Conservatism and its modernising, anti-traditionalist rivals, liberalism and socialism, are the dominant political philosophies and ideologies of the post-Enlightenment era. Conservatives criticise their rivals for making a utopian exaggeration of the power of theoretical reason, and of human perfectibility. Conservative prescriptions are based on what they regard as experience rather than reason; for them, the ideal and the practical are inseparable. Most commentators regard conservatism as a modern political philosophy, even though it exhibits the standpoint of paternalism or authority, rather than freedom. As John Gray writes, while liberalism is the dominant political theory of the modern age, conservatism, despite appealing to tradition, is also a response to the challenges of modernity. The roots of all three standpoints “may be traced back to the crises of seventeenth-century England, but [they] crystallised into definite traditions of thought and practice only [after] the French Revolution” (Gray 1995: 78).
It is contested both what conservatism is, and what it could or ought to be—both among the public and politicians, and among the philosophers and political theorists that this article inevitably focuses on. Popularly, “conservative” is often a generic term for “right-wing viewpoint occupying the political spectrum between liberalism and fascism”. Philosophical commentators offer a more distinctive characterisation. Many treat it as a standpoint that is sceptical of abstract reasoning in politics, and that appeals instead to living tradition, allowing for the possibility of limited political reform. On this view, conservatism is neither dogmatic reaction, nor the right-wing radicalism of Margaret Thatcher or contemporary American “neo-conservatives”. Other commentators, however, contrast this “pragmatic conservatism” with a universalist “rational conservatism” that is not sceptical of reason, and that regards a community with a hierarchy of authority as most conducive to human well-being (Skorupski 2015).
Compared to liberalism and socialism, however, conservatism has suffered philosophical neglect (Broad 1913: 396–7). Many deny that it is an ideology, or even a political philosophy, regarding it instead as a disposition that resists theoretical expression—a “non-ideology” that attempts to avoid the errors of ideologies (Graham 1986: 172; in contrast, Nisbet 1986). Is it an ancient attitude, or one that developed only in response to Enlightenment rationality and its political products, liberalism and socialism? How is it related to contemporary “neo-conservatism”? Is it a coherent position, or does it, as many have argued, fail to distinguish what is worth conserving from what is not? These are some of the questions commonly raised about conservatism, and that are explored here.
- 1. The Nature of Conservatism
- 1.1 Broad versus narrow sense conservatism
- 1.2 Narrow sense or Burkean conservatism as scepticism about reason
- 1.3 Tradition and gradual reform: conservatism vs. reaction
- 1.4 Formal procedural vs. substantive senses of “conservatism”; contrast with neo-conservatism and libertarianism
- 1.5 Conservatism and liberalism: the standpoint of freedom vs. standpoint of paternalism
- 2. The Development of Conservative Thought
- 3. Critiques of conservatism
- 4. Cultural conservatism and conservation
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Conservatism in a broad sense, as a social attitude, has always existed. It expresses the instinctive human fear of sudden change, and tendency to habitual action. The arch-royalist and anti-populist Earl of Clarendon, writing the history of the 17th century English Civil War soon after it happened, was instinctively conservative in this broader, un-self-conscious sense. Thus Beiser contrasts the “conservatism [that] had always existed in Germany as a social attitude”, with a self-conscious conservatism that developed as a social force in the 1790s, opposed to the Aufklärung or Enlightenment, and in reaction to the French Revolution (Beiser 1992: 281). “Self-conscious” here means not merely implicit in behaviour, but consciously avowed, and ascribed to others. The most distinctive and historically important version of this narrower, self-conscious conservatism rests on scepticism concerning reason in politics.
Various precursors of this self-conscious conservatism have been claimed. Aristotle is often cited, for holding that morality and politics—unlike natural science—lack special experts, and that in these areas, human experience over generations is the main source of knowledge. Confucius is another possible precursor. From a later but still pre-Enlightenment era, the English common law notion of precedent, developed by such as Edward Coke (1552–1634), is a clear influence on self-conscious conservatism (Pocock 1989). For Hoppit,
Tory, or what would now be called ‘conservative’, political thought remained alive and well [in England] in the 1690s and 1700s….Thomas Sherlock [wrote] in 1704, ‘To maintain the Establish’d Form of Government, is the First and Highest Duty of Men Acting in Society’. (Hoppit 2000: 196)
David Hume (1711–1776) is sometimes regarded as a conservative. He was a sceptic about reasoning concerning ends as opposed to means, but did not live to see the French Revolution and the arguments underlying it; Dr. Johnson remarked that he was “a Tory by chance” (reported by Boswell, in Fieser ed. 2005: 290).
These thinkers are proto-conservatives; it is commonly accepted that as a self-conscious standpoint, conservatism came into existence with Burke’s critique of the French Revolution (Kirk 1954: 5; Honderich 2005: 6; Nisbet 1986; Claeys 2007: 11–34). The 18th century European Enlightenment aimed to improve the human condition through reform of political institutions. Its thinkers aimed to establish ethical and political principles that appealed to reason rather than established authority or tradition, a “universal ethics independent of historically contingent tradition” (Beveridge and Turnbull 1997: 124). The French Revolution gave powerful expression to this belief, rapidly reinforced by the Industrial Revolution and growth of capitalism.
For many contemporary writers, the French Revolution was a liberation of the human spirit, an assertion of reason against irrational feudal authority. The Revolution reflected the Enlightenment’s attitude towards history, which it regarded not as the inevitable realisation of a divine plan, but as open to direction by enlightened reason, expressed in social and educational reform. Although conservative thinkers opposed the French Revolution, their attitude towards the Enlightenment is debated. Burke is often associated with what Isaiah Berlin called the “Counter-Enlightenment”, but he has also been seen as “an Enlightened figure, who saw himself defending Enlightened Europe against the gens de lettres and their revolutionary successors”—it was “one Enlightenment in conflict with another” (Pocock 1999: 7). Bourke comments that historians have
mistaken Burke’s enlightened opposition to doctrinaire attacks on organised religion for a…counter-enlightenment crusade… encouraged by a secular teleology [that reduces] enlightenment to the criticism of religion…Burke’s espousal of sceptical Whiggism and Protestant toleration is curiously reinterpreted as hostile to the very principles of enlightenment he was in fact defending. (Bourke 2014: 28)
Thus the common assumption that conservatism rejects modernity is questioned by Scruton, for whom it “is itself a modernism… [that desires] to live fully in the present, to understand it in all its imperfections” (2007: 194). John Gray comments that Oakeshott’s conservative thought is paradoxical in that he “is in no sense an anti-modernist: If anything, he is an uncompromising modernist, perhaps even a postmodernist” (Gray 2007, Other Internet Resources).
