law, science, theology, religion, philosophy, aesthetics, and secular “common sense.” (For a historical account of African-American life in the United States see Franklin and Moss, Jr. 2000.) In each case a primary resource was the foundational metaphysical and ontological “unit idea” of a hierarchical Great Chain of Being (Lovejoy 1964) on which each race was believed to have a fixed and determining place. Accordingly, as living property it was encumbered on enslaved Africans and their descendants to live so as to make good on the investments in their purchase and maintenance by engaging in productive labor, without compensation, and to endure and reproduce as ontological slaves in order to sustain and justify the institution of their imprisonment. According to this supposedly divinely sanctioned philosophical anthropology, African and African-descended children, women, and men were defined as constituting a category of being to which none of the normative moral and ethical notions and principles governing civilized life applied. Pressed into an ethically null category, they were compelled to live lives of social death stripped of defining webs of ennobling meaning constituted by narratives of previous histories, renewing presents, and imagined and anticipated futures of flourishing, cross-generational continuation.
On the whole, they did not succumb to the requirement to become socially dead, certainly not completely, though many thousands did. Always there were those who cultivated strengths of body, mind, soul, and spirit and exerted these in defense of the preservation of senses of themselves and of their peoples, of their “race,” as having worth beyond the definitions and valuations set on them by rationalizations of institutionalized enslavement and oppression. Always there were those who, in the cracks, crevices, and severely limited spaces of slave life and constricted freedom, preserved and shared fading memories of lives of beauty and integrity before the holocaust; who found, created, and renewed nurturings of imaginings of better life to come through music-making, dancing, and creative expression in the artful fashioning and use of items of material culture, and in the communal and personal relations, secular and spiritual, that the slaves formed, sustained, and passed on.
Nurtured by these efforts, they resisted the imposition of ontological death and nurtured others in resisting. They reflected on their existence and the conditions thereof; conceived of and put into practice ways to endure without succumbing, ways to struggle against enslavement and the curtailment otherwise of their lives and aspiration; and conceived and acted on ways to escape. They studied carefully their enslavers and oppressors and assessed the moral significance of all aspects of the lives enslavers and oppressors led and determined how they, though enslaved and despised, must live differently so as not to follow their oppressors and enslavers on paths to moral depravity. They conceived of other matters, including the terms and conditions of freedom and justice; of better terms and conditions of existence and of personal and social identities; of how to resist and endure while creating things of beauty; how to love in spite of their situations; conceived of their very nature as living beings …
These considerations took various forms within and across the centuries. More than a few African and African-descendant persons would engage in concerted intellectual and practical actions against the enterprise of slavery in all of its forms. Their considerations and articulations can be found in various repositories of philosophizings: in the lyrics and rhythmic structures and timings of various genres of music-making; in newspaper writings and pamphlets; in poetry and other modes of creative writing; in letters; in slave narratives and autobiographies; in the legacies and documentary histories of institutions, those of Black churches and church denominations especially; in those of women's and men's service organizations; in the documentary histories of conventions and convention movements; etc. For from the earliest instances of the enslavement of Africans in the colonies in the 1600s and continuing through the 1800–1865 Civil War between forces of the Union of North and East and forces of the Confederacy of the South, militant agitation for the abolition of slavery was a prominent endeavor among persons of color both “free” and enslaved, as were efforts to achieve greater respect and freedom for Black women from male domination and oppression and from sexual exploitation as well as from racism. Phillis Wheatley (1753?-1784), a young, lettered house-slave in Boston, Massachusetts, wrote poems “on various subjects, religious and moral,” in one of which she expounded on the significance of “Being Brought from Africa to America” and extolled Christians to remember that though Negroes be “black as Cain,” they, too, can be “refin'd and join th' angelic train” (Wheatley  1997). Aside from Wheatley's highly polished and thoughtfully probing poetry, the fact that she had penned the verses prompted such disbelief that her master, and a prominent group of White men of the city, including the governor and lieutenant governor of the state, felt compelled to write letters to the publisher and the reading public to attest that Wheatley had mastered the English language and was, indeed, the author of the verses. Lettered articulation, in high verse no less, was a significant counter to claims of Negro inferiority, hence the need for legitimation of Wheatley's writings by White persons of significant standing in order for those writings to enter a race- and gender-constricted literary public sphere.
Wheatley was the first in what would become a long and continuing line of enslaved persons of African descent in the United States who took up creative and other genres of writing as means for engaging in resisting oppression and for reclaiming and exercising their humanity through thoughtful articulation. Slaves' narrations of the stories of their lives and of the conditions of enslavement and their aspirations and quests for freedom constitute an extraordinarily rich body of literature to be studied for philosophizings born of struggles. Olaudah Equiano's The Interesting Narrative of the Life of Olaudah Equiano, of Gustavus Vassa, the African Written by Himself (1789) is but one example of such narratives. Consider carefully Equiano's recounting having to wrestle with and reclaim his sense of self, even his name, after having been stolen into slavery as a child, transported to the New World, and being renamed “Gustavus Vassa.” A profound and consequential instance of existential philosophizing that discloses the significance of a compelled struggle to reclaim and exercise a person's right, and power, of identification of self and social being…
For a Negro, slave or free, to indulge in the articulation of critical reflections on the nature of their being and the conditions of their life was a bold contradiction of prevailing characterizations of African peoples and their descendants in the racialized ontologies of White Racial Supremacy, and a dangerous threat to the enterprise. David Walker (1785–1830) exemplified the threat. He sent shockwaves of fear across the slaveholding South, especially, with the publication and wide distribution of his Appeal in Four Articles; Together with a Preamble, to the Coloured Citizens of the World, but in Particular and Very Expressly, to Those of the United States of America (1829) in which he advocated forcefully that Coloured people rise up in armed struggle against their oppressors. Moreover, in articulating his provocative appeal in a written document, Walker employed with great skill and impact a strategic use of rhetoric to gain leverage in the public sphere: while ostensibly directing the Appeal to an audience of “Coloured Citizens” almost none of whom were regarded as citizens and very few of whom, among those enslaved certainly, could read and, if they could, would have been prohibited from getting their hands and minds on such an appeal, in truth was also directed at White slaveowners and oppressors. This strategy would become a stable in the arsenal of discursive means Black folks would use to engage in the work of articulating their considerations and advocating for life-enhancing changes.
Frederick Douglass (1817–1895), a passionate and indefatigable opponent of slavery and the subordination of women (“What Are the Colored People Doing for Themselves?” 1848; “Prejudice Not Natural,” 1849; “The Claims of the Negro Ethnologically Considered,” 1854), would use the strategy with superbly nuanced skill. An especially brilliant thinker and prolific writer, he was also brilliant in his oppositional eristic engagements over the constitutional, biblical, and ethnological justifications of Negro inferiority and enslavement and on a wide range of other subjects, including the compelling need for appropriate education (directed at preparing the formerly enslaved for productive, economically self-sustaining labor), good character, and political equality. Douglass was an astute critical thinker and speechmaker, and was a foremost thinker with regard to such matters as the constitutionality of slavery, of the meanings of freedom and justice and of the implications of both for enslaved and free or freed Negroes (Douglass 1845). Maria Stewart (1803–1879), likewise committed to freedom and justice for Black people, was a pioneering feminist in speaking out publicly (“Religion and the Pure Principles of Morality, the Sure Foundation on Which We Must Build,” 1831) and thus took advantage of cracks in the public sphere to advance the cause for abolition and the liberation of women (Stewart 1831). Sojourner Truth (Isabella Baumfree, 1797–1883) was a legendary unlettered but unnervingly bodacious itinerant intellectual provocateur who agitated for ending slavery and the subordination of women (“Woman's Rights,” 1851). On one celebrated occasion, Truth walked uninvited into a Women's Rights Convention of assembled White people, sat down on the edge of the speakers' stage until she simply had to be recognized, and then delivered her now famous “Ar'n't I a Woman?” speech (Truth 1851).
If slavery were abolished, what did the vocal Negro advocates think would be the most appropriate modes and ends of life for Negro men and women?
For some it would or should involve assimilation, that is, processes by which one racial and/or ethnic group is absorbed by another, for some physically as well as socio-culturally, with one group relinquishing its own racial and/or ethnic cultural distinctiveness to take on the defining life-world character and practices of another. For early African American assimilationists this would have meant accepting as appropriate and sufficient goals for African American life the country's pronounced cultural, social, political, and economic ideals—though generally without endorsements of the superiority of the White race—as proof of their humaneness and of their having “risen” from a condition of “savagery” to having become “civilized,” particularly by having become Christianized.
