Anna Julia Cooper

First published Tue Mar 31, 2015

This entry takes as its focal point the philosophical contributions of Anna Julia Cooper with an emphasis on her scholarship and some attention to her commitments as an educator and activist. Authoring one of the earliest book-length analyses of the unique situation of Black women in the United States, Cooper offers clearly articulated insights about racialized sexism and sexualized racism without ignoring the significance of class and labor, education and intellectual development, and conceptions of democracy and citizenship.[1] With an academic training deeply rooted in the history of Western philosophy and the classics, Cooper’s philosophical significance also lies in her foundational contributions to feminist philosophy, standpoint theory, and epistemology, as well as critical philosophy of race and African-American philosophy (including African American political philosophy). The first two sections of this entry situate Cooper by providing some context for her two best known writings and then exploring the historical and contemporary reception of Cooper’s philosophy. From here, the main topics covered include an in-depth analysis of her scholarship with special attention given to A Voice from the South By a Black Woman of the South, her dissertation (L’attitude de la France à l’égard de l’esclavage pendant la revolution), and other select essays beyond these two texts. The entry concludes with a biographical sketch of Cooper in order to prioritize her scholarship and critically engage her theories (rather than commencing by recounting her life story).

1. Situating Cooper: Context for Cooper’s Two Best-Known Writings

Anna Julia Cooper’s best-known written work, A Voice from the South by a Black Woman of the South, was published in 1892. This collection of essays and speeches, described by Mary Helen Washington as an “unparalleled articulation of black feminist thought” and by Beverley Guy-Sheftall as the first book length Black feminist text, emphasizes the import of a woman’s voice and her unique contributions while at the same time highlighting the racialization of gender and the sexualization of race. Cooper takes an intersectional approach to examining the interlocking systems of race, gender, and class oppression—explicitly articulating how Black women are simultaneously impacted by racism (the race problem) and sexism (the woman question) and yet she is either an unknown or unacknowledged (by white women, white men, or Black men) factor in examining or eliminating these systems of oppression. For these reasons, Cooper argues, Black women have a unique epistemological standpoint from which to observe society and its oppressive systems as well as a unique ethical contribution to make in confronting and correcting these oppressive systems. Other central themes in Voice include the importance of education and intellectual development; the necessity of respecting difference and the special contribution that each racial group makes for human progress; an economic, materialist, and existential conceptualization of value or worth; and a theory of truth. Thus, this seminal text has philosophical import not only for feminist philosophy, standpoint theory, and epistemology, but also for Critical Philosophy of Race and African American philosophy.

Anna Julia Cooper’s Voice was published less than 30 years after the 1865 13th Amendment to the Constitution which declared: “Neither slavery nor involuntary servitude, except as a punishment for crime whereof the party shall have been duly convicted, shall exist within the United States, or any place subject to their jurisdiction.” Select major works that come before Cooper’s Voice include Memoirs of Elleanor Eldridge (1838); Religious Experience and the Journal of Mrs. Jarena Lee, Giving an Account of Her Call to Preach the Gospel (1849); Narrative of SojournerTruth (1850) and the “Ain’t I a Woman” remarks attributed to Sojourner Truth (from the 1851 Women’s convention in Akron, OH[2]); Narrative of the Life of Frederick Douglass (1845) and Douglass’s My Bondage and My Freedom (1855); and Martin Delany’s The Origins of Races and Color (1879).

Significantly, Cooper’s Voice is published before Booker T. Washington’s famous “Atlanta Address” (1895), his autobiographical works The Story of My Life and Work (1896) and Up From Slavery (1901), as well as Washington’s historic two-volume The Story of the Negro (1909). It is also published ahead of W.E.B. Du Bois’s well-known “The Conservation of Races” (1897) speech, the publication of The Souls of Black Folk (composed of essays and speeches written by Du Bois between 1897 and 1903), and Darkwater: Voices from Within the Veil (1920) which not only borrows the language of Cooper’s book title, but also relies on Cooper’s astute insights on race and gender. As Mary Helen Washington and Joy James have noted, Du Bois quoted a passage from Cooper’s “Womanhood: A Vital Element in the Regeneration and Progress of a Race,” in his essay “The Damnation of Women” from Darkwater, however; he truncates Cooper’s full argument in his selective quotations and he fails to acknowledge her as the source of the quote.

Cooper’s scholarly contributions beyond A Voice from the South include her translation of the classic French text Le Pèlerinage de Charlemagne in 1917 and, of course, her dissertation—L’attitude de la France à l’égard l’esclavage pendant la revolution (later translated by Frances Richardson Keller Slavery and the French Revolutionists) which she defended in Paris, France at the Sorbonne in 1925.[3] Cooper became the fourth African American woman in the US to earn a Ph.D. and accomplishes this feat the same year as Alain Locke publishes two seminal writings. Locke, having earned a Ph.D. in philosophy from Harvard University in 1918, on the topic “The Problem of Classification in Theory of Value” goes on to publish “Harlem: Mecca of the New Negro” and then the book length version The New Negro: An Interpretation in 1925.[4] There are several newspaper articles announcing Cooper’s achievement, but the event itself, and perhaps more importantly the scholarly contributions made by Cooper in her thesis, seems to slip into oblivion. Cooper’s project examines the ways in which attitudes about race and the institution of slavery in France and San Dominique impacted conceptualizations of rights and freedom in the contexts of the French and Haitian Revolutions (and the Age of Reason and Revolution more generally). This work by Cooper is quite significant insofar as the Haitian Revolution is too often overlooked in relation to the American and French Revolutions, and furthermore, there was a United States military occupation of Haiti at the time she wrote it (1914–1935). Cooper’s dissertation offers an insightful and yet underappreciated analysis of the Haitian Revolution that could be paired well with, for example, C.L.R. James’s The Black Jacobins.

In addition to these better-known major scholarly writings, Cooper went on to write and publish other essays and critical commentaries over several decades—including a memoir about earning her doctorate from the Sorbonne titled The Third Step and a memoir about the Grimké family titled The Early Years in Washington: Reminiscences of Life with the Grimkés (both memoirs published about the middle of the twentieth century). Intentionally placing Cooper’s scholarship and activism front and center in recognizing her philosophical import goes against commentaries that cast aside Cooper’s theoretical contributions to focus almost exclusively on her biography and personal life. As Lewis Gordon has noted in Existentia Africana: Understanding Africana Existential Thought (2000), too often we find a close examination of the ideas and theories of Black intellectuals absent because interpretations of their biographies and experiences have been preferred focal points. Vivian M. May takes this a step further in Anna Julia Cooper, Visionary Black Feminist: A Critical Introduction (2007) where she notes a disturbing tendency among many writers to focus on Black women intellectuals’ lives rather than their theories. Consequently, Black women’s arguments and theoretical contributions have frequently been under-engaged or even dismissed altogether because so much attention is concentrated on their life stories. Indeed, the bulk of this encyclopedia entry focuses on Cooper’s scholarship, activism, and philosophical contributions in order to resist this troubling trend. A brief biographical and historical background is available at the end of this entry to locate Cooper’s theoretical work within a larger socio-historical and biographical context.

2. Historical and Contemporary Reception of Cooper’s Philosophy

Historically, Anna Julia Cooper was directly and indirectly engaged in debates about ideas related to race, gender, progress, leadership, education, justice, and rights in the late 19th and early 20th centuries with race men like Frederick Douglass, Martin Delany, Alexander Crummell, W.E.B. Du Bois, and Booker T. Washington as well as activist women such as Maria W. Stewart, Sojourner Truth, Frances Harper, Ida B. Wells-Barnett, and Mary Church Terrell. These debates transpired not only through speeches and writings (including public essays and private letters), but also at major meetings like the Hampton Conference (1892), the Chicago World’s Fair (1893), and the Pan African Conference (1900)—to give only a few examples.

In the early African American philosophical canon, activist-intellectuals like Frederick Douglass, Booker T. Washington, Alain Locke, and W.E.B. Du Bois tend to be the more readily recognized philosophical figures of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries in the United States than Anna Julia Cooper and other Black women scholars and activists from this era who are largely overlooked. The canonization of Black men of this period is evidenced by book-length scholarly publications produced throughout the 1990s such as Leonard Harris’s The Philosophy of Alain Locke: Harlem Renaissance and Beyond (1991); Howard Brotz’s African American Social and Political Thought, 1850–1920 (1992); Howard McGary and Bill Lawson’s Between Slavery and Freedom: Philosophy and American Slavery (1993); and Howard McGary’s Race and Social Justice (1999). Certainly, the works of prominent philosophers who write about this tradition have made it possible even to describe an area of philosophy called “African American Philosophy.” Unfortunately these early contributions to African American philosophical discourse frequently ignored the philosophical contributions of African American women including Cooper. Fortunately there is at least one exception to this exclusive focus on men, specifically Joy James’s Transcending the Talented Tenth (1996) in which Anna Julia Cooper figures prominently beside W.E.B. Du Bois and Ida B. Wells-Barnett. James notes the ways in which Cooper argued for a bottom up rather than a top down approach to leadership and standard of measurement for liberation. Rather than focusing on Black intellectual male elites, Cooper asserted that we must pay attention to the conditions of working class and poor Black women. This position offers an ethics of the oppressed consistent with many Black feminist philosophies and also comparable with Continental figures like Jean-Paul Sartre who makes similar claims decades later.[5]

Attention to Cooper in the philosophical literature increases as we move into the twenty-first century. For example, when it comes to anthologizing Cooper’s scholarship her writings have been featured in over thirty anthologies, including philosophy anthologies such as James A. Montmarquet and William H. Hardy’s Reflections: An Anthology of African American Philosophy (2000); Leonard Harris, Scott L. Pratt, and Ann S. Waters’s American Philosophies: An Anthology (2001); and Tommy Lott’s African American Philosophy: Selected Readings (2002). More recently, Cooper has earned an important place in articles focusing specifically on African American women’s philosophical traditions in special issues of journals. Hypatia, Special Issue on Women in the American Philosophical Tradition, Volume 19, Number 2, Spring 2004 (Edited by Dorothy Rogers and Therese B. Dykeman) is one example. This issue includes two articles on Cooper. The first by Cathryn Bailey examines Cooper’s philosophy of education (for Cooper, liberal arts education provided the tools needed to live an examined life worth living rather than only earning a living) along with Cooper’s constructions of Black womanhood against prevailing notions that Black women were not true women. And the second by Vivan M. May emphasizes Cooper’s intersectional approaches to liberation and the epistemological significance of Cooper writing herself into typically exclusionary intellectual traditions.

