Reference is a relation that obtains between certain sorts of representational tokens (e.g., names, mental states, pictures) and objects. For instance, when I assert that “George W. Bush is a Republican,” I use a particular sort of representational token — i.e. the name ‘George W. Bush’— to refer to a particular individual — namely, George W. Bush. While names and other referential terms are hardly the only type of representational token capable of referring, linguistic tokens like these have long stood at the center of philosophical inquiries into the nature of reference. Accordingly, this entry will focus almost entirely on linguistic reference. For more on the reference of mental states, see the entries on causal theories of mental content, externalism about mental content, and teleological theories of mental content. For more on the reference of pictures, see the entry on Goodman's aesthetics.
Proper names are standardly considered a paradigm example of linguistic reference — or, more specifically, a relation that obtains between certain sorts of linguistic expressions and what speakers use those expressions to talk about. Other expressions which are generally considered to be of the referring sort include indexicals like ‘I’, ‘here’, ‘now’, and ‘that’. While it is highly questionable that all words refer, most philosophers of language assume that at least certain sorts of terms (e.g. proper names and indexicals) regularly and reliably do so. It is these sorts of terms that will serve as our primary focus below. Assuming that at least certain sorts of terms do in fact refer, the central question regarding linguistic reference becomes: how do such terms refer? What, in other words, is the ‘mechanism’ of reference? Subsidiary questions concern the relation between reference and meaning, reference and truth, and reference and knowledge. Some philosophers have thought that the nature of reference is able to shed light on important metaphysical or epistemological issues. Other philosophers, however, are less sanguine. Indeed, certain philosophers have gone so far as to deny that reference is a substantive relation, one deserving of serious philosophical scrutiny.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Proper Names
- 3. Indexicals
- 4. Other Terms
- 5. Other Issues: Reference, Reality, and Knowledge
- 6. Negative Views of Reference
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- Related Entries
We use language to talk about the world. Much of what we say about the world appears to be meaningful; some of it, presumably, is even true. For instance, I seem to be saying something true when, in the appropriate sort of setting, I assertively utter:
- George W. Bush is a Republican.
How do we manage to do such things? How, for instance, do I manage to talk about George W. Bush and thereby say meaningful and true things about him? In a word: how do I refer to George W. Bush by means of the name ‘George W. Bush’? Metaphorically, we seem to be able to use language to talk about the world because words, or at least certain types of words, somehow ‘hook on to’ things in the world, things like George W. Bush. Proper names — that is, expressions like ‘George W. Bush’ and ‘Tony Blair’ — are widely regarded as paradigmatic referring expressions. Although it may seem implausible to suppose that all words refer, that all words somehow ‘hook on to’ bits of reality, several different types of words are arguably of the referring sort. These include: proper names, natural kind terms, indexicals, and definite descriptions. Particular issues arise with regard to each of these, and each will be discussed in some detail below.
The central issues, the central questions, concerning reference are four: (i) What is the mechanism of reference? In other words, in virtue of what does a word (of the referring sort) attach to a particular object/individual? (ii) Is there a single mechanism of reference common to all referring terms, or do different sorts terms attach to their referents in virtue of different sorts of things? (iii) What is the relation between reference and meaning? For instance, is the meaning of a word to be identified with the mechanism by which it refers? Or is the meaning of a referential term perhaps best understood as the referent itself? (iv) What is the relation between reference and truth? More specifically, does the reference of a word, or its mechanism of reference, somehow enter into the truth conditions of assertive utterances of sentences containing that word?
The primary focus in this article will be on the first two of these questions, those concerning the mechanism of reference and whether there is a single mechanism common to each sort of referring term. However, as will become evident in what follows, addressing these first two questions will prove to be impossible without addressing the latter two to as well. Theories of proper names will be considered first, in Section 2, as proper names are considered by many to be referring terms par excellence. What's more, the mechanism by which proper names refer is arguably unique to such expressions. Section 3 will focus on indexicals, in large part because the mechanism(s) by which they refer arguably stand in sharp contrast to the case of proper names. As we will see, however, there is at least some reason to doubt the tenability of this contrast. Section 4 will consist of a brief discussion of two further sorts of expressions which are often classified as referring terms — natural kind terms and (singular) definite descriptions — along with several sorts of expressions which are typically not conceived of as referring terms — e.g. quantifiers, prepositions, verbs, and adverbs. Section 5 will canvass some possible connections between both reference and reality and reference and knowledge. Finally, in Section 6, a few words will be said about so-called ‘negative’ views of reference, according to which reference does not constitute a substantive relation between language and reality and is thus not a topic worthy of serious and sustained philosophical inquiry.
Proper names are paradigmatic referring expressions. If, properly speaking, there are such things as referential terms — that is, terms that somehow ‘hook on to’ things in the world — then proper names are surely among those terms. What are proper names? For the purposes of this article, one might think of proper names as at least roughly co-extensive with the sorts of expressions that ordinary (non-philosophically trained) speakers standardly call ‘names’, expressions like ‘George W. Bush’, ‘Barcelona’, and ‘Mount Everest’. What do these expressions have in common? In virtue of what do they constitute a genuine class of linguistic expressions? At least at first glance, these would appear to be syntactically simple expressions that refer, or at least purport to refer, to particular objects/individuals. Thus, ‘George W. Bush’ refers to a particular man, ‘Barcelona’ refers to a particular city, and ‘Mount Everest’ refers to a particular mountain. And even though it is questionable whether expressions such as ‘Santa Claus’ and ‘Sherlock Holmes’ actually refer to anything at all, there can be no doubt that they at least purport to refer: to Santa Claus and Sherlock Holmes, respectively. They are thus to be counted as proper names for present purposes.
There are many theories concerning the means by which proper names refer. We will consider three of the more popular (and plausible) kinds of theories: descriptivist theories, causal theories, and hybrid causal-descriptive theories. Then we will consider two more general issues regarding the reference of names, issues that arise for theorists of any persuasion.
According to descriptivist theories of proper names, a particular use of a proper name refers by means of some descriptive content associated with that name — standardly, it is assumed, via the speaker's association of some descriptive content, in her mind, with the name in question. This descriptive content is thought to uniquely determine the name's referent. When a speaker uses the name ‘N’ and in doing so successfully refers to a particular object or individual x, the descriptivist thus claims (i) that the speaker must be thinking of N as the (unique) F and (ii) that x must in fact be the (unique) F. In other words, the descriptivist theory of proper names posits that referential success hinges on speakers attaching to each name in their repertoire some descriptive content F which uniquely singles out some specific object in the world. Conversely, when speakers neglect to associate a sufficiently precise description with a name, the descriptivist should predict that reference fails.
Classical descriptivists, like Gottlob Frege (1892) and Bertrand Russell (1919), were perfectly willing to acknowledge that the descriptive content in question might vary — sometimes quite markedly — from one speaker to the next. Indeed, according to Russell, such content may vary across time for one and the same speaker. Thus, while I may associate the name ‘Bush’ with the descriptive content the previous U.S. president, Laura Bush may associate the same name with the descriptive content my husband. When Obama is no longer president, my identifying content will no doubt change — perhaps to something like the U.S. president who compromised on the issue of government-funded stem cell research. If George and Laura were to divorce, her identifying descriptive content would no doubt change as well — perhaps to my ex-husband. In either case, the individual referred to by means of the name is determined (or, as it is often put, is ‘picked out’ or ‘fixed’) by the particular descriptive content the speaker associates with that name. Because the descriptive content in question is typically characterized by means of a definite description (an expression of the form the F), such theories are often (even if somewhat misleadingly) known as ‘descriptivist theories’ of proper names.
Much of the appeal of descriptivist theories of proper names stems from the fact that such theories can be naturally expanded into theories of meaning (or ‘semantic content’). When these theories are expanded in this way, they offer some significant advantages when compared to their main competitor, the ‘Millian‘ theory of proper names (after J.S. Mill, 1867). In particular, the descriptivist theory of meaning (as opposed to the more modest descriptivist theory of reference) can easily account for the non-triviality of identity statements involving co-referring names, sentences containing empty names, sentences containing true negative existentials, and propositional attitude reports. In short, the descriptivist theory of meaning not only offers a natural pairing for the descriptivist theory of reference; together, they offer an appealing explanation for a wide variety of linguistic phenomena.
Let us turn now to the sorts of cases that have proved problematic for Millianism — or the thesis that the meaning of a proper name just is the bearer of that name — in order to come to better understand the appeal of descriptivism. Consider the following four sentences:
- Hesperus is Phosphorus.
- Santa Claus lives at the North Pole.
- Vulcan does not exist.
- Fred believes that Cicero, but not Tully, was Roman.
Here is why the Millian view faces problems with these sorts of cases. Suppose (as is in fact the case) that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ refer to the same thing (the planet Venus). Suppose as well that ‘Santa Claus’ and ‘Vulcan’ both lack referents, and that Fred is a perfectly rational agent, and thus not inclined to harbor contradictory beliefs. Then, Millianism would predict that (2), which seems informative, is trivial (since its meaning turns out to be of the form ‘a = a’). It would predict that (3), which seems meaningful, is meaningless (on account of the meaningless subject term). It would predict that the intuitively true and meaningful (4) is absurd (as its meaningfulness presupposes the existence of what it denies exists). And it would predict that (5), which attributes seemingly consistent beliefs to Fred, attributes to him beliefs that no minimally rational agent could possibly entertain (simultaneously) — namely, the beliefs that x was Roman and the belief that one and the very same x was not Roman. Of course, Millians have offered various responses to these concerns. The usual strategy has been to claim that the intuitions surrounding utterances of sentences like (2) through (5) are the result of mistaking what is merely communicated (or implicated) for the proposition literally expressed. Thus, although what is literally expressed by (2) is trivial, what it serves to communicate is not. Although there may be no proposition literally expressed by (3) or (4), propositions can nonetheless be communicated by utterances of those sentences. Finally, although an utterance of (5) is likely to express a falsehood — assuming Fred is a rational agent — such an utterance may nevertheless communicate something true (supposing, for instance, that Fred has two distinct ‘modes of presentation,’ or ways of thinking about, the famous Roman orator).
