Aristotle on Non-contradiction

First published Fri Feb 2, 2007; substantive revision Fri Jun 12, 2015

According to Aristotle, first philosophy, or metaphysics, deals with ontology and first principles, of which the principle (or law) of non-contradiction is the firmest. Aristotle says that without the principle of non-contradiction we could not know anything that we do know. Presumably, we could not demarcate the subject matter of any of the special sciences, for example, biology or mathematics, and we would not be able to distinguish between what something is, for example a human being or a rabbit, and what it is like, for example pale or white. Aristotle's own distinction between essence and accident would be impossible to draw, and the inability to draw distinctions in general would make rational discussion impossible. According to Aristotle, the principle of non-contradiction is a principle of scientific inquiry, reasoning and communication that we cannot do without.

Aristotle's main and most famous discussion of the principle of non-contradiction occurs in Metaphysics IV (Gamma) 3–6, especially 4. There are also snippets of discussion about the principle of non-contradiction early in the corpus, for example in De Interpretatione, and there is the obscure chapter 11 of Posterior Analytics I, but none of these rival Aristotle's treatment of the principle of non-contradiction in Metaphysics IV. The discussion below mostly concerns the main interpretative and philosophical issues that arise from reading Metaphysics IV 3–6.

Aristotle's discussion of the principle of non-contradiction also raises thorny issues in many areas of modern philosophy, for example, questions about what we are committed to by our beliefs, the relationship between language, thought and the world, and the status of transcendental arguments. Arguments from conflicting appearances have proved remarkably long-lived, and debates about skepticism, realism and anti-realism continue to this day.

1. Three Versions of the Principle of Non-Contradiction

There are arguably three versions of the principle of non-contradiction to be found in Aristotle: an ontological, a doxastic and a semantic version. The first version concerns things that exist in the world, the second is about what we can believe, and the third relates to assertion and truth. The first version (hereafter, simply PNC) is usually taken to be the main version of the principle and it runs as follows: “It is impossible for the same thing to belong and not to belong at the same time to the same thing and in the same respect” (with the appropriate qualifications) (Metaph IV 3 1005b19–20). The following are some of those qualifications: The “same thing” that belongs must be one and the same thing and it must be the actual thing and not merely its linguistic expression. Also, the thing that belongs must belong actually, and not merely potentially, to its bearer.

The second version is as follows: “It is impossible to hold (suppose) the same thing to be and not to be (Metaph IV 3 1005b24 cf.1005b29–30).” Although this version is ambiguous as it stands, it is best understood as the claim that it is impossible to hold the same thing to be F and not to be F &c.

As a descriptive account of human psychology, this may seem implausible. People surely have inconsistent beliefs; indeed, most of us have many inconsistent beliefs. This is especially true if we take into account the consequences of our beliefs. Must one, though, believe the consequences of one's beliefs? These remain difficult issues in modern philosophy of language and epistemology. Can one knowingly believe an outright contradiction? Heraclitus, for instance, seems to say contradictory things. Here, Aristotle might retort, and he does so retort with respect to Heraclitus, that people can utter such words, but cannot really believe what they are saying (Metaph IV 3 1005b23–26).

An alternate way of understanding the second formulation is to treat it not as a descriptive claim about human psychology, but as a normative claim, a claim about what it is rational to believe. On this view, it is not that one cannot believe that x is F and not F &c, but that one cannot rationally do so.

It is not completely clear how Aristotle understands the second formulation. At the end of Metaphysics IV 3, Aristotle gives a bad argument that the doxastic version rests on the ontological version, confusing belief that not p with not having the belief that p.

There is a further problem with this second formulation. We need to distinguish the possibility of believing that x is F and not F in a particular case from the possibility of disbelieving the first version of PNC in its full generality.

The third version is that “opposite assertions cannot be true at the same time” (Metaph IV 6 1011b13–20). As it stands, this version is neutral about the internal structure of the assertion, but Aristotle assumes that any assertion involves predicating one thing of another. As with the second formulation, one might give a psychologistic interpretation, relating to what people actually do affirm and deny, but the idea that opposite assertions cannot be true at the same time suggests that this third version is better interpreted as a variant of the first formulation.

Which version Aristotle intends to establish is a matter of controversy. He could be establishing the second version on the basis of the first, or the first version on the basis of the second, or just the second version.

2. The Peculiar Status of the Principle of Non-Contradiction

Aristotle says that PNC is one of the common axioms, axioms common to all the special sciences. It has no specific subject matter, but applies to everything that is. It is a first principle and also the firmest principle of all. Like modus ponens, as Lewis Carroll memorably showed, PNC does not function as a premise in any argument. Unlike modus ponens, PNC is not a rule of inference. Aristotle says that it is a principle which “is necessary for anyone to have who knows any of the things that are” (Metaph IV 3 1005b15). It is no mere hypothesis.

Aristotle explains that, given its peculiar status as the firmest first principle, PNC is not susceptible to demonstration. A demonstration is a deductive argument, the conclusion of which is deduced from firmer, prior premises. It follows that if PNC could be deduced from another premise, then that premise would have to be a firmer and prior principle, with the result that PNC could not have been the firmest first principle. Aristotle also says that if PNC could be demonstrated, then everything would be subject to demonstration, which would lead to an infinite regress. Therefore demonstration is ruled out, and one must be wary of reconstructions of Aristotle's discussion in terms of ordinary deductive arguments. Anyone asking for a deductive argument for PNC, as Aristotle points out, is missing the point, or, rather, is asking for something that is impossible without using PNC. You cannot engage in argument unless you rely on PNC. Anyone who claims to reject PNC “for the sake of argument” is similarly misguided.