Philosophia Africana: Analysis of Philosophy and Issues in African and the Black Diaspora, Special Issue: Anna Julia Cooper, Volume 12, Number 1, March 2009 (Edited by Kathryn T. Gines and Ronald R. Sundstrom) is a special issue devoted entirely to Cooper. The featured articles connect Cooper’s feminist philosophy with her social and political writings; virtue and care ethics in Cooper’s writings; romantic conceptions of human nature and flourishing; Cooper’s legacy as a public intellectual; and her philosophy of social justice that informs her philosophy of education. Likewise African American Review: Special Section on Anna Julia Cooper, Volume 43, Number 2, Spring 2009 (Edited by Shirley Moody-Turner) traces the trajectory of Cooper studies from A Voice from the South and beyond. Articles here take up Cooper’s contributions to social theorizing and ethical social relations, race and gender domination, critiques of racial representation, social and economic oppression, radical approaches to education, and community advocacy.

In addition to Gines, Sundstrom, and Bailey above, prominent philosophers like Lewis Gordon have also highlighted Cooper’s philosophical import, including her contributions to existentialism, Black feminist philosophy, and theories of worth, in two important texts. In Existentia Africana: Understanding Africana Existential Thought (2000) Gordon presents Cooper as a nineteenth century figure exploring questions of problematic existence and suffering within black intellectual existential productions. Cooper engaged ontological questions of being—from liberation and humanization to revolution and freedom. With this in mind, Gordon examines the existential dimensions of Cooper’s A Voice from the South, placing it beside texts like W.E.B. Du Bois’s Souls of Black Folk, Ralph Ellison’s Going into the Territory, Frantz Fanon’s Black Skin, White Masks, and Toni Morrison’s Playing in the Dark.

In An Introduction to Africana PhilosophyCambridge Introductions to Philosophy (2008), Gordon asserts that Cooper, “is without question the most sophisticated thinker on what is known today as black feminist thought from the late nineteenth century into the early twentieth century” (Gordon 2008, 71). More specifically, Gordon explains how Cooper’s A Voice from the South “articulated the argument that continues to resonate in black feminist thought, namely, that black women must become agents of their own future, and that much of the health of their community rests on their shoulders because of the burdens they are forced to carry. This argument is advanced through her theory of worth, which she issues in response to racist arguments against the value of black people.” Cooper’s theory of worth, described by Gordon as “an efficiency theory of worth” is especially evident in her essay “What Are We Worth?” (Gordon 2008, 71). Gordon places Cooper’s philosophical insights here in conversation with Marx (“Cooper, like Marx, was in fact working with a model of alienation that did not require the category of oppression, although subjugation and correlates with slavery were hallmarks of their thought”) and Nietzsche (both explored the relationship between worth and health—those benefiting from absence of adversity are less healthy than those facing and overcoming adversity).

There is not yet a book length analysis written by a philosopher that focuses on Cooper’s philosophical import and contributions, however; one could certainly argue that Vivian M. May’s Anna Julia Cooper, Visionary Black Feminist: A Critical Introduction (2007) offers the most comprehensive analysis of Cooper’s writings to date. Going against critical readings and (mis)interpretations of Cooper as an elitist who subscribed to Western ethnocentrism and Victorian constructions of the “Cult of True Womanhood,” May challenges Cooper’s readers and critics to engage in a more nuanced analysis of her writings and activism. For example, May emphasizes Cooper’s activism (which is often marginalized and/or erased altogether in the secondary literature) in a way that demonstrates how Cooper’s lived experience and scholarship were quite anti-elitist. According to May, “Perhaps, then, the challenge lies in developing flexible interpretative strategies able to attend to Cooper’s different vocal registers or resonances without silencing them, and more expansive notions of political action or of counter-publics able to recognize a broader range of activities as, in fact, activist” (50). Additionally, in response to Stephanie Athey’s framing of Cooper as problematically relying on eugenic language and ideology, May presents a counter-argument reading Cooper as contributing to an early materialist Black feminist analysis of Black women’s oppression (55). Contra claims that Cooper sought to imitate whiteness or Western ethnocentrism and Eurocentrism, May underscores Cooper’s contention that “imitation is the worst of suicide” and adds, “Cooper argued that what African Americans needed most was ‘deliverance’ from normative whiteness” (61). May also emphatically rejects dismissals of Cooper as a woman invested in the oppressive habitus of “True Womanhood,” offering an alternate reading of Cooper as one who manipulates and strategically redeploys, rather than fully accepts or embraces, the tenets of True Womanhood.

3. Recognizing Cooper’s Voice: A Woman Question and a Race Problem

The historical neglect of Cooper’s scholarship by philosophers requires an extensive overview of Cooper’s scholarly writings. This section reintroduces A Voice from the South in order to advance Cooper’s place, not only in African American philosophy and Critical Philosophy of Race, but also in Feminist and Social and Political Philosophy. Voice is organized into two parts. The first part, “The Colored Woman’s Office”, includes: “Our Raison d’Être” (1892); “Womanhood: A Vital Element in the Regeneration and Progress of a Race” (1892); “The Higher Education of Women” (1890–1891); “Woman Versus the Indian” (1891–1892); and “The Status of Women in America”(1892). The second part, “Race and Culture” features: “Has America a Race Problem: If So, How Can it Best Be Solved?” (1892); “The Negro as Presented in American Literature” (1892); “What Are We Worth?” (1892); and “The Gain from a Belief” (1892). In this collection of essays, several of which were originally delivered as public speeches, Cooper argues that woman’s experience in general and Black woman’s experience in particular, places her in a unique position to have a distinctive voice, influence, and contribution to make to her race, to the nation, and to the world more broadly.

“Our Raison d’Être”

In the short but powerful opening statement of A Voice from the South, “Our Raison d’Être” (1892) Cooper explains that while the voice of the Negro (man) of the South has been but a muffled chord, “the one mute and voiceless note has been the sadly expectant Black woman…” (cited in The Voice of Anna Julia Cooper, hereafter VAJC, p. 51). Using the analogy of a courtroom trial, Cooper explains that the plaintiff’s and defendant’s attorneys:

…have analyzed and dissected, theorized and synthesized with sublime ignorance or pathetic misapprehension of counsel from the black client. One important witness has not yet been heard from. The summing up of evidence deposed, and the charge to the jury have been made—but no word from the Black Woman. (VAJC, 51)

Cooper underscores how the Black [male] client, the muffled voice, has at least been consulted, even if only with “ignorance” and “misapprehension.” But the “one important witness,” i.e. the Black woman, has been rendered mute and voiceless. Cooper asserts that the white man cannot speak to Black men’s experiences and furthermore, that Black men cannot speak to Black women’s experiences. She elaborates on this position in “Womanhood, A Vital Element in the Regeneration and Progress of a Race.”

“Womanhood: A Vital Element in the Regeneration and Progress of a Race”

In “Womanhood: A Vital Element in the Regeneration and Progress of a Race” (1886) Cooper astutely addresses intersecting issues of race, gender, and society—including intra-group racial politics, intra-group gender politics, and the professed ideals of American society. Her observations speak directly to debates in early African American philosophy and political thought around leadership, representation, and competing philosophies of race (for example between Frederick Douglass’s assimilationism and Martin Delany’s separatism). Concerning intra-group racial politics, Cooper asserts: “The Late Martin Delany, who was an unadulterated black man, used to say when honors fell upon him, that when he entered the council of kings the black race entered with him; meaning, I suppose, that there was no discounting his race identity and attributing his achievements to some admixture of Saxon blood” (VAJC 63). As a Black woman whose father is thought to have been her mother’s white master, Cooper pushes back on two fronts. Not only can Delany not represent the whole simply by virtue of his “pure” Black blood (unmixed with Saxon blood), but also because “no man can represent the race” (VAJC 63). It is in this context that Cooper made the now famous declaration that “Only the BLACK WOMAN can say ‘when and where I enter, in the quiet, undisputed dignity of my womanhood, without violence and without suing or special patronage, then and there the whole Negro race enters with me” (VAJC, 63). Here she problematizes intra-group race and gender politics (specifically Black male patriarchy) by insisting on the significance of the BLACK WOMAN in general and laying claim to her particular significance as a Black woman to the progress of the race—this despite the admixture of Saxon blood, which in her case had been violently imposed by the legacy of slavery and the systematic sexual exploitation of Black women.

This analysis also provides a different background against which we can read Cooper’s description of the “colored girls” of the South as: “that large, bright, fatally beautiful class that stand shivering like delicate plantlets before the fury of tempestuous elements, so full of promise, yet so sure of destruction; often without a father to whom they dare apply the loving term, often without a stronger brother to espouse their cause and defend their honor…” (VAJC 60). This passage not only underscores the danger that Black girls and women faced in terms of sexual exploitation it also challenges some claims made by Alexander Crummell in a speech given three years earlier titled “The Black Woman of the South: Her Neglects and Her Needs” (1883). Crummell makes a clear distinction between the colored people (whom he describes as those who were more educated and had better material conditions) and the negro population (whom he describes as intellectual starvelings). Crummell attributes the affluence of colored people to “the kindness and generosity of their white kindred—white fathers and relatives (1883, 212). Cooper is making the case that “colored” people don’t always have a “father to whom they dare apply the loving term” or the kindness and generosity that having white kindred in selective instances might have entailed. She also makes many references to the ways in which white men protected “English womanhood” and the perceived lack of protection of Black women by Black men. When Cooper asserts that snares and traps are set for the “unprotected, untrained colored girl of the South,” this is a reference to the sexual exploitation of Black girls and women (VAJC, 64).