However, particular care must be taken in characterizing an engaged thinker's commitments and aspirations as “assimilationist.” While appropriate and useful in some instances, in others the label is often misused or misplaced, for various thinkers were quite nuanced in articulating their positions on various matters: for example, in advocating assimilation of prevailing economic ideas, principles, and practices while advocating social, cultural, and political independence for Black people. Douglass, one of the most well-known of African American cultural and political assimilationists, is an instructive example. He was not an advocate of the assimilation of the Negro race into the White race; rather, he preferred, at the extreme, the assimilation of all distinct races into a single, blended race, so to speak, so that there would no longer be distinct races in which aspirations for super-ordination and subordination could be invested. Similar views on cultural and economic assimilation were articulated by T. Thomas Fortune (1856–1928), the journalist and advocate of Black unionizing and political independence (“Political Independence of the Negro,” 1884), and by the radical abolitionist Henry Highland Garnet (1815–1881), who at one point was convinced that “This western world is destined to be filled with a mixed race” (“The Past and the Present Condition and the Destiny of the Colored Race,” (1848; 1996, p. 200), emphasis in the original).
On the other hand, there were Negro women and men of the seventeenth, eighteenth, and nineteenth centuries of enslavement for whom the prospect of assimilating with White people in any fashion or on any terms was to be firmly rejected. Such sentiments were especially prominent during the decades leading up to the Civil War as conditions became even more constraining for supposedly free-born and freedpersons with the passage in 1850 of the Fugitive Slave Law that stripped away any legal protection for escaped and former slaves who made it to free states by declaring it legal for any White person to apprehend any Negro who could not document their free status and return the person to enslavement. Garnet, responding to the circumstances the law created, is representative of those Black folks who became advocates of the emigration of Negro people to Africa. He was the founder of the African Civilization Society, an organization that promoted emigration of American Negroes to Africa in keeping with a more positive agenda than was the case with the American Colonization Society, which was organized by White people to foster the relocation of troublesome abolitionist free Negro people to Liberia, the colony founded with federal support by White Americans intent on preserving the institution of slavery and White Racial Supremacy.
Emigrationist considerations and projects thus became prominent ventures during this period, advocated with persuasive force by other very able activist thinkers, among them Edward Blyden (1832–1912), James T. Holly (1829–1911), and Martin Delany (1812–1883). Delany's The Condition, Elevation, Emigration, and Destiny of the Colored People of the United States (1852) was an especially well-reasoned critique of notions of citizen prevailing in the United States and a detailing of conditions affecting Colored people, including, in his estimation, their overreliance on “moral theorizing” and not enough on pragmatic political reasoning informed by comparative studies of the histories of oppression of other “nations” within nation-states dominated by an antagonistic national (i.e., racial) group (Delany 1852; 2004). Based on his analysis, Delany was convinced that people of color could not enjoy lives as full citizens with full respect and rights in the United States. Hence, he reasoned, people of color should leave the country for South America—though later he would advocate emigrating to Africa—to establish their own independent nation-state. (However, when the Civil War erupted, Delany was persuaded by Frederick Douglass, his former colleague in publishing The North Star newspaper, to join other Black men in forming a regiment to aid the Union forces in defeating the Confederate Army and the South's agenda for the continuation of the enslavement and oppression of Black people.)
It is important to note, however, that emigrationists were often motivated not only by desires to escape the various modes and intensities of disrespect for their racial being and humanity by relocating to Africa, in particular, but also in order to fulfill aspirations to engage in missionary work among native peoples on that continent in order to “raise” them from “savagery” to “civilization” through education and Christianization. Edward Blyden, for example, spent a large portion of his life engaged in educational and missionary work in Liberia. James T. Holly, who advocated emigration to, and himself subsequently settled in, Haiti and authored a lengthy work devoted to “defending the inherent capabilities of the Negro race, for self-government and civilized progress” (A Vindication of the Capacity of the Negro Race for Self-Government and Civilized Progress, 1857), was a clergyman. So, too, was the indomitable Queen's College of Cambridge University-educated Alexander Crummell (1819–1898), who devoted twenty years of his life to educational and missionary work in Liberia and Sierra Leone followed by years of pastoral work in the United States. Crummell (“The Relations and Duties of Free Colored Men in America to Africa,” 1860; “The Race Problem in America,” 1888) was a formidable and very articulate thinker, author, speechmaker, and organizer with commanding presence. He was a principal founder of the American Negro Academy (1897–1924), a gathering of astute minds and engaged Negro men devoted to analyzing the conditions of life of Negroes in the United States, to determining how best to protect them from the continuing ravages of centuries of enslavement, and to determining how best to develop the race to achieve political and social equality and economic justice.
Worthy of critical exploration in the case of these figures: the extent to which, and on what terms, each of them embraced (assimilated) prevailing European and Euro-American conceptions of civilization and the processes and conditions, states of character in particular, by which a person or people could be said to be “civilized.” It is apparent in their writings and the logic of their missionary work, in other lands as well as within the United States, that neither figure accepted the long-prevailing arguments that the Negro race was inherently and ineradicably inferior. To the contrary, close scrutiny of their articulations will reveal that each was convinced that the civilizational inferiority of continental Africans, and of the ignorant, brutally constrained Negroes of deficient character in the United States, was due to conditions of deprivation fostered by the enslavement and racism fostered by White people. At the core of the missionary work of these men, and of many of their female and male contemporaries and successors, including persons who worked at “uplifting” enslaved and freedpersons in the United States, was a principled and dedicated commitment to well-reasoned and forcefully articulated belief in the God-given humanity and inherent worth of persons of the Negro race, and fervent and equally dedicated belief in the ameliorative and progressive benefits of education and racial independence. And each of these seminal figures took himself or herself as a living example of the actualization of the potentiality for substantial, qualitative development and advancement by Negroes contrary to the characterizations of the race by those who rationalized and otherwise sought to justify enslavement and constrictions of the range of possibilities for Negro development. The articulations of a significant number of such persons have been preserved in the vast body of writings contending with enslavement, with aspirations and quests for freedom and justice, with what a constitutionally democratic and multiracial United States of America ought to be in order to include Coloured people as full citizens and fully respected human beings. Theirs are, indeed, philosophizings born of struggles.
Beyond question, one of the particularly acute axial periods of history for people of African descent in the United States of America was that of the half-decade of civil war (1860-1865) continued through ensuing years of Reconstruction-struggles between White proponents of a culture of aspiring aristocratic genteel racial supremacy and a political economy devoted to developing industrial and finance capitalism in the North and East of the country who wanted to preserve the federated union of states, and White proponents of a regional civilization devoted to a decidedly pronounced and violently aristocratic Southern hegemonic White Racial Supremacy based on a political economy of agrarian capitalism supported by enslaved Negro labor, proponents who forged a Confederacy out of states that seceded from the Union in order to preserve their distinctive civilizational project. For a great many Black people, the hope was that the Union forces would prevail in the war, the institution of slavery would be abolished, and they would be freed and free to enjoy lives of full citizenship. More than a few devoted themselves, in various ways, to aiding the Union efforts, some even as fighting soldiers. Frederick Douglass played a major role in persuading President Abraham Lincoln to allow Negro men to join the Union army as fighting soldiers and in persuading many men to join. With President Abraham Lincoln's issuance of the Emancipation Proclamation in 1863 freeing the slaves in the Confederate states and Union victory in the Civil War two years later, the day of Jubilation! for Black people and other opponents of slavery appeared to be at hand.
And so it seemed. There followed a brief, euphoric period of statutory freedom during which Black people held elective and appointive offices in many states that had been part of the Confederacy and otherwise made initial significant gains in other areas of life. However, a post-war so-called compromise between Republican economic and political forces in the North and East and those of Democrats in the South settled a disputed presidential election and allowed a South not completely vanquished by the lost war to regain power in its region in exchange for Republican hegemony in the federal government.
Violent terrorism and brutal repression of Negroes followed immediately, in the South especially, which spawned two decades (mid 1860s-1880s) of post-Reconstruction struggles by newly-emancipated Black people to survive conditions in which they had been set adrift by many former allies in the North and East and were being pressed back into near-slavery by forces in the South. A Great Migration ensued as hundreds of thousands of Negroes left the South for hoped-for better opportunities without racial violence in the East, North, Southwest, and West of the United States, in some cases in response to persuasive articulations by various spokespersons (Edward W. Blyden, James T. Holly, and Alexander Crummell, among others) who renewed calls for various programs of emigration or what some scholars have termed separatist Black Nationalism: migrations within and out of the country to sites on which all-Black communities and towns would be formed (away from the United States in Africa; within the country in Kansas and Oklahoma, for example).
Migrations within the United States were by far the most significant of the relocations. And the movements greatly accelerated over the decades as the nineteenth century gave way to the twentieth and the U.S. American economy was undergoing transformation into an industrial giant and international power as a consequence of meeting the needs of production to support the country's participation in the First World War and other developments. In the North, Northeast, and West of the country this industrialization created historic demands for workers and, subsequently, historic opportunities for work. Meanwhile, in the South rapidly increasing mechanization in agriculture and subsequent decreasing reliance on the labor of nearly-enslaved, hyper-exploited Negro tenant farmers and workers, and increasing industrialization in the region, left the greater majority of Black people in dire straits. These developments, combined with hopes for life unrestricted by racial segregation enforced by brutal violence, by lynchings especially, exerted additional pull-and-push forces that prompted hundreds of thousands to join in the migrations to the country's industrial centers.