Given the impossibility of deducing PNC from anything else, one might expect Aristotle to explain the peculiar status of PNC by comparing it with other logical principles that might be rivals for the title of the firmest first principle, for example his version of the law of excluded middle—for any x and for any F, it is necessary either to assert F of x or to deny F of x. Instead, Aristotle defies others to find a prior principle (Metaph IV 4 1006a10–11). For modern philosophers, it is still an interesting question whether PNC is prior to other principles of logic, or, indeed, to the notions of truth, reference and identity. PNC assumes the notion of identity: It is impossible for (one and) the same thing to belong and not to belong to (one and) the same thing at (one and) the same time &c. PNC is presupposed by Leibniz's law, which states that if x and y are discernible (if one has a property that the other lacks), then x is not identical with y.

3. The Elenctic Method and Transcendental Arguments

Although PNC is not subject to demonstration, it is subject to “elenctic refutation” according to Aristotle. The “elenchus” refers to the Socratic method of argument. When Socrates uses the elenchus, he gets his opponent to refute himself out of his own mouth. The opponent makes a proposal that is shown to conflict with other claims to which he agrees. To be consistent, the opponent must give up one of these claims, and he usually abandons the original proposal. This is the method of reductio ad absurdum familiar to ancient Greek geometers and modern formal logicians and mathematicians.

The idea of using an elenchus is at first sight very puzzling. The person claiming to reject PNC is not being consistent and apparently does not want to be. Aristotle is not trying to catch the opponent in a formal contradiction. The opponent purportedly does not care about that, and it would be begging the question. Instead, Aristotle's trick is to draw the opponent into saying something, without making a complete statement, that shows that he does accept that x is F and is not at the same time not F, in spite of the words he previously said. In other words, Aristotle needs to show that his opponent is committed to at least one thing that is not contradictory. The Socratic method is turned on its head.

It has long been noted that Aristotle is here assuming that his opponent takes the very strong position that for any x and for any F, it is possible for F to belong and not to belong to x at the same time in the same respect &c. Later he says that he is glad to have stamped out the view according to which we do not have anything definite in our thinking (Metaph IV 4 1009a3–5).

Aristotle's “elenctic refutation” has been fruitfully compared to a Kantian transcendental argument. Transcendental arguments generally run as follows: If certain aspects of experience or thinking are possible, the world must be a certain way. Since these aspects of experience or thinking do exist, the world is a certain way. These aspects of our experience or thinking presuppose that the world is a certain way. That the world is a certain way explains these aspects of our experience or thinking and not the other way round. On this interpretation, Aristotle would be arguing that the world conforms to PNC, or that PNC is true, because it is presupposed by and explains the opponent's ability to say something significant.

Transcendental arguments are controversial. One controversy surrounds the precise content of their conclusions and what exactly is presupposed. Should one conclude that the world must be a certain way or merely that we have to think that it is a certain way, in order to have the experience and thoughts at issue? The modern debate finds its counterpart in debate among scholars about what Aristotle is aiming to do in his elenctic discussion. There are two main possibilities. Aristotle may be aiming to show that the ontological version of the principle of non-contradiction is true, or he may be aiming to show merely that it cannot be disbelieved.

4. Aristotle's Challenge to the Opponent to Signify Some One Thing

Aristotle challenges the opponent to signify some one thing both to himself and to another, for example, “human being”. Aristotle explains that the word chosen by the opponent can have several meanings, provided one definition can be assigned to each and each definition is assigned a different word. Aristotle says that the word may not have infinitely many meanings. Perhaps this is because otherwise the opponent can keep on saying that we have not yet reached the meaning she has in mind, or perhaps Aristotle envisages infinitely branching meanings, so that we will never arrive at anything definite.

Aristotle next draws a distinction between “signifying” and “signifying about”. The opponent needs to do both and not merely signify about. One can signify about something by saying “pale (thing)”, but that does not tell you what you are signifying, e.g., a human being. “Human being” both signifies about and signifies a human being. If “human being” means something definite, for example, “two-footed animal” (Aristotle's dummy definition), then, Aristotle concludes, it is impossible that the same thing be a human being and not be a human being. (For a parallel discussion, see Posterior Analytics I 22.)

On such an account, Aristotle is showing the opponent that if she wants to reject PNC she must pick out the same object and say that contradictory predicates apply, but if she does not mean anything definite by “human being”, for example, then she will be unable to pick out a subject of predication, for example, a human being, and say that contradictory predicates apply. Saying that an individual human being is a human being and not a human being, where the first means “two-footed animal” and the latter means something different is not to reject PNC. That is why the opponent must pick a particular word with a definite meaning.

On an alternative account, Aristotle is merely talking about kinds. “Pale (thing)” does not signify a kind, whereas “human being” does. Signifying one thing does not involve signifying an individual who is a member of a kind, but simply one kind.