Cooper emphasizes the honor of Black women, the idea that they should occupy the role of mother or a family role (“Woman, Mother,—your responsibility is one that might make the angels tremble…The training of children…” [VAJC, 59]), and their responsibility for the moral education of Black youth and the regeneration of the race (“…the regeneration…the retraining of the race…must be the black woman” [VAJC, 62]). On this basis, some have argued that Cooper upholds American ideals of womanhood and attempts to assimilate Black women to the characteristics often assigned to their white female counterparts. Other examples of these ideals include Cooper’s claim that “the hope of our country…rests…on the home life and the influence of good women in those homes” (VAJC, 55). And furthermore, that the responsibility of woman and mother is to train children (VAJC, 55). Cooper asserts: “…the position of woman in society determines the vital elements of its regeneration and progress. Now that this is so on a priori grounds all must admit. And this is not because woman is better or stronger or wiser than man, but…because it is she who must first form the man by directing the earliest impulses of his character” (VAJC 59). These ideas about women’s role in society, and/or civilization are comparable to those expressed by Thomas Babington Macaulay, Ralph Waldo Emerson, and Martin Delany.

Macaulay states, “‘You may judge a nation’s rank in the scale of civilization from the way they treat their women’” (VAJC, 55). Likewise Ralph Waldo Emerson claims in “American Civilization”:

Right position of woman in the State is another index [of civilization]. Poverty and industry with a healthy mind read very easily the laws of humanity, and love them: places the sexes in right relations of mutual respect, and a severe morality gives that essential charm to woman which educates all that is delicate, poetic, and self-sacrificing, breeds courtesy and learning, conversation and wit, in her rough mate; so that I have thought it a sufficient definition of civilization to say, it is the influence of good women. (Emerson 1862)

And in The Condition, Elevation, Emigration, and Destiny of the Colored People of the United States, Martin Delany declares, “No people are ever elevated above the condition of their females; hence, the condition of the mother determines the condition of the child. To know the position of a people, it is only necessary to know the condition of their females; and despite themselves, they cannot rise above their level” (Delany 1862, Chapter 24, Delany's emphasis).[6]

In addition to questions about gender, Cooper also interrogates ideals about civilization and society. Some take Cooper’s representation of American society as an exemplar to be problematic, especially when she looks down on other societies to justify this idealized standard. For example, she disparages the lifestyles of those in Turkey describing them as “the vilest of the vile, unprogressive, unambitious, and inconceivably low…[Turkey is an] effete and immobile civilization” (VAJC, 54). At times she glorifies American society and contrasts it with others. America is described as fresh, vigorous, progressive, elevating and inspiring, “the European bud and the American flower of civilization” (VAJC, 54). She acknowledges we have not yet reached our ideal American civilization, but assures her audience that “America is the arena in which the next triumph of civilization is to be won” (VAJC, 54). Cooper, however, does not completely romanticize the American experience. Although she describes America as the “flower of modern civilization” she quickly notes that every person in America is not able to fully experience this “floral” aspect of American life. Cooper is very aware that the Black experience in America is quite contrary to that of their white counterparts. But she is hopeful, perhaps over-optimistic, about improving the status and experience of Blacks in America, stating, “our satisfaction in American institutions rests not in the fruition we now enjoy, but it springs rather from the possibilities and promise that are inherent in the system, though as yet, perhaps, far in the future” (VAJC, 54). Some might read this as Cooper’s attempt to hold America up to its professed ideals.

“The Higher Education of Women”

In the essay “The Higher Education of Women” (1890–1891) Cooper provides a feminist argument for educating women. She examines the sentiments against the education of women in the early 1800s and provides a counter argument by referencing the positive impact that education has had in the lives of women who were able to attend colleges and pursue B. A. degrees as well as the positive impact on the world more broadly. According to Cooper, higher education among women “…has given symmetry and completeness to the world’s agencies” (VAJC, 76). Thus, one of the objectives of giving women access to higher education is to better equip them to influence humanity and to contribute to the questions, problems and debates on the world stage. Cooper argues, “the feminine factor can have its proper effect only through women’s development and education so that she may fitly and intelligently stamp her force on the forces of her day…” (VAJC, 78).

Cooper not only discusses the education of women in general, she is also acutely aware of the importance of education in the lives of Black women and girls in particular. We are again reminded of the double damnation of Black women, here in the area of education. While there were constraints on educational opportunities for Black people more generally, she brings attention to an attitude of resistance from Black men concerning academic development among women. Cooper admits, “It seems hardly a gracious thing to say, but it strikes me as true, that while our men seem thoroughly abreast of the times in almost every other subject, when they strike the woman question they drop back into sixteenth century logic” (VAJC, 85). She notes that while Black men were aware of issues such as racial uplift, they largely ignored the problems specific to (Black) women, i.e. the other “half” of the race that they were supposedly uplifting. This antiquated attitude is not limited to the higher education of adult women, but also applied to young girls. Cooper exclaims, “[G]ive the girls a chance!… Let our girls feel that we expect more from them than that they merely look pretty and appear well in society. Teach them that there is a race with special needs which they and only they can help; that the world needs and is already asking for their trained, efficient forces” (VAJC, 86–87).

In “The Higher Education of Women” we see Cooper’s commitment to the idea that women (and girls) have a voice that must be heard, they have an influence and contribution that must be made to the race and to all of humanity. The attainment of higher education by women has produced well-equipped and thoughtful women “whom the world has long awaited for in pain and anguish till there should be added…the complement of that masculine influence which has dominated it for fourteen centuries” (VAJC, 73). Cooper expounds on her theories about the unique mission and influence of women, namely “to put in the tender and sympathetic cord in nature’s grand symphony, and counteract, or better, harmonize the diapason of mere strength and might” (VAJC, 75). Cooper acknowledges that with the (negative) influence of men, some women may strike a “false note” or parrot “cold conceits”—however, Cooper insists that “her heart is aglow with sympathy and loving kindness, and she cannot be true to her real self without giving out these elements into the forces of the world” (VAJC, 75).

“Woman Versus the Indian”

In “Woman Versus the Indian” Cooper situates her philosophy of rights intersectionally—calling for the natural inherent rights of all people, or “the rights of humanity” but also specifying groups typically denied these rights such as Blacks, women, Indians (or Native Americans), and the poor. Just as she is critical of Black men for their sexism, Cooper is equally critical of white women’s racism, particularly the racism expressed by white women’s organizations that claimed to be tackling the oppression of all women. She challenges the tendency in the (white) woman’s movement to fight for (white) women’s rights at the expense of, or instead of, others’ rights. Taking a strong stand against all forms of oppression in “Woman Versus the Indian” (1891–1892) she declares:

Woman should not even by inference, or for the sake of argument, seem to disparage what is weak. For woman’s cause is the cause of the weak; and when all the weak shall have received their due consideration, then woman will have her ‘rights,’ and the Indian will have his rights, and the Negro will have his rights, and all the strong will have learned at last to deal justly, to love mercy, and to walk humbly …. (VAJC, 105)

In this essay, Cooper is responding in part to an essay by Ann Shaw with the same title. Shaw’s essay, as the title suggests, places the issue of women’s rights against the rights of American Indians. It is noteworthy that Cooper rejects exclusionary reasoning (by inference or by argument) stating, “All prejudices, whether of race, sect, or sex, class pride, and caste distinctions are the belittling inheritance and badge of snobs and prigs” (VAJC, 105). Cooper’s disdain for such thinking is thoroughly communicated. She adds, “The philosophic mind sees that its own ‘rights’ are the rights of humanity” (VAJC, 105). Cooper is denouncing oppression against all persons, “The white woman does not need to sue the Indian, or the Negro, or any other race or class who have been crushed under the iron heel of Anglo Saxon power and selfishness” (VAJC, 108).

For Cooper, it is necessary to reject and speak out against all forms of oppression. She petitions:

It is not the intelligent woman versus the ignorant woman; nor the white woman versus the black, the brown, and the red—it is not even the cause of woman versus man…[W]oman’s strongest vindication for speaking is that the world needs to hear her voice…when race, color, sex, condition, are realized to be accidents, not the substance of life…then woman’s lesson is taught and woman’s lesson is won—not the white woman not the black woman nor the red woman, but the cause of every man or woman who has writhed silently under a mighty wrong. (VAJC, 108)

She pleads the cause of every man and woman who is wronged, rejecting oppression against the ignorant, various races, and women.

“The Status of Woman in America”

In “The Status of Woman in America” (1892), Cooper demonstrates continued awareness of issues facing Black women in America and she advocates their political involvement and empowerment. Cooper discusses the U.S. economy and the condition of women during the woman’s era of the late nineteenth century, (VAJC, 11).[7] She brings to the forefront the dilemma of the Black woman, the fact that “She is confronted by both a woman question and a race problem and is as yet an unknown or an unacknowledged factor in both” (VAJC, 112).

Cooper emphasizes the dedication of educated and uneducated Black women to the survival of the race. Both have demonstrated their commitment to the race in concrete ways, for example, by leaving their husbands for committing “race disloyalty” in their voting choices during Reconstruction (VAJC, 133 and 115). She states, “It is notorious that ignorant black women in the South have actually left their husband’s homes…for what was understood by the wife to be race disloyalty, or ‘voting away’ as she expresses it, the privileges of herself and her little ones” (VAJC, 115). Cooper makes many references here to Black men, the role they played in politics, and how they were “absorbed in the immediate needs of their own political interests” (VAJC, 113). She also mentions the perception that the “Democratic Negro is a traitor and a time server” (VAJC, 115). She adds, “…there are not many men…who would dare face a wife quivering in every fiber with the consciousness that her husband is a coward who could be paid to desert her deepest and dearest interests” (VAJC, 115).