In contrast to the Millian approach, which involves ‘explaining away’ such wayward intuitions, the descriptivist approach embraces these same intuitions as probative. In particular, the descriptivist might claim (as many such theorists have) that the reference-fixing descriptive content associated with a proper name constitutes the meaning of that name. On such a view, a view that we will call ‘expanded descriptivism’, not only does the description the previous U.S. president determine the reference of the name ‘Bush’ (as I now employ that name), the meaning of this description also constitutes the meaning of that name. So long as we allow that proper names that are co-referring can have different descriptive meanings, then we can account for the informativeness of (2) and for the fact that (5) ascribes consistent beliefs to Fred. Just suppose that the meaning of ‘Hesperus’ is the brightest evening star, the meaning of ‘Phosphorus’ is the brightest morning star. Then (2) expresses the informative claim (or proposition) that the brightest evening star is the brightest morning star. Or suppose that ‘Cicero’ means the most famous ancient orator and ‘Tully’ means the guy called ‘Tully’ by the English. Then (5) ascribes consistent beliefs to Fred: the belief that the most famous ancient orator was Roman and the belief that the guy called ‘Tully’ by the English was not Roman. Moreover, if we allow that proper names that fail to refer may nevertheless have associated descriptive meanings, then we can account for the meaningfulness of sentences like (3) and (4). By claiming that the reference-fixing descriptive content of an expression is its meaning, descriptivist theories of reference are thus able to straightforwardly account for a variety of cases that have proven to be enduringly problematic for Millians.
What's more, Millianism itself — in contrast to its competitor, expanded descriptivism — fails to even begin to address the question: what is the mechanism of reference? While the theory can be supplemented with an answer to this question (by adopting, say, the causal theory of reference discussed in the next section), this pairing may seem less natural than the package offered by the expanded version of descriptivism. Expanded descriptivism offers a tight parallel between the theory of meaning and the theory of reference: a proper name refers to its bearer in virtue of the fact that the name is associated with a certain descriptive content as its meaning, and the fact that this content, in turn, is uniquely satisfied by the name's bearer. Millians, in contrast, can hardly aspire to such theoretical elegance.
The central challenge to the descriptivist theory is that there is reason to suspect that proper names are not semantically equivalent to singular definite descriptions. In contrast to descriptivism, Ruth Barcan Marcus (1961) proposed that we ought to conceive of proper names as ‘tags’. To say that proper names are tags is, for Marcus, to say that they have no linguistic meaning and are therefore not semantically equivalent to any singular description of their referents. Proper names do not, on this sort of view, refer by way of the descriptions they allegedly stand for; they refer directly to their bearers. Marcus's (1961) view thus constitutes a version of what has come to be known as the ‘direct reference’ theory of names. Important consequences of this theory include, as Marcus (1961) notes, the necessity of identity statements between co-referring proper names — something which, though highly intuitive, is not guaranteed by many descriptivist theories of proper names. Other important consequences include the dissolution of puzzles involving substitutivity in modal contexts (Marcus 1993).
Nearly a decade later, Saul Kripke, in a trio of lectures subsequently published as Naming and Necessity (1980), proposed a similar view of proper names. For Kripke, as for Marcus, proper names refer directly, without the mediation of any associated descriptive content. And Kripke, like Marcus before him, makes note of the fact that this sort of view guarantees the necessity of identity statements containing co-referring proper names. However, Kripke articulates his version of the direct reference theory not in terms of the notion of tagging, but in terms of the notion of ‘rigid designation,’ a notion that applies not only to proper names, but to (at least certain sorts of) definite descriptions and to natural kind terms as well.
This brings us to Kripke's three well-known objections to descriptivist theories of proper names (1980). These are: first, the problem of unwanted necessity (sometimes referred to as an ‘epistemic’ problem); second, the problem of rigidity (sometimes referred to as a ‘modal’ problem); and, third, the problem of ignorance and error (sometimes referred to as a ‘semantic’ problem). The first and second problems apply only to expanded descriptivist theories of reference, theories that claim that the meaning of a proper name is its reference-fixing description. The third problem applies to more basic versions of the descriptivism as well, versions that commit only to the weaker claim that the reference of a proper name is determined by the associated descriptive content while eschewing the claim that this content also serves as the name's meaning.
To get these problems more clearly in view, consider assertive utterances of the following sentences:
- Aristotle (if he existed) was a philosopher.
- Aristotle was fond of dogs.
- Einstein was a genius.
Suppose that, for a particular speaker Fred, the definite description that most aptly expresses the meaning of ‘Aristotle’ is the last great philosopher of antiquity. Then, if expanded descriptivism is correct, a sentence like (6) should sound (to Fred at least) trivial, necessary, and analytic. It should sound as trivial, necessary and analytic as “Bachelors are unmarried” or “Squares have four sides,” at least to Fred. But it probably won't; even Fred will probably be willing to admit that Aristotle might never have gone into philosophy. Had things been different, Aristotle might (for instance) have died in infancy or pursued a career in the theater. This is the problem of ‘unwanted necessity.’
Now let's consider just such a possible world: a world in which Aristotle died in infancy. Suppose that this possible world is, in other respects, pretty much like the actual world. And suppose, for the moment, that we adopt the descriptivist theory. Then, sentence (7), as used by English speakers in the actual world, would arguably be true of such a possible world just in case Plato was (in that possible world) fond of dogs! For, given the suppositions in question, Plato would arguably have satisfied the description associated with ‘Aristotle’ (by hypothesis the last great philosopher of antiquity). But it seems intuitively implausible to suppose that the name ‘Aristotle’ — as we in fact use that name in the actual world — could be used to refer to anyone other than its referent in the actual world, namely Aristotle. Of course, had things been relevantly different, the name ‘Aristotle’ might have been used to refer to Plato (say), but given how the name is actually used, it cannot be used by speakers to refer to Plato in this — or any other possible — world in which Plato exists. All this suggests that names are rigid: such that they refer to the same individual in every possible world in which that individual exists. Definite descriptions, in contrast, do not appear to be rigid: the definite description ‘the last great philosopher of antiquity’ might well refer to (or ‘denote’) Plato in a world where Aristotle dies in infancy. This suggests that names are semantically different from descriptions, which in turn suggests that the mechanism by which a name refers cannot be identified with some definite description. This is the problem of ‘rigidity.’
Now let us move on to the twin problems of ‘ignorance and error’. Suppose that Fred believes of Einstein only that he was a physicist. Then, he will fail to refer to Einstein via his use of the name ‘Einstein’, since the associated descriptive content, a physicist, fails to pick Einstein out from among countless other physicists. This is the problem of ‘ignorance’. Suppose now that Fred believes that Einstein was the inventor of the atomic bomb. (According to Kripke (1980) many speakers believe this, or used to at least.) The descriptivist theory would then predict what is surely false — that when such a speaker utters a sentence like (8), he refers not to Einstein but to Oppenheimer (the person who did in fact invent the atomic bomb). This is the problem of ‘error’.
For these and other reasons, many (perhaps most) philosophers of language have rejected descriptivist theories of proper names in favor of either causal or hybrid theories. Not everyone, though, has rejected descriptivism. John Searle's (1983) response to Kripke's three-pronged challenge basically claims that the theory refuted by Kripke (the so-called ‘Frege-Russell’ theory) is a straw man, and that a plausible version of the description theory (namely, Searle's) can circumvent each and every one of Kripke's objections. One need only acknowledge that the reference-fixing content associated with the use of a given name needn't be the sort of content expressible by a single definite description, or even by an open disjunction of such expressions. For there is no reason to insist that reference-determining content must be expressible linguistically. Rather, the reference-fixing content is identical to the totality of a given speaker's ‘intentional content’ — that is, the totality of mental content a given speaker associates with the name in question. The referent will be whatever object/individual fits the bulk of this content. Moreover, such content (which is likely to vary widely from speaker to speaker) is not to be regarded as giving the meaning of a name, where the ‘meaning’ of a name is construed as something like a definition.
Once these amendments are made, the problems noted by Kripke are easily avoided — according to Searle at least. In response to the problem of unwanted necessity, Searle effectively bites the bullet. On his view, it is indeed a necessary truth that Aristotle (for instance) satisfies a significant chunk of the intentional content associated (by the speaker) with the name ‘Aristotle’. But this does not mean that “Aristotle was a philosopher” is on par with “Bachelors are unmarried.” For the associated descriptive content is not in any way synonymous with the name; it does not define the name, it merely fixes its reference. In response to the rigidity problem, Searle points out that intuitions of rigidity are easily enough accommodated: one can simply rigidify the reference-fixing description. Thus, ‘Aristotle’ refers (in all possible scenarios) to the individual who actually did such-and-such. Finally, in response to the problems of ignorance and error, Searle points out that once all of the relevant intentional content is taken into consideration, these problems simply do not arise. For associated with ‘Einstein’ will of course be the content individual whom others in my community call ‘Einstein’. If this content, which might well be sufficient to pick out Einstein, has significant weight for the speaker, it could effectively ‘trump’ any divergent content. It might thus succeed in ‘picking out’ the right individual: Einstein. (And if it didn't, that would only show either that the speaker wasn't really referring to the individual others in his community call ‘Einstein’ or else that the community doesn't actually have a practice of using the name ‘Einstein’ to refer to Einstein.)