The details of the argument are controversial. Is it meant to be generalizable across the board so that it would work for things that are not substances, for example, qualities like redness? Aristotle elsewhere says that the sweet is necessarily so (Metaph IV 5 1010b24–6). Must the opponent say something that names a natural kind? What if the opponent says “animal”, naming a genus rather than a species? What if the opponent says “goatstag”, something that does not exist? Does the distinction between “signifying” and “signifying about” necessarily lead to subjects that are individuals (for example, individual human beings or horses) and their properties? Here, we run into the issue of Aristotelian essentialism.

5. The Role of Aristotelian Essentialism

Aristotelian essentialism is the view that there exist what modern philosophers would treat as natural kinds, for example, human beings, horses and acanthus plants. Individuals belonging to these kinds have essential natures that are definable. These individuals cannot survive a change in essence, but they can survive a change in their accidental properties. There is a difference between dying and dyeing one's hair. When a human being ceases to be a human being, she dies. By contrast, when her hair is dyed a different color, she survives. In an earlier work, Aristotle distinguishes essence, for example the necessary property of being rational for a human being, from accident, for example, being asleep, and from distinctive properties, those necessary properties that are explained by rationality but are not part of the human essence, for example, the capacity to learn a language (Topics I 5). It is a puzzling feature of the argument of Metaphysics IV 4 that distinctive properties are not explicitly mentioned.

Aristotle says that those who refuse to take up the challenge to signify one thing “do away with substance and essence. For they must say that all attributes are accidents, and that there is no such thing as ‘being essentially a human being’ or ‘an animal’” (Metaph IV 4 1007a20–23). According to Aristotle, then, those who claim to reject PNC are rejecting Aristotelian essentialism. Aristotle connects “merely signifying about” with denoting an accident, and “signifying” with denoting the bearer of an accident, the bearer being a substance. If the opponent refuses to “signify”, she is left with accidents.

Next, Aristotle tries to put Humpty Dumpty together again: Accidents cannot be predicated of accidents, but they must be predicated of something. For example, if there are accidents such as the musical or the pale, these cannot be predicated of one another, so they need a subject with an essential nature to be predicated of, for example, Socrates, a human being. While Socrates is pale and musical, the pale is not musical, nor the musical pale, unless all this means is that Socrates is pale and musical. Nor does a collection of accidents—the pale, the musical and so on—add up to one subject like Socrates. Nor does it tell us what Socrates is, a human being. Accidents need subjects and subjects that are substances and have an essential nature, and, if that is the case, essentialism is reinstated and PNC applies after all.

According to Aristotle, if the opponent refuses to speak, he is no better off than a vegetable. While this may seem to be merely ill-tempered abuse, it has a serious side. If the opponent rejects PNC and essentialism, then he cannot explain why he is not a vegetable. Aristotelian essentialism, if correct, applies to oneself as well as to other things in the world. At first sight, it is not clear why the PNC-opponent is left with a picture of anything. But perhaps that is Aristotle's point. Aristotle gives the PNC-opponent a world in which accidents can be linked up in any way he likes. Anything goes in such a world, or nothing goes, depending on his taste. Alternatively, as Aristotle puts it, “all things will be one” (Metaph IV 4 1007a19).

Aristotle is arguing that the rejection of PNC leads to the rejection of Aristotelian essentialism, and the acceptance of Aristotelian essentialism leads to the acceptance of PNC. A controversial question is whether Aristotle is also arguing that the acceptance of PNC necessarily goes hand in hand with the acceptance of Aristotelian essentialism. If Aristotle is claiming that to signify something is to signify a bearer that has an essential nature, this would lead to the acceptance of both PNC and some form of essentialism. The argument itself does not rule out Platonic forms as the bearers, or momentary objects, or numbers. Nevertheless, the argument could be supplemented by Aristotle's arguments elsewhere against Platonic forms, and his distinctions between different types of change in the world.

6. The Principle of Non-Contradiction and Action

Aristotle notes that even if the opponent fails to speak, she must still act, and if she acts in a certain way, that shows that she thinks that things in the world are one way rather than another, and that some courses of action are better than others. That is why people do not walk into wells or over precipices, and it shows that people think it better not to walk into a well or over a precipice than to do so. Their actions show that they have beliefs that conform to PNC.

In response to Aristotle, one might wonder whether it is possible to act merely as if one has certain beliefs, without having them. In Hellenistic philosophy, the question arises whether the skeptic can live his skepticism, and in modern philosophy the parallel question arises whether moral anti-realists can act on their theory. If the answer is yes, then all Aristotle will have shown is that we do act as if we are committed to PNC, an answer that falls short of Aristotle's aim in Metaphysics IV 4, whether this is interpreted as to show that PNC is true or to show that PNC is indubitable.

On this view, we are left with a skeptical Humean or pragmatic account. Aristotle's account would be parallel to Hume's skeptical solution to the problem of induction: We just do proceed as if induction is correct, even though we lack any justification for so doing. Or compare Wittgenstein: “..the end is not an unfounded presupposition—It is an unfounded way of acting.” (On Certainty, Section 110).

Is such a view coherent? Here it is appropriate to ask the skeptic what kind of justification she is seeking. The question returns us to the problem of PNC being a first principle for which there is no ordinary proof. Is it possible to act as if one has certain beliefs even though one does not? Here the skeptic owes the non-skeptic some account of “as-if belief” that differs from actual belief. If this is to act following “how things appear to one”, Aristotle is justified in asking whether they can even appear to be F and not F to the same human being at the same time. “As-if belief” may commit one to PNC just as much as actual belief does.