In its narrow, self-conscious sense, conservatism can be characterised as an
approach to human affairs which mistrusts both a priori reasoning and revolution, preferring to put its trust in experience and in the gradual improvement of tried and tested arrangements. (O’Hear 1998)
Kekes argues similarly that conservatism, with its defining scepticism and opposition to “rationalism” in politics, contrasts with liberalism and socialism in rejecting a priori value-commitments (Kekes 1997: 368). This position was enunciated most trenchantly by Burke, conservatism’s “master intellectual”, acknowledged by almost all subsequent conservatives. He rejected a priori reasoning in politics, notably claims to abstract natural rights, manifested most dramatically in the French Jacobin dream of destroying and rebuilding society. Burke holds that there is a practical wisdom in institutions that is mostly not articulable theoretically, certainly not in advance, but is passed down in culture and tradition.
Revolutionary Jacobinism is conservatism’s polar opposite and historic contender. The name comes from the Jacobin Club whose central figure, Robespierre, launched the French Revolutionary Terror. (On revolution and Jacobinism, see Graham 1986: 178–81.) Conservatives such as Burke contrast the French Revolution with England’s more peaceful Glorious Revolution of 1688, which for them was a revolution in the original sense—a return to an alleged status quo prior to monarchical absolutism, as opposed to an overturning of traditional institutions in accord with a rational plan. Conservatism and revolutionary Jacobinism are inter-dependent concepts that arose together, in conjunction with liberalism and socialism. One could argue that there is a conceptual holism between them, in that they cannot be understood independently of each other, and must be inter-defined (Hamilton 2013 ch 1.2). In its modern concept, political revolution rejects the past; before the 18th century, according to most historians, “revolution” had only its literal sense of “return to an original state”. (Cressy (2006) suggests that in the English Civil War of the 1640s, a metaphorical use emerged, meaning sudden, dramatic change in politics or religion.) With the Enlightenment, the natural order or social hierarchy previously largely accepted was questioned. (The earliest stirrings of this questioning were found in the English Civil War and even the Peasant’s Revolt.) Implicit in Jacobinism is what may be termed revolutionary utopianism, which allows the sacrifice of present generations for alleged future benefit. (According to critics of utopianism such as Schiller, indeed, one should not even sacrifice oneself for a utopian vision, as do members of revolutionary organisations, such as Nelson Mandela and Joe Slovo of the ANC; Schiller, and Goethe, also provided conservative critiques of French Revolutionary ideals and practices.)
Conservatives reject revolutionary Jacobinism’s espousal of political rationalism, which attempts to reconstruct society from abstract principles or general blueprint, without reference to tradition. Conservatives view society not as a machine but as a highly complex organism, and hold therefore that “without the aid of experience, reason cannot prescribe political ideals that can be realised in practice” (Beiser 1992: 283). Present generations possess duties and responsibilities whose original reasons, if they were ever apparent, are now lost. Tradition represents for conservatives a continuum enmeshing the individual and social, and is immune to reasoned critique; the radical intellectual is therefore arrogant and dangerous (Kekes 1997: 365). For liberals and socialists, in contrast, tradition has value only insofar as it survives rational criticism.
Conservatism therefore rests on what may be termed particularist scepticism concerning abstract rational principles. Conservatives regard the radical’s rationalism as “metaphysical” in ignoring particular social, economic and historical conditions:
I cannot [praise or blame] human actions…on a simple view of the object, as it stands stripped of every relation, in all the nakedness and solitude of metaphysical abstraction; (Burke, WS III: 58)
circumstances give every political principle its colour. (Cobban 1960: 75)
For conservatives, abstract propositions cannot be simply applied to specific circumstances. Unlike liberals and socialists, therefore, conservatives are particularist in rejecting universal prescriptions and panaceas; they reject the Enlightenment-modernist requirement that practical rationality is liberated from all particularism (Beveridge and Turnbull 1997). This is not “particularism” in its dictionary definition of “exclusive adherence to one’s own group, party, sect, or nation”; rather, it is a philosophical sense that has an affinity with moral particularism as advocated by Dancy (2004). The parallel is incomplete, however; political conservatives do not deny that there are general principles, they just deny that one should apply them. Their position is an essentially epistemic one—that one cannot know the general principles whose implementation would benefit the operation of society. According to Gray, conservatism’s fundamental insight is that
persons’ identities cannot be matters of choice, but are conferred on them by their unchosen histories, so that what is most essential about them is…what is most accidental. The conservative vision is that people will come to value the privileges of choice…when they see how much in their lives must always remain unchosen. (2010: 159)
Conservative scepticism is quite distinct from Cartesian or external world scepticism, therefore, since this scepticism is based on reason; rather, it is sceptical about the claims of theoretical reason, in politics and ethics. Nor does its scepticism constitute a critique of society in the Marxist sense. For conservatives, society rests on prejudice, not reason; prejudice is not irrational, but simply unreasoning. Burke advocated educated prejudice as an antidote to its bigoted forms—arguably, not a rejection of reason, but a scepticism about its inordinate pretensions. Philosophers might speculate about why we have the duties that we do, but prejudice makes us act, without having to calculate all the consequences—or indeed to reason about ends. This is not the irrationalism of Nietzsche or Freud, for whom much of human behaviour is irrationally driven, but rather, a non-rationalist standpoint. It is sceptical about proposals of reform based on a priori commitment to a value such as freedom or equality. (See 2.3 on Burke below) In elucidating conservatism, one should distinguish between the metaethical claim that abstract values do not exist or are not worth pursuing, and the epistemic challenge “how are these values be accessed in practice?” Conservatism is primarily an epistemic standpoint. Conservatives believe that values of justice, freedom, and truth are important and should be pursued by the state, but they interpret those values in a concrete fashion.
As we have seen, it is generally recognised that conservatism is not dogmatic reaction. It advocates piecemeal, moderate reform, which follows from its scepticism concerning reason, and its valuing of experience concerning human affairs. Burke argued that “a state without the means of some change is without the means of its conservation”. But change must be cautious, because knowledge is imperfect and consequences can be unintended. According to conservatives, institutions and morals evolve, their weaknesses become apparent and obvious political abuses are corrected; but ancient institutions embody a tacit wisdom that deserves respect. Conservatives are sceptical of large-scale constitutional, economic or cultural planning, because behaviour and institutions have evolved through the wisdom of generations, which cannot easily be articulated.
The notion of tradition is central to conservatism, and its self-conscious, contrastive use arises only in modernity. In the later 18th century, the mobilisation of “the past” as an explicit political resource became especially important, and a contrast between “traditional” and “modern”—as opposed to “ancient” and “modern”—was stressed. Burke’s political philosophy was an early instance of this process. This mobilisation has been associated with “the invention of tradition” (Hobsbawm and Ranger 1983), in which mass-produced “traditional” artefacts established a fictional organic relation between past and present, as in Sir Walter Scott’s re-invention of the kilt and other “traditional” artefacts for King George IV’s visit to Edinburgh in 1822.