Despite Searle's ingenious defense of the descriptivist theory, many have found it ultimately implausible. This is probably due, at least in part, to the conviction of many contemporary philosophers that there is something ‘magical’ about description theories of reference. Such theories appear (according to these philosophers) to imbue the mind with a rather curious property: one that allows its contents to ‘magically’ attach to things outside of it. Michael Devitt (1990), echoing Hilary Putnam (1981), makes this very complaint. He first makes the general point that nothing inside an object is sufficient to determine its relation to something outside it. He then applies this principle to the case at hand, asking pointedly (p. 91):
How can something inside the head refer to something outside the head? Searle sees no problem: It just does. That's the real magic.
Evans (1982, p. 298) had made much the same point earlier, when he wrote:
What makes it one rather than another of a pair of identical twins that you are in love with? Certainly not some specification blue printed in your mind… If God had looked into your mind, he would not have seen with whom you were in love, and of whom you were thinking.
The basic idea is this: mental content, however detailed, is simply not sufficient to ‘pick out’ some extra-mental entity. (Such arguments are complicated, however, by the fact that certain theories of mental content contend that such content too can only be understood in relation to things outside of the speaker's head. See the entry on externalism about mental content.)
More recently, a different offshoot of descriptivism has come to the fore in philosophical inquiries regarding names, an offshoot that itself subsumes two closely related views: ‘meta-linguistic descriptivism’ and ‘predicativism’. According to meta-linguistic descriptivists like William Kneale (1962), Kent Bach (1987, 2002), Bart Geurts (1997), and Alexis Burgess (2013), what the use of a name like ‘George ’ means is the bearer of the name ‘George’. Along similar lines, Tyler Burge (1973) and Delia Graff Fara (forthcoming) have argued that what names mean in isolation is actually a certain sort of property, namely the property of bearing the name ‘George’. Since sentences containing names in the subject place intuitively aren't about these properties, predicativists supplement this initial claim with a further one: bare occurrences of names (as in the subject place) are accompanied by an unpronounced ‘that’ (Burge) or ‘the’ (Fara), so as to form the complex ‘that George’ or ‘the George’. Thus, for predicativists like Burge and Fara, the semantic value of a name in the subject place is equivalent to that of a complex demonstrative or an incomplete definite description. How such terms refer will, therefore, depend whether and how one thinks that complex demonstratives or incomplete definite descriptions refer. Bach, for one, claims that definite descriptions do not refer at all, at least semantically speaking. That, in turn, means that names do not refer — at least not semantically — and that, perhaps surprisingly, the reference a name turns out to be wholly inconsequantial for the truth conditions of the utterance in which it occurs. By treating incomplete definite descriptions and complex demonstratives differently, however, other meta-linguistic descriptivists and predicativists have managed to avoid taking on this sort of commitment.
Both meta-linguistic descriptivisism and predicativism about proper names are typically spelled out as commitments regarding the logical form of certain sorts of linguistic expressions. That is, these theories are typically understood to be in the business of explaining what sorts of semantic values, or meanings, names have rather than explaining how names get their referents. Nonetheless, these views bring with them substantive claims about reference as well. In particular, meta-linguistic descriptivists and predicativists alike generally agree that the bare (or subject-place) use of a name refers to a particular bearer of that name, even if they disagree about whether such reference is, properly speaking, semantic. This means that these theorists owe us an explanation both of what it means to bear a name and of what it is about particular contexts in virtue of which a particular use of a name refers to a particular bearer of that name, as opposed to some other bearer. For the most part, predicativists and meta-linguistic descriptivists alike have had relatively little to say about either of these aspects of their theory. Instead, they have preferred to leave it open how exactly incomplete definite descriptions and complex demonstratives manage to pick out referents in contexts. Likewise, they have been content to appeal to an intuitive notion of what it is to ‘bear a name’ rather than spelling out precise conditions for when it is that an object or individual can rightly be said to stand in this relation to a particular name. One recent exception is Aidan Gray (forthcoming), who is concerned to defend predicativism from the charge of vicious circularity. The worry is this: suppose that ‘George’ picks out the property of bearing the name ‘George’. Which property is this? Well, it would seem to be the property had by all and only the things to which we can properly apply the name ‘George’. But now our explanation has appealed to precisely the same property we were hoping to explicate in the first place, the property of bearing the name ‘George’!
Gray proposes an analysis of the name-bearing relation in terms of the mutual presuppositions of speakers in a given speech community. This has the interesting upshot of offering a prima facie appealing way of explaining the phenomenon of reference shift via error, in which a name comes to be borne by something other than its original bearer although no speaker ever intends to use the name in anything other than the way that it was originally passed on to them. For Gray, name-bearing can shift due to the introduction of a widespread, but false, presupposition to the effect that some object x has in past been the bearer of the name ‘N’. Reference change via error is, however, more standardly posed as an objection to the main competitor to descriptivist theories of the reference of names: causal theories. It is time, therefore, to turn our attention to such theories.
The causal theory was adumbrated by Kripke (1980) as an alternative to the descriptivist theory of nominal reference. The central idea underpinning this sort of theory is that (the use of) a name refers to whatever is linked to it in the appropriate way, a way that does not require speakers to associate any identifying descriptive content whatsoever with the name. The causal theory is generally presented as having two components: one dealing with reference fixing, the other dealing with reference borrowing. Reference is initially fixed with a dubbing, usually by perception, though also on occasion by description. Reference is fixed via perception when a speaker says, in effect, of a perceived object: “You're to be called ‘N’.” Reference is fixed via description when a speaker stipulates, in effect: “Whatever is the unique such-and-such is to be called ‘N’.” (As noted by Kripke (1980), the name ‘Neptune’ was fixed by description, stipulated by the astronomer Le Verrier to refer to whatever was the planetary cause of observed perturbations in the orbit of Uranus.) After this initial reference-fixing, the name is passed on from speaker to speaker through communicative exchanges. Speakers succeed in referring to something by means of its name because underlying their uses of the name are links in a causal chain stretching back to the dubbing of the object with that name. Subsequent speakers thus effectively ‘borrow’ their reference from speakers earlier in the chain, though borrowers do not have to be able to identify lenders. All that is required is that borrowers are appropriately linked to their lenders through chains of communication. However, as Kripke points out, in order for a speaker (qua reference borrower) to succeed in using a proper name to refer to the object/individual the lender was using the name to refer to, she must intend to do so. Thus, I may use the name ‘Napoleon’ to refer to my pet cat, even if I first became acquainted with the name in a situation where it was being used to refer to the famous French general. The important point is that, in such a case, I do not intend “to use the name to refer to the individual the lender used it to refer to.” Instead, I intend to introduce a new name into the lexicon, one that just happens to sound exactly like a name for the famous French general.
One of the most serious and enduring problems facing the causal theory of reference (as sketched by Kripke, at least) is that it appears to be at odds with the phenomenon of reference shift via error. Gareth Evans cites the case of ‘Madagascar’, once used to refer to a portion of the African mainland, but now used to refer to the great African island. Marco Polo was apparently the first speaker to use the name to refer to the island. He was under the impression — a misimpression — that this was how the name was actually used. The problem is this: when Marco Polo used the name, he surely intended to refer to whatever was referred to by the person(s) from whom he acquired the name. His intention was not to introduce a novel use of the name. But the individual(s) from whom Polo acquired the name intended (by hypothesis) to use the name to refer to a portion of the African mainland. How, then, did it come to refer to the island? Evans goes on to provide an imaginary case that makes the same basic point.
Two babies are born, and their mothers bestow names upon them. A nurse inadvertently switches them and the error is never discovered. It will henceforth undeniably be the case that the man universally known as ‘Jack’ is so-called because a woman dubbed some other baby with that name. (1982, p. 301)
The causal theorist faces a dilemma here. First, she might propose that (contra what seems to be the natural way of describing these cases) in each case a new name has actually been introduced, i.e. ‘Madagascar-2’ and ‘Jack-2’. This would entail that not every reference-fixing use of a name turns out to be intentional; sometimes new names are introduced, and their reference somehow fixed, unintentionally. Alternatively, the causal theorist can modify her view so as to allow for events subsequent to the initial dubbing to affect what a given name refers to. Devitt (1981) develops a version of the latter strategy by contending that a name is typically ‘grounded’ in its bearer in numerous perceptual confrontations after the initial dubbing. As part of what grounds reference, these perceptual confrontations are thus semantically significant and capable of effecting reference change over time. The basic idea is that, given a sufficient number of such groundings over a sufficient period of time, reference change may occur. Thus, ‘Madagascar’ was able to shift reference from the mainland to the island once perceptually-based groundings in the island became established. The island was effectively dubbed ‘Madagascar’ by means of such groundings. (Note that this entails that Marco Polo was unlikely to be the first to use the name ‘Madagascar’ to refer to the island, since, although he might have been apt to apply that name to the island, an insufficient number of groundings would have obtained at the point when he was himself using the name.) And the man known by all as ‘Jack’ is not so-called because, years earlier, someone dubbed another individual that name. He is so-called because numerous uses of ‘Jack’ are grounded in him.
Although the causal theory (as revised by Devitt) provides a plausible account of nominal reference, its advocates still need to supplement their theory of reference with a theory of meaning — a theory that accounts for the fact that proper names appear to have some sort of meaning or ‘cognitive content.’ On its own, the causal theory of reference does not provide any answers to the questions of cognitive significance that so bothered description theorists like Frege and Russell.