In settling in the new locales, the migrants and their subsequent generations began to undergo what, with hindsight, became a historic and wrenching transformation of what had been, for the most part, a brutally oppressed, illiterate, yet resolute agrarian peasantry into an ethno-racial urban working class, and the transformation of a significant few of them into a modern middle class. With the transformations came vexing challenges and opportunities. Among the most compelling needs were for forms of life appropriate to the new urban circumstances—as well as for those who remained in the rebuilding South—that would sustain the person and a people and promote flourishing life in conditions of intense competition with other ethno-racial class groups, and high risks of social disintegration and failure as invidious racism, unchecked by federal restraints, became ever more intense and widespread. There were, then, compelling needs for social and cultural as well as economic support as nuclear and extended family units were disrupted in being stretched across long miles of migration and crucial forms of communal and organizational support that helped to sustain life in the South were in very short supply in the new urban centers. Once again, in the context of demanding needs to be met in the struggle to survive and endure, particularly thoughtful and articulate Black persons took up the challenges of conceiving what was best to be done for the well-being of the race, and how best to achieve well-being.
African American women were especially prominent in endeavoring to attend thoughtfully and pragmatically to the well-being of the race, but also in endeavoring to make good for Black women on the promises of Emancipation for social, political, and economic freedom. An exemplary figure in this regard is Anna Julia Cooper (1859?-1964), who graduated from Oberlin College in 1884 and, at age sixty-five, completed a doctoral dissertation at the Sorbonne on Slavery and the French Revolutionists, 1788–1805 (Cooper 1925). A career educator before earning her doctorate, Cooper was a pioneering feminist who set out a provocative view of what she regarded as the superior capacity of women to lead the reformation of the human race in her book A Voice from South (1892). Poet, journalist, novelist, and essayist Frances Ellen Watkins Harper (1825–1911) weighed in with a forceful argument that the “spiritual aid” that women can provide is crucial for moral development and the social advancement of the human race (“Woman's Political Future,” 1893). Memphis, Tennessee-born and Oberlin College-educated Mary Church Terrell (1863–1954) lived a stellar life of articulate leadership in uplift and advocacy organizations devoted to the development and well-being of Colored women (Colored Women's League, the National Association of Colored Women), commitments articulated in “The Progress of Colored Women” (1898, published 1904) and other writings. Fluent in several languages, Terrell forged relations with Negro and other women in several countries who worked for reforms on behalf of women. And particular note must be taken of the audacious, pistol-totting Ida B. Wells-Barnett (1862-1931), an investigative journalist and newspaperwoman who took it upon herself, as an anti-lynching crusader, to investigate cases of lynching across the country to document the facts of each case, which she published in 1895 as The Red Record: Tabulated Statistics and Alleged Causes of Lynching in the United States with an introductory letter from Frederick Douglass, with whom she collaborated in many endeavors. During an especially violent and trying period, courageous, thoughtful, and articulate activist Black women such as Wells-Barnett, Cooper, Terrell, and others initiated what would become a long and varied tradition of feminist philosophizing and work by women of African descent devoted to the enhancing development of Negro persons, families, organizations, and communities.
Few of these thoughtful feminists, it should be noted, were energetic advocates of Nationalist emigration during this turbulent period. Perhaps because many Nationalist agendas and articulations were soon eclipsed (though by no means completely silenced) during the years of 1880–1915 that came to be largely dominated by the persuasive ameliorative leadership of Booker T. Washington (1856–1915), an educator and strategic power-broker who focused his considerable efforts on uplifting a Black southern peasantry into educated literacy for economic self-reliance and on the nation-wide organization of Negro businesses for the pursuit of predominance in certain sectors of the economy. After delivering a poignant and crafty invited “Atlanta Exposition Address” to resounding praise during an 1895 international industrial exposition, Washington, already well on his way as a leader recognized as such by Negro people, was elevated by certain powerful and influential White people to the vaunted position as their leader and spokesman for “the Negro” to whom they would turn to broker matters in race relations. The key to this positioning was the reaction of many White people, concerned about post-war transformations under way in race relations, to the following declaration in Washington's Exposition address: “In all things that are purely social we can be as separate as the fingers, yet one as the hand in all things essential to mutual progress” (Washington 1895; 1992, p. 358). Concentrating on the first part of his statement, anxious White people interpreted his public endorsement of the “purely social” separation of the races as an endorsement by Washington of the hegemony of White people in all areas.
It was not. In fact, Washington was explicit in the address in declaring that it was “important and right that all privileges of the law be ours…” He went further in articulating a vision of “that higher good, that, let us pray God, will come in a blotting out of sectional differences and racial animosities and suspicions, in a determination to administer absolute justice, in a willing obedience among all classes to the mandates of law” (Washington 1895; 1992, p. 359). Hearing, apparently, what they wanted to hear, not the fullness of what Washington wanted them to hear, anxious White people of power and influence certified him a ‘good and safe’ Negro and promptly made him their go-to Negro designated by them as “the Leader of the Negro people.” Washington accommodated them, in service to his own ego as well as in service to the benefit of the Negro race (by his own reasoning, of course). He was brilliantly skillful in executing a nuanced, pragmatic strategy of wearing a mask of seeming accommodation of White hegemony as he promoted Negro empowerment and self-sufficiency through education that stressed disciplined comportment, thrift, industrial and agricultural work, and ownership of property (and while clandestinely supporting securing political equality for Negroes). As an enlarged figure who brokered the largesse and influence of White people flowing to Negroes throughout the nation, and as the founding administrative and educational leader of Tuskegee Institute in Alabama that continues to provide education to persons of African descent, Booker T. Washington's philosophizings, political engagements, and practical endeavors would have widespread, profound, and lasting impact.
Washington was challenged, publicly and on several fronts, by, among other thinker-activist Black persons, the astute and irrepressible thinker-scholar (and more) William Edward Burghardt Du Bois (1868-1963) whose philosophical stances and strategies for transforming the conditions of existence for Black people were substantially different from Washington's seeming public accommodation to White social hegemony. In the view of some, Washington might be better described as a social separatist and economic and political conservative committed to Black economic independence made even stronger by the predominance of Negroes in some sectors of the national economy resulting in the dependence of White folks on the productivity of Black folks. To this end, for Washington and similar conservative accommodationists, the economic and political hegemony of White people was to be finessed by strategies of seeming acceptance by Black people that masked surreptitious opposition as Colored people pursued economic self-reliance, full political citizenship, and eventual social acceptance that was to be “earned” by forming and exercising good character and responsibility through education for, and the practice of, honest, socially productive, and economically rewarding work.
Du Bois, however, argued for immediate recognition of and respect for Negro people with full civil and political rights (though he supported qualifications for exercising the franchise for all voters), social equality, and economic justice. He became an outspoken critic of Washington's leadership (“Of Mr. Booker T. Washington and Others,” 1903) having become impatient with the latter's accommodating gradualism and the spirit-sapping impact he (Du Bois) thought this was having on those Black folks who were ready, even overdue, for full equality and respect (Du Bois 1903; 1992). In contrast to Washington, Du Bois might best be described as a cultural nationalist advocating pluralist integration: pursuit of a racially integrated socially and politically democratic socio-political order—and, later in his long life, a democratic socialist economic order—in which diverse racial and ethnic groups cultivate and share, and benefit mutually from sharing, the products of their cultural distinctiveness to the extent that doing so does not threaten the integration and justness of the social whole.
The two men were from profoundly different backgrounds. Washington had been born into slavery, but with the aid of education and character development at Hampton Institute he was able to advance to national and international prominence as an educator and figure of unprecedented influence, which he recounted in his widely read and inspiring autobiography Up From Slavery (Washington 1901; 1963). Du Bois, on the other hand, never had living experience with slavery, nor, even, with much in the way of invidious racial discrimination before entering college in the South. With undergraduate degrees from Fisk University and Harvard University, studies at the University of Berlin, and a Ph.D. in History from Harvard, Du Bois was one of a very few exceptionally highly educated persons in the United States. Drawing on his learning and with arrogant confidence in his education-enhanced, penetrating, creative, and critical intellect, varied, frequent, and penetrating scholarly and creative explorations of the history, conditions, and future prospects of the Negro and other oppressed races, as well as of Western Civilization, became his passionate and committed life's work.
Du Bois far outstripped Washington in the range of his concerns, the depths of his explorations, and the extent of his seminal involvements in and contributions to international organizations and movements pressing for independence for colonized African and other peoples, his contributions to a number of the international Pan-African Conferences (1919, 1921, 1923, 1927, and 1945) and Movement being but one example. And of particular note, Du Bois studied philosophy with William James and others while a student at Harvard, and, for a moment, considered pursuing a career in the discipline. Though he chose otherwise, his vast and rich articulations are frequently philosophically novel and astute and thus all the more engaging for researchers, scholars, teachers, artists, and millions of readers in various educated publics. His The Souls of Black Folk (1903), for example, has been a seminal text for generations of African Americans, and others, who were coming of age intellectually. Many were aided, especially, by his poignant characterization and exploration of the vexing tensions of the experience of “double consciousness”—of the “twoness” of being both Negro and American—and by his promising exploration of how best to work at resolving the tension by ‘merging’ the two selves into one ‘truer’ self.
From Du Bois, then, a philosophy of the soul, if you will, motivated by the compelling needs of a racialized people subjected to ontological as well as social, political, economic, and cultural degradation. In particular, during the turbulent decades of the orchestrated failure of post-Civil War Reconstruction, when real possibilities for racial and economic democracy were being killed at birth by the proponents and guardians of capitalism and White Racial Supremacy, Du Bois initially worked out his affirmative cultural nationalist position on the raciality of the Negro, and of other races, in “The Conservation of Races” (1897; 1992). This was an effort at conceptionalization to which Du Bois would return and rework several times, even near the end of his extraordinarily long and productive life, as in “Whither Now and Why” (1960; 1973). Throughout his life Du Bois remained convinced that people of African descent should articulate and appropriate a racial identity based on shared history and culture and continue to invest in their historical legacies and cultural creativity while holding open to all, “on the principle of universal brotherhood,” the organizations, institutions, and cultural riches in and through which the life-worlds of Negro peoples are forged, sustained, and shared.
Booker T. Washington died in 1915, W.E.B. Du Bois nearly half a century later (…on the evening before the historic 1963 March on Washington for Jobs and Freedom as hundred of thousands of Negroes and other supporters converged on the nation's capital to press for full civil and economic rights). The deaths of both brought to a close their long reigns of Black male leadership prominence, and predominance, in various arenas. Still, they were far from being the only leaders of their people. For as the nineteenth century gave way to the twentieth, Black women were again substantial contributors to the intellectual explorations, organizational work, and local, national, and international movements seeking freedom and enhanced existence for African and African-descendant peoples. They were, as well, influential on Black male leadership. In 1897, for example, Du Bois accepted an invitation from Alexander Crummell to become a member of the American Negro Academy to share in the critical work of developing understandings of the deteriorating situation of Black people in the nation, made worst by widespread racially-motivated violence, in order to develop and implement strategies to protect and advance the race. (Du Bois offered his proposal in “The Conservation of Races,” the second Occasional Paper delivered to the group.) Due largely to Crummell's objections, Black women were not initially allowed to become members of the Academy. However, while Crummell was a substantial influence on Du Bois, he (Du Bois) was also influenced by Ana Julia Cooper who advised his thinking on a number of matters regarding which he conversed with his male colleagues in the Academy. Other women—Ida B. Wells, Mary Church Terrell, Jane Adams—also exerted critical influence on Du Bois through their ideas, their organizational work, and their personal relations with him.
These and other thoughtful, articulate, and engaged Black women did not allow themselves to be limited to subordinate roles of influence on male leaders. Rather, as was true for many of their foresisters, they had important matters of concern about which they thought seriously, discussed in their women's clubs and other organizations, wrote and spoke, and worked with determination to effect progressive transformations in the lives of women and their families as well as for the racial group and the society as a whole. From the especially violent and trying decades of Reconstruction on into the early decades of the twentieth century, women such as Wells-Barnett, Cooper, Terrell, and others contributed substantially to what has become a long and varied tradition of woman-focused philosophizing and artistic expression by women of African descent in the United States.
Continuing the tradition, Elise Johnson McDougald, for example, wrote of “The Struggle of Negro Women for Sex and Race Emancipation” (1924–25; 1995); Alice Dunbar-Nelson (1875–1935) of “The Negro Woman and the Ballot” (1927; 1995); Sadie Tanner Mosell Alexander of “Negro Women in Our Economic Life” (1930; 1995); and Florence “Flo” Kennedy produced “A Comparative Study: Accentuating the Similarities of the Societal Position of Women and Negroes” (1946; 1995). Working through, and often leading, local, regional, national, and international secular and church-related women's clubs and organizations, these and other Negro women gave defining shape to legacies of feminist and womanist engagement and leadership that are now being reclaimed and studied for inspiration and guidance. And the efforts and contributions of several of these women would be joined to those of later generations who would become major contributors, in thought and in other ways, to developments that would unfold as history-making movements devoted to cultural expressiveness, gaining more in the way of civil and economic rights, to gaining power, Black Power!, and to gaining more freedom, rights, and respect for women of all ethno-racial groups and socio-economic classes.
The historical context for the subsequent and more recent developments and movements was set by transformative dislocations and reconfigurations that intensified competitions within and among ethno-racial groups and socio-economic classes that affected significantly relations between White and Black races, in particular, as the country went through unprecedented industrial and economic growth and increasing predominance in the Western hemisphere as a consequence of the Great Depression (1929 through the late 1930s and into the early 1940s) and attendant disruptions, recovery from which was spurred significantly by involvements in the Second World War (1939–1945) and the Korean War (1950–1953). There followed several decades of economic expansion and rising prosperity for urban, industrial workers among whom were large numbers of Black workers, descendants of earlier migrants to the urban centers, who benefitted from the industrial intensifications and thus expanded significantly the growing modern, educated, increasingly economically viable, church-going, community-sustaining, psychologically secure and increasingly self-confident aspiring Black working and middle classes that were determined to provide successive generations with greater freedom, respect, and economic security bolstered by high expectations for even greater successes and achievements. Spread across both classes were the tens of thousands of Black men who returned to civilian life from the country's recently racially integrated Armed Forces after serving at home and overseas to help “make the world save for democracy.” A great many of these veterans, supported by Negro women and men who kept the home-front while enduring the difficulties of wartime sacrifices as they worked the nation's fields and factories though still denied the fullness of citizenship, were unwilling to acquiesce to the subordination to racial apartheid and invidious racial discrimination required by the doctrines and programs of White Racial Supremacy that still held sway.
This context became the nurturing soil in which various forms of Black Nationalism flowered once again as the influence of Washington's philosophy and strategies declined. Caribbean-born immigrant Marcus Garvey (“Race Assimilation,” 1922; 1992; “The True Solution of the Negro Problem,” 1922; 1992; “An Appeal to the Conscience of the Black Race to See Itself,” 1923; 1992), proponent of a militant Black Nationalist philosophy of independence and self-reliance for Black peoples world-wide, and of the emigration of people of African descent from the U.S. and elsewhere “back to Africa,” rose to prominence from his base in New York City as the most successful mass organizer of Black people in the history of the U.S. with the founding and internationalization of his United Negro Improvement Association (UNIA) (Garvey 1925; 1986; Martin 1986). Garvey's organizational and socio-political movement, fueled by his “Philosophy and Opinions” carried by his organization's newspapers and other publications with international reach, along with the eruption of the Harlem Renaissance, likewise in New York, an eruption of literary and artistic productions motivated by very thoughtful and passionate affirmations of African ancestry and of the positive, creative importance of the cultural and aesthetic significance of African American life, were two of the most significant emigrationist and cultural nationalist developments of the period. Both were articulated through and otherwise spawned new, profoundly influential modes of creative, reflective thought and expression.
The Harlem Renaissance was an extraordinary eruption of heightened, critical, and creative self-conscious affirmative racial identification by thoughtful Negroes bent on expressing their affirmations of their raciality through all of the creative arts and modalities of articulation, a development unprecedented in the history of the presence of peoples of African descent in the United States (Huggins 2007). The cultural significance of the productions and articulations; of the engagements, practices, and creations of the bold and talented participant-contributors; of the organizations, institutions, and publications they created and endeavored to sustain (some successfully, many others not) devoted to culture creation, refinement, preservation, and mediation— all continue to have substantial influences even today, most especially in terms of the novel ideas and idea-spaces and discursive communities that were created and articulated through the bodies of literature and works of art, music, and dance that are still being mined productively by contemporary artists and scholars. The producers and carriers of the Renaissance were natives of the whole of the African Diaspora, across the Atlantic World especially, as well as from across the African continent, and they drew on the cultural and historical legacies of both (and on those from other parts of the world) for inspiration and content for their philosophizing artistic creativity in defining and giving expression to The New Negro.
Alain Leroy Locke (1886–1954), the first African American to earn a Ph.D. in Philosophy, from Harvard (having already earned a degree from Oxford and having studied philosophy at the University of Berlin), and the first to be named a Rhodes Scholar, was one of the significant intellectual and facilitating midwifes to the production and publication of much creative work during the Renaissance (as was Du Bois). As the guest editor for a special March 1925 issue of Survey Graphic devoted to explorations of race and the New York of people of African descent, Locke, titling the issue Harlem: Mecca of the New Negro, brought together for the issue writings of fiction and poetry; articles on music, drama, the Negro's past, “Negro Pioneers,” “The New Scene,” “The Negro and the American Tradition”; and much else by a racially mixed large group of authors with expertise in a wide variety of fields. Among these: Du Bois (“The Negro Mind Reaches Out”); Elise Johnson McDougald (“The Task of Negro Womanhood”); pioneering Africanist anthropologist Melville J. Herskovits (“The Negro's Americanism”); sociologist E. Franklin Frazier (“Durham: Capital of the Black Middle Class”); the young poet and creative writer Countée Cullen (“Heritage”); Howard University-based educator and scholar Kelly Miller (“Howard: The National Negro University”); poetess Gwendolyn B. Bennett and creative writer Langston Hughes writing on music; poems by Angelina Grimke; and a large number of others. After the great success of the special issue, Locke edited and published an anthology, The New Negro, that included revised versions of most of the material from the issue, but with much new material and artwork by Winold Reiss, a very accomplished artist from Bavaria (Locke 1925).
In the judgment of many scholars of the Renaissance, The New Negro became, in the words of one, “virtually the central text of the Harlem Renaissance.” The title was taken from the collection's lead essay, “The New Negro,” which was written by Locke. In the essay Locke endeavored to characterize the “New” Negro, the circumstances of the emergence of this character-type, the nature of its shared pride-of-race character, its psychology and mission and relation to the Negro masses, and the consequences of the emergence of the New Negro for race relations in the United States and for developments in Africa and the African Diaspora for which this new group-figure would serve as the avant garde. The anthology, then, is a gateway to an important selection of articulations by figures who were seminal contributors to as well as beneficiaries of the Harlem Renaissance, and to the vast and still growing multidisciplinary body of works that explore various aspects, figures, contributions, and consequences of the Renaissance. And Locke's lead essay is a poignant gateway into his career of philosophizing as well as an adept example of an attempt to simultaneously characterize and give agenda-setting character and guidance to an extraordinary praxis-guiding artistic and intellectual revolution the focal point of which were determined efforts of racial-group self-affirmation and self-determination, beginning with the radical ontological work of redefining and revaluing on progressive terms the meaning of the Negro, then setting the tasks by which the New Negro—the “thinking Negro,” as Locke characterized the group in his essay—would lead through decidedly Negro Africanist-inspired, philosophically-minded cultural creativity and articulate expressions of philosophizings born of struggles…
And lead they did, as a number of the persons, organizations, and institutions participating in and contributing to the Renaissance, the Garvey and other movements, and others in the social classes that were inspired by and fed them all became prominent figures in the Civil Rights/Freedom Movement of the 1950s-mid 1960s during which “civil rights” and “integration” were major objectives of struggle. The National Association for the Advancement of Colored People (NAACP), the NAACP Legal and Educational Defense Fund (which became formally independent from the NAACP in 1957), and the National Urban League were but three of several organizations that would lead the continuing, but substantially reenergized, organizationally strengthened, and philosophically prepared and focused struggles to secure legally sanctioned and guaranteed democratic freedom, social and political equality, economic justice, and human dignity for Negroes in the United States of America. Publications and statements from these and other organizations; member correspondences; legal briefs and papers from court cases; the creative and scholarly works from members and descendants of the Renaissance, Garvey, and other movements; Black newspapers of the period—all are rich repositories of the philosophizings fueling and guiding the new phase of struggle.
Studies of these philosophizings are likely to reveal that while there definitely were persons and organizations advocating radical, even revolutionary, transformations of the political economy and social orders of the United States, overwhelmingly the pursuit of desegregation and racial integration as important manifestations of the achievement of democratic freedom, social and political equality, economic justice, and human dignity for Negroes using moderate but progressive strategies of legal and civil-disobedience struggles were dominant means and agendas of social and political effort exerted by people of African descent in the United States over the last half-century and more. These commitments were manifested most profoundly in the Civil Rights/Freedom Movement.
“The Movement,” as it was experienced and known by many of those intimately involved, proved to be a phenomenally historic, personally and socially transformative, national movement with profound international ramifications in Africa—South Africa especially—and other countries. Initially, the attack on racial apartheid in the quest for racial integration was pursued through legal challenges to de jure racial segregation. A major victory was achieved with the unanimous 1954 rulings of the U.S. Supreme Court in Brown v. Board of Education I and II that declared racial segregation in public schools unconstitutional, thereby overturning the Court's 1896 Plessey v. Ferguson decision that declared that government-sanctioned racial segregation was constitutional as long as “separate but equal” resources and facilities were provided. The team of engaged and creative Black (and White) legal warriors from the NAACP Legal Defense and Education Fund and other thinker-scholars (historians, sociologists, social psychologists) were successful in persuading the Justices on the Court that the invidious discrimination suffered by Black folks within the schemes of White-dominated racial segregation was manifested not only in decidedly unequal resources and facilities, but, through “inferior” education in Negro schools, in debilitating damage to the psychic souls and self-concepts of Negroes, the children especially, which severely impaired their capacity to develop into and be the kind of persons who could meet the full responsibilities and enjoy the full benefits of citizenship. In short, the legal team forged a legal strategy that rested on the construction and successful articulation of a sophisticated philosophical anthropology, aided by empirical psychological, sociological, and historical studies, in support of an argument regarding the vital linkage between the integrity of personhood and democratic citizenship, thus between the enabling of democratic citizenry and the education of the person free of resource-impoverishment and the distortions of the soul that were consequences of hierarchic, invidious racial discrimination that was being imposed on Negro children in racially segregated schools. The Court was persuaded..
However, this historic victory through persuasive philosophizing was initially stymied by recalcitrant, segregationist local governments and an overwhelming majority of White citizens in the Confederate South and by much foot-dragging by local governments and White citizens in other regions of the country. White opponents of racial integration who were determined to preserve segregation and White Supremacy unleashed yet another wave of violent terrorism. Nonetheless, the advocates of desegregation and integration were determined to secure full rights and human dignity for Negro Americans. A new philosophy and strategy of struggle was adopted that, through the leadership of Mahatma Gandhi, had proven successful in defeating Great Britain as the colonial power dominating India: non-violent direct action in the pursuit of justice grounded in an explicit philosophical commitment to the sanctity of human life, including love for opponents, and to the redeeming and restorative powers, personally and socially, of principled commitment to engagement in nonviolent struggle.
Gandhi's philosophy, the history and intricacies of the movement he led in India, and his leadership were studied closely by a young Negro missionary to India from the United States, James Morris Lawson, Jr., who, due to his commitments to nonviolence, had already been imprisoned for refusing induction into the military during the Korean War. Noting from news accounts that reached him in India that the Civil Rights Movement in the United States was gathering force, Lawson returned to the country determined to find ways to become involved and contribute. While studying theology at Oberlin College in preparation for a career as a minister in service to the Movement for social justice, he was introduced to Martin Luther King, Jr., who came to Oberlin to deliver a speech, and was persuaded by King that he should “not wait, come now” to the South to aid the Movement by, among other things, providing instruction in the philosophy of nonviolence. Lawson transferred to the Divinity School of Vanderbilt University in Nashville, Tennessee, and was soon deeply engaged in giving intellectual and spiritual guidance and inspiration to the educational, psychological, philosophical, and practical preparation of legions of mostly young college students in the city who were committed to engaging in nonviolent struggle to end the indignities suffered by Black people as a consequence of de jure White Supremacy and racial segregation. The campaign they waged, led by Fisk University co-ed Diane Nash and with the support of increasing numbers of Nashville's Black citizens, White college students, and that of more than a few very principled and dedicated anti-segregation White citizens, was eventually successful in bringing about the formal desegregation of the city's public facilities and commercial establishments. Many of the Nashville Movement's leaders and stalwart participants, Lawson included, would become major contributors to the national Movement while other student-participants helped to bring about further historic transformations in the city and elsewhere in the South, through their courageous participation in the Freedom Rides, especially. (A critical, full-length biography and philosophical study of James M. Lawson, Jr. and his philosophical commitments and engagements has yet to be done…)
A philosophy of nonviolence grounded in Christian love motivated and guided determined Black people, and allied White and other people, in achieving unprecedented progressive transformations of centuries-hardened, intellectually well-supported social, political, and, to notable extents, economic life in a United States of America ordered since its founding by philosophies of White Racial Supremacy and Black racial inferiority and subordination. Martin Luther King, Jr. (“Love, Law, and Civil Disobedience,” 1961; “The Ethical Demands for Integration, “ 1963) has become the signature figure among several of the leaders of this Movement, marked distinctively by his profoundly thoughtful Christian theological and philosophical commitments to nonviolence as the grounding for personal and shared social life as well as for engaging in struggles for freedom and justice (Washington, J.M. 1986). However, the groundwork for the Movement he would be chosen to lead had been laid and further developed by many other organizationally-supported Negro women and men of articulate thought and disciplined action from labor and other constituencies: among these A. Philip Randolph (who served as a founding organizer and president of the Brotherhood of Sleeping Car Porters, president of the Negro American Labor Council, and vice president of the AFL-CIO) and Bayard Rustin (a veteran of struggles for civil and other rights for Negroes and workers of all colors), who were the organizers of the 1963 March on Washington for Jobs and Freedom during which King delivered the speech (“I Have a Dream”) in which he invoked a vision for America that became his hallmark and a guiding theme of the Movement.
Certainly, Martin Luther King, Jr. is one of the most prolific and profoundly influential, even historic, figures of African descent whose articulations continue to compel widespread, intensive study as especially rich instances of religious, moral, theological, and socio-political philosophizing. Still, King's articulations, as well as the sacrificial life he lived and gave in leadership service, firmly and uncompromisingly grounded in especially thoughtful commitments to Gandhi-inspired nonviolence (“Nonviolence and Racial Justice,” 1957; “The Power of Nonviolence,” 1958) and Jesus-inspired agape love (“Love, Law, and Civil Disobediance,” 1961; “A Gift of Love,” 1966) await full and widespread appreciation as the truly phenomenal gifts of inspiration, commitment, and guidance to a social movement that they were. They were gifts that, infused in and channeled by the Movement, changed the legal and social structures, the culture of race relations, and thereby the history of the United States. These gifts also inspired others in their struggles for similar changes elsewhere in the world. The consequences of the Movement that embodied these gifts confirmed, once again, that the combination of love and nonviolent struggle could, indeed, succeed. And, as has been the case throughout the history of the presence of persons of African descent in this country, these particular philosophical gifts were neither forged and developed in, nor mediated to others from, the contexts of academic philosophy but were, indeed, philosophizings born of struggles, gifts that changed a country for the better that, it is feared, has yet to recognize and embrace fully the confirmed lessons the gifts embody…
Overwhelmingly, the pursuit of desegregation and racial integration as goals of movements for democratic freedom, social and political equality, economic justice, and human dignity for Negroes has been a dominant item on the agendas of social and political philosophies motivating and guiding struggles exerted by people of African descent in the United States over the last half-century and more, manifested most profoundly in the Civil Rights/Freedom Movement. However, the Movement's integrationist agenda, moral-persuasionist strategies, commitment to nonviolence, and explicit commitment to a theologically and religiously grounded notion of love for the Movement's opponents was strongly challenged by other organizational forces (mid-1960s to the early 1970s), especially by “Young Turks” in the Movement's Student Non-violent Coordinating Committee (SNCC), an influential number of whom were inspired by the revolutionary philosophies conveyed in the speeches, writings, and organizational activities of Malcolm X and the anti-colonial engagements and writings of Frantz Fanon as well as by major figures in decolonizing liberation movements in Africa and elsewhere that were being waged through armed struggle. These Young Turks, and others in a variety of decidedly Left-Nationalist organizations and proto-movements who were inspired by various notions of revolutionary transformation, initiated yet another resurgence of Black Nationalist aspirations and movements that came to be referred to collectively as the Black Power Movement. The period was also complicated by competitive conflicts with a cacophony of persons and organizations espousing commitments to anti-Nationalist multi-racial, multi-ethnic socialist and communist agendas.
This was a period of unprecedented tumult, complicated by violent rebellions by Black people in urban centers across the country and the nation's involvement in a gone-badly-wrong and increasingly unpopular war in Vietnam that was highlighted all the more by national and international movements against the War led principally by young, college-age people, many of whom had come of age politically through their involvements in or educative witnessing of the Civil Rights and Black Power Movements. Of particular note, a significant number of young White women who had been intimately involved in the Civil Rights, Black Power, and Anti-War Movements had become increasingly poignantly aware of the disrespect for, misuse, and underutilization of women by many men in the Movements and became radicalized into forging a movement to address their concerns, which was subsequently characterized as the Second Wave Feminist Movement.
All of these developments were fueled by and fostered intense intellectual adventures, some of which were also fertilized by practical engagements of various kinds. The Black Power Movement, in particular, overlapped with and both fueled and was fueled by philosophizings and engagements that were definitive of more expansive and consequential Black Consciousness and Black Arts Movements that, as had the Harlem Renaissance of several decades earlier, spurred an intensive and extensive renaissance of aggressively radical and expressive creativity in the arts that was centered, once again, on reclaiming for self-definition and self-determination the ontological being of persons and peoples of African descent, with influences, in many instances, from various Leftist ventures, nationalist and internationalist as well as socialist and communist. This was an unstable and volatile mixture that cried out for a clarifying philosophy to provide guidance through the thicket of ideological possibilities and the agendas for personal and communal identity-formation and life-praxes that each proffered with greater or less coherence and veracity.
More than a few spokesmen and spokeswomen came forward to philosophize on behalf of their group's or organization's (or their own) vision for ‘what was to be done’ to insure liberation for Black people, people of African descent. (“Liberation” was the watchword for the new agenda; “Negro” and “Colored” were denigrated and cast aside, no longer acceptable as terms of racial identification). Politics—and all aspects and dimensions of individual and social life were explicitly politicized—became defined by and focused through the lenses of the substantive symbolics of racialized and enculturated Blackness, even as the intellectual warriors waging the conceptual and other battles on behalf of Blackness struggled to find adequate terms and strategies with which to forge satisfactory and effective articulations of the passionately sought and urgently needed new identities as articulations of long standing identities and life-agendas were discredited and thus rendered inadequate for a significant and influential few. For still a great many other “Negro?”, “Black?”, “Colored?”, “African- American?”, “African-descended?”, and “American?” persons there was more than a bit of psychic turmoil and tension, no less of consternation and confusion. And hardly any of these persons, nor even many of the most ardent warriors calling for and/or purveying new notions and definitions of “Black consciousness” and “Black” agendas for individual and shared lives, knew of and had recourse to Alain Locke's sober and sobering well-reasoned “The New Negro,” nor the rich resources that had been produced by the producers and carriers of the Harlem Renaissance. And so the intensified ontologizing philosophizing proceeded at near breakneck speed driven largely by a generation of young adults few of whom had, nor would accept, little in the way of intellectual or practical guidance from the experienced and wise of previous generations for whom many of the young and arrogant had too little respect…
The reason, Harold Cruse, a wise and very experienced elder of Left and Nationalist organizations and struggles and a formidable thinker in his own right, was careful to point out, was due to a severe and consequential disruption of the passing-on of experience-tested and verified knowledge from one generation to another by the ravages of the witch-hunting and persecuting of any and all accused of being a Communist or Communist sympathizer during the crusading campaign led by Senator Joseph McCarthy during the 1950s. Many lives and careers were destroyed as a result of McCarthy's campaign, and many persons and organizations with Leftist commitments were either destroyed or driven underground, or otherwise left severely tainted and thus made an “untouchable” bereft of employment, even of one-time friends and close associates. (W.E.B. Du Bois was one who suffered this fate, which is largely why he made the momentous decision to renounce his citizenship and leave the United States for residence in Ghana, where he died…) The radical Young Turks, then, not short of courage or passion, set out on a mission all but impoverished, in many cases, of much needed historical and intellectual capital, thus were sometimes poorly armed for the battles they sought to wage. Still, the trans-generational disruption that Cruse pointed out was not complete. There were those who filled the gap between the Harlem Renaissance and the rise of the new Black renaissance who would be of significant influence and guidance, and would serve as personal as well as intellectual mentors and role models: Robert Hayden, Ralph Ellison, Margaret Walker, Gwendolyn Brooks, Lorraine Hansberry, and James Baldwin, among several others.
There would be much philosophizing born of struggles by the new generation. Much credit has to be given to those who had the wherewithal of discipline and fortitude, and good fortune, to survive and leave legacies of accomplishment that continue to enrich Black folks, and others. The Black Arts Movement, for example, had profound impacts through the productions and articulations that gave new directions and meanings to artistic creativity, to the agendas guiding creativity and expression and the mission of service to various audiences. A manifesto, “Towards a Black Aesthetic,” by Hoyt Fuller (1923–1981; Fuller 1994) and his work as editor of the journal Negro Digest, which later was renamed Black World and was followed by First World when the publisher of the latter was pressured to discontinue publication of a journal serving Black radicals, were path-setting ventures during a period much in need of clear paths. Likewise the “The Black Aesthetic” by the essayist and theorist Addison Gayle, Jr. (1932–1991), his introduction to an anthology that he edited and published bearing the same title (Gayle, Jr. 1972). A collection of writings on theory, drama, music, and fiction by many of the leading artistic minds in the new Black generation, The Black Aesthetic has come to be regarded by scholars as “the theoretical bible of the Black Arts Movement” and thus did for the makers of this Movement what Locke's The New Negro had done for the makers of the Harlem Renaissance. Both Fuller and Gayle would play roles similar to Locke's in serving as midwives to the creative and critically-minded development of a sizable portion of a generation of seriously radicalized Black thinker-artists.
The new activist thinker-artists of the 1960s—Nikki Giovanni, Sonia Sanchez, Amiri Baraka, A.B. Spellman, Larry Neal, Mari Evans, Haki R. Madhubuti, and Maulana Karenga, for example—were as productive, formidable, and widely influential as were the New Negroes of the 1920s and '30s, even more so as they exploited the advantages of access to the enabling resources of the media of radio, television, and recordings in addition to print media, and to the human resources that became available through lecture-circuits on college and university campuses. Many of these Black warriors of the intellect and arts took up positions, some settling into them for the long term, on the faculties of colleges and universities and helped to development the guiding philosophies and wage the political battles that ushered in new programs in Black and African Studies. In so doing they magnified the forcefulness and range of their intellectual and artistic powers and contributions, and helped to alter cultural and intellectual scenes in the United States and the African Disapora…
Until quite recently, there were very few person of African descent who were professionals in the discipline of Philosophy. As already noted, W.E.B. Du Bois was one of a very few to study Philosophy formally while a student at Harvard but decided against pursuing it professionally. Alain Leroy Locke was one of the first persons of African descent in America to earn a doctoral degree in Philosophy (Harvard University, 1918). A few more followed decades later (1950s), among them Broadus N. Butler, Max Wilson, Berkeley Eddins, and, still later, Joyce Mitchell Cook, the first African American female to earn a Ph. D. in Philosophy. These were some of the pioneering persons of African descent in the United States who entered the profession of academic Philosophy with the certification of a terminal degree in the discipline.
More recently (late 1960s through the 1970s) successive generations of persons of African descent have entered the profession as cohorts of new generations of young Black women and men entered the academy with the expansion of opportunities for higher education that came as a result of the successes of the desegregation-integration and Civil Rights Movements. More than a few of these persons were influenced by the Black Power, Black Consciousness, and Black Arts Movements, as well, and in some cases by independence and decolonization movements on the African continent and in the African Diaspora in the Caribbean. The emergence of and pursuit of distinctive agendas within academic Philosophy to articulate and study philosophizings by persons African and of African descent were initiated by several of the new entrants, agendas that grew out of and were motivated by these movements. Thus, the new entrants were determined to contribute as educators, sometimes as engaged intellectuals involved in movement organizations, by identifying and contributing to, or by helping to forge anew, philosophical traditions, literatures, and practices intended, in many instances, to be distinctive of the thought- and life-agendas of Black peoples. Here, then, the wellspring of concerns and aspirations that gave rise to calls for, and efforts to set out, “Black” philosophy, then “Afro-American,” and later “African American” philosophy, precursive efforts leading to what is now the more or less settled name, but still developing concept, of Africana philosophy.
Formal, professional recognition and sanctioning of these efforts, which had been pursued, with significant impact, through presentations of papers on and discussions of various topics in sessions during annual meetings of divisions of the American Philosophical Association (APA) and other organizations of professional philosophers and other teacher-scholars such as the Radical Philosophers Association (RPA) and the Society for Phenomenological and Existential Philosophy (SPEP), were achieved when, in 1987, the Association recognized the efforts as having established a legitimate sub-field of philosophy and made “Africana philosophy” an officially listed specialty in the discipline. Across the years the Association's Committee on Blacks in Philosophy has been instrumental in organizing a number of these important sessions, though, of no less importance, many such sessions were hosted by other sympathetic and supportive committees of the Association as well as by other organizations of professional philosophers that held meetings concurrent with those of divisions of the Association. Thus, the recognition and sanction have come, to significant degrees, as results of long efforts led by philosophers Robert C. Williams (deceased), William Jones, Howard McGary, Jr., and La Verne Shelton, among others, each of whom gave years of service as chairpersons of the Association's Committee on Blacks in Philosophy. Each also contributed early articulations that initiated the work of forging the sub-field.
Also of special importance to this long development towards recognition and legitimation, and to the production of much of the early writings, presentations, and critical networking collegiality that have been foundational to the development of Africana philosophy, were a series of conferences devoted to explorations of “Black Philosophy” or of “Philosophy and the Black Experience” that were held during the 1970s, most of them organized and hosted at Historically Black Colleges and Universities (HCBUs: notably, Tuskegee University, Morgan State University, and Howard University) though important gatherings were also held at the University of Illinois-Chicago Circle (ca 1970, another thirty years later), Haverford College (an international gathering in the summer of 1982 of African and African American philosophers and teacher-scholars from other disciplines), and, more recently, at the University of Memphis. Particularly noteworthy in this regard is the Philosophy Born of Struggle Conference, which has been hosted annually for fifteen years primarily through the indefatigable efforts of J. Everet Green and Leonard Harris, and the Alain Locke Conference organized and hosted biannually by the Department of Philosophy of Howard University (Washington, DC).
The development and institutionalization of African American philosophy, of Africana philosophy more generally, with recognition by the American Philosophical Association—though not by all, or even most, departments of Philosophy in academic institutions—have also been facilitated by the noteworthy success of many of the pioneers in securing and retaining positions in academic departments (of Philosophy, of Philosophy and Religion, of Philosophy and other disciplines) in various institutions of higher education across the country. A substantial few of these persons have earned tenure and promotions, several to the rank of Professor, while several have even been appointed to endowed professorships. Consequently, a slowly increasing number of philosophers who are African or of African descent now hold positions in departments and programs that serve graduate and professional students.
One especially significant consequence of these important developments is that several of these persons now have built legacies of teaching and scholarship that span several decades with significant influences on generations of students. Practitioners of Africana philosophy are thus producing new generations of practitioners. And practitioners of all generations are contributing to the literature of articulate expression of what is now a substantial and growing body of works supporting teaching, research, and scholarship in Africana philosophy. Of importance, as well, are the growing number of lectures and seminars in colleges and universities across the country given by philosophers of African descent at the invitation of departments of Philosophy, often with the cooperation and co-sponsorship of other departments and programs. These invited presentations reconfirm and strengthen the intellectual legitimacy of much work in Africana philosophy while doing much the same for the invited philosophers.
Leonard Harris has been a pioneer of published works on African American philosophy and continues to be a major contributor in many ways, not least as an editor of collections that have made widely available important texts that otherwise would not have gotten the attention of researchers and scholars concerned with the philosophizings of Black folks. Of particular note, his edited collection The Philosophy of Alain Locke: Harlem Renaissance and Beyond (Harris 1989) provides ready access to philosophical essays from among Locke's more than three hundred published and unpublished essays and book reviews. And his Philosophy Born of Struggle: Anthology of Afro-American Philosophy from 1917 (Harris 1983) was for many years the only widely available, somewhat historically organized collection of writings by African American professional philosophers and other philosophizing Black scholars. (An important earlier collection is Percy E. Johnston's Afro-American Philosophers. (Johnston 1970)) More recently new collections devoted to African American Philosophy have been organized and published by Tommy L. Lott (Lott 2002); by Lott and John P. Pittman (Lott and Pittman 2003); and by James A. Montmarquet and William H. Hardy (Montmarquet and Hardy 2000).
This publishing is an important part of the story of Africana philosophy, and helps to make and legitimate the case that persons African and of African-descent, on the African continent and in the African Diaspora in the Americas and elsewhere, are creators and custodians of Africana philosophy. A number of publishers have recognized and accepted these developments and, after substantial, long-standing resistance and outright refusal by many to recognize historic writings by persons of African descent and contemporary scholarship by philosophers African and of African descent as proper instances of philosophical work, have made a priority of adding works of Africana philosophy to their lists of published works.
Of particular publishing significance is the continuing, regular appearance of issues of Philosophia Africana: Analysis of Philosophy and Issues in Africa and the Black Diaspora, a journal for which Emmanuel Chukwudi Eze of DePaul University was founding editor until his unexpected death in 2007. Philosophia Africana remains the only scholarly journal in the United States that is devoted to Africana philosophy, though increasingly other philosophy journals are accepting and publishing writings that fall within the subfield. None, however, have been as generous as Philosophical Forum, which, under the editorial directorship of Max Wartofsky (deceased), devoted two entire special issues to explorations of philosophical matters of particular concern to Black philosophers. Noteworthy, too, has been the continuing midwifing of New York-based publisher and scholar Alfred Prettyman, who has devoted time, energy, and other resources to nurturing The Society for the Study of Africana philosophy (originally the New York Society for the Study of Black Philosophy), an organization of philosophers and other engaged thinkers of African descent, and persons not of African descent, who come together in his home to present and discuss ideas and works on the way to publication or recently published. For a brief period Prettyman was editor and publisher of the now dormant The Journal of the New York Society for the Study of Black Philosophy.
The professional recognition and legitimation of Africana philosophy generally, of African, African American, and Afro-Caribbean philosophy as sub-foci of the field; the notable success enjoyed by a slowly increasing number of persons African and of African descent in being hired, retained, and promoted by departments and programs in institutions of higher education; more publishing opportunities; a continuing vigorous schedule of regular conferences and conference sessions devoted to explorations of matters pertinent to the field—all of these continue to be crucial to building and enhancing the literature-base of the field and to facilitating teaching, research, scholarship, and other collegial engagements and practices that are essential to forming and sustaining nurturing discursive communities devoted to engaging philosophizing productive of Africana philosophy. And the enterprise is being enriched by the participation and contributions of an increasing number of persons, students and professionals, who are neither African nor of African descent.
Substantial progress has thus been made in mitigating some of the impediments that had long hampered recognition of and attending to the philosophizing efforts of persons African and of African descent. Nonetheless, still more mitigating work remains. There is the need, for example, to bring to consideration for better appreciation the writings of several generations of especially thoughtful and insightful Black essayists and novelists, poets and musicians, artists and dancers, preachers and theologians, and other public-speaking Black intellectuals who, through their means of expression, have philosophized about the conditions and prospects of Black folks and, in many cases, have helped to sustain the will and determination to endure the assaults on the humanity, the being, of persons and peoples African and of African descent. In this regard, too little attention has been given, for example, to the philosophical writer-novelist Charles Johnson who, before he became a distinguished novelist, was a graduate student in Philosophy. The articulated thought of many other Black writers, some of them novelists, also compel close, appreciative readings by philosophers for what these articulations disclose of the writers coming to terms thoughtfully and creatively with the exigencies of existence for Black folks as the writers imagined or re-imagined them in the locales and historical moments of their writerly creations. Likewise in many sermons, speeches, letters, songs, and dances created and expressed, creatively very often, by thoughtful Black persons. Of necessity, then, Africana philosophy must be an even more intensive and extensive interdisciplinary enterprise.
A principal impediment to the recognition and appreciation of the philosophizings of Black folks have been the thorough investments in Eurocentrism and White Racial Supremacy that have grounded and structured so much of the historiography within the discipline of Philosophy for so very many decades. Resolving these misconstruals of the discipline's history will require substantial revisions, ones inclusive of the philosophizings of persons of many excluded groupings. In so doing, careful work must be done to reclaim for wider distribution and careful study as many as possible of the earliest articulations—many of which were never published—that helped pave the way to the development of African American philosophy, of Africana philosophy more generally, as fields of discourse (Kuklick 2001; Kuklick 2008).
With hindsight, an especially crippling factor in the development of Africana philosophy within academic Philosophy in the United States (throughout the African continent and the African Diaspora, in fact) has been that far too little of the attention of the pioneers, and of present practitioners, has been devoted to issues that are of significance to women African and of African descent even though, as has been indicated through the narration of the history of philospohizing born of struggles, the contributions of Black women have been significant though seldom with the prominence of attention they should have had outside of women's circles. As was shown, in the New Worlds in which African peoples were being re-made/were remaking themselves into new persons and peoples of African descent, numerous Black women across the generations were challenged to think hard and long about the assaults on their communities, their families, their very bodies and souls. Here, then, a compelling need to foster and support the philosophizing efforts of Black women who direct our attention to the lives and philosophizing of Black women, historically and contemporarily. Noteworthy in this regard are the groundbreaking, inspiring efforts of philosopher Kathryn Gines in founding the Collegium of Black Women Philosophers. The Collegium is bringing together women from across the country in conferences devoted to recovering and recognizing the contributions of pioneering women philosophers of African descent while exploring present issues and forging agendas of further work to be done.
The possible futures of developments in Africana philosophy in African and the African Diaspora are open. The initial work of making the case for and legitimacy of African American, African, and Africana philosophy and its subfields has been accomplished with significant success even without universal acceptance and respect. That is to be expected, for no intellectual movement or disciplinary sub-field ever wins acceptance by all. Still, there is more to be done by way of consolidating the gains while forging new developments as minds are turned to challenging issues, many of them novel. To note, for two decades much of the effort of practitioners of Africana philosophy has been devoted to explorations of race, a foundational and pervasive complex of forceful factors shaping virtually all aspects and dimensions of life in the formation of Modernity in Europe and the Americas, and in every instance in which Europeans encroached on the lands and lives of peoples around the globe. Achieving justice without racism in polities bequeathed by Modernity is hardly finished business. So, the need to rethink race will be with us for a while yet.
However, the need will be generated by resolutions of old difficulties and challenges. Success will bring new challenges. Among these, settling such questions as whether there can and should be norms, practices, and agendas that are definitive of philosophizing identified as instances of “Africana” philosophy. If so, then on what terms, and to what ends, are the requisite agendas, norms, and practices to be set to serve the best interests of African and African-descended peoples, without injustice to non-Black peoples, and thereby provide those philosophizing with normative guidance while conforming to norms that ensure propriety and truthfulness in discursive practices on conditions of warrant that are open to and can be confirmed by persons who are neither African nor African-descended? Should such concerns continue to be appropriate conditioners of philosophical effort? The praxes and supportive discursive communities constitutive of Africana philosophy will have to meet certain institutionalized rules governing scholarly practices even as those of us committed to the development of the enterprise contribute to critiques and refinements of these institutionalized rules while devising and proposing others.
The work constituting Africana philosophy, on the African continent and throughout the African Diaspora, has helped to change the agendas and rules of discourse and praxis in Philosophy and other disciplines and discursive communities in contemporary academic institutions and organizations. The enterprise has been a significant contributor to the emergent recognition of the need to give greater respectful attention to raciality and ethnicity (as well as to gender, sexual orientation, and other constitutive aspects of our personal and social identities) as conditioners of philosophical praxis without thereby invalidating reconstructed notions of proper reasoning. As well, practitioners of Africana philosophy have aided the development of much wider and deeper recognition and acknowledgment of inadequacies in basic notions and agendas in the legacies of Western Philosophy thereby helping to open us all to challenging new needs and possibilities for further revising philosophical traditions and practices. The expansion of academic Philosophy to include Africana philosophy is indicative of efforts to achieve greater intellectual democracy in multi-ethnic, multi-racial societies. These developments should be continued, aided by philosophizing persons who are neither African nor of African descent, nor, even, professional academic philosophers, and continued as part of a larger, ongoing effort to appreciate and learn from the many life-enriching creations of all peoples as contributions to the treasure-houses of human civilization.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Bibliographie de la philosophie africaine – Introduction: An extensive bibliography, according to the “Introduction,” of “philosophical Literature on Black Africa” that includes “Philosophy books, articles or texts written by Africans, including Afro-Americans of the Diaspora, as well as all philosophical works published on Africa or edited in Africa, whatever the origins and nationalities of the authors” (Hountondji, Paulin J. (ed), Bilan de recherche philosophique africaine. Répertoire alphabétique / Philosophical Research in Africa. A Bibliographic Survey. 1ère partie/Part l: 1900–1985, Cotonou, Conseil Interafricain de Philosophie / Inter-African Council for Philosophy., 1987,, pp.VIII-XI, X-XV).
- Black Philosophy for the Internet: A website maintained by Philosophy Born of Struggle (pbos.com/blackphilsophy.com).
- Caribbean Philosophical Association.
- African Resource: A website founded by Nkiru Nzegwu (Professor of Africana Studies and of the graduate program in Philosophy, Interpretation and Culture at Binghamton University, New York) that provides ready access to a wealth of information concerning Africa and the African Diaspora, including a “Knowledge Project” section that offers “journals and databases,” and sections devoted to fashion, arts and culture, essays and reviews, lifestyles, science-technology, business, and much more.
- Africana Philosophy at PhilPapers.org: A promising website devoted to “Online research in philosophy” hosted by the Institute of Philosophy, University of London. The section devoted to “African/Africana Philosophy” is organized around thoughtful main topics (“Arabic and Islamic Philosophy”; “Areas of African Philosophy”; Themes and Traditions in African Philosophy”; “African Philosophies”; African-American Philosophy”; “Afro-Caribbean Philosophy”; and “African/Africana Philosophy, Miscellaneous”), each with inviting, pertinent subtopics. However, most of the subtopics have few, if any, entries. (Requests for editors and contributors abound on this Website.) And a number of the subtopics that have entries do not include references for the writings that have been foundational to shaping and furthering the fields that constitute Africana philosophy.
African Philosophy: Africana aesthetics | African Philosophy: ethics | African Philosophy: ethnophilosophy | African Philosophy: meta-philosophy | African Philosophy: philosophy of religion | African Philosophy: sage philosophy | Afro-Caribbean Philosophy | Akan Philosophy: ethics and political philosophy | Akan Philosophy: of the person | double consciousness | Douglass, Frederick | Locke, Alain LeRoy | Négritude | race: and Black identity | reparations, Black | Yoruba Philosophy: epistemology | Yoruba Philosophy: ethics and aesthetics