Action is the place where our beliefs collide with the world. If the skeptic is skeptical about beliefs, it is not clear that she can accept that there are actions, as opposed to reflexes and other involuntary movements. Such a PNC-opponent would become a robot, not just a vegetable.

7. The Principle of Non-Contradiction and Proximity to the Truth or the Truth-Like

At the end of chapter 4, Aristotle says that however much things “are so and not so”, there “is a more and a less in the nature of things”, for someone who thinks that four things are five is less wrong than someone who thinks that they are a thousand, and so there must be some truth to which the more true is nearer. He adds that even if there is not some truth to which the more true is nearer, “still there is already something firmer and liker the truth, and we shall have got rid of the unqualified doctrine which would prevent us from having anything definite in our thought” (Metaph IV 4 1009a2–5). He first points out that we can make comparative judgments, even if we do not make absolute judgments, and that comparative judgments presuppose some absolute standard. But even if there is no absolute standard, something truth-like is presupposed and so we will not be prevented from having anything definite in our thought.

One might wonder how much of a concession these points are to Aristotle's opponent. A modern scientific realist would insist that our views merely approximate the truth. But would it be enough that there be something “liker the truth”? It would be interesting to work out the implications of these ideas for Aristotle's essentialism. Would Aristotle be sympathetic to “fuzzy essentialism” or “fuzzy realism”? How much vagueness can Aristotelian realism allow? These are issues about realism that later Hellenistic philosophers and modern philosophers consider in more detail.

8. The Argument from Conflicting Appearances

In chapter 5, Aristotle distinguishes two types of opponent, those who claim to reject PNC for the sake of argument, and those Pre-Socratics who are genuinely perplexed. He now addresses the second type. Anaxagoras and Democritus are led to say that contradictions are true at the same time, because they are confused by change. They see contraries coming into existence out of the same thing, and infer that the same thing must have had contrary properties. Aristotle introduces his distinction between the potential and the actual to dispel their confusion. An object can be potentially F and potentially not F, but it cannot be actually F and actually not F at the same time.

Other philosophers are led by the argument from conflicting appearances to accept conclusions that violate PNC or lead to general scepticism. Aristotle presents the argument as follows:

  1. There are three sorts of cases of conflicting appearances:
    1. Things appear different to different members of the same species, e.g., the same thing is thought bitter by some and sweet by others (Metaph IV 5 1009b2–3).
    2. Things appear different to members of different species (e.g., to other animals and to us) (Metaph IV 5 1009b7–8).
    3. Things do not always appear the same even to the senses of the same individual (Metaph IV 5 1009b8–9).
  2. It is not clear which appearances are true and which false (Metaph IV 5 1009b10).
  3. Conclusions:
    1. Nothing is true (Democritus in dogmatic mood, Metaph IV 5 1009b11–12).
    2. (If something is true) it is not clear to us (Democritus in skeptical mood, Metaph IV 5 1009b12).
    3. Everything is just as true as everything else. (This is mentioned as an explanation of premiss 2 at Metaph IV 5 1009b10–11. It is Protagoras's view, as described at the beginning of the chapter.)

In response to this argument, Aristotle concedes most of the first premise. He agrees that things do appear different to different members of different species, to different members of the same species, and even to the same individual, although he denies that the same thing can appear differently to the same sense of the same individual at the same time (Metaph IV 5 1010b18).

Unlike modern philosophers, Aristotle does not attack the inference from premises 1 and 2 to the conclusions in 3. Instead, he attacks premise 2. If the attack is successful, he will have knocked down all three conclusions at the same time. Aristotle's attack on premise 2 does not rest on accepting a majority verdict. Aristotle appears to accept his opponents' argument that, in cases like 1a, where things appear different to different members of the same species, majority decision is not an appropriate criterion for truth, because if the majority were ill or mad, the minority would be thought to be in that condition. He argues instead that people are not really confused as to whether magnitudes and colors are such as appear to those at a distance or those nearby, or whether what appears to the weak or strong is heavier or whether what appears to one asleep or awake is true. Once awake, a person in Libya is not confused about whether his dreams of Athens or his waking experiences are true; he does not start out for the odeon. Therefore, according to Aristotle, people do not really find it unclear which appearances to take as true.

Aristotle extends his discussion to opinions, arguing that not all opinions are equally authoritative. Aristotle points out that when it comes to questions about our future health, the opinion of the physician is not on a par with a lay person. Nor are our senses equally authoritative on the same subject matter. Each sense is authoritative about its own special objects. For example, sight, and not taste, is the authority on color, but taste, and not sight, is the authority on flavor (Metaph IV 5 1010b11–17). According to Aristotle, then, it is far from unclear which appearances, or whose opinions, are to be trusted in cases of conflict. Those who profess to deny this, show, by their own actions, presumably by trusting only their waking appearances when they are awake, and by consulting a physician when they are ill and so on, that they believe quite the reverse. Therefore, according to Aristotle, the second premise of the argument from conflicting appearances is false, and so the argument fails.

Aristotle has not had the last word. The skeptics of Hellenistic times made much of arguments from conflicting appearances, and modern philosophers continue to discuss their efficacy, especially in the field of ethics.

9. Protagoras, Heraclitus, and Plato's Theaetetus

At the beginning of Metaphysics IV 5, Aristotle says that PNC stands and falls with the doctrine of Protagoras, that each individual human being is the measure of all things. In his Theaetetus 151–183, Plato argues that Theaetetus, who holds that knowledge is nothing but perception, is committed to Protagoras's view via an argument from conflicting appearances. If the wind appears cold to you but hot to me and knowledge is nothing but perception, then we must both be correct, as Protagoras says.