Reference change is not the only problem facing the causal theory of reference. Evans (1973) provides several examples of uses of proper names that are most naturally accounted for via a hybrid theory, according to which the reference of a proper name (as used by a speaker) is the dominant causal source of the body of descriptive information the speaker associates with the name. Consider, for instance, the following hypothetical case discussed by Evans:
An urn is discovered in which are found fascinating mathematical proofs. Inscribed at the bottom is the name ‘Ibn Khan’ which is quite naturally taken to be the name of the constructor of the proofs. Consequently it passes into common usage amongst mathematicians concerned with that branch of mathematics. ‘Khan conjectured here that…’ and the like. However suppose the name was the name of the scribe who had transcribed the proofs much later; a small ‘id scripsit’ had been obliterated. (1982, p. 306)
Presumably, we want to say that the name as used by contemporary mathematicians refers to the ancient mathematician, not to the scribe. But the (unamended) Kripkean causal picture would predict that the name refers to the scribe. After all, contemporary mathematicians no doubt intend to use the name to refer to the individual called, by those in the ancient community, ‘Ibn Kahn.’ Their intention is not to introduce a novel use of the name. On Evans' view, however, the name refers to the ancient mathematician, since it is the mathematician who constitutes the dominant causal source of the descriptive information associated with the name: mathematician who proved such-and-such. Because the ancient mathematician is responsible for the existence of the proofs, he is arguably the dominant causal source of the descriptive information associated with the name ‘Ibn Kahn’.
The advantages of Evans' theory appear to be considerable. Evans himself claims that his theory effectively combines the virtues of the descriptive theory with those of the causal theory, while avoiding their respective vices. Like descriptivist accounts, Evans' hybrid theory accounts for cognitive significance (of the sort evidenced by sentences like (2) through (5)) as well as reference; like causal accounts, it preserves the intuition that one cannot refer to something with which one has no causal connection whatsoever. Moreover, Evans' theory avoids the problems of ignorance and error. For it denies that reference is determined by ‘fit’ or ‘satisfaction’ of any sort of descriptive content.
It is worth noting, however, that certain of the details of Evans-like views are open to question. What's more, these details matter for the predictions that will be generated by such views. Evans himself shifted his stance on what constitutes a ‘dominant causal source’ between Evans (1973) and Evans (1982), excising an earlier requirement that dominant causal sources must reliably put the language-user in a position to have knowledge of, or at least true beliefs about, the referent. On Evans' later view, speakers must merely be deferring to a core group who know the referent as so-and-so. More recently, Imogen Dickie (2011) has argued that certain information about the kind of thing that is named must also be preserved in chains of Evans-like transmission of reference from those who know an object as so-and-so to those who do not.
It is also worth pointing out that Evans' proposal is by no means the only hybrid theory available. Devitt's (1981) version of the causal theory, outlined in the last section, is also a ‘hybrid’ theory of sorts. Although his theory of reference borrowing is a purely causal one, there is a descriptive element in his theory of reference-fixing. This descriptive element is needed to handle what Devitt calls the ‘qua problem,’ a problem entailed by the view that reference-fixing is a purely causal, non-descriptive, event. This sort of view of reference-fixing, Devitt claims, is false. Rather, in order to fix the reference of a name, the namer must at least know what kind of object she is naming. Thus, in order to succeed in naming a certain dog ‘Spot’, I must at least know what kind of thing the nominatum-to-be is: I must at least know that he is (say) an animal. If I think he is merely an inanimate spot in my field of vision, I will not have succeeded in naming him. Now, to know what kind of object one is naming is to conceptualize that object, to think of it as an object of a certain sort, as (in other words), satisfying a certain predicate. It is thus to think of it qua such-and-such. Thus, if an act of reference-fixing is to be successful, the reference-fixer must think of the referent-to-be under a certain description — one that that object or individual actually satisfies. If this is right, however, then the event of reference-fixing cannot be conceived of in purely causal terms.
The three theories of proper names canvassed above all tacitly assume not just that names are univocal — that is, that they are not ambiguous — but also that there is only one bearer of a particular name at a particular time. Without this implicit assumption, it will not be enough to explain why ‘George W. Bush’ refers to George W. Bush. We need to say why this use of ‘George W. Bush’ refers to one person while another use might well refer to someone else. In other words, whichever of the above theories one finds most appealing, we still lack a clear way of specifying which description, causal chain, or dominant causal source is relevant for fixing the reference of a proper name at a particular context of use.
David Kaplan (1990) outlines one natural way of responding to this challenge: he claims that each name refers to only one thing, but that one cannot tell which name has been used merely from the overt phonological form of the speaker's utterance. In other words, Kaplan posits that there are any number of names all written and pronounced ‘George W. Bush’. But while each of these names is written and pronounced identically, each refers to a different person. The question now becomes: what determines which name a speaker has used in context? Kaplan suggests that the answer to this question has to do with the speaker's mental states, and in particular with the speaker's intention to talk about one or another object. While Kaplan conceives of such mental states in terms of the causal theory of reference, the basic outline of Kaplan's proposal could also be adapted to a hybrid theory or even to a descriptivist theory by way of certain ammendations. In particular, the speaker's mental states would have to be cashed out either in terms of a dominant causal source or in terms of a descriptive content, depending on which theory one is considering.
Another natural suggestion would be to claim that names are actually context-sensitive in some way — that is, that they refer to different objects/individuals in different contexts. Predicativists and meta-linguistic descriptivists already hold a version of this view, in virtue of their holding that bare uses of names are equivalent to complex demonstratives or incomplete definite descriptions. Can causal theorists (or hybrid theorists, for that matter) also hold a view like this? Yes. Such a view has in fact been sketched by both Francois Recanati (1997) and Michael Pelczar and Joe Rainsbury (1998). According to this sort of ‘indexical theory’ of proper names, there is only one name ‘George W. Bush’, but context somehow determines which George W. Bush is the referent of any particular use of that name. That is, context serves to take us from the set of objects named ‘George W. Bush’ (according to a standard causal-historical theory of name acquisition and transfer) to a particular individual named ‘George W. Bush’. Supposing that what it is about the context that plays this role is in fact the speaker's mental states, then the gap between this suggestion and Kaplan's earlier suggestion narrows significantly. The following difference remains, however: on the indexical theory of names, there is just one name ‘George W. Bush’, whereas on Kaplan's proposal there are any number of names ‘George W. Bush’, each of which is written and pronounced in the same manner. While the choice of one or the other of these pictures may seem relatively minor, it will turn out to be rather significant when we turn to consider whether it is possible to offer a unified theory of reference, one that encompasses both names and other sorts of referential terms.
Adding to the difficulties that arise in offering a theory of reference for proper names, Sam Cumming (2008) has pointed to the fact that names sometimes appear to be bound in context by indefinite descriptive material earlier in the discourse. Adapting a case from Oscar Wilde, Cumming offers the following example:
- There is a gentleman in Hertfordshire going by the name ‘Ernest’. Ernest is engaged to two women. (2008, p. 535)
Such cases are problematic for both descriptivists and Millians. The problem for descriptivists is that (9) seems true even in a world where there are two gentlemen in Hertfordshire going by the name ‘Ernest’, each of whom is engaged to two women. In this world, the relevant descriptive content fails to isolate a single individual, and the name is thus predicted to be empty. For Millians, the problem is that (9) can be supplemented with further material that would fit either of the men going by the name of ‘Ernest’, e.g. “Ernest is the older of two brothers,” “Ernest is the younger of two brothers.” Intuitively, both of these extensions can be true, and yet for Millians the reference of a name shouldn't vary with the addition of further text. To the extent, then, that both causal and hybrid theorists have been tempted to endorse Millianism, this represents a problem for both those views. More generally, cases like these put pressure on the claim that names always function as devices of reference. (For more on both the reference and logical form of proper names, see the entry on names.)
Terms like ‘I’, ‘you’, ‘here’, ‘now’, ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘this’, and ‘that’, often called ‘indexicals’, are typically offered alongside names as paradigm examples of referential terms. Interestingly, the mechanisms that have been proposed to account for how such terms refer are rather different from those which have been proposed to account for the reference of names. A brief investigation into these proposals will help to bring more clearly into view the second of our main questions: is there just one mechanism by means of which referring expressions refer? Or do different sorts of referring expressions refer in different ways? In fact, as we will see, it is not even clear that all indexicals refer in the same way, let alone all referential terms. In particular, a distinction has often been drawn between what are called ‘pure’ and ‘impure’ indexicals, with rather different theories of reference being offered for each.
What are pure indexicals? Roughly, they are expressions the reference of which depends on certain very regular aspects of the contexts in which they are used, where ‘context’ is understood to incorporate, inter alia, a speaker, hearer, time, and place. In contrast, ‘impure’ indexicals are supposed to be more irregular in their reference, sensitive to less public aspects of the context such as the speaker's mental state. While both the existence and the significance of this distinction are controversial, examples of each of these sorts of terms — should the distinction prove both real and significant — typically are not. Standard examples of pure indexicals include ‘I’, ‘here’, ‘now’, and arguably ‘you’. The list of impure indexicals, on the other hand, is generally agreed to include ‘this’, ‘that’, ‘he’, ‘she’, and ‘it’.
The traditional (Frege/Russell) view of indexicals, both pure and impure, is that the reference of such expressions is fixed by some sort of descriptive content associated by the speaker with the expression. This reference-fixing description is the meaning, the propositional contribution, of the expression. The motivation for such a view is largely intuitive. Indexicals certainly do appear to mean something, and their meanings presumably have something to do with how these expressions refer. For instance, the meaning of ‘I’ is arguably the speaker of this utterance and refers to that individual; the meaning of ‘now’ is arguably the time of this utterance and refers to that time. And so on.