In this essay, Cooper makes no attempt to gloss over the sexist challenges faced by Black women. She states that Black women are “hampered and shamed by a less liberal sentiment and a more conservative attitude on the part of those for whose opinion she cares most [i.e. Black men]” (VAJC, 113). She adds, “As far as my experience goes the average man of our race is less frequently ready to admit the actual need among the sturdier forces of the world for women’s help or influence” (VAJC, 113). Cooper asserts that women have significant contributions to make to social, economic, and national issues (“Great social and economic questions await her influence” [VAJC, 113]). They can shed light on the management of school systems, public institutions, prison systems, and mental institutions (VAJC, 113). Cooper understood that the status of women and their role in the progress of the race was changing. She recalls that fifty years before her time a woman’s activity was limited to “a clearly cut ‘sphere’, including primarily the kitchen and the nursery… [But] the woman of today finds herself in the presence of responsibilities which ramify through the profoundest and most varied interests of her country and race” (VAJC, 116).

This can be read in contrast to some of the gender roles that Cooper outlined in the “Womanhood” essay. In the “Status” essay we see Cooper take up a stronger more encompassing notion of Black female agency that more readily embraces new opportunities and possibilities for Black women outside of the domestic sphere. She is speaking here of the vital roles that women must play outside of the home in order to see progress for the Black race. What she has in mind here goes beyond the traditional standards of white womanhood.

“Has America a Race Problem? If So, How Can it Best Be Solved?”

In “Has America a Race Problem? If So, How Can it Best Be Solved?” (1892) Cooper argues that progressive peace is achieved through fair conflict and difference, anticipating later work by Audre Lorde. According to Cooper, “All through God’s universe we see eternal harmony and symmetry as the unvarying result of the equilibrium of opposing forces” (VAJC, 121). Operating at the forefront of this analysis is racial conflict. What Cooper has in mind is not the obliteration of one race by another, but the progress that is achievable when we embrace difference and change. Cooper endorses multiculturalism and racial diversity for the purpose of progress and argues that isolation hinders the development of racial groups rather than making them stronger. Here Cooper is responding to various positions about interactions, or even admixture, between races. Like Crummell before her and Du Bois after her, Cooper was convinced that every race had a particular purpose and message to contribute toward human progress. Du Bois has been credited with making this claim in “Conservation of Races” from The Souls of Black Folk, but this idea had been prevalent for years before the 1897 “Conservation of Races” speech.

Robert Bernasconi has traced this idea back to the philosophy of Johann Gottfried von Herder who wrote Ideas on the Philosophy of the History of Humankind (1784). Herder (against Immanuel Kant) actually “rejected the division of humanity into races and insisted that a division into peoples is more appropriate” (Bernasconi 2000, 23). Herder argued that each group of peoples has a unique and important contribution to make to civilization. Going against prevailing 18th century ideas about civilization and race, Herder asserted that the Negro is a human and not an animal. He adds, “You should not oppress him, nor murder him, nor steal from him: for he is a human being just as you are…” (Bernasconi 2000, 26).

This provides greater insight into not only Du Bois’s claim that “manifestly some of the great races of today—particularly the Negro race—have not as yet given to civilization the full spiritual message which they are capable of giving (Du Bois 1897, quoted from Du Bois 1903, 26), but also Cooper’s claim (five years before Du Bois) that “Each race has its badge, its exponent, its message, branded in its forehead by the great Master’s hand which is its own peculiar keynote, and its contribution to the harmony of the nations” (VAJC, 122). For Cooper, the delivery of each message requires contact and conflict, but not brutal repression and racial domination. Cooper is clear that prejudice and race domination only leads to immobility and death. Implicit in her argument is a rejection of the complete assimilation (or even amalgamation) of one race into another. (This is also a theme that is taken up later by Du Bois.) Cooper constantly reiterates the point that race differences are intended to encourage races to sharpen or improve one another through equilibrium, conflict, and harmony, not through domination and hierarchy, or even assimilation. We see the significance of God even in Cooper’s philosophy of history as it relates to conflict and progress when she explains, “the God of battles is in the conflicts of history. The evolution of civilization is in His care, eternal progress His delight” (VAJC, 129).

“The Negro As Presented in American Literature”

In “The Negro As Presented in American Literature” (1892) Cooper shows that standpoint theory does not have to devolve into unending relativism when we take into account the possibility of an inauthentic standpoint. She expresses her outrage at pseudo-intellectuals who disingenuously take up the “Negro question” to analyze race, bringing with them their prejudices, antipathies, and a rejection of any candid and careful study. She explains that with “flippant indifference” many “aspire to enlighten the world with dissertations on the racial traits of the Negro” (VAJC, 140). This is the case, not only for dissertations on race, but also for art and literature that seeks to portray a distorted image of the Negro. Cooper asserts, “it is an insult to humanity and a sin against God to publish any such sweeping generalizations of a race on such meager and superficial information. We meet at every turn—this obtrusive and offensive vulgarity, this gratuitous sizing up of the Negro and conclusively writing down his equation, sometimes even among his ardent friends and bravest defenders” (VAJC, 147).

Cooper calls into question the standpoint from which such dissertations are written and argues that the Negro has the right to identify the shortcomings of such analyses. The issues raised by Cooper here concern not only the standpoint from which these materials are produced, but also the inauthenticity of the product itself. This inauthenticity leads to a mass production of images that “portray colored persons only as bootblacks and hotel waiters, grinning from ear to ear and bowing and curtseying for the extra tips” (VAJC, 149). As a result of this false yet dominating image, many have not seen, “and therefore cannot be convinced that there exists a quiet, self-respecting, dignified class, …of cultivated tastes and habits…” among Negroes, (VAJC, 149). Even more impressive than Cooper’s ability to advance issues of standpoint theory and authenticity, is her insight about the producers of these controling negative images. Cooper asserts that rather than producing an accurate picture of the Black man, these portraits only reveal the consciousness (or subconsciousness) of the white man producing the images. According to Cooper, the authentic image of the Negro has not yet been produced. She assets, “an authentic portrait, at once aesthetic and true to life, presenting the Black man as a free American citizen, not just the humble slave of Uncle Tom’s Cabin—but the man, divinely struggling and aspiring yet tragically warped and distorted by the adverse winds of circumstance, has not yet been painted…that canvass awaits the brush of the colored man himself” (VAJC, 158).

“What Are We Worth?”

In “What Are We Worth?” Cooper provides a theoretical rendering of race prejudice, grounding it in sentiment and/or ideas. Cooper’s starting point for these reflections is a quote from Henry Ward Beecher (brother of Harriet Beecher Stowe) in which he asks, if Africa and Africans where to sink into the ocean “how much poorer would the world be?” and then posits that in the end “not a poem, not an invention, not a piece of art would be missed from the world”—suggesting that none of the above have been contributed to the world by Africa or Africans. From this starting point Cooper goes on to describe sentiment as “ephemeral”, “shifting”, and “unreliable”, and furthermore that “color prejudice or race prejudice is mere sentiment governed by the association of ideas” (VAJC, 162). Cooper surmises that when she hears expressions of dislike of the Negro for being “weak” such sentiments are an example of narrow-mindedness that is not worth engaging. She states, “Now this dislike it is useless to inveigh against and folly to rail at” (VAJC, 162).

Presenting race prejudice as sentiment governed by the association of ideas, Cooper explains that it is “impervious to reason” and “cannot be annihilated by rhetoric” (VAJC, 163). Thus, rather than approach the question of the worth of Africans from the standpoint of sentiment, Cooper raises the existential and phenomenological question of the value of human persons, particularly persons of African descent in the American context. She then shifts her analysis of worth to market value, examining the notion of worth as determined by the value of material, labor, and in the case of persons, the vital importance of education (“Education, then, is the safest and richest investment possible to man” [VAJC, 168]).

Cooper offers an array of statistics on Black schools (including early childhood developments, colleges, and universities), teachers, ministers, and other professionals (e.g. doctors and lawyers) to make the case for the “unassisted effort of the colored people for self-development” (VAJC, 169). She also provides statistics on the high mortality rates, the economic disempowerment of share cropping systems, and the limited housing opportunities among Black Americans. Cooper describes the white labor unions of the North as tyrannical insofar as their working conditions are far more preferable to those of Black men working for fifty cents per day in the fields and “the pinched and down-trodden colored women bending over wash-tubs and ironing boards—with children to feed and house rent to pay, wood to buy, soap and starch to furnish—lugging home weekly great baskets of clothes for families who pay them for a month’s laundrying barely enough to purchase a substantial pair of shoes” (VAJC, 173). Cooper critiques labor unions when she describes “foreigners” and “immigrant laborers, who cannot even speak English” threatening to “cut off the nerve and paralyze the progress of an industry that gives work to an American-born citizen” (VAJC, 173–174).

Returning to the education question, Cooper is clear that she supports both classical education and trade education based on what is most appropriate for the individual student. On the one hand, she notes, “I want nothing I may say to be construed into an attack on classical training or on art development and culture. I believe in allowing every longing of the human soul to attain its utmost reach” (VAJC, 175). On the other hand, she is clear that, “The power of appreciation is the measure of an individual’s aptitudes; and if a boy hates Greek and Latin and spends all his time whittling out steamboats, it is rather foolish to try to force him into the classics” (VAJC, 175).