For conservatives, vital political relations are organic. Unlike reactionary thinkers, they regard traditions not as static, but as in a gentle and gradual flux, encouraged by the astute reformer. For Burke, the English revolutionaries of 1688 achieved restoration as opposed to “innovation”. Reform corrects the inadequacies of ancient institutions in light of contemporary needs—conservatives such as Disraeli might want to create a broader suffrage, for instance—but one must disdain “the blind and furious spirit of innovation”. Reform must be practically and not theoretically-based:
I must see with my own eyes…touch with my own hands not only the fixed but the momentary circumstances, before I could venture to suggest any political project whatsoever...I must see the means of correcting the plan…I must see the things; I must see the men. (Burke, WS III: 326)
For Kekes, conservatism adopts a stance of scepticism between extremes of rationalism and fideism (belief based on faith), and steers a middle course of pessimism between claims of perfectibility and corruptibility (1998: 54, 89, 60). Conservatives aim to
conserve the political arrangements that have historically shown themselves to be conducive to good lives thus understood (1998: 27);
history [as] the best guide to understanding the present and planning for the future. (Kekes 1997: 352)
Conservatism’s “organic” social vision is inherently sceptical of the state, and puts faith instead in the family, private property and religion; it does not involve the rich organicism of the British Idealists Bradley and Bosanquet, that yields “a mystical union with the superior unity of the state”—a German philosophical rather than British conservative conception (Sweet 1999). As Cobban writes, Locke’s influence ensured that the “historic idea in Burke’s mind [did not] pass into the full organic theory of society” (Cobban 1960: 89). It is reaction and not conservatism that is inherently authoritarian. For conservatives, individuals and local communities are better assessors of their own needs and problems than distant bureaucrats. Free from utopian planning, conservatives hold, society finds its own, largely beneficial, shape.
Conservatism proceeds via the tried and tested, relying not on pure reason, but on what Burke called the “latent wisdom” of prejudice, instinct and custom, which accumulates across generations. For Kirk, “prejudice is not bigotry or superstition”, though it may degenerate into these; it is
pre-judgment, the answer…which intuition and ancestral consensus of opinion supply…when [one] lacks either time or knowledge to arrive at a decision predicated upon pure reason. (1954: 34)
For conservatives, custom is immemorial but not thereby static; it is “constantly being subjected to the test of experience” (Pocock 1989: 213). But to change the state in response to “floating fancies or fashions” is to break the “whole chain and continuity of the commonwealth” (Burke, WS III: 145).
1.4 Formal procedural vs. substantive senses of “conservatism”; contrast with neo-conservatism and libertarianism
Conservatism has been equated with pragmatism or political realism; Gamble (2012) argues that conservative political “thought” is all practice—self-interested practice. But conservatism is generally regarded as a philosophy, if not a systematic one. Two contrasting interpretations of conservatism distinguish it from mere pragmatism. Both reject a priori reasoning, revolution and social experiments; both trust experience, look for gradual improvement of tried and tested arrangements, and sympathise with the pragmatist’s motto “if it ain’t broke, don’t fix it”; both are sceptical of reason, and are particularist:
(1) relativistic conservatism holds that if socialism, feudalism or fascism works well in some country, one should try to make it run better through minor improvements based on experience and accumulated wisdom. The judgement of whether something is broken or runs reasonably well appeals to values accepted in the relevant society. Thus conservatives in reasonably functioning socialist, feudal and fascist countries advocate different modes of social organisation and gradual improvement, according to prevailing values. On this view, conservative particularism is relativistic.
(2) non-relativistic conservatism rejects views such as socialism, libertarianism and fascism that aim to structure society around a single rationally articulated organising principle. On this interpretation, particularism does not imply relativism. Revolutionary systems, and autocratic systems with no possibility of incremental change—societies that do not exhibit living traditions—are not amenable to a conservative outlook. Conservatism is situational, but some situations do not permit conservative responses.
The sarcastic dismissal of Burke by a liberal defender of the Revolution, J.S. Mill’s father James, is effective only against position (1), relativistic conservatism:
In the case of public institutions, Mr. Burke had…worked himself into an artificial admiration of the bare fact of existence; especially ancient existence. Everything was to be protected, not because it was good, but, because it existed. Evil, to render itself an object of reverence in his eye, required only to be realised. (James Mill 1858: Vol. V, 200–1)
Yet only position (2), non-relativistic conservatism, can express the conservative criterion of a well-functioning society, in terms of organic tradition; there is no such thing, in these terms, as a “reasonably functioning totalitarian society”. This non-relativist position is minimally rational and universal, while remaining particularist. (This terminology is elucidated further at 2.3). (Lock (2006) regards (1) and (2) as an unBurkean choice between constructed opposites, arguing that Burke is not strongly relativist, but recognises temporal and geographical differences that amount to a kind of relativism.)
Conservatives seek to “preserve the political arrangements…shown to be conducive to good lives”, writes Kekes (1997: 351–2). Perhaps he overlooks the contestability of conceptions of the good life, and of arrangements that preserve it; liberals, for instance, stress the value of individual freedom, independent of burdensome constraints of tradition. According to (2), there is a conservative conception of the good life, and of the arrangements that preserve it—one that rejects the over-valuation of Enlightenment rationalism and revolution. But as we will see, conservatives must steer a course between unconservative mere pragmatism, and unconservative substantive policy. (The issue recurs throughout this entry, especially in sections 2.3 and 3.1.)
For Graham, conservative scepticism is
not so much a scepticism about the moral perfection of mankind, as a scepticism about the knowledge necessary in politics. (1986: 176)
But these are hard to separate. Liberals and socialists stress the malleability of human nature under the influence of changeable historical conditions. The anti-conservative Rousseau had an optimistic conception of human nature, blaming government and society for failings that—according to conservatives—belong to individuals. Conservatives, in contrast, regard human nature as weak and fallible, unalterably selfish rather than altruistic (Kekes 1997: 368). Scruton is typical in regarding human beings as frail creatures of limited sympathy not easily extending to those remote in space or time (Scruton 2012). (Rawls’s “limited altruism” in the “circumstances of justice” seems derived from Hume, and so might be characterised as a conservative feature of Rawls’ thought.) Conservatism is imperfectionist, anti-utopian and pragmatic, “unable to appeal to any future that is not already present and past” (Scruton 1980: 27).
Conservatism is popularly confused with neo-conservatism and with libertarianism. But right libertarians and neo-conservatives, unlike Burkean conservatives, reject state planning for doctrinaire reasons. Making anti-planning into a principle, or economic liberalism into an ideology, offends the conservative’s pragmatic, sceptical temper, which could admit a role for state planning and economic intervention were such things shown to be effective. Conservatives reject ideologies, of which neo-liberalism is one. As Oakeshott argues
A plan to resist all planning may be better than its opposite, but it belongs to the same style of politics. And only in a society already deeply infected with Rationalism will the conversion of the traditional resources of resistance to the tyranny of Rationalism into a self-conscious ideology be considered a strengthening of those resources. It seems that now, in order to participate in politics [one must have] a doctrine…. (Oakeshott 1991 : 212)
The conservative’s rejection of rationalism therefore cuts both ways; it undermines both socialism, and the doctrinaire, free-market rejection of socialism. Conservatives oppose rational planning, but do not dogmatically oppose planning that works. Scruton, for instance, believes that a market economy is most conducive to prosperity, but like Adam Smith, insists that markets should work within, and not erode, customs and moral and legal traditions. Burke’s and Scruton’s conservatism is not an economic view, but one that regards society as formed over a long period in relation with place and land; it treats rights and duties on the model of the common law, depending on tradition and practice, rather than on abstract notions of human rights (see entry on rights).