One obvious objection to this view is that what the term ‘I’ refers to does not appear to be sensitive to what sort of descriptive content a speaker might happen to associate with that term. For instance, the fact that I might happen to associate the description the previous U.S. president with the term ‘I’ does not mean that I can use the term ‘I’ to refer to George W. Bush, should I be so inclined. Another problem with this view, discussed extensively in Kaplan (1989b), is that reference-determining descriptions don't look to be the right sorts of things to figure into the propositional contents expressed by indexical-containing utterances — at least on the assumption that such contents are supposed to help explain our judgments about ‘what is said’. Thus, consider an assertive utterance of:
- I am hungry
Suppose, first, that I am the speaker. I utter (10). Now, suppose that you are the speaker. You utter (10). While there may be a sense in which we ‘said the same thing’ — that is, the sense in which we uttered the same sentence-type — there is a more interesting and philosophically-rich sense in which we did not. According to the descriptivist theory of indexicals under consideration, however, we said the same thing in this more substantive sense as well. I asserted that the speaker is hungry, and so did you. All that differs is the context in which we uttered this proposition.
Considerations like these point the way to Kaplan's ‘direct reference’ view of pure indexicals, according to which an indexical's ‘character’ determines its reference in a context. The reference of an indexical in a context is its ‘content’ — that is, its contribution to what is said or expressed by the whole of the speaker's utterance. Character, on the other hand, is more akin to linguistic meaning than reference and is supposed (according to Kaplan) to account for cognitive significance. Still, character is invariant across contexts; it is insensitive to factors like what the speaker's mental state happens to be, or what happens to be salient in context. The character of an expression provides the rules for its correct use in context. Thus, the character of ‘I’ will be a rule specifying that the expression refers to the speaker in the context of utterance. The character of ‘you’ will be a rule specifying that the expression refers to the audience in the context of utterance. And so on.
Since characters are insensitive to the speaker's mental states, there is no possibility of my using the term ‘I’ to refer to George W. Bush. Nor are your and my utterances of (10) predicted to express the same proposition. What's more, as Kaplan points out, the view allows us to productively distinguish between ‘metaphysical’ necessity and what Kaplan calls ‘logical’ necessity. The sentence “I am here now” represents a clear example of logical necessity: in virtue of what the indexicals ‘I’, ‘here’, and ‘now’ all mean, Kaplan claims that this sentence cannot be uttered falsely. Yet clearly it is not necessary in any sort of metaphysical sense that a particular speaker be wherever she happens to be at the time of utterance; she could have just as easily been somewhere else instead.
Although widely accepted, several concerns linger for Kaplan's direct reference account of indexicals. First, Nunberg (1993) contends that indexicals have descriptive uses as well: uses that are both semantically significant and relevant to what is said. As evidence, he offers sentences like the following:
- I thought you were my mother.
Suppose that there is a knock on the door and you assume that it is your mother, whom you are expecting. You then open the door, see that the visitor (x) is a friend, and utter (11) upon opening the door. You arguably mean by that utterance something like: I thought that the person at the door was my mother. It seems implausible in the extreme that you meant that you thought that x, your friend, was your mother! You would never mistake the one for the other. Second, some have disputed Kaplan's claim that pure indexicals like ‘I’ are wholly insensitive to the speaker's mental states. Third, it is unclear that anything like Kaplan's apparatus of inter-contextually-stable characters can be extended to account for impure indexicals like ‘this’ or ‘that’.
In contrast to the pure indexicals, the reference of impure indexicals like ‘he’, ‘she’, and ‘it’ is not typically thought to be characterizable purely in terms of stable rules which themselves make reference to some abstract aspect of the context. At the extreme, ‘true demonstratives’ like ‘this’ and ‘that’ look to be the sort of thing that can be used to refer to just about anything in just about any context — thus making it extremely difficult to characterize the way in which they refer in terms of any sort of contextually-invariant rule.
Still, several possibilities present themselves. One is to make the rule itself sensitive to certain variable aspects of the context, such as what is salient in the context (whatever exactly that amounts to). Howard Wettstein (1984) offers a proposal along these lines, one which has been more recently revived in Allyson Mount (2008). The basic idea is that a term like ‘she’ refers to whoever counts as the most salient female in the context. Similar rules will apply to the other impure indexicals. A prima facie problem with this sort of view is that multiple impure indexicals can be used in a single sentence, as in:
- That is actually larger than that, it's just further away.
What this means is that salience is going to have to be more fine-grained than just being relative to a sentence; it must be the sort of thing that can vary over the course of the utterance of a sentence. What's more, we can imagine an utterance like (12) being made without any accompanying ostensive gestures, and even succeeding in communicating a distinct content in such situations. It remains an open challenge for salience-based theories to explain just how salience can change over the course of an utterance, and just what it is about sentences themselves that can serve to shift what is salient in a context. Another challenge to salience-based theories of reference is that it is highly unclear that any single object is ever maximally salient relative to a context, rather than relative to a context and a sortal or kind. But since simple demonstratives like ‘this’ and ‘that’ plausibly fail to come with any restrictions on the kinds of things to which they can be used to refer, such theories leave unresolved how it is that simple demonstratives acquire their referents. Finally, it is simply not at all clear that we cannot use terms like ‘this’ or ‘that’ to refer to objects are less than maximally salient in a context. A rampaging woolly mammoth might well count as maximally salient in just about any context; quite plausibly, it would. Still, even in a context containing such a creature, it seems that I can successfully use the term ‘that’ to refer to the spear next to you when I plead for you to “Throw that at the mammoth, for the love of God!”
In response to these and other problems, many philosophers have followed Kaplan (1989a) in claiming that the reference of impure indexicals depends, somehow or other, on the speaker's mental state. While the details of the resulting views vary significantly, what they share is a commitment to something like the following core thesis: what the use of an impure indexical refers to, in context, is whatever the speaker intended to refer to by means of that use. Even with just this basic commitment in view, we should be able to see how speaker intention-based theories of reference will be able to explain the reference of multiple uses of impure indexicals within a single sentence (speaker's mental states can be complex) as well as reference to non-maximally-salient objects or objects of a kind (speakers are presumably not required only to intend to refer to such objects). Speaker-oriented views of reference face a different set of problems, however — most notably what has been called the ‘Humpty Dumpty Problem’, after some of Humpty Dumpty's notable comments regarding the degree of control he exerts over the meanings of his words in Lewis Carroll's Through the Looking Glass. This problem is, in fact, a very general one; it arises whenever one appeals to the speaker's intentions to help determine either meaning or reference. At its core, the problem is this: if it is the speaker's intentions that determine the meaning of a particular sort of term, then what prevents the speaker from using that term in a highly unexpected manner, one that intuitively strikes us as betraying a significant degree of linguistic incompetence? For instance, what would prevent me from using the term ‘he’ to refer to an inanimate object, or even the term ‘I’ to refer to George W. Bush? The worry is that proponents of speaker-intention based views of indexical reference can offer no adequate response to this challenge.
In fact, a number of different strategies for responding to the Humpty Dumpty Problem have been proposed. At one extreme, Stefano Predelli (2002) suggests that our judgments to the effect that one cannot use ‘he’ to refer to an inanimate object or ‘I’ to refer to George W. Bush are non-probative and should be discarded. Using these terms in this way may not prove to be an effective way of communicating to a normal audience, but reference, by Predelli's lights, isn't constrained by potential communicative efficacy. At the other extreme, one finds Kaplan's (1989a) original suggestion, which is in fact far more modest than it is standardly taken to be. According to Kaplan, a speaker's mental states determine the reference of true demonstratives like ‘this’ and ‘that’ only when the speaker is occurrently perceiving her intended referent. Beyond such cases, Kaplan simply declines to offer a theory of reference for true demonstratives.
Most theorists have found themselves dissatisfied with both of these two options — the former because it forces on us a highly revisionary understanding of how the theory of reference is to account for what would seem to be some core data regarding indexicals, and the latter because it effectively gives up on the project of offering a general theory of reference for impure indexicals. Such theorists have thus attempted to circumvent the Humpty Dumpty Problem in ways that fail to bring with them such radical consequences. The two dominant strategies to this end have been (i) to appeal to Gricean considerations regarding the nature of intentions to refer or (ii) to impose some further requirements that the speaker's intended referent must meet in order to count as the referent of the impure indexical in question. We will introduce each of these strategies in turn.
Stephen Schiffer (1981) and Kent Bach (1992) were the first to try invoking an explicitly Gricean theory of ‘referential intentions’ in order to avoid the Humpty Dumpty Problem as it arises for indexicals. The basic idea is that the relevant sorts of intentions for fixing the reference of impure indexicals are, properly speaking, intentions aimed at getting the listener to identify a particular object (x) as the referent. If the speaker intends to use an indexical in some non-standard way to refer to x, then it is very likely that she will also take it to be impossible for her listener to identify the object to which she purportedly intends to refer as the referent. In such cases, according to the Gricean, the speaker did not really intend to refer to x. Rather, she was in some other sort of complex, confused mental state which should not in fact be counted as a genuine intention to refer to x. Thus, the Gricean predicts that the speaker will have failed to refer to x, since successful reference requires a genuine intention to refer. One lingering problem for Griceans is that speakers can, and often do, have strange beliefs about their listeners' mental states and capacities. Such beliefs might prove sufficient to make the speaker believe that the listener will be able to recover her intended referent — thus allowing her to genuinely intend to refer to some object — even in cases where no reasonable listener would in fact be able to recover that object as the referent. For example, the speaker might, for whatever reason, have come to believe that the listener has transparent access to the speaker's mental states whenever she uses an impure indexical. This strange belief should ensure that, whatever object x the speaker has in mind as the referent, she will believe: the listener will be able to recover x as the referent. According to the Gricean then, this speaker's use of an impure indexical should succeed in referring to whatever x the speaker intends for it to refer to, and regardless of what the value of x happens to be. Yet it hardly seems right to say that one might successfully refer to a ship in the distance by using the term ‘he’ just because one mistakenly believes that the listener will be able to identify that ship as one's intended referent — by means of directly accessing one's mental state at the point when one utters this term.