Plato goes on to argue that Protagoras is committed to the view that nothing is anything in itself (otherwise one might be wrong about how it really is) and to a “secret” Heraclitean doctrine of flux. In order to accommodate more and more conflicting appearances, and to avoid violating PNC, more and more flux is needed, until we reach a radical version of Heraclitus's doctrine according to which everything is “so and not so” (Tht 183), with accompanying difficulties for ordinary language. The extended argument also contains a mini-argument, a “self-refutation”, where Plato draws the “exquisite” conclusion that Protagoras refutes himself if he agrees that other people disagree with his own view (Tht 171A-D). If they are right, then he must be wrong!

The details of Plato's argument, the fairness and the success of his strategy against Theaetetus and Protagoras are matters of some controversy. A recent point of contention is whether Plato's Protagoras is committed to a view of “relative truth” instead of flux, and how far Aristotle's Protagoras is similar. What is less controversial is that elements of Plato's discussion re-surface in Aristotle's Metaphysics IV. Aristotle's opponents are said to believe that knowledge is perception because they think that what they perceive is all that exists, and they are also said to be impressed by arguments from conflicting appearances. The thesis that knowledge is perception and an argument from conflicting appearances lead to Protagoras's view in Plato's Theaetetus. In Metaphysics IV 5, Aristotle agrees with Plato that Protagoras's view and the suggestion that everything is “so and not so” (an expression echoed by Aristotle earlier at Metaph IV 4 1006a30–31) go hand in hand. The Protagoras of Plato's Theaetetus and the PNC-opponent in Metaphysics IV 4 are said to be committed to the thesis that nothing is anything in itself, understood by Aristotle to mean that everything is accidental.

While Aristotle does not saddle Heraclitus himself with the rejection of PNC, he notes that Heraclitus's followers thought that there is so much change in the world that it is impossible to say anything true, and so Cratylus, one of their number, was reduced to wagging his finger. Cratylus was mistaken, according to Aristotle, because there is no radical flux. When things change, something persists, and even if the quantity of a thing is not constant, we know each thing by what sort of thing it is. Presumably, even if its water is constantly flowing, we can still identify a river. Aristotle points out that if there were radical flux, this would be tantamount to everything being at rest, so the idea of radical flux is contradictory.

One way to think of Aristotle's strategy in Metaphysics IV is as the reverse of Plato's. If the PNC-opponent says something significant, for example, the beginning of Protagoras's doctrine of the measure, “human being”, then she is committed to denying the thesis that nothing is anything in itself, and to accepting a non-Protagorean view. On this interpretation of Aristotle's strategy, at least two puzzling features in Aristotle's discussion are resolved, why he appears to be addressing someone who claims the contrary, and not the contradictory of PNC, and how Aristotle can argue from the second version of the principle of non-contradiction to the first. Since Plato's Protagorean is forced to reject PNC across the board, Aristotle's Protagorean PNC-skeptic would be an opponent who claims the contrary, not merely the contradictory, of PNC. In addition, a Protagorean PNC-skeptic, who accepts that “as things appear to one, so they are” would have to be impressed by an argument that shows that things cannot appear to him in a way that would violate PNC. On his own view, showing that PNC is indubitable would also show that it is true.

At this point, one might wonder if Protagoras can turn the tables on Aristotle. Certainly, to a Protagorean, showing that PNC is indubitable would show that it is true, but it also assumes his own view, that how things appear is how they are! Does Aristotle or Protagoras win? The same can be asked of the “exquisite” argument of Plato's Theaetetus. Is Protagoras's view refuted or confirmed? The Stoic Chrysippus apparently wrote a whole book, now lost, on such table-turning arguments.

A further question surrounds the formulation of Protagoras's own view. In Metaphysics IV 6, Aristotle explains how a Protagorean PNC-skeptic ought to present his view so as to avoid violating PNC: “those who seek to be compelled by argument, and at the same time demand to be called to account for their views, must guard themselves by saying that the truth is not that what appears exists, but that what appears exists for him to whom it appears, and when, and to the senses to which, and under the conditions under which it appears.” Otherwise, they will find themselves contradicting themselves (Metaph IV 6 1011a20–25). However, Aristotle still finds fault with this view because it makes everything relative to perception, including the perceiver. Not everything can be relative to perception, according to Aristotle. As he explains at the end of the previous chapter, there is something beyond perception that causes the perception and is prior. Aristotle uses his discussion of PNC and Protagoras to stake out a realist position.

10. Aristotle's Conclusion

At the end of chapter 6, Aristotle concludes, “Let this, then suffice to show (1) that the firmest belief is that opposite assertions are not true at the same time, (2) what happens to those who speak in this way and (3) why people do speak in this way (Metaph IV 6 1011b13–15). ”

On the first point, as we saw, it is controversial whether Aristotle's conclusion that the firmest belief is a belief in PNC carries with it the presupposition that PNC is true, a presupposition that is needed for his own project of first philosophy. On the third point, Aristotle discusses views about perception and change that lead people to say that they reject PNC. On the second point, Aristotle shows that those who say that they reject PNC do not really do so, or, if they do, they will be giving up intelligible discourse and action, and—one might add—they will be living in a world of mere sophistry and power. It is controversial how much of an essentialist or indeed realist view one must accept if one accepts PNC, but it is clear that PNC is essential for the project of an Aristotelian science. Without it, Aristotle notes, beginners in philosophy who are interested in the truth would be off on a wild goose chase (Metaph IV 5 1009b36–8). Acceptance of PNC, then, may also have ethical implications.