Conservatism differs from neo-conservatism and libertarianism in motivation or formal features, therefore. For instance, in both the modern US Republican Party (GOP) and British Conservative Party, Burkean conservatism has been submerged. The GOP’s anti-governmentalism is closer to libertarian traditions; its patriotic and deeply religious standpoints—and what critics regard as its militarism and opposition to immigration—coincide only partially with Burkean conservatism. (It has been argued (Harvey 2005; Ha Joon Chang 2003) that neo-conservatives do not reduce state intervention, but simply shift its priorities, while maintaining its massive scale.)
It follows that despite some claims to the contrary, Nozick’s Anarchy State and Utopia is not a conservative rival to Rawls’ liberal theory (Nozick 1977). Nozick and conservatism seem to share a commitment to the invisible hand of the free market, and rejection of an extensive state. But Nozick is more plausibly regarded as a right libertarian, an extreme classical or neo-liberal. It is wrong to say that he is “rare among conservatives” in presenting it with a “general principle or rationale”, viz. “from each as they choose, to each as they are chosen”, in contrast to the socialist or communist “from each according to his ability, to each according to their need” (Honderich 2005: 60; see Nozick 1977: 160). Conservatives avoid such principles. Rejecting Nozick as a model, Scruton stresses that “political understanding, as a form of practical judgement, does not readily translate itself into universal principles” (Scruton 1980: 36).
Libertarianism influences neo-conservatism, but—as an extreme form of liberalism—is at best neutral towards conservatism’s emphasis on tradition. Perhaps neo-liberalism is libertarianism plus related economic doctrines, while neo-conservatism is libertarianism plus elements of traditional conservatism. Neo-liberals like Milton Friedman question drug-prohibition and conscription, which conservatives and neo-conservatives would not.
Conservatism’s popular association with laissez-faire capitalism is also debatable; it has been associated as much with feudal romanticism as with capitalism. Feudalism is a contested label for the economic system prevalent in Europe from after the decline of the Roman Empire until the 16th century, and which rested on the holding of land in return for labour; in France, it persisted as the ancien regime up till the French Revolution. A sympathiser with the ancien regime such as Burke could therefore be regarded as a feudal romantic. (On feudalism, see Dyer 2002, and Pocock 1987.) Like some socialists, many 19th century conservatives reacted against industrialism and laissez-faire capitalism with a feudal nostalgia. Marx contrasted the warmth and security of feudalism with the inhumanity of capitalism, but rejected “feudal idyllics”, dismissing Disraeli and “feudal socialists” for failing to comprehend “the march of modern history” (Duncan 1973: 19–22).
Conservatism may seem to share the laissez-faire doctrine, imputed to Adam Smith, of the invisible hand—according to which, in a free market, unintended consequences of actions tend to promote the general good. The capitalist free market is held to be self-regulating; producers and consumers, acting selfishly, benefit each other, and rational economic planning disrupts the innate, benign “intelligence” of markets. The evolutionary nature and anti-statism of laissez-faire theory appeal to conservatives, but as we saw, they would not reject planning in a doctrinaire way. In fact, the “invisible hand” was unimportant and indeed alien to Smith (Rothschild 2001: 116–56). The allegedly neo-conservative Hayek, with his esteem for “the unconscious, the blind, the untheoretical, the imperfectly understood”, is more Burkean here (Rothschild 2001: 149; see also Scruton 2007); for Gray, he synthesises “the deepest insights of conservatism with the best elements of classical liberalism” (2010: 124). Hayek valued local, transient, untheoretical knowledge, and advocated unfettered markets on the conservative sceptical grounds that they best realise organic social institutions.
Substantive definitions of conservatism such as Aughey’s should be questioned, therefore. For him it is
the intellectual justification of inequality and privilege, and the political justification of the authoritative relationships such inequalities and privileges demand. (Aughey 1992: 23; also Honderich 2005: 45)
It is true that no revolution has proclaimed inequality, while for Burke, the social order is rooted in it; and conservatives may defend an established ruling class, regarding ruling as a skill likely to be most highly developed there. But in Quinton’s influential account, conservatism is more neutral:
political wisdom…is not to be found in the theoretical speculations of isolated thinkers but in the historically accumulated social experience of the [whole] community…[in] traditional customs and institutions [and people with] extensive practical experience of politics. (1978: 16–17)
To reiterate, conservatism is not essentially associated with aristocracy and hereditary forms of government, or opposed to democracy. For conservatives, as for Millian liberals, the viability of democracy depends on the period and conditions. For Burke himself, writing much earlier than Mill, a majority should be drawn only from a body qualified by tradition, station, education, property and moral nature; he questioned the “principle that a majority of men told [i.e., counted] by the head are to be considered as the people, and that as such their will is to be a law” (Burke 1791, ‘Thoughts on French Affairs’ : 344).
While conservatism should not be assimilated with neo-conservatism or neo-liberalism, many conservatives have converted to the latter:
A political outlook that in Burke, Disraeli and Salisbury was sceptical of the project of the Enlightenment and suspicious of the promise of progress has mortgaged its future on a wager on indefinite economic growth and unfettered market forces. [This] scarcely exhibits the political prudence…once revered as a conservative virtue. (Gray 1997: 88)
Scruton also laments this development, while John Harris comments on the enduring tensions that Thatcher exposed in Conservatism:
If you profess to believe in both the unrestrained market and such old Tory touchstones as family, nation and community, you will...discover that the former eats away at the foundations of the latter (Harris, 2013; Harvey (2005) offers a trenchant critique of neo-liberalism and neo-conservatism.)
Conservatism is further elucidated by contrasting it with liberalism. Both liberalism and socialism are more theoretically complex than conservatism, for two reasons: conservatism self-consciously rejects philosophical theorising; and, since academics tend towards the left, conservatism as a political philosophy is neglected. (For instance, Scruton describes his book The Meaning of Conservatism (1980) as “dogmatics” rather than philosophy.) There could be no conservative theory of distributive justice to rival Rawls’, since, for conservatives, the problems that Rawls addresses do not exist. For them, politics does not concern the theoretically complex justification of ends, but rather facilitates the enjoyment of “non-political” ends such as “country”, “family” and “religion” (Ashford 1990: 40–1).