The other dominant response to the Humpty Dumpty Problem has been to say little about the nature of referential intentions themselves, but rather to impose certain external constraints on when those intentions succeed in fixing reference. Different theorists have experimented with very different sorts of constraints. Marga Reimer (1991a, 1992), taking up a suggestion that Kaplan introduced in his (1978) but then later abandoned, suggests that when true demonstratives like ‘this’ and ‘that’ are accompanied by ostensive gestures, then the referent itself must lie in the general direction indicated by that gesture. While Reimer herself fails to do so, one can imagine generalizing this sort of view so as to make it a matter of the stable, context-invariant meaning (i.e. the character) of a particular indexical not just whether it is sensitive to ostensive gestures, but also whether it is subject to further constraints on reference, such as gender or sex constraints (as is plausibly the case with the pronouns ‘he’ and ‘she’) or inanimacy requirements (as is plausibly the case with the pronoun ‘it’). One worry regarding this sort of view, however, is that it would seem to entail speakers cannot use the impure indexicals ‘this’ and ‘that’ to refer to objects represented by other objects in the direction of the speaker's ostensive gesture — which seems false. For instance, one can point to a picture of Carnap and say truly, of Carnap, “That is one of the greatest philosophers of the twentieth century.” This is despite the fact that Carnap himself is nowhere to be found in the direction indicated by the pointing. Another concern with the view is that, while it might succeed in constraining the ways that impure indexicals can be used when they happen to be accompanied by pointings, it is unclear that it can successfully bar all Humpty Dumpty-ish uses of indexicals, particularly those that involve no gestures at all.
In a very different vein, King (2014) has suggested that, while speakers' intentions serve to fix the reference of impure indexicals in context, they do so only to the extent that the speaker's intended referent could be recovered by a suitably idealized listener in the relevant context. Unfortunately, this notion of a suitably idealized listener promises to be difficult, if not impossible, to spell out in the sort of manner that would be necessary for the theory to count as being genuinely predictive. In particular, what listeners are apt to recover in context is likely to depend, inter alia, on their initial perceptual state. Yet, beyond stipulating that the listener must be paying sufficient attention to the speaker to recover the string of words that she utters, it is highly unclear that there is any sense in which a suitably idealized listener is going to have to start in any particular attentional state. But if attentional states are not part of the idealization, then it is likely that there will be no one thing that a suitably idealized listener would identify as the referent. If that is correct, then King's view entails that uses of impure indexicals almost always fail to refer.
Beyond the difficulties that arise in grappling with the Humpty Dumpty Problem, significant problems arise for speaker-oriented views of reference when faced with speakers who are sufficiently confused about the world — and, in particular, about the object to which they intend to refer. The classic example of this sort of confusion is due to Kaplan (1978), who asks us to imagine a scenario in which the speaker's picture of Rudolf Carnap, which usually hangs behind her desk on the wall, has been replaced by a picture of Spiro Agnew. Failing to realize this, the speaker now points behind herself, directly at the picture of Agnew, and says:
- That is a picture of one of the greatest philosophers of the twentieth century.
According to Kaplan, this utterance is clearly false. But since the speaker, in some sense at least, intended both to refer to her picture of Carnap and to the picture hanging behind her on the wall, it stands as a challenge to speaker-oriented theories of reference to explain why only the latter of the speaker's intentions proved relevant to determining the reference of her use of ‘that’. Bach has claimed that the Gricean picture of referential intentions can deal with this sort of case by deeming only the latter intention ‘genuinely referential’, Reimer that the speaker's gesture constrains which of her intentions is relevant, and King that this is actually a case of reference failure. None of these responses has yet achieved widespread acceptance, however.
At this point, it is worth pausing to note just how significant the differences are that have been posited to obtain between the mechanisms by which names and indexicals refer. With respect to names, it seemed at least plausible that such terms might refer by means of an associated description, which might also serve as their meaning or content in context. With regard to indexicals, in contrast, such a suggestion looked highly implausible. Many indexicals seemed to be sensitive to highly variant aspects of the context, such as what is salient or what the speaker's mental state happen to be. Names, on the other hand, appeared to be far less sensitive to these sorts of factors. Such considerations would seem to cast into doubt whether there is just one way in which referential terms refer; in other words, such considerations make it look rather plausible that there is more than one basic mechanism of linguistic reference. Perhaps this is right. Perhaps there is no one mechanism by means of which speakers use linguistic items to refer. On the other hand, there are several ways in which one might try to bring greater order to the various cases we have considered.
First, one might distinguish between two fundamentally different sorts of referential terms: context-sensitive referential terms and context-insensitive referential terms. This would be in the spirit of Kaplan's (1990) proposal regarding the nature of names: part of what it is to be a name is to be a name for something. Once one knows which name has been uttered, there is no more question what the reference of that name is — though it is still open to us to ask how that name acquired that particular referent. Indexicals, on the other hand, are a fundamentally different sort of referring term, for which an entirely different sort of theory is appropriate. Such terms are not bound up with referents; they are genuinely used to refer to different things on different occasions. It remains to be seen whether these are themselves best accounted for in a unified manner, or whether different theories must be offered for pure and impure indexicals.
On the other hand, one might follow Recanati (1997) or Pelczar and Rainsbury (1998) in assimilating names to indexicals and claiming that names too are genuinely used to refer to different objects/individuals on different occasions of use. In that case, one might hope to offer a generalized theory of what makes particular indexicals (including, now, names) refer to specific things on particular occasions of use. Here, one might appeal to something like salience, though once more far more would have to be said about what might make a particular ‘George’ salient when several Georges are present or have recently been the topic of conversation. Alternatively, one might endorse the claim that the reference of all indexical expressions — names and other indexicals alike — is fixed by the content of an accompanying description. Finally, one might appeal to the speaker's mental states to fix both the reference of indexicals and of names in a non-descriptive manner. In that case, the speaker's very ability to think of a particular individual as bearing a name might still need to be explained in terms of a causal or causal-descriptive hybrid story. That story, in turn, would effectively limit the sorts of things that speakers could intend to refer to with particular names. Alternatively, one might follow Predelli in claiming that speakers can use names and other referential terms to refer to whatever they please. They are just well-advised to refrain from doing so if their ultimate aim is to be understood.
For the most part, philosophers have tended to pursue the question of how linguistic items refer with respect to particular terms, rather than as a general project. This methodology makes salient the very real possibility that our best accounts of the reference of various different sorts of terms will prove to be difficult, if not impossible, to reconcile with each other. Should that turn out to be the case, it raises the question of whether we should in fact posit there to be a unified phenomenon of linguistic reference. In fact, even the specter of such disunity should push us to ask: in virtue of what, if not the mechanism by which they ‘hook onto’ objects in the world, might referential terms all count as devices of reference? This question, in turn, points towards a bigger-picture analogue: what is the phenomenon of reference in general, such that uses of certain sorts of linguistic items (but, presumably, not others) count as genuine instances of this phenomenon?
The complexities which arise in trying to understand the notion of linguistic reference don't end with names and indexicals. Here, we will consider two further sorts of terms that are often thought of as referential — natural kind terms and singular definite descriptions — as well as whether the notion of reference can be productively extended even to a range of terms to which it does not intuitively apply.
Putnam (1975) extended Kripke's views of proper names to so-called ‘natural kind’ terms. These are terms that refer (naturally enough) to kinds of things that are found in nature. The ‘kinds’ in question are kinds of the sort studied by scientists, whether biologists, chemists, or physicists. They are kinds individuated by underlying structure: a structure that purportedly explains the more superficial properties of the kind. Thus, the expressions ‘tiger’, ‘gold’, and ‘water’ are natural kind terms. ‘Dust bunny’ and ‘cow patty’ are not — despite the fact that they refer (loosely speaking) to ‘kinds’ of things ‘found in nature.’ The traditional view of such terms sees them as descriptive in content, where the descriptive content of such terms determines their reference. That is, the kind is referred to in virtue of the fact that it ‘satisfies’ the properties expressed by the associated descriptive content. The motivation for such a view is two-fold. First, it provides intuitive analyses in cases where a purely referential account of meaning proves unintuitive; second, in contrast to an account of the latter sort, a descriptive account of natural kind terms offers an explanation of reference.
The intuitiveness of the descriptive view is brought out by seeing how it might handle cases that a purely referential account of natural kind terms would have trouble with. Consider, for instance, assertive utterances of the following sentences:
- Furze is gorse.
- Gnomes are mythical creatures.
- Unicorns don't exist.
- Fred believes that filberts, but not hazelnuts, are sweet.
(13) seems informative, (14) meaningful, (15) both meaningful and true, and (16) appears to attribute consistent beliefs to Fred. A purely referential account of meaning, according to which the meaning of a natural kind term is nothing other than its bearer, would predict that the first of these utterances is trivial, the second and third meaningless, and that the fourth attributes inconsistent beliefs to Fred. In contrast, suppose that we adopt a descriptivist account of meaning. Then, provided co-referring terms can have different descriptive contents, and provided further that empty kind terms have descriptive contents, we can explain the informativeness of (13), the meaningfulness of (14) and (15), and the fact that (16) does not ascribe inconsistent beliefs to Fred. (The explanations here parallel the descriptivist explanations for (2)–(5).)