11. A Note on Dialetheism and Paraconsistency

Aristotle's account of the PNC has been challenged anew by modern-day dialetheists, who hold that there are some true contradictions, and that Aristotle's discussion fails to show otherwise. Moreover, some modern logicians, who need not be dialetheists, think that logic can be paraconsistent, i.e., that, contrary to classical logic, one contradiction need not lead to an explosion where anything goes. While Aristotle is obviously not a dialetheist, it is not clear where he stands on the issue of paraconsistency in Metaph IV. Although Aristotle does claim that if his opponent rejects PNC across the board, she is committed to a world in which anything goes, he never argues that if (per impossibile) his opponent is committed to one contradiction, she is committed to anything, and he even considers that the opponent's view might apply to some statements but not to others (Metaph IV 4 1008a10–12). However one understands these passages, in the Prior Analytics, Aristotle does commit himself to the view that syllogistic is paraconsistent (APr. II 15 64a15).

12. Posterior Analytics I 11

This is an intriguing and relatively neglected text. At first sight it looks as if Aristotle is presenting a valid argument that includes contradictions as some of the premises, which would be surprising given his account of PNC in Metaphysics IV. However, the text is even more obscure than usual.

There are two basic interpretations. According to one interpretation, Aristotle does indeed include contradictions, but these are idle and play no real logical role in the argument he presents. According to the other interpretation, following Aquinas's commentary (lecture 20), Aristotle is not claiming that Callias both is and is not Callias or that he is and is not a human being, for example, but that the term “animal”covers Callias and those who are not Callias and not human beings, as Aristotle himself explains when he says that the major term (“animal”) is more extensive than the middle term (“human”). (In the syllogism All As are Bs; All Bs are Cs; therefore All As are Cs, “A” is the major term and “B” is the middle term.)

There are difficulties with both interpretations. Aristotle starts by saying that no demonstration assumes PNC unless it concludes that x is F and not not-F. According to the first interpretation, Aristotle's explanation about the major and middle term is unnecessary. However, according to the second interpretation, the relationship between Aristotle's main point and his comments about PNC is obscure. The text invites further elucidation.


Selected Primary Texts, Translations and Commentaries


  • Ackrill, J. L., 1963. Translation and commentary. Aristotle's Categories and De Interpretatione. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Barnes, J., 1975. Translation with notes. Aristotle's Posterior Analytics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1984. The Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation. Princeton: Princeton University Press, vols 1 and 2.
  • –––, 1994. Translation with notes. Aristotle's Posterior Analytics. 2nd edition. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Irwin, T. H. and Fine, G., 1995. Translation with introduction, notes and glossary. Aristotle: Selections. Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Jaeger, W., 1951. Aristotelis Metaphysica. Oxford Classical Text. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kirwan, Christopher, 1993. Translation with notes. Aristotle's Metaphysics Books Gamma, Delta and Epsilon. 2nd edition. Oxford:Clarendon Press.
  • Madigan, Arthur S. J., 1993. Translation. Alexander of Aphrodisias: On Aristotle's Metaphysics 4, with appendix by Richard Sorabji. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Minio-Paluello, L. (ed.), 1949. Aristotelis Categoriae et Liber De Interpretatione. Oxford Classical Text. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Ross, W. D., 1923. Greek text and commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics,, vols 1 and 2. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1928. Translation of Aristotle's Metaphysics. 2nd edition. For example, in Richard McKeon (ed.) The Basic Works of Aristotle. New York: Random House, 1941.
  • Ross, W.D. (ed.), 1958. Aristotelis Topica et Sophistici Elenchii. Oxford Classical Text. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1964. Aristotelis Analytica et Posteriora, with preface and appendix by L. Minio-Paluello. Oxford Classical Text. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Rowan, J., 1961. Translation. Saint Thomas Aquinas's Commentary on the Metaphysics of Aristotle. Chicago: H. Regnery Co.


  • Burnet, J. (ed.), 1900. Platonis Opera I: Euthyphro, Apologia, Crito, Phaedo, Cratylus, Theaetetus, Sophista, Politicus. Oxford Classical Text. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Burnyeat, M.F., 1990. The Theaetetus of Plato. Translation by M.J. Levett, revised by M.F. Burnyeat, and an introduction by M. F. Burnyeat. Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett.
  • Duke, E. A., Hicken, W. F., Nicoll, W. S. M., Robinson, D. B., and Strachan, J.C.G. (eds.), 1995. Platonis Opera I: Euthyphro, Apologia, Crito, Phaedo, Cratylus, Theaetetus, Sophista, Politicus. Oxford Classical Text. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • McDowell, John, 1973. Translation with notes. Plato's Theaetetus. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Selected Secondary Literature