It is often argued that modern political philosophy is animated by the idea of freedom, while ancient political philosophy rests on a natural order discernible by reason to which humans must conform (Franco 1999: 2). But as a modern standpoint, conservatism’s commitment to freedom is contested; it can be argued that the liberal standpoint of freedom is opposed by the conservative standpoint of paternalism or authority. The dividing line may be Rousseau, for whom the purpose of the state is not merely security of life and property, as Hobbes, Locke and conservatives concur; rather, it is freedom itself (Franco 1999: 9). Rousseau’s works were held to influence the French revolutionaries, and late 18th and early 19th century philosophers were convinced that the Revolution was caused by philosophers’ ideas of equality, democracy, freedom (Israel, 2002). (In fact, Rousseau regarded the revolutionary cure as worse than the disease, and was pessimistic about political progress.) In expressing the standpoint of freedom, philosophical liberalism embraces ethical individualism—that all value and right reduces to value of or for individuals, and the rights of individuals—respect for persons, and freedom of thought and discussion, based on individual autonomy (Skorupski 2015). For classical liberals, liberty thrives only when traditional sources of authority—monarchical, aristocratic, religious—are rejected.
It is often said that liberals prioritise rights over duties, while conservatives prioritise duties over rights. Conservative thinking expresses the standpoint of paternalism:
…the value of individual liberty is not absolute, but stands subject to…the authority of established government…the conservative will seek to uphold all those practices and institutions through which habits of allegiance are acquired. (Scruton 1980: 19, 30)
Obedience, for Scruton, is the principal virtue of political subjects, without which societies atomise and crumble; real freedom is not in conflict with obedience, but is its other side (Scruton, 1980). For Oakeshott, there is no freedom without authority. For Beiser, paternalism holds that
the purpose of the state is to promote the welfare, religion and morality of its subjects, and not only to protect their rights. (Beiser 1992: 282)
Burke was “less concerned with protecting the individual from the potential tyranny of the State, and more to protect the property of the few from the folly and rapacity of the many” (Lock 2006: 321–2).
The contrast with liberalism and its standpoint of freedom should be qualified, however. Burke certainly wanted to enhance freedom, but held that it is realised imperfectly in our institutions; pursuit of an abstract ideal may lose us what freedom we have. Both conservatives and classical liberals advocate limited government; it is particularist scepticism and an associated pessimism that define conservatism. Liberals concurred with Burke’s limits on government, concern for private property, and judicious reform (Kirk 1954: 162). However, although Burke agreed that government originates from the need to protect property, he disavowed many of Locke’s principles (Kirk 1954: 14).
Conservatives reject the liberal’s concept of abstract, ahistorical and universal rights, derived from the nature of human agency and autonomy, and possessed even when unrecognised, for instance by slaves in Ancient Greece (on abstract rights, see for instance Gewirth 1983). For conservatives, a priori claims such as L.T. Hobhouse’s “The proper end of government is the uncovering of civil liberties”, are doubly mistaken (Hobhouse 1964 : 19); government does not have such ends, and “uncovering civil liberties” is particularly disruptive. However, while Hobhouse, Rawls and Dworkin defend abstract and universal rights, liberals such as Mill are more historically-sensitive—through Coleridge, he drew on aspects of conservative thought. Mill’s abstract utility principle becomes conservative in operation, through his emphasis on the malleability and educability of character; our preferences, desires, and tastes arise from existing institutions, and so any abstract institutional blueprint fails to maximise utility. Mill holds that a nation’s history and society decide the best apparatus of government, and he locates Coleridgean “Ideas” in “organic” historical institutions—their original purpose and meaning. However, Mill’s perfectionism contrasts with conservative pessimism about human nature, and he rejected what he called “intuitionism”, which fosters conservatism by assuring people that anything they believe deeply enough must be true; rather, he holds that inveterate beliefs must be justified by reason (Mill, Autobiography, CW, I: 233; Skorupski 2010: 24). Despite the influence of Coleridge, therefore, Mill remained a liberal and not a conservative, who valued reason above Burkean prejudice.
Conservatives are not legal positivists, however, and allow some idealisation of rights; indeed, even legal positivists Bentham, Austen and Hart, in conceding that there are moral constraints, allow that there are bad laws. Burke held that the Stuart monarchs abrogated the rights of free-born Englishmen; under the Stuarts, therefore, the latter had rights that were not simply those that prevailed. Indeed, Burke does not entirely reject the concept of natural rights. Though sceptical of appealing to rights that are beyond positive law, in his Indian writings he acknowledged that when deprived of positive legal resources, one can appeal to natural law though not natural right (Bourke 2014; though see Stanlis 1953, and Canavan 1960).
Burke’s French disciples first coined the word “conservative” (French, “conservateur”); Burke himself used “conserve”. To reiterate 1.2 above, conservatism and revolutionary Jacobinism are inter-dependent concepts that arose together; the concept predates its label. In 1830 the Quarterly Review commented that “what is called the Tory might with more propriety be called the Conservative party”, and Canning and Peel adopted the label. (The Oxford English Dictionary entry suggests that “Conservative” originally designated an opponent of reactionary “Tory” views.) “Liberal” began to be used for the Whigs, and by 1840 Thomas Carlyle used “conservatism” to describe what he regarded as opposition to progress. (“Tory” survives, as a label for the British party; “Whig” does not.) Mill’s “Essay on Bentham” (1838) described Bentham as a “Progressive”, and Coleridge as a “Conservative”. Other European languages borrowed “conservative” and “conservatism” from English. Mostly it is the British, and their former Empire, that have parties labelled Conservative; countries with a strong republican tradition (France, USA, Argentina) have never had mass-based, self-styled “conservative” parties. European parties of the right are Christian Democrat, and in the USA, Republican. One should not conclude, however, that conservatism is essentially a British view; all cultures have political sceptics who value experience.
David Hume (1711–76) is sometimes regarded as a precursor of Burke’s conservatism. For Neiman,
Burke used [Hume’s] claims about the impotence of reason and the mind’s subsequent dependence on custom and habit to argue against radical attempts to change the established order. (Neiman 2001: 294)
Cobban contrasts Burke’s residual contractualism with Hume’s
theory of the origins of society and government which placed political conservatism on a much sounder and more realistic basis. (1960: 51)
Others claim Hume as a liberal. John Stewart rejects the picture of Hume clinging to a raft of custom and artifice, because as a sceptic, he has no alternative: “[He] was confident that by experience and reflection philosophers can achieve true principles”, and did not deny that reason determines right and wrong in morals and politics (Stewart 2014: 8).
Liberalism had J.S. Mill, who as Skorupski comments “[drove] so many windows onto its innermost commitments”, interrogating its values and policies (Skorupski 1989: 338); socialism had Marx. For most conservatives, Burke largely defines modern conservatism—even if his “windows”, unlike Mill’s, seem more like panes of frosted glass. We now examine his ideas and how they arose.