But according to Putnam (1975), it would be a mistake to suppose that natural kind terms refer via descriptive content ‘inside the head of’ the competent speaker. I can refer to such things as furze (gorse) and filberts (hazelnuts) even if the descriptive content I associate with the expression in question is not ‘uniquely satisfied’ by such things — indeed, even if the content in question is satisfied by (say) walnuts or cashews. (This is basically the problem of ‘ignorance and error.’) Putnam made the same basic point via a number of thought-experiments. Thus, I refer to elm trees when I use the term ‘elm’; and I refer to beech trees when I use the term ‘beech’. But the descriptive content I associate with these terms may well be the same — something like deciduous tree of some sort. Thus, it cannot be what is inside my head that determines that to which I refer. Consider the famous ‘Twin Earth’ thought-experiment. Oscar and Twin Oscar refer to different kinds of substances (H2O, XYZ) when they use the term ‘water’ — despite the fact that their narrow or internal psychological states are identical, that (more specifically) the descriptive content they associate with the term (clear, odorless, colorless liquid, that falls from the sky and accumulates in lakes, rivers, and oceans) is the same. The moral is: the reference of a natural kind term cannot be determined solely by what's ‘in the head’. So, if meanings are reference-determiners, they are not in the head. (And if they are in the head, they are not reference-determiners.)
This brings us to the Putnam/Kripke causal view of reference for natural kind terms. It is similar to Kripke's account of nominal reference; indeed, it is more or less an extension of that account. Reference is initially fixed at a dubbing, either by perception or description of samples of some particular natural kind. The reference is then to whatever has an internal structure identical to that of the samples. In the case of water, this would be having the chemical structure H2O. Speakers at a dubbing are able to lend their reference to others via communicative exchanges, and these others can then lend reference to still others. Speakers who are ignorant as to the properties of the kind in question can nevertheless use the natural kind term to refer to the members of the kind because underlying their uses are causal chains stretching back to a reference-fixing.
Putnam thought that his causal account of natural kind terms could be extended to artifactual kind terms as well. These are terms that refer to kinds of man-made objects: pencils, clocks, telephones, and so forth. Putnam motivates his causal account of artifactual kind terms by appealing to intuitive considerations — that is, to thought experiments. Suppose we were to discover that pencils are not artifacts, but organisms. We would still call them ‘pencils’, and would be correct in doing so. This shows that the reference of such expressions cannot be fixed via some description of the form artifact the function of which is to…
Perhaps. But that only shows (at most) that the description in question cannot be of the particular form in question. Perhaps the relevant description is one of the form: that which has such-and-such a function. There need be no mention of the notion of an ‘artifact’ per se. In fact, a descriptivist view, according to which the reference of such terms is fixed by a function-specifying description, is intuitively plausible. Why? Presumably, because artifacts are not individuated by anything ‘hidden’, but rather by something transparent, i.e. their function. If function is indeed transparent, it should not be implausible to suppose that reference is determined by a description that specifies the function in question. Does that mean that one must know the reference-fixing description in order to refer to the kind in question? No. What it means is only that non-experts effectively defer to experts who do know (and don't just theorize about) the relevant reference-fixing descriptions. The question remains whether or not one can properly conceive of an organism as having a function extrinsic to its own being (as in Putnam's living-pencils example). But again, one can easily modify the relevant description to something like: that which purportedly has such-and-such a function. This would allow for mistaken attributions of artifactuality.
A definite description is an expression having a certain grammatical form: namely, the form ‘the F’. For our purposes, the central question regarding such phrases is whether or not a quantificational theory of descriptions — Russell's in particular — is adequate to handle the data regarding what Donnellan has called the ‘referential use’ of descriptions. Some further background is needed to understand this issue.
Russell (1905) famously opposed both Meinong (1904) and Frege (1892/1952) by claiming that definite descriptions are not genuine referring expressions, that they are not ‘logically proper names’ in Russell's terminology. In other words, their propositional contribution is not (simply or at all) their denotation. Russell's arguments appeal to intuitions (Russell would no doubt call them ‘facts’) about truth value and meaningfulness. Thus, consider assertive utterances of the following two sentences:
- The King of France is bald.
- The Queen of England has three sons.
(17) is meaningful, though certainly not true. As Russell himself puts it, it is “plainly false.” Russell's ‘Theory of Descriptions’ predicts that (17) is meaningful but false, expressing a (false) proposition to the effect that there exists exactly one king of France and that whatever is king of France is bald. According to Russell, (18) should get the same kind of analysis as (17). So, pace Frege, (18) turns out not to be about the Queen of England. Indeed, it is about nothing at all: for definite descriptions are not referring terms, but existential quantifiers. More specifically, the ‘proposition expressed’ by the assertive utterance of a sentence of the form The F is G is one to the effect that there is exactly one F and whatever is F is G.
P.F. Strawson (1950) claimed that Russell's theory was the result of overlooking certain fundamental distinctions, including the distinction between referring and meaning. Attend to these distinctions, and you will see that definite descriptions are indeed referring expressions, not quantifiers. But this does not mean that they are logically proper names, only that speakers use them to talk about particular objects/individuals, not to assert that things of a certain sort exist. Thus, consider an assertive utterance of:
- The King of France is wise.
According to Strawson, such an utterance will be neither true nor false, since the definite description fails to refer to anything. Indeed, nothing at all has been asserted (or ‘stated’ or ‘said’) by means of this utterance. On Russell's view, the statement is false as it involves the false claim that there exists a unique king of France. The meaning of the description, on Strawson's view, is given by a rule: one to the effect that it is to be used in cases where there is a (contextually) unique king of France to whom one is referring by means of the term.
Keith Donnellan (1966) thought that definite descriptions were pragmatically ambiguous in that they had two different uses, and that these two uses were relevant to what is said, to the ‘statement’ made. One of these uses, the so-called ‘attributive use’, was captured by Russell's theory but not Strawson's; the other use, the ‘referential use’, was captured by Strawson's theory but not by Russell's. Or so Donnellan claimed. To see the motivations for positing this sort of ambiguity, consider the following case. Smith is found brutally murdered and it is claimed (on account of the heinousness of the crime) that:
- The murderer of Smith is insane.
Suppose that the speaker has no idea who the murderer is. Then, the description is used attributively — to say something about whoever (uniquely) murdered Smith — and Russell's analysis applies. That is, the statement is true just in case there is a unique murderer of Smith and whoever murdered Smith is insane. But now suppose that Jones is accused of Smith's murder and that the speaker believes that Jones is guilty. In attempting to say something about Jones, the speaker comes out with an utterance of (20). In this case, the description is used referentially, to pick Jones out so as to say something about him. According to Donnellan, the statement is thus true just in case Jones is insane — even if he is innocent and the actual murderer (Robinson) is quite sane. Russell's theory, according to Donnellan, cannot accommodate the referential use, and so is incomplete at best.
Kripke's (1977) responds to Donnellan's argument by accusing Donnellan of mistaking pragmatic facts for semantic facts. More specifically, Kripke accuses Donnellan of confusing speaker reference for expression reference. Kripke claimed that the referential use of definite descriptions was both genuine and interesting, but was not properly semantic. Thus it was not relevant to Russell's theory. According to Kripke, the truth value of:
- The man in the corner drinking champagne is happy tonight.
depends only on whether the man in the corner drinking champagne is happy. This is so even if the speaker intends to refer to someone else, a man in the corner who only appears to be drinking champagne but who is in fact drinking sparkling water. In such a case, the speaker may say something true (or false) about the individual to whom he intends to refer. Nevertheless, the truth-value of the sentence itself will not depend upon the properties of the speaker's referent, but on those of the semantic referent: on those of the description's denotation, should there be one. Thus, according to Kripke, Russell's theory of descriptions, though perhaps not without its problems, is not undermined by the referential use of descriptions. Although many have accepted at least the basics of Kripke's rejoinder to Donnellan, the debate over the referential use — over whether it in fact undermines Russell's theory of descriptions — continues unabated.
It seems almost obvious that there are expressions that refer. But do all (meaningful) expressions refer? Intuitively, at least, there appear to be many sorts of expressions — perfectly meaningful expressions — that do not refer. Consider, for instance, the following five sentences:
- Nobody runs faster than me.
- Fred is tall.
- Do it for the sake of the children.
- Yes, I am very proud of you and the children.
- She skipped happily.
Consider the italicized words in each and ask yourself what they might be used to refer to. ‘Nobody’ certainly doesn't refer to anyone; ‘Fred’ refers to Fred, but what does ‘tall’ refer to? A property? But which one? And do such properties really exist in a sense that would allow them to be objects of reference? This is controversial. What about ‘sake’ (and other nouns like ‘behalf’ and ‘dint’)? And what of ‘yes’, ‘very’, ‘of’, and ‘and’? What do adverbs like ‘happily’ refer to? A way or manner of some activity? Again, is it plausible to suppose that such things exist in a sense which enables them to be objects of reference? Not obviously. The point is simply this: some perfectly meaningful expressions do not seem to be referring expressions, in which case a theory of how they refer, of how their reference relates to the meaning or truth of sentences in which they occur, would be beside the point. It seems more reasonable (or at least more intuitive) to suppose that such expressions derive their meaning from something other than reference. Consequently, attempts to devise theories of reference for such expressions are rather uncommon, though certainly not unheard of. Frege (1892/1952) offered a highly systematic conception of reference on which reference is assigned to every constituent of a sentence that is relevant to determining its truth-value. (Quantifiers, for instance, are said to refer to second level concepts.) Much later, Montague (1960) constructed a semantic theory on which expressions of the sort in question are again assigned referents. But it is fair to say that the sense in which such expressions might be said to refer is not an intuitive one, but rather one that is highly technical and theory-laden.