As if rebutting the opening suggestion by Beecher that Africans have not contributed poetry, inventions, or art—Cooper highlights the poetic contributions of Phillis Wheatley, the inventions of successful Black farmers, the heroism of Black soldiers, and the artistic work of sculptor Mary Edmonia Lewis. Coming full circle back to her description of race prejudice as sentiment Cooper concludes: “Short sighted idiosyncrasies are but transient phenomena. It is futile to combat them, and unphilosophical to be depressed by them…Our only care need be the intrinsic worth of our contributions…and if we contribute a positive value in those things the world prizes, no amount of negrophobia can ultimately prevent its recognition” (VAJC, 187).

“The Gain from a Belief”

In “The Gain from a Belief” Cooper takes on English and French progressivism and positivism of the 19th century (Mill, Comte, and others) using these figures’ organic metaphors and visions of cultural development to explore the debates about racial uplift, the so-called Negro problem, liberalism, cosmopolitanism, and universal brotherhood. She presents the reader with a philosophical antagonist—a solitary figure with a cold, intellectual eye, pallid check, and harrowed brow. He represents “Speculative unbelief, curiously and sneeringly watching the humdrum, common-place, bread-and-butter toil of unspeculative belief” (VAJC, 188). This thinker—with his speculative unbelief, skepticism, positivism, and agnosticism, is juxtaposed with “struggling, working, believing humanity” that holds unscientific faith. Confronting the imagined philosophical figure Cooper states, “Sir…Your philosophy, I presume, lifts you above the toils and anxieties, the ambitions and aspirations of the common herd. Pardon me, but do you not feel called to devote those superior powers of yours to the uplifting of your less favored brotheren?” (VAJC, 188).

Cooper goes on to describe various philosophical positions concerning positivism, agnosticism, and skepticism looking at the works of Pascal, Ritcher, Hume, Comte, Huxley, Mill, Spencer, Lewes, and Ingersoll. Against these philosophies, Cooper makes the case for the import of heroism, devotion, and sacrifice inspired by feeling, faith, and belief. She clarifies her position of faith noting, “I do not mean by faith the holding of correct views and unimpeachable opinions on mooted questions; nor to I understand it to be the ability to forge cast-iron formulas and dub them TRUTH…To me, faith means treating the truth as true” (VAJC, 193). These points are directed toward the possibilities and various beliefs concerning racial uplift.

Cooper asserts, “Life must be more than dilettante speculation” (VAJC, 194). Rather than talking as a spectator, you ought to lead, finance, and live what you believe. Taking up some of the racial debates of that time, Cooper argues that one’s actions should follow from one’s beliefs. If you believe that “…the Negro race in America has a veritable destiny in His [God’s] eternal purposes”… then time should not be wasted on “discussing the ‘Negro Problem’ amid the clouds of your fine Havana, ensconced in your friend’s well-cushioned arm-chair and with your patent leather boot-tips elevated to the opposite mantle” (VAJC, 194). If you believe that “God hath made one blood of all nations of the earth; and that interests which specialize and contract broad, liberal, cosmopolitan idea of universal brotherhood and equality are narrow and pernicious, then treat that truth as true” (VAJC, 194). Cooper asks philosophers and thinkers to be consistent in applying their positions and expressing their beliefs. She advises, “Don’t inveigh against lines of longitude drawn by others when at the same time you are applying your genius to devising lines of latitude which are neither race lines, nor character lines, nor intelligence lines—but certain social-appearance circlets assorting your ‘universal brotherhood’ by shapes of noses and texture of hair” (VAJC, 194). Cooper continues, “If you object to imaginary lines—don’t draw them! Leave only the real lines of nature and character” (VAJC, 195). She concludes by returning to the import of the power of belief, “If thou believest, all things are possible; and as thou believest, so be it to thee” (VAJC, 196).

4. Cooper’s Doctoral Thesis: L’attitude de la France à l’égard de l’esclavage pendant la revolution

Cooper’s dissertation provides insights and analyses pertinent to social and political philosophy, critical philosophy of race, as well as critical interpretations of French Enlightenment. Like Voice, this text by Cooper warrants an extensive overview because it has remained almost wholly overlooked by philosophers. In L’attitude de la France à l’égard de l’esclavage pendant la revolution, Cooper succeeds in resituating racial oppression, colonialism, and slavery as issues central to rather than tangential to the French and Haitian Revolutions. Her topic was motivated by several observations including comments from French President Poincaré—which to her seemed significant to France’s attitude about racial equality, as well as the erection of a monument in Dakar, “A la Gloire de l Armée Noirse” (VAJC, 324). Additionally, Cooper was researching “the Franco Japanese Treaty of 1896—The Naturalization of France: a) for Japanese, b) Hindus, c) Negroes, and of course the discussions of the National Assemblies during the French Revolution; the writings and speeches of and about La Société des Amis des Noir—l’Abbe Gregoire and others” (VAJC, 324).

To these interests and influences, Cooper adds her avid reading of Le Monde Noir (or La Revue du Monde Noir) and contributions from thinkers such as Franz Boas, Jean Finot, Author de Gobineau, along with discourses from Alphanse de Lamartine and his drama Toussaint L’Ouverture. La Revue du Monde Noir, launched in October 1931, was conceptualized at the Clamart salon (located in the Paris apartment of Jane and Paulette Nardal) and managed by the Nardal sisters along with Léo Sajous, Clara Shepard, and Louis-Jean Finot. An original issue of La Revue du Monde Noir is in Cooper’s archived papers at Howard University’s Moorland-Springarn Center. Priced at 7 francs 50 or 30 cents U.S., the issue contains such contributions as “Race Equality” by Louis-Jean Finot, “The Creole Race” by Maître Jean-Louis, a poem by Claude McKay, and “A Negro Woman speaks at Cambridge and Geneva” by Paulette Nardal.

The introduction to Cooper’s thesis outlines the origins of the institution of “Negro slave trade,” which was “founded on the abuse of power…and maintained by violence” (SFHR, 31). Cooper discusses the impact of the slave trade on mortality rates of the enslaved (e.g. through the middle passage) along with the ways in which slavery and colonialism underdeveloped the continent of Africa while enriching the Spanish, Portuguese, Iberian peoples, the United States, England and France—among others. She highlights the harms of slavery for both the slavers and the enslaved while also underscoring the prominent role of slavery in the colonial system. In France in particular she asserts, “the colonists, the rich merchants, had too much to gain from the shameful traffic in slaves to be willing even to consider the possibility of suppressing slavery. Since the time of Colbert, too many French ports had been developed and enriched by the trade” (SFHR, 37). The struggle against slavery and the opposing interests of the colonists against the Blacks would have been one-sided in the interest of the colonist, Cooper asserts, if not for the establishment of the Friends of the Blacks by Brissot, Sièyes, and Condorcet in 1787, (SFHR, 37).

Against this background, in the first chapter of the thesis Cooper details the prosperity of the French colonies, especially Santo Domingo, on the eve of the Revolution (“The Social Conditions of the French-American Colonies; the Class Structure”). She describes the various classes including the “petite blancs” (lower middle class whites), “mulatto class” (sometimes rather well educated and extremely desirous of affirming their equality with whites), “colored men” (a term used by the petit blancs that included both those with a mixture of the white race and the black race, as well as the pure Negro natives of Africa or the colonies), and “freed men” (who were generally poor and who were almost as jealous of the mulattos as of the whites), (SFHR, 44–45).

From here Cooper details the geography of Santo Domingo and the conflicts (including slave revolts and the violence of the colonial and slave systems) that contributed to the white colonists of Santo Domingo approaching the National Assembly of France. Disturbed about the influence of the Society of the Friends of the Blacks, the colonists established an adversarial group called the Massiac Club, which claimed the right to be represented in the National Assembly. The unexpected result was the increased visibility of the colonial problem for the public, which actually strengthened the position of the Friends of the Blacks concerning the problem of human liberty and equality between the races, (SFHR, 48–49). Cooper states, “Thus the Friends of the Blacks profited from the admission of the deputies of Santo Domingo to draw attention toward the great problem of equality of the races, and to the concurrent problem of the suppression of slavery” (SFHR, 53). Another outcome of this debate was the question of the principle of colonial representation—the idea that the colonies are a part of the national territory of France, not just lands to be exploited, (SFHR, 56).

In Chapter Two, Cooper describes the formation of “The American Colonists”—a committee of colored men organized by “the elder Raimond, Jacques and Vincent Ogé” (SFHR, 59). They sought the admission of a deputy to represent them in the Constituent Assembly and demanded “the absolute equality of colored men and free Negroes with white colonists” (SFHR, 60). This reopened debates about the problem of equality of the races in the colonies and raised “A graver question, that of the abolition of the trade and slavery” (SFHR, 60). In addition to considering the “fate of the blacks” there are also the other events of the Revolution in France including Bastille, the Declaration of the Rights of Man and Citizen, and the height of the reign of terror, (SFHR, 61). Cooper asserts, “It is certain that if the whites had adopted a more conciliatory attitude toward the free mulattos many disasters could have been avoided” (SFHR, 63). But the colonist joined forces with the Massiac Club to prevent the emancipation of slaves and to establish a force in the colonies that could resist any legislation against slavery. The result was, in part, the establishment of a Colonial Committee that would centralize colonial questions in the hands of a few and remove them from the Friends of the Blacks, (SFHR, 65). Cooper is clear that financial concerns outweighed ideals about freedom and racial equality. She argues that the establishment of this Colonial Committee was indicative of the necessity to “slow down a revolutionary moment menacing the whole of the West Indies” coupled with a desire to protect the financial interests and national wealth of France insofar as “trade with Santo Domingo represented two thirds of the total trade of France” (SFHR, 66).