In his Reflections on the Revolution in France, the Irish Whig and parliamentarian Edmund Burke (1729–1797) warned against revolutions and their utopian schemes for human perfectibility. Writing in 1790, he predicted the French Revolutionary Terror of three years later:
In the groves of [the] academy [of this new conquering empire of light and reason], at the end of every vista, you see nothing but the gallows; (Burke, WS III: 128)
he also foresaw Napoleon’s coup. His prediction is based on his view that when compliance no longer flows from customary allegiances, the result is naked force (WS VIII: 128). As Steiner comments,
When Burke reflected and published, the French Revolution was in its Arcadian phase [and] his bloodstained previsions seemed nearly hysterical…Retroactively… his sombre clairvoyance took on formidable weight. (Steiner 1988: 3; see Lock 2006: Vol. 2)
He provided “the first serious argument that revolutions devour their own children and turn into their own opposites” (Hitchens 2011: 161)—that the violent seizure of power invites its violent counter-seizure. Its British friends compared the French Revolution with the Glorious Revolution of 1688; for Burke, it reprised 1649, when Parliament was purged and the king executed. The 1688 Revolution did not affirm, like the French Revolution, that power can revert to the people, who have a right to “erect a new form…as they think good” (to quote Locke’s Second Treatise) (Pocock 1989: 207).
Burke argued that revolutionaries impose theory on political practice, when they should rather derive theory from it. In a speech of 1782, he held it preposterous
to take the theories which learned and speculative men have made from that government, and then, supposing it made on those theories which were made from it, to accuse that government as not corresponding with them. (1782 House of Commons motion, in SW IV: 148)
regarded as folly the Enlightenment programme of willed, abstractly underwritten social reform, which violated the organic mystery of historicism, the [Aristotelian]… unfolding of…institutional modes of social being. (Steiner 1988: 3)
He opposed radical rationalist philosophes, Rousseau’s Romantic sentimentalism, and Bentham’s utilitarianism, lamenting that “the age of chivalry is gone. That of the sophists, economists and calculators has succeeded” (Burke, WS III: 127). He held against these calculators and rationalists that “no great human institution results from deliberation”, but rather, evolves in ways not envisaged by its founders; “human works are fragile in proportion to…the degree to which science and reasoning” have helped construct them (Kirk 1954: 24; Burke, WS III: 128). As Pocock writes,
the reason of the living, though it might clearly enough discern the disadvantages, might not fully perceive the advantages of existing and ancient institutions;
there is always
more in laws and institutions than [meets] the eye of critical reason. (Pocock 1989: 203)
Burke required close and constant attention to circumstance, for society is “a dense medium”, never easy to penetrate. (1987 : 54)
Isaiah Berlin and Stuart Hampshire link Burke with reactionaries such as de Maistre. But to reiterate, Burke advocated organic and restorative reform, not reaction:
a nation without the means of its own reform is without the means of its own preservation. (Burke, WS III: 327; Lock 2006: 305)
The Reflections argue that the ancien regime could have been restored to its pre-corrupt state; summoning the Estates General for May 1789 was an opportunity for enlightened reform of the monarchy, hijacked by enthusiastic atheists and deists (WS VIII: 175–6). Burke advocated “slow politics”, an inching forward on the secure foundation of inherited settlements and loyalties (Mount 2014).
Burke had a Whig belief in limited government. He identified liberties and rights with landed property, hence King George III’s praise of Reflections for supporting “the cause of the Gentleman”. Burke differs from liberal tradition not in rejecting rights as such, but in his conception of them (Lock 2006: 313–26). He rejected a constitution or bill of rights that does not simply express existing practice. For him, the only reliable liberty comes through descent, justified
…not on abstract principles “as the rights of men”, but as the rights of Englishmen, and as a patrimony derived from their forefathers… The idea of inheritance furnishes a sure principle of conservation, and…of transmission; without at all excluding a principle of improvement. By a constitutional policy, working after the pattern of nature, we receive, we hold, we transmit our government and our privileges, [just as] we enjoy and transmit our property and our lives. (Burke, WS III: 83)
Burke mistrusted appeals beyond positive law, but his writings on India allow, in its absence, an appeal to natural law though not natural right. The Hobbesian conception of Reflections treats natural rights as pre-social, and incompatible with society. For Burke, liberty is precarious; to say that it is assured by providential order, and has an inevitable progress, is the kind of metaphysical principle he abhorred (Himmelfarb 1987: 146–7).
Burke misrepresents the social contract of Hobbes, Locke and Rousseau as a rather temporary expedient,
nothing better than a partnership agreement in a trade of pepper and coffee, calico, or tobacco, or some other such low concern, to be taken up for a little temporary interest, and to be dissolved by the fancy of the parties. (Burke, WS III: 147)
But his position is genuinely distinct from theirs in crossing the generations:
[The state] is a partnership in all science; a partnership in all art; a partnership in every virtue…As [its] ends…cannot be obtained in many generations, it becomes a partnership…between those who are living, those who are dead, and those who are to be born. Each contract of each particular state is but a clause in the great primeval contract of eternal society, linking the lower with the higher natures, connecting the visible and invisible world… (Burke, WS III: 147)
Hampsher-Monk comments that Burke
sublimates the contract’s ideological power whilst draining it of radical potential: a contract involving the dead and unborn could hardly be renegotiated. [This rhetorical figure] expresses his deepest beliefs about the status of political establishments. Our social institutions cannot (like ordinary contracts) be the product of any individual’s calculation or insight (Hampsher-Monk 2012: 202–3)
For Scruton (1980), liberals tend to make present members of society dominance over those who went before, and those who come after; some conservative commentators fear that the cross-generational contract is now being broken by
enormous inter-generational transfers [from future to present generations] implied by current fiscal policies. (Ferguson 2012)
Burke was a Christian thinker whose conservatism has been traced to his theological presuppositions (Harris 1993; Cobban 1960: 94); he saw atheistic Jacobinism as a threat to Western cultural tradition. Many conservative writers share his religious interpretation of the contract across the generations. For Kirk (1954: 7), established religion is among the traditions that conservatives value. But religious belief is not essential to conservatism, and Oakeshott was a secular conservative (Cowling, 2004: xv).
Burke’s writings appealed to Continental as well as Anglo-American audiences; both Tocqueville and Macaulay were followers. But they caused a stormy reaction from radicals. Thomas Paine, a friend with whom Burke quarrelled, defended a cosmopolitan conception of rights; liberty is each person’s natural right, which only the living possess, and Burke’s idea of descent was a “usurpation” and diminution of it:
[No] generation [has] a property in the generations which are to follow. The parliament or the people of 1688…had no more right to dispose of the people of the present day…. (Paine 1791: 92)
Paine wanted the American Revolution to abolish slavery, and to restrain the French Revolution from violent fanaticism; Burke, sympathising with Marie Antoinette, “pities the plumage and forgets the dying bird”—the people (Paine 1791: 102). Mary Wollstonecraft, in her pamphlet A Vindication of the Rights of Men (1790), said that
had you been a Frenchman, you would have been, in spite of your respect for rank and antiquity, a violent revolutionist. Your imagination would have taken fire. (Wollstonecraft 1790: 44)
In his later career, liberals believed, Burke showed himself a prisoner of the feudal and landed conception of society.