  • Annas, Julia, 1986. “Doing without Objective Values: Ancient and Modern Strategies,” In Malcolm Schofield and Gisela Striker (eds.) The Norms of Nature: Studies in Hellenistic Ethics, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press, 3–29.
  • Annas, Julia and Barnes, Jonathan, 1985. The Modes of Scepticism: Ancient Texts and Modern Interpretations, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2000. Translation. Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Scepticism, 2nd Edition. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Anscombe, G. E. M., 1967. “Aristotle,” In G.E.M. Anscombe and P.T. Geach. Three Philosophers, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Anscombe, G. E. M. and Von Wright, G. H. (eds.), 1969. Wittgenstein: On Certainty, Evanston: Harper and Row.
  • Aquinas, Thomas. Commentarium in libros Posteriorum Analyticorum, in Opera Omnia, Rome: Vatican Polyglot Press, Volume 1, 1882, Leonine Edition.
  • Baltzly, Dirk, 1999. “Aristotle and Platonic Dialectic in Metaphysics, Gamma 4,” in Shiner 1999.
  • Barnes, Jonathan, 1969. “The Law of Contradiction,” Philosophical Quarterly, 19: 302–9.
  • Bett, Richard, 2000. Pyrrho, his Antecedents and his Legacy, Oxford: Clarendon Press (pbk, 2003), especially ch. 3.
  • Bett, Richard (ed.), 2010. The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Scepticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bostock, David, 1988. Plato's Theaetetus, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Brinkmann, Klaus, 1994. “Commentary on Gottlieb,” Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy, Vol. VIII: 199–208.
  • Broadie, Sarah Waterlow, 1977. “Protagoras and Inconsistency: Theaetetus 171a6-c7,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 59: 22–36.
  • Burnyeat, M.F., 1969. “Conflicting Appearances,” Proceedings of the British Academy, 65: 69–111.
  • Burnyeat, M. F., 1975. “Protagoras and Self-Refutation in later Greek Philosophy,” Philosophical Review, 84: 44–69.
  • –––, 1976. “Protagoras and Self-Refutation in Plato's Theaetetus,” Philosophical Review, 85: 172–95 (reprinted in Epistemology: Companions to ancient thought, I. Stephen Everson (ed.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990).
  • –––, 1983. “Can the sceptic live his scepticism?” In M. F. Burnyeat (ed.) The Sceptical Tradition, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1983.
  • Bury, R. G., 1933. Text and Translation. Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Pyrrhonism, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, vols 1–2.
  • Carroll, Lewis, 1895. “What the Tortoise said to Achilles,” Mind, 4 (14): 278–80. [Reprint available online]
  • Cassin, B., 1993. “Il senso di Gamma e la strategia di Aristotele contro i Presocratici in Metafisica iv”. Rivista di Filosofia Neo-Scolastica, 85: 533–565.
  • Cassin, B and Narcy, M., 1989. La Décision du Sens, Paris: Librairie Philosophique, J. Vrin.
  • Castagnoli, L., 2010. Ancient Self-Refutation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chappell, Timothy D. J., 2005. Reading Plato's Theaetetus, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Charles, David, 2000. Aristotle on Meaning and Essence, Oxford: Clarendon Press, especially Appendix 1.
  • Code, A., 1986. “Aristotle's investigation of a basic logical principle,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 16(3): 341–358.
  • –––, 2010. “Aristotle and the History of Scepticism,” in Ancient Models of Mind: Studies in Human and Divine Rationality, Nightingale and Sedley (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cohen, S. Marc, 1986. “Aristotle on the Principle of Non-Contradiction,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 16(3): 359–370.
  • Cooper, John M., 2004. “Plato on Sense-Perception and Knowledge (Tht, 184–186),” In John M. Cooper, Knowledge, Nature and the Good: Essays on Ancient Philosophy, Princeton University Press, 2004, 43–64.
  • Cresswell, M. J., 2003. “Non-Contradiction and Substantial Predication,” Theoria, 69: 166–183.
  • Crivelli, Paolo, 2004. Aristotle on Truth, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dancy, R. M., 1975. Sense and Contradiction, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Degnan, Michael J., 1999. “What is the Scope of Aristotle's Defense of the PNC?” In Shiner 1999.
  • Denyer, Nicholas, 1990. Language, Thought and Falsehood in Ancient Greek Philosophy, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Erginel, M., 2009. “Relativism and Self-Refutation in the Theaetetus,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 36: 1–45.
  • Evans, J. D. G., 1974. “Aristotle on Relativism,” Philosophical Quarterly, 24: 193–203.
  • Fine, Gail, 2003. Plato on Knowledge and Forms, New York.: Oxford University Press, especially chs. 6–8.
  • Furth, Montgomery, 1986. “A Note on Aristotle's Principle of Non-Contradiction,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 16 (3): 371–81.
  • Gottlieb, Paula, 1994. “The Principle of Non-Contradiction and Protagoras: The Strategy of Aristotle's Metaphysics IV 4,” Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy, Vol. VIII: 183–209.
  • Halper, Edward, 1984. “Aristotle on the Extension of Non-Contradiction,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 1(4): 369–80.
  • –––, 2009. One and Many in Aristotle's Metaphysics Alpha-Delta, Las Vegas, Nevada: Parmenides, especially ch. 5, sections 5.9–5.10.
  • Husik, I., 1906. “Aristotle on the Law of Contradiction and the Basis of the Syllogism,” Mind, 15: 215–22.
  • Irwin, T. H., 1977. “Aristotle's Discovery of Metaphysics,” Review of Metaphysics, 31: 210–29.
  • –––, 1988. Aristotle's First Principles. Oxford: Oxford University Press, especially ch. 9, sections 98–106.
  • Keeling, Evan, 2013. “Aristotle, Protagoras, and Contradiction: Metaphysics IV 4–6,” Journal of Ancient Philosophy, 7(2): 75–99.
  • Kenny, A J. P., 1967. “The Argument from Illusion in Aristotle's Metaphysics,” Mind, 76: 184–97.
  • Kerferd, G. B., 1949. “Plato's account of the relativism of Protagoras,” University of Durham Journal (New Series), 11(1): 20–26.
  • Lear, Jonathan, 1980. Aristotle and Logical Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1988. Aristotle: the desire to understand, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, especially ch. 6, section 6.4.
  • Lee, Mi-Kyoung, 2005. Epistemology after Protagoras: Responses to Relativism in Plato, Aristotle and Democritus, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2010. “Antecedents in Early Greek Philosophy,” in Bett 2010, 13–35.
  • Lewis, David, 2004. “Letters to Priest and Beall,” In Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb (eds.) 2004, 176-77.
  • Long, A. A., 1981. “Aristotle and the history of Greek scepticism,” In D. J. O. O'Meara (ed.) Studies in Aristotle, Washington D.C: Catholic University of America Press, 1981, 79–106.
  • Łukasiewicz, J., 1910. “Aristotle on the law of contradiction,” In Barnes, J., Schofield, M., and Sorabji, R. (eds.) Articles on Aristotle, vol. 3 Metaphysics. New York: St. Martin's Press, 1979.
  • Mackie, J. L., 1964. “Self-Refutation: a formal analysis,” Philosophical Quarterly, 14: 193–203.
  • Martinich, A. P. (ed.), 2006. The Philosophy of Language, 5th edition. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Meiland, J. W., 1977, “Concepts of Relative Truth,” Monist, 60: 568–82.
  • Moore, F. C. T., 1975. “Evans off Target,” Philosophical Quarterly, 25: 58–9. [A reply to Evans 1974.]
  • Pasquale, Gianluigi, 2005. Aristotle and the Principle of Non-Contradiction, Sankt Augustin: Academica Verlag.
  • Peña, Lorenzo, 1999. “The Coexistence of Contradictory Properties in the Same Subject According to Aristotle,” In Shiner 1999.
  • Priest, Graham, 1998. “To be and not to be—that is the answer. On Aristotle on the Law of Non-Contradiction,” Philosophiegeschichte und Logische Analyse, I: 91–130. [A dialetheist critique.]
  • –––, 2005. Doubt Truth to be a Liar, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Priest, Graham, Beall, J. C. and Bradley Armour-Garb (eds.), 2004. The Law of Non-Contradiction: New Philosophical Essays, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ross, W.D., 1923. Aristotle, London: Methuen and Co.
  • Scholar, M.C., 1971. “Aristotle Metaphysics IV 1010b1–3,” Mind, 80: 266–8. [A reply to Kenny 1967.]
  • Selby-Bigge, L.A. and Nidditch, P.H. (eds.), 1978. Hume's Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals (1777). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Shields, Christopher, 2013, Aristotle (The Routledge Philosophers), London and New York: Routledge, second edition, especially ch. 6, section 6.5.
  • Shiner, R. (ed.), 1999. Apeiron: A Journal for Ancient Philosophy and Science, XXXII (3) – volume devoted to the Law of Non-Contradiction.
  • Siegel, Harvey, 1986. “Relativism, Truth and Incoherence,” Synthése, 68: 225–259.
  • Smith, Robin, 1982. “The Syllogism in Posterior Analytics I,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 64: 113–35.
  • Stern, Robert (ed.), 2003. Transcendental Arguments and Prospects, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Taylor. C. C. W., 1999. The Atomists: Leucippus and Democritus: Fragments: a text and translation with a commentary, Toronto; Buffalo: University of Toronto Press.
  • Thom, Paul, 1999. “The Principle of Non-Contradiction in Early Greek Philosophy,” In Shiner 1999.
  • Wedin, Michael V., 1999. “The Scope of Non-Contradiction: A Note on Aristotle's ‘Elenctic’ Proof in Metaphysics Gamma 4,” In Shiner 1999.
  • –––, 2003. “A Curious Turn in Metaphysics Gamma: Protagoras and Strong Denial of the Principle of Non-Contradiction,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 85 (2): 107–130.
  • –––, 2004. “Aristotle on the Firmness of the Principle of Non-Contradiction,” Phronesis, 49 (3): 225–265.
  • –––, 2004. “On the Use and Abuse of Non-Contradiction: Aristotle's Critique of Protagoras and Heraclitus in Metaphysics Gamma 5,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, XXVI: 213–239.
  • –––, 2005. “Animadversions on Burnyeat's Theaetetus: On the Logic of the Exquisite Argument,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, XXIX: 171–91.
  • Whitaker, C. W. A., 1996. Aristotle's De Interpretatione: Contradiction and Dialectic, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ziglioli, Ugo, 2007. Protagoras and the Challenge of Relativism, Aldershot: Ashgate.

See also the bibliographies of the related entries on Aristotle's Metaphysics and Logic, and Plato's Theaetetus below.

Other Internet Resources


Thanks to Evan Keeling, Anne Veenstra, Emily Fletcher, David Ebrey, and Graham Priest.

Copyright © 2015 by
Paula Gottlieb <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to