The Friends of the Blacks were “prepared to sacrifice everything for the success of their cause,” and the Massaic Club colonialists “were just as dedicated to their detestable cause” (SFHR, 71). Barnave presented a decree (March 1790), which contained the principle that the colonies were to provide their own constitution, thereby ending arbitrary administration. The colonists then demanded independence, but “Without making any distinction between the whites and the colored men, without even mentioning one or the other, they contented themselves in the famous Article IV, with conferring civil rights upon ‘all property owners of twenty-five years of age,’ who possessed real estate, or lacking such property, had been domiciled in and had contributed to the parish for two years” (SFHR, 71). Cooper notes that the ambiguity of the article allowed landholding mulattoes to hope that these civil rights applied to them “without assuring them any benefit” (SFHR, 72). Furthermore, colored men in Paris were alarmed by the silence of the decree on their particular rights. Just as mulattos were seeking the same rights as whites, Blacks would go on to claim the same rights as mulattos. The result of the decree was resistance and insurrection. “In spite of all of these measures,” Cooper notes, “it was in vain that the Constituent Assembly and its Colonial Committee had hoped to save the colonies from danger of insurrections,” (SFHR, 77). The decree of May 15, 1791 which accorded political rights to mulattoes born of free parents and recognizing them as active citizens was a defeat for the colonists, yet they refused to comply with it (SFHR, 80). The white colonists revolted, the decree was retracted (though not altogether annulled), and the Friends of the Blacks and the Jacobin Club were brought closer together.

In the third chapter Cooper documents the various Civil Commissions sent to Santo Domingo along with the resulting reports and decrees that followed with those visits. White colonists continued to act in open opposition to any semblance of political equality (which they feared might also lead to social equality) for mulattoes (SFHR, 88). She notes, “…April 4th a new National Law annulled the Constitutional Decree of September 24th, 1791, conferred upon colored men and free Negroes equal political rights with whites, and ordered a new election, more in accord with principles of equality, of the colonial and parochial assemblies which had been reinvigorated by then to enforce the new Law the [a]ssembly provided for the appointment of three new Civil Commissioners having dictatorial powers and supported by a sufficient military force” (SFHR, 88).

In time the Commissioners “let the blacks do as they wished,” emancipation was proclaimed in the West and in the South, “Negroes everywhere refused to work, and economic conditions worsened to the extent that insubordination increased” (SFHR, 95–97). In examining the correspondence of this particular period, Cooper notes the descriptions of insurrections and loss of property, and the seemingly secondary attention to the question of slavery. She asserts, “Thus we find one more argument in support of the idea, which inevitably grows stronger as one reads so many convincing documents, that the question of the emancipation of the slaves had only been considered and embraced by a few enthusiasts, idealists like Brissot and his friends…who had only seen a problem to be resolved by humanity and theory where in fact a thorough practical preparation was necessary” (SFHR, 98).

Cooper also outlines the events leading up to the rise in power of Toussaint Louverture (whom she describes as “a grand figure” “intelligent and capable” and “endowed with a strong personality that towered over those of his companions” (SFHR, 101). A leader able to “see and foresee,” Louverture sent Sonthoax back to France followed by Hédouville and Raimond. In a campaign against Rigaurd for power, Louverture facilitated massacres of mulattoes in the North and eventually “made himself master of all the Spanish territory” (SFHR, 106). Expecting a strong response from France and Napoleon, Louverture forced Blacks back to work to increase the prosperity of the island and “permitted no revolt, finishing off insurrectionists swiftly…” (SFHR, 108). In the end, Louverture would be sent to France where he died on April 7, 1803. Napoleon went on to reestablish slavery and slave trade in the French colonies. Cooper observes, “In truth, it seems that Napoleon never gave more than absent minded thoughts to the obviously complicated problem presented by that too distant island” (SFHR, 111). A new “war of extermination” broke out against the “last vestiges of the white race at Santo Domingo” (SFHR, 111). Louverture’s successor Dessallines declared the island independent and restored the Indian name of Haiti “so that there would no longer be reminders of the European occupation” (SFHR, 111).

In her conclusion, Cooper reflects on the various factors that complicated the entire situation from the economic conditions in revolutionary France to the issue of slavery and the problem of race—a problem that was not simply Black and white, but also involved “the intermediate mulatto,” and finally, a political problem, (SFHR, 114). Cooper describes the political problem in this way, “The change in regime was not accepted in these distant countries as it should have been, because it was not understood. The majority of the colonists remained royalists. And so did the blacks. A war of parties was added to the war of races” (SFHR, 114).

5. Other Select Essays and Writings: Ruminations Beyond Voice

The Ethics of the Negro Question

In “The Ethics of the Negro Question” (1902) Cooper confronts the hypocrisy of Christianity in America. According to Cooper, the Negro “stands in the United States of America today as the passive and silent rebuke to the Nation’s Christianity, the great gulf between its professions and its practices, furnishing the chief ethical element in its politics, …[and pointing the finger at so-called] ideals of civilization” (VAJC, 206). This sentiment is reiterated in “The Negro in American Literature” where Cooper asserts that the color caste in this country is a “scathing rebuke to weak-eyed Christians who cannot read the golden rule across the color line” (VAJC, 145).

Cooper recounts the harsh circumstances under which the Negro is uprooted and transplanted to this “Christian” nation, reduced to chattel and beasts of burden for the purpose of producing wealth for white men and the economy of the nation (VAJC, 207). Like Frederick Douglass and others, Cooper underscores this nation’s failure to adhere to the declaration that “all men are created equal” from the beginning. Her use of language and imagery are worth quoting at length. She asserts:

Professing a religion of sublime altruism, a political faith in the inalienable rights of man as man, these jugglers with reason and conscience were at the same moment stealing heathen from their far away homes, forcing them with lash and gun to unrequited toil, making it a penal offense to teach them to read the word of God,—nay, more, were even begetting and breeding mongrels of their own flesh among these helpless creatures and pocketing the guilty increase, the price of their own blood in unholy dollars and cents. (VAJC, 207)

Cooper not only highlights the discontinuity between religion, faith, reason, and conscience on the one hand and the atrocities of slavery on the other, she also exposes the white male slave owner as a rapist who fathers children by Black female slaves and then exploits the labor of those children who must assume the slave status of their mothers. This is a constant point of emphasis by Cooper not only because of its prevalence during and after slavery, but also because of her own her lived experience. Added to all of this is the problem of lynching—adeptly described by Ida B. Wells-Barnett as “Our National Crime”.

“My Racial Philosophy” (Survey Question)

Cooper wrote “My Racial Philosophy” (1930) in response to a survey distributed by Charles S. Johnson to Black college graduates. In 1927 Johnson became chair of a newly formed social science department at Fisk University. Other prominent members of the department faculty at that time included now famed social scientists Robert E. Park and E. Franklin Frazier. The formation of this department at Fisk was made possible by a $200,000 contribution from the Laura Spelman Rockefeller Memorial—for whom Spelman College, the renowned historically Black college for women in Atlanta, GA is also named (Gasman 1999, 6). By 1930, Johnson was collecting data from this survey taken by Cooper and numerous others, and by 1946 Johnson had become the sixth president, though the first Black president, of Fisk.

The question to which Cooper was replying in Johnson’s 1930 survey is (question # 65): “Have you a ‘racial philosophy’ that can be briefly stated?” Cooper begins her two-page reply by emphasizing the fact that race and gender prejudice is often overlapping, particularly for Black women. The analysis of race and gender intersectionality dominates Cooper’s philosophy, not only here, but throughout A Voice from the South. Here she asserts, “the whips and stings of prejudice, whether of color or sex, find me neither too calloused to suffer, nor too ignorant to know what is due me” (VAJC, 236). Cooper adds that one would be mistaken to “imagine that oppression goes only with color” and explains, “When I encounter brutality I need not always charge it to my race” (VAJC, 236). Even more significant in Cooper’s racial philosophy is the correlation she draws between prejudice, civilization, and our responsibility in the formation of our civilization. Cooper claims that the brutality of prejudice is “chargeable to the imperfections in the civilization…for which as a teacher and a trained thinker I take my share in responsibility” (VAJC, 236).

6. Biographical Sketch

Anna Julia Cooper was born into slavery as Annie Hayward in Raleigh, North Carolina on August 10, likely in 1858 (though some sources date her birth in 1859) before the Civil War. Cooper describes her mother Hannah Haywood as “the finest woman” she had ever known who despite being “untutored” was still able to “read her bible and write a little.”[8] Cooper presumes that her father was her mother’s master, adding that her mother “was always too modest and shamefaced ever to mention him.” With this one sentence Cooper captures both the plights of enslaved Black women of that time—being untutored and sexually exploited; as well as the significant triumphs—learning to read and write against the odds (and in many cases against the law).

At the young age of nine, barely removed from slavery, Cooper (then Annie Haywood) begins school at Saint Augustine Normal School in Raleigh, North Carolina where she continued her education for about fourteen years. During this time she also worked as a tutor and teacher. Cooper completed studies at what became Saint Augustine’s Normal Collegiate School in 1877 and then married George Cooper. The newlyweds continued to study and teach at Saint Augustine’s, but George Cooper, who went on to become an Episcopal priest, died two short years later. In a letter seeking admission to Oberlin College in Ohio, Cooper lists the content of her previous studies including English; Latin: Cesar (seven books), Virgil’s Aeneid (six books), Sallust’s Cataline and Jugurtha, a few orations of Cicero; Greek: White’s first lessons, Goodwin’s Greek Reader—including selections from Xenophon, Plato, Herodotus, and Thucydides, the Iliad; along with Algebra and Geometry. It is obvious that her education was deeply rooted in the history of Western philosophy and the classics. Cooper gains admission and leaves Saint Augustine’s for Oberlin College in 1881 where she goes on to earn a B.A. in mathematics in 1884 and then an M.A. for college teaching in 1887.