Burke’s apparent change of affiliation is much-debated. For most of his career, he was regarded as a moderate reforming Whig, campaigning against the corruption and brutality of the East India Company. Only at the end did he become the Tory scourge of Revolution. Indeed, Reflections is liberal compared to Letters on a Regicide Peace five years later, which demanded a war abroad and repression at home to extirpate revolutionary infection. The 19th century regarded him as a liberal, treating his later career as an aberration—an interpretation reversed in the 20th century. Marx scathingly dismissed Burke as an opportunist:
The sycophant—who in the pay of the English oligarchy played the romantic…against the French Revolution just as, in the pay of the North American colonies…he had played the liberal against the English oligarchy—was an out-and-out vulgar bourgeois. “The laws of commerce are the laws of Nature, and therefore the laws of God.” (E. Burke, l.c.: 31, 32)…true to the laws of God and Nature, he always sold himself in the best market (Das Kapital, Vol. 1, Ch. 31)
Coleridge, slightly more charitably, wrote:
If his Opponents are Theorists, then every thing is to be founded on PRUDENCE, on mere calculation of EXPEDIENCY… Are his Opponents Calculators? Then…God has given us FEELINGS, and we are to obey them! (Coleridge CW, The Friend, II (first published 1809): 123–6)
For Lock, Burke’s statements are context-specific rhetorical acts, never intended to form a consistent system; the traditional view of Burke as a “liberal” who ended up as a “conservative” is simplistic, though his views did develop over time (see Lock 2006 Vol II: 306).
Others have variously attempted to reconcile the earlier and later Burke. Churchill argued that
the Burke of Liberty and the Burke of Authority [sought] the same ideals of society and Government…defining them from assaults, now from one extreme, now from the other. (Churchill 1932: 40—like Burke, he changed party and so may have identified with him)
Macpherson argued that by Burke’s time, the traditional order was a capitalist one, and so his conservatism was consistent with free-market liberalism; Burke advocated the Whig principles underlying the Glorious Revolution of 1688 and the American Revolution of 1776, but not the French Revolution (Macpherson 1980; see Burke 1987 : 15, on how his opponents are “constantly confounding” the revolution of 1688, and those of 1649 and 1789). In contrast, O’Brien in The Great Melody—the title, a quotation from W.B. Yeats, is Burke’s consistent opposition to abuse of power in Ireland, America, India and France—argues that his understanding of the American Revolution was not a radical, liberal one. He was always a Christian and monarchist, and his great speech was entitled “On Conciliation with the Colonies”; until independence was inevitable, conciliation was his aim. Cobban, seeing Burke as “the greatest of the followers of Locke”, denies that he changed his opinion fundamentally at the time of the French Revolution; rather, “an inconsistency runs right through his thought” (Cobban 1960: 40). (Pocock 1994 outlines Burke’s conflicting commitments to English Whiggery and Irish Catholicism.)
A fundamental question is how far the “prejudice” that Burke advocates is non-rational. Was he anti-reason, or just against abstract reason? Did he supplant individual with collective reason? For Cobban, Burke was “a philosopher of unreason in the great age of Reason” (Cobban 1960: 75). A subtler view is that for him, individual reason cannot discern fully how social and political institutions work; it cannot see the entire process of communal adaptation, or understand by itself the principles on which it is based. As Hampsher-Monk puts it, institutions result from trial and error, embodying accumulated historical experience in institutional reason—like precedent within Common Law, which Burke had studied. (Pocock 1989: 211ff. discusses Burke’s debt to this tradition; he rejected legalism, and especially—since he was a kind of relativist—the idea of the Common Law as timeless and immemorial.) Burke contrasted the wisdom of the law, with the limited reflective reason of individuals—no one person can reproduce in thought the complex train of experiences and decisions that led the law to be what it is—and he relies on the tradition of sceptical and conservative empiricism in English social thought, including Coke’s critique of the Stuart monarchs (Pocock 1989). The British and American common law system is evolutionary, not abstract like Roman and Napoleonic coded law. Judgment according to precedent, unlike a priori codified law, is better able to anticipate new circumstances.
Burke [credited] educated prejudice as an antidote to its bigoted forms. This did not entail a renunciation of reason, but a suspicion of its inordinate pretensions. (Bourke, in Dwan and Insole 2012: 29)
Scruton echoes Burke when he argues that beliefs that appear to be examples of prejudice may be useful and important; the attempt to justify them will merely lead to their loss. One might show prejudice as irrational, but there will be a loss if it is discarded (Scruton 1980).
Burke is opposed not to reason, but to the arrogance of individual reason, therefore:
We are afraid to put men to live and trade each on his own private stock of reason…the stock in each man is small, and…individuals would do better to avail themselves of the general bank and capital of nations and of ages…. Prejudice is of ready application in the emergency; it previously engages the mind in a steady course of wisdom and virtue and does not leave the man hesitating in the moment of decision sceptical, puzzled, and unresolved. (Burke, WS III: 138)
Rejecting the dominant individualist cognitive tradition in Western epistemology, Burke regards political reason as historically accumulated in developed social institutions—including an unwritten constitution, practices of representation, and dispositions notably of compromise. According to Himmelfarb, there is for Burke good reason—reason itself—to praise prejudice, which exists on a continuum with theoretical reason (Himmelfarb 2008b). However, Hampsher-Monk argues that
Burke’s fear of the inadequacies of individual reason has only an obscure counterpart in his belief in collective wisdom. (1992: 304)
Does Burke follows Hume’s notion of custom, which may be regarded as irrationalist or even nihilist? For Burkean conservatives, “reason” operates only relative to or within a prior “non-rational stabilisation of belief” in habit or prejudice—a stabilisation necessary to avoid scepticism in the traditional philosophical sense. For Hume and Burke this is a customary framework; for religious thinkers such as Cardinal Newman it is fideistic, appealing to the extra-rational authority of religious doctrine. Prejudice is normative; the inability to subsume particular actions under a universal law does not imply radical relativism (Vannatta 2014). For the classical liberal, in contrast, reason precisely does not operate within customary frameworks.
Burkean conservatism influenced Continental European traditions, but these also had a separate development. De Tocqueville (1805–59) was probably the most Burkean among 19th century Continental conservatives in his condemnation of the French Revolution:
Our revolutionaries had the same fondness for broad generalisations, cut-and-dried legislative systems, and a pedantic symmetry; the same contempt for hard facts; the same taste for reshaping institutions on novel, ingenious, original lines…[for reconstructing] the entire system instead of trying to rectify its faulty parts. (1955 : 147)
In Germany, Burke’s Reflections were translated three times before 1793, implying an influence on such conservatives as Gentz, Rehberg and Brandes. (Though Beiser (1992) argues that they arrived at their position independently.) August Wilhelm Rehberg (1757–1836) was a founder of German reformist conservatism, whose penetrating critique of the French Revolution bears striking similarities to Burke’s (see the entry on August Rehberg, sections 3 and 4). The historians von Savigny (1779–1861) and von Ranke (1795–1886) assumed a Burkean organic development of societies. German conservatives adopted positions from reformism to reaction, aiming to contain democratic forces—though not all of them were opposed to the Aufklärung or Enlightenment. To reiterate, reaction is not Burkean conservatism, however. De Maistre (1753–1821) was a reactionary critic of reason, intellectuals and universal rights. Burke attacked the revolutionaries of 1789 “for the sake of traditional liberties, [Maistre] for the sake of traditional authority” (Viereck 2009: 191). De Maistre praised Russian political culture as a spontaneous growth; in contrast, that of Western Europe had been “scribbled over” by Enlightenment philosophers (see Gray 1998: 122).
In an alternative tradition to Burkean conservatism, Continental conservatives have subscribed to Thomist or Hegelian traditions, resulting in rational or systematic conservatism—which might include reactionary forms. Commentators differ on the extent to which “rational conservatism” challenges the centrality of Burkean conservatism to conservative tradition. John Gray argues that
Conservatives have sometimes disdained theoretical reflection on political life, implying that political knowledge is…best left inarticulate, uncorrupted by rationalist systematising. The [19th and 20th] centuries are nevertheless replete with conservative thought…as systematic and reflective as any found in the liberal tradition. (Gray 1995: 78–9)
As well as Burke, Gray cites Hegel, de Maistre, Savigny, Santayana and Oakeshott, conservatives in that they share a “spirit of reaction against the excesses of liberal rationalism” (Gray 1995: Ch. 10). Skorupski (2015) contrasts anti-universalist pragmatic with universalist rational conservatism; “rational conservatism” does not exhibit particularist scepticism. Rational conservatives are, who maintain that a community with a hierarchy of authority is most conducive to human well-being—though they also regard agent-relative virtues such as loyalty and patriotism as fundamental, holding that it is universally true that patriotism is a virtue. This is clearly the standpoint of authority rather than the standpoint of freedom (see 1.5).
Hegel (1770–1831) is a key figure in the understanding of rational conservatism. Surprisingly for a standpoint that stresses the value of experience, conservatism—Hume excepted—has been associated more with Idealism than with empiricism; philosophical empiricists have commonly been radicals. Hegel has been claimed for conservatism, but his political affiliation has been disputed since his earliest disciples. For Left Hegelians including Marx, Hegel’s concept of free thought was a defence of Enlightenment rationality, and a critique of traditional political authority. For them, Geist did not invoke a transcendent power, as some Right Hegelians maintained, but was an anthropological and historical process of emancipation, propelled by contradiction and struggle. In the 20th century, Hegel was regarded alternatively as a proto-totalitarian reactionary, a conservative, or a liberal. But the “old orthodoxy” that he is a conservative or reactionary—in Anglophone philosophy largely derived from Popper—has disappeared, and he is often seen as synthesising conservatism and liberalism (Fine 2001: 5).
Hegel was ambivalent towards the French Revolution, the world-historical event against which his generation thought out their political philosophy and stance towards the Enlightenment (Taylor 1977: 403). The German Constitution was critical, lamenting with Burke the “blind clamour for freedom” and radical egalitarianism (Hegel PW: 93); the abstract, Rousseauean notion of freedom, attempting to construct society on the basis of “subjective reason”, caused a “fury of destruction”. The “Preface” of Elements of the Philosophy of Right (1821) is a Burkean attack on those who suppose
that no state or constitution had ever previously existed…that we had now…to start right from the beginning. (Hegel 1821: 12)
…afforded the tremendous spectacle, for the first time we know of in human history, of the overthrow of all existing…conditions within an actual major state and the revision of its constitution from first principles…[on] what was supposed to be a purely rational basis…the most terrible and drastic event (Hegel 1821: §258R)
Rousseau’s contractual account destroys the “divine” element of the state (ibid.).
But Hegel’s Rousseauean side is clear in the Philosophy of History, where the Revolution signals the dawn of freedom:
A constitution…was established in harmony with the thought of right…Never since the sun had stood in the firmament and the planets revolved around it had it been perceived that man’s existence centres in his head, i.e., in thought, inspired by which he builds up the world of reality. (Hegel 1822–1830: 447)
put forward the will as the principle of the state, a principle which has thought not only as its form [but also] its content, and which is in fact thinking itself. (Hegel 1821, §258R)
Some writers thus claim Hegel for liberalism rather than conservatism, regarding his philosophy as
the most profound and compelling application of the [positive] idea of freedom as…autonomy to the realm of politics. (Franco 1999: 3)
The contemporary consensus sees Hegel as attempting to synthesise liberalism and conservatism. For Cristi, his rapprochement is not an eclectic blend of liberal and conservative strands of thought, but a systematic synthesis:
The dialectical method brings about [their] reconciliation…by allowing an institutional embodiment for Hegel’s commitment to free subjectivity. (Cristi 1989: 719–20, 725)
While Hegel does not appeal to non-human natural law or providential order, he attempts to reconcile human reason with historical laws and institutions:
For Hegel, unlike Burke, the political order must ultimately be justified to human reason, although not in the individualistic manner that typifies Enlightenment rationalism. (Franco 1999: 127)
(Though to reiterate, Burke’s position here is contested.) The Idea of the state unites its divine character with the Rousseauean view that it is the product of human will and rationality (Franco 1999: 288).
Hegel thus synthesises the universal and the particular:
The essence of the modern state is that the universal should be linked with the complete freedom of particularity and the well-being of individuals…the personal knowledge and volition of the particular individuals who must retain their rights…Only when both moments are present in full measure can the state be regarded as…truly organised. (Hegel 1821: §260)
Hegel (1821) argues that in morality and politics, we judge for ourselves, but not by ourselves. We come to recognise rational norms historically, as actualised; we always reason in terms of the norms of our society, which we must nonetheless endorse only reflectively.
Contemporary Left Hegelians treat Hegel’s doctrine that reason is active in history as the claim that free thought, through the thinking of individuals, is history’s internal cause. Conservatives, in contrast, attacked Hegel’s conception of evolving reason, for undermining the political order (Moggach 2013). But for Skorupski, Hegel holds that free thought or natural reason must be mediated by entrenched institutions of intellectual and spiritual authority: for Aquinas, the Church, for Hegel, a tradition of communal ethical life. Hegel affirms that “the right of the subjective will”, the freedom of the moral subject, is inherent in modern ethical life, thus grounding reason in free thought, but only in the context of a conservative holism (Skorupski 2015). The key concept here is Sittlichkeit (“the ethical” or “ethical life”).
Sittlichkeit is the third element in Hegel’