Reference is arguably the central notion in the philosophy of language, with close ties to the notions of meaning and truth. But one might wonder whether reference has implications for philosophical issues that go beyond the philosophy of language proper. Many have thought that it does, and many of these philosophers have seen connections between reference and reality, the nature of which is the subject matter of metaphysics. One of the oldest metaphysical problems — the so-called ‘problem of non-being’ — involves the notion of reference. Many others have seen connections between reference and knowledge, the nature of which is the subject matter of epistemology. Certain epistemological problems — e.g. Putnam's infamous ‘brain in a vat’ thought-experiment — also involve the notion of reference. In contrast, there are philosophers who believe that reference — understood as providing a substantive link between language and the world — is not a subject worthy of serious philosophical study. Various reasons have been given for this negative attitude toward reference, including: (i) reference is inherently indeterminate (Quine, 1960), (ii) the notion of reference is without theoretical value (Davidson, 1984), and (iii) all that one can say about reference is what is embodied by instantiations of a schema like: ‘a’ refers to a. Before looking briefly at these negative views, let's look at a possible connection between reference and reality.
Consider the following sentence:
- Pegasus does not exist.
Surely this sentence is true. More precisely, an assertive utterance of (27) would express a true proposition. After all, we all know that Pegasus is a purely mythical creature. Yet, the truth of (27) would seem to imply that Pegasus in some sense is, that Pegasus has being of some sort. Otherwise, how could we refer to the mythical horse and say truly of it that it does not exist? Thus, Pegasus and other nonexistent beings nonetheless are. They have being, since otherwise we could not coherently (and truly) deny that they exist. Or so claimed Meinong (1904). How do we avoid commitment to what Quine (1961) famously called Meinong's “bloated universe”? One solution (namely, Quine's) is to distinguish sharply between meaning and reference, and then claim that although ‘Pegasus’ has no reference, it does have a meaning. In particular, its meaning is given by a definite description which is to be interpreted à la Russell (1905). Thus, (27) gets analyzed as (something like):
- There does not exist a unique winged horse.
Or, more precisely:
- It is false that there exists a unique winged horse.
What this sentence says is clearly true, and we can say that it is true without being committed to even the minimal being of Pegasus. In effect, the solution claims that certain expressions that look like names are not names in the logical sense: their meaning (if any) is not their reference. Such expressions are instead abbreviated Russellian descriptions. Such descriptions do not have meaning in isolation — in particular, they do not mean what they denote — and they may in fact denote nothing. Rather, they have meaning only in the context of the sentence in which they occur, a sentence whose assertive utterance expresses a complex existential proposition to the effect that there exists a unique F and whatever is F is G. This is not the only way out of Meinong's universe of non-existent beings, however. Some philosophers have argued that names of fictional and mythical creatures refer to existent objects — abstract objects in particular. Nathan Salmon (1998), for instance, advocates a version of this general view. Salmon claims that ‘Pegasus’ and the like refer to existent things — to abstract entities, man-made artifacts. On such a view, (29) is actually false. Pegasus, a man-made artifact, does indeed exist and so can be referred to. Intuitions to the contrary are to be explained away as a conflation of speaker meaning and word meaning, the former of which may involve a proposition to the effect that Pegasus does not exist as a physical object. This way of looking at the problem of non-being allows Salmon to remain a Millian — that is, to remain committed to the view that the meaning of a proper name is nothing more than its reference — while also allowing that expressions like ‘Pegasus’ are genuine proper names. (For more on reference to non-existent objects, see the entry on nonexistent objects.)
Now let's turn to issues of reference and knowledge, looking specifically at Putnam's envatted brains. Putnam purports to arrive at a substantive conclusion — that we are not brains in vats — with the assistance of a particular theory about the nature of reference — namely, the causal theory. The basic argument is this. If you were a brain in a vat, you could not think that you were; but you can think that you're a brain in a vat; so you cannot be a brain in a vat. The reason for this is that thinking you are a brain in a vat requires causal links to things which, if you were a brain in a vat, wouldn't exist. These are the sorts of causal links between thought and reality that would make thinking you are a brain in a vat possible in the first place. So you can't have such thoughts, if those thoughts are true. You can in fact have such thoughts, so they must not be true.
The literature responding to Putnam's argument is enormous. Some who have responded to Putnam have interpreted his argument as a refutation of skepticism; other respondents have interpreted the argument as having a considerably more modest (metaphysical) conclusion: that I am not a brain in a vat. One of the most influential responses to Putnam's argument, assuming this more modest aim, was put forth by Tony Brueckner (1986). Brueckner contends that the argument doesn't yield the conclusion that Putnam promised: that I am not a brain in a vat. Rather, it yields only the significantly different conclusion that: my utterance of “I am not a brain in a vat” is true. Some subsequent literature has explored the legitimacy of the ‘disquotation’ step that's needed to get from where Putnam gets us to where he promised to get us. Another influential criticism of Putnam's argument was first made by Peter Smith (1984). Smith argues that Putnam's argument won't work against certain ways of construing the brain in a vat hypothesis. But Smith's criticism, though compelling, responds only to Putnam's argument construed as a refutation of skepticism. After all, the skeptic needs only one coherent skeptical hypothesis to motivate his position.
How does all this relate to the causal theory of reference? The sentiment among some epistemologists is that the sort of semantic externalism underpinning the causal theory is simply not strong enough to support a refutation of skepticism. Thus, suppose we accept the reasonable view that the content of some thoughts/expressions is not completely determined by what is going on inside one's head. Suppose that such contents are at least partly determined by the nature of items one has been in causal contact with. Even then, it is not clear that we have the basis for concluding that skepticism is incorrect even if we do end up with a priori considerations supporting the metaphysical conclusion that we're not brains in vats. (See Keith DeRose (2000) for more on this view. See also the entry on skepticism and content externalism for more on Putnam's brain in a vat argument.)
Thus far, this article has been concerned largely with what might be called ‘positive’ views of reference. Reference, construed as a relation between bits of language and bits of reality, is assumed to be a genuine, substantive relation worthy of philosophical scrutiny. Accounts (whether descriptive, causal, hybrid, speaker-oriented, salience-based, character-driven, etc.) are then given of what constitutes this link. Moreover, some philosophers (as just noted) believe that referential theories have important implications for metaphysical and epistemological issues. But not all philosophers are so sanguine about either the possibility or the theoretical significance of reference. In closing, we will briefly discuss several ‘negative’ views of reference.
W.V.O. Quine (1960) has argued that reference is inherently indeterminate or ‘inscrutable’. By this, Quine means that there is no fact of the matter about what our words refer to. It is not that our words refer to something but we are unable to determine what that is. Rather, there is simply no such thing as that to which our words refer. Nevertheless, Quine does not go so far as to say that our words fail to refer in any sense. His view is rather that it makes sense to speak of what our words refer to only relative to some purpose we might have in assigning referents to those words. Quine's argument for the inscrutability thesis involves an application of the thesis that empirical theories are underdetermined by their supporting evidence. For any body of empirical evidence we might have about speakers of a given language, there will be a number of competing theories as to what their words refer to. Such theories will be empirically equivalent: equally consistent with the empirical data. One theory might say that, in the language in question, ‘gavagai’ refers to rabbits; another might say that it refers to undetached rabbit parts; a third might say that it refers to time-slices of rabbits. Quine's views on underdetermination can be applied to one's own language. The result is that the available evidence no more forces the speaker to the conclusion that by ‘rabbit’ he means rabbits, than it forces him to conclude that by ‘rabbit’ he means undetached rabbit parts or time-slices of rabbits. If a speaker observes himself using the word ‘rabbit,’ the evidence he amasses will give equal support to all three theories, as well as to many others. So, according to Quine, for any given body of empirical evidence, there will be numerous competing theories as to what the words one uses refer to. And there will be no principled way of adjudicating between these theories.
Donald Davidson's instrumentalist views on reference are even more radical than Quine's. Davidson (1984) claims that reference is a theoretically vacuous notion: it is of absolutely no use in a semantic theory. His basis for endorsing this position is his conviction that no substantive explanation of reference is possible. The problem is that any such explanation would have to be given in non-linguistic terms, but no such explanation can be given. As Davidson puts it (1984, p. 220): if the name ‘Kilimanjaro’ refers to Kilimanjaro, then no doubt there is some relation between English (or Swahili) speakers, the word, and the mountain. But it is inconceivable that one should be able to explain this relation without first explaining the role of the words in the sentences; and if this is so, there is no chance of explaining reference directly in non-linguistic terms. However, this does not mean that there is no hope for semantics. On the contrary, on Davidson's view a Tarskian theory of truth for a language is at the same time a theory of meaning for that language. The point here is that a Davidsonian theory of meaning has no place for the notion of reference per se; instead, it assimilates what we might be tempted to call reference into the theory of linguistic truth.
Similar in spirit to Davidson's views are the views of deflationists about reference (not to be confused with deflationism about truth). Such theorists claim that there is nothing more to referential notions than is captured by instances of a schema like: ‘a’ refers to a. Such a schema generates claims like ‘Frege’ refers to Frege. Such views are often accompanied by, and motivated by, a deflationary theory of truth, according to which to assert that a statement is true is just to assert the statement itself.
In spite of the myriad concerns regarding the viability of the theory of reference which serve to underwrite these ‘negative’ views of reference, the nature of the relation between language and reality continues to be one of the most talked about and vigorously debated issues in the philosophy of language. What remains to be seen is to what extent this work may prove helpful to better understanding the more general notion of reference, a notion equally at home in aesthetics and philosophy of mind as it is in philosophy of language.
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