Although Cooper’s affinity for the Western philosophical canon, languages, and advanced mathematics at times resulted in her being misread as elitist, it must be noted that these academic and scholarly achievements are complemented by her lifetime commitment to education, activism, and community service. The depth of this commitment is evidenced by her work as a tutor in North Carolina in her youth, and later as a teacher at Saint Augustine’s College and Wilberforce College where she taught mathematics, literature, and modern languages. Cooper would have many more years of teaching and administrative experience at M Street High School in Washington D.C., where she was appointed principal from January 2, 1902 to June 30, 1906. After a controversy at M Street High School, Cooper left Washington D.C. to teach for several years at Lincoln University in Missouri. The controversy centered on claims about the immorality of the teachers and misconduct among students. It has been speculated that these charges were raised because some were disgruntled by Cooper’s commitment to teaching classical texts and languages—an approach often associated with Du Bois’s educational philosophy rather than Washington’s emphasis on vocational training. But Louise Daniele Hutchinson has made the case that Percy M. Hughes, the white director of Washington High Schools at the time, played a role in this controversy insofar as he brought the charges against Cooper. Despite public support for Cooper, the brouhaha ultimately resulted in her not being reappointed as principal of M Street High School in 1906. Cooper did eventually return to teach at M Street from 1910 to 1930, before teaching at Frelinghuysen University where she held the office of the president from 1930 to 1941.

In addition to these educational and administrative contributions, Cooper also did work at a War Camp in Indianapolis, supervised a playground in West Virginia, supervised the Colored Settlement House in Washington D.C., and helped to facilitate the opening of the first YWCA chapter for Black women in Washington, D.C. She was also very active in the racial and gender uplift movement, including the Negro Women’s Club Movement—playing a leadership role in the Washington Colored Woman’s League which eventually became a part of the National Association of Colored Women’s Clubs. Cooper was a speaker at the Hampton Conference in 1892, a speaker at the Chicago World’s Fair in 1893, and she co-founded the Colored Women’s League in 1894 in Washington, D.C. She helped organize and also addressed the Pan African Conference in London in 1900 (which later became the Pan African Congress) before touring Europe with her foster daughter Lula Love (visiting the Paris Exposition, Oberammergau, Munich, and several cities in Italy). Furthermore, Shirley Moody-Turner has noted that Cooper was active in the Hampton Folklore Society (working as an interim editor for the Southern Workman) and the Washington Negro Folklore Society (as a founder and corresponding secretary). Some have claimed that Cooper was the only female member of the American Negro Academy (though others have argued that she was not an official member).

In 1925, at the age of 66, Cooper earned a Ph.D. at the Sorbonne in Paris, France becoming the fourth Black American woman to earn a Ph.D. The first three black women to earn the Ph.D. in the U.S. include Sadie T.M. Alexander (University of Pennsylvania), Georgianna Rosa Simpson (University of Chicago), and Eva B. Dykes (Radcliff College) and each did so in 1921. Cooper recalls the Herculean effort required to complete her exams and thesis for the doctorate in The Third Step. She took courses at La Guilde Internationale, Paris in French Literature, History, and Phonetics during the summer months in 1911, 1912, and 1913. After starting her doctoral studies at Columbia University in New York in the summer of 1914, Cooper would then take guardianship of five children (her great-nieces and nephews) and in 1916 she purchased a five-bedroom home in which to raise them. By 1917 she earned thirty-two credits and was certified in French, Latin, and Greek at Columbia. However, Cooper could not meet the one-year residential requirements as she was still working at M Street High School in Washington, D.C. She later decided to transfer her credits from Columbia to the University of Paris in France. In December of 1923 Cooper came down with influenza and asked for a sick leave from her teaching obligations. By February 1924 she selected her thesis topic, but then learned that she had only sixty days to return to her teaching post or be “dropped” from her position at M Street High School. Cooper returned to her teaching position on the sixtieth day and continued to do research and writing on the thesis at the Library of Congress on evenings and weekends. She defended her thesis on March 23, 1925 and received her diplôme de Docteur ès lettres de la Faculté de Paris on December 29, 1925 in a ceremony supported by the Alpha Kappa Alpha sorority at Howard University.

Cooper continued teaching at M Street High School until 1930. She also taught at Frelinghuysen University, holding the office of the president from 1930 to 1941. Over the decades various magazines and newspapers published several of her commentaries on the state of the race. Cooper lived to be 105 years old, residing in Washington D.C. until her death on February 27, 1964. Memorial services were held in Raleigh, North Carolina where she is buried. The cemetery gravestone reads:

Anna J. Cooper, Ph.D. 1859–1964
Educator, Author, Poet and
School Administrator
Early Advocate of Equal Rights
For Blacks And Women
A Graduate Of St. Augustine’s College
Erected 1979.


Primary Literature: Works by Anna Julia Cooper

  • A Voice From the South, Xenia, Ohio: The Aldine Printing Company, 1892.
  • A Voice from the South, with an Introduction, Mary Helen Washington (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • The Voice of Anna Julia Cooper (VAJC), Charles Lemert and Esme Bhan (eds.), Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 1998.
  • “The Ethics of the Negro Question,” in The Voice of Anna Julia Cooper, Charles Lemert and Esme Bhan (eds.), Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 1998, pp. 206–215.
  • “Discussion of the Same Subject [The Intellectual Progress of the Colored Women of the United States since the Emancipation Proclamation],” in The World’s Congress of Representative Women, May Wright Sewall (ed.), Chicago: Rand McNally, 1894, pp. 711–715.
  • “Paper by Mrs. Anna J. Cooper,” Southern Workman, 23 (7) (July 1894): 131–33.
  • “Colored Women as Wage Earners,” Southern Workman, 28 (August 1899): 295–298.
  • Slavery and the French Revolutionists, 1788–1805 (translation of Cooper’s doctoral thesis, L’attitude de la France à l’égard de l’esclavage pendant la révolution), Lewiston: E. Mellen Press, 1988.
  • Slavery and the French and Haitian Revolutionists: L’attitude de la France à l’égard de l’esclavage pendant la revolution, edited and translated by Frances Richardson Keller, reprinted Rowman & Littlefield, 2006.
  • “The American Negro Academy,” Southern Workman, 27 (2) (February 1898): 35–36.

Other Primary Literature Cited

  • Crummell, Alexander, 1883, “The Black Woman of the South: Her Neglects and Her Needs,” in Destiny and Race: Selected Writings, 1840-1898, Wilson Jeremiah Moses (ed.), Amherst: The University of Massachusetts Press, 1992.
  • Delany, Martin, 1852, The Condition, Elevation, Emigration, and Destiny of the Colored People of the United States, Amherst: Humanity Books, 2004, available online at Project Gutenberg.
  • Du Bois, W.E.B., 1897, “The Conservation of Races,” Occasional Papers 2, American Negro Academy, available online; reprinted in Du Bois 1903; reprinted in D. Lewis (ed.), W.E.B. Du Bois: A Reader, New York: Holt, 1995.
  • Du Bois, W.E.B., 1903, The Souls of Black Folk, reprinted in Blight and Williams (eds.), Boston: Bedford Books, 1997.
  • Emerson, Ralph W., 1862, “American Civilization,” in The Atlantic Monthly, IX/54 (April): 502-511.


  • Freedman, E. B., (ed.), 2007, The Essential Feminist Reader, New York: Modern University.
  • Harris, Leonard, Pratt, Scott L., and Waters, Ann S., (eds.), 2002, American Philosophies: An Anthology, Malden, Mass. and Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Lengermann, P. M., and Niebrugge-Brantley, J., (eds.), 2007, The Women Founders: Sociology and Social Theory, 1830–1930: A Text Reader, Long Grove, Illinois: Waveland Press.
  • Lott, Tommy L., (ed.), 2002, African-American Philosophy: Selected Readings, Upper Saddle River, New Jersey: Prentice Hall.
  • Montmarquet, James A. and Hardy, William H., (eds.), 2000, Reflections: An Anthology of African American Philosophy, Belmont, California: Wadsworth Thompson Learning.
  • Maffly-Kipp, L. F., and Lofton, K., (eds.), 2010, Women’s Work: An Anthology of African-American Women’s Historical Writings From Antebellum America to the Harlem Renaissance, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Scott, Lee and Hord, Fred L., (eds.), 1995, I am Because We Are: Readings in Black Philosophy, Amherst, Massachusetts: University of Massachusetts Press.
  • Waters, Kristin, and Conaway, Carol B., (eds.), 2007, Black Women’s Intellectual Traditions: Speaking Their Minds, Burlington, Vermont: University of Vermont Press and Hanover, New Hampshire: University Press of New England.

Journal Special Issues

  • Hypatia, Special Issue on Women in the American Philosophical Tradition, Volume 19, Number 2, Spring 2004 (Edited by Dorothy Rogers and Therese B. Dykeman)
    • May, Vivian M., “Thinking from the Margins, Acting at the Intersections: Anna Julia Cooper’s A Voice from the South” in Hypatia, Volume 19, Number 2, Spring 2004.
    • Bailey, Catherine. “Anna Julia Cooper: ‘Dedicated in the Name of My Slave Mother to the Education of Colored Working People’” in Hypatia, Volume 19, Number 2, Spring 2004.
  • Philosophia Africana: Analysis of Philosophy and Issues in African and the Black Diaspora, Special Issue: Anna Julia Cooper, Volume 12, Number 1, March 2009 (Edited by Kathryn T. Gines and Ronald R. Sundstrom)
    • May, Vivian M., “Anna Julia Cooper’s Philosophy of Resistance: Why African Americans must ‘reverse the picture of the lordly man slaying the lion … [and] turn painter.’” in Philosophia Africana, Volume 12:1, March 2009.
    • Bailey, Catherine, “The Virtue and Care Ethics of Anna Julia Cooper” in Philosophia Africana, Volume 12:1, March 2009.
    • Johnson, Karen “Anna Julia Cooper’s Philosophy of Social Justice in Education” in Philosophia Africana, Volume 12:1, March 2009.
    • White, Carol “One and All: Anna Julia Cooper’s Romantic Feminist Vision” in Philosophia Africana, Volume 12:1, March 2009.
    • Cusick, Carolyn “Anna Julia Cooper, Worth, and Public Intellectuals” in Philosophia Africana, Volume 12:1, March 2009.
  • African American Review: Special Section on Anna Julia Cooper, Volume 43, Number 1, Spring 2009 (Edited by Shirley Moody Turner).
    • Moody Turner, Shirley, 2009, “Preface: Anna Julia Cooper: A Voice Beyond the South”, African American Review: Special Section on Anna Julia Cooper, Volume 43, Number 1, Spring 2009.
    • Guy-Sheftall, Beverly, 2009, “Black Feminist Studies: The Case of Anna Julia Cooper”, African American Review: Special Section on Anna Julia Cooper, Volume 43, Number 1, Spring 2009.
    • May, Vivian M., 2009, “Writing the Self into Being: Anna Julia Cooper’s Textual Politics” African American Review: Special Section on Anna Julia Cooper, Volume 43, Number 1, Spring 2009.
    • Moody-Turner, Shirley and Stewart, James, 2009, “Gendering African Studies: Insights from Anna Julia Cooper” African American Review: Special Section on Anna Julia Cooper, Volume 43, Number 1, Spring 2009.
    • Johnson, Karen A., 2009, “In Service for the Common Good” African American Review: Special Section on Anna Julia Cooper, Volume 43, Number 1, Spring 2009.
    • Moody-Turner, Shirley. “A Voice Beyond the South: Resituating the Locus of Cultural Representation in the Later Writings of Anna Julia Cooper”, African American Review: Special Section on Anna Julia Cooper, Volume 43, Number 1, Spring 2009.

Secondary Literature

  • Alexander, E., 1995, “‘We Must Be about Our Father’s Business’: Anna Julia Cooper and the In-Corporation of the Nineteenth-Century African-American Woman Intellectual”, Signs, 20 (2): 336–356.
  • Aldridge, Derrick, 2007, “Of Victorianism, Civilizationism, and Progressivism: The Educational Ideas of Anna Julia Cooper and W. E. B. Du Bois, 1892–1940”, History of Education Quarterly, 47 (4) (November 2007): 416–446.
  • Alridge, D. P., 2008, The Educational Thought of W.E.B. DuBois: An Intellectual History, New York: Teachers College Press.
  • Anderson, N. S., and Kharem, H., (eds.)., 2009, Education as Freedom: African American Educational Thought and Activism, Lanham, Maryland: Lexington Books.
  • Andrews, W. L., (ed.)., 2006, The North Carolina Roots of African American Literature: An Anthology, Chapel Hill, North Carolina: University of North Carolina Press.
  • Baham, Eva, 1997, “Anna Julia Haywood Cooper, a stream cannot rise higher than its source: The vanguard as the panacea for the plight of black America”, PhD dissertation, Purdue University, 1997.
  • Baker-Fletcher, Karen, 1994, A Singing Something: Anna Julia Cooper and the Foundations of Womanist Theology, New York: Crossroads.
  • Bernasconi, Robert, 2000. The Idea of Race, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company
  • Bonnick, Lemah, 2007, “In the Service of Neglected People: Anna Julia Cooper, Ontology, and Education”, Philosophical Studies in Education, 38: 179–198.
  • Boyd, A. E., (ed.)., 2009, Wielding the Pen: Writings on Authorship by American Women of the Nineteenth Century, Baltimore: John Hopkins University Press.
  • Browne, Errol Tsekani, 2008, “Anna Julia Cooper and Black Women’s Intellectual Tradition: Race, Gender and Nation in the Making of a Modern Race Woman, 1892–1925”, PhD dissertation, University of California Los Angeles.
  • Carby, Hazel, 1987, Reconstruction Womanhood: The Emergence of the Afro-American Woman Novelist, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Chateauvert, Melinda, 1990, “The Third Step: Anna Julia Cooper and Black Education in the District of Columbia, 1910–1960”, in Black Women in United States History, The Twentieth Century, Volume 5, Hine, Darlene Clark, (ed.), Brooklyn: Carlson, pages 261–276.
  • Evans, Stephanie, 2007, Black Women in the Ivory Tower, 1850–1954: An Intellectual History, Gainesville: University of Florida Press.
  • Evans, Stephanie Y., 2009, “African American Women Scholars and International Research: Dr. Anna Julia Cooper’s Legacy of Study Abroad”, Frontiers: The Interdisciplinary Journal of Study Abroad, 18: 77–100.
  • Finlay, B., 2007, Before the Second Wave: Gender in the Sociological Tradition, Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson Prentice Hall.
  • Gabel, Leona C., 1982, From Slavery to the Sorbonne and Beyond: The Life and Writings of Anna J. Cooper, Northampton, MA: Smith College.
  • Gasman, Marybeth, 1999. “The Presidency of Charles S. Johnson at Fisk University as a Model for Collaboration between Philanthropy and Black Higher Education, 1946-1956,” in Research Reports from the Rockefeller Archive Center, Spring 1999.
  • Gates, H. L., and Jarrett, G. A., (eds.)., 2007, The New Negro: Readings on Race, Representation, and African American Culture, 1892–1938, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Gautier, A., 2006, African American Women’s Writings in the Woman’s Building Library, Libraries and Culture, 41 (1): 55–81.
  • Giddings, Paula, 1984/1996, When and Where I Enter: The Impact of Black Women on Race and Sex in America, New York: W. Marrow.
  • Giles, M. S., 2004, Special Focus: Dr. Anna Julia Cooper, 1858–1964: Teacher, Scholar, and Timeless Womanist, The Journal of Negro Education, 75 (4): 621–634.
  • Gillman, S. K., and Weinbaum, A. E., (eds.), 2007, Next to the Color Line: Gender, Sexuality, and W.E.B. Du Bois, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Glass, K. L., 2005, “Tending to the Roots: Anna Julia Cooper’s Sociopolitical Thought and Activism”, Meridians, 6 (1): 23–55.
  • Glass, K. L., 2006, Courting Communities: Black Female Nationalism and “Syncre-Nationalism” in the Nineteenth-Century North, New York: Routledge.
  • Gordon, Jane, 2007, “Failures of Language and Laughter: Anna Julia Cooper and Contemporary Problems of Humanistic Pedagogy”, Philosophical Studies in Education, 38: 163–178.
  • Gordon, Lewis R., 2008, An Introduction to Africana Philosophy, (Cambridge Introductions to Philosophy), New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gordon, Lewis, 2008a, “Anna Julia Cooper and the Problem of Value”, in An Introduction to Africana Philosophy, (Cambridge Introductions to Philosophy), New York: Cambridge University Press, pages 69–73.
  • Harrison, B. C., 2002, “Diasporadas: Black Women and the Fine Art of Activism”, Meridians, 2 (2): 163–184.
  • Hutchinson, Louise Daniel, 1981, Anna Julia Cooper: A Voice from the South, Washington, D.C.: Smithsonian Institution Press.
  • James, Joy, 1996, Transcending the Talented Tenth: Black Leaders and American Intellectuals, New York: Routledge.
  • Johnson, Karen, 2000, Uplifting the Women and the Race: The Lives, Educational Philosophies and Social Activism of Anna Julia Cooper and Nannie Helen Burroughs, New York: Garland Publishers.
  • Keller, F. R., 1999, “An Educational Controversy: Anna Julia Cooper’s Vision of Resolution”, NWSA Journal, 11 (3): 49–67.
  • Lemert, C. C., 2007, Thinking the Unthinkable: The Riddles of Classical Social Theories, Boulder: Paradigm Publishers.
  • May, Vivian M., 2007, Anna Julia Cooper, Visionary Black Feminist: A Critical Introduction, New York: Routledge.
  • May, V. M., 2008, “‘It Is Never A Question of the Slaves’: Anna Julia Cooper’s Challenge to History’s Silences in Her 1925 Sorbonne Thesis”, Callaloo, 31 (3): 903–918.
  • Rogers, E. E., 2005, “Afritics from Margin to Center: Theorizing the Politics of African American Women as Political Leaders”, Journal of Black Studies, 35 (6): 701–714.
  • Simeon-Jones, K., 2010, Literary and Sociopolitical Writings of the Black Diaspora in the Nineteenth and Twentieth Century, Lanham, Maryland: Lexington Books.
  • Staton-taiwo, S. L., 2004, “The Effect of Cooper’s A Voice From the South in WEB Du Bois’ Souls and Black Flame Trilogy”, Philosophia Africana, 7 (2): 59–80.
  • Upton, J. N., and Maples, R. L., 2002, “Multiculturalism: Toward a New Understanding of Nationality”, in Bailey, A., (ed.), Community, Diversity, and Difference: Implications for Peace, New York: Rodopi, pages 117–131.
  • Vogel, T., 2004, Rewriting White: Race, Class, and Cultural Capital in Nineteenth-Century America, New Brunswick, New Jersey: Rutgers University Press.
  • Warren-Christian, Christiane, 2003, “Anna Julia Cooper: Feminist and Scholar”, PhD dissertation, Drew University.
  • Washington, M. H., 1987, “Anna Julia Cooper: The Black Feminist Voice of the 1980s”, Legacy, 4 (2): 3–15.
  • Weiss, P. A., 2009, Canon Fodder: Historical Women Political Thinkers, University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.


  • Howard University, Moorland-Spingarn Research Center (Washington, D.C.), Anna Julia Cooper Collection
  • Oberlin College, Anna Julia Cooper Alumni File. RG 28, Box 206, Oberlin College Archives

Other Internet Resources


Many thanks to Beverly Guy-Sheftall, Vivan M. May, Joycelyn Moody, Shirley Moody-Turner, Jacqueline Scott, and Ronald R. Sundstrom for helpful comments and feedback on this entry.

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Kathryn T. Gines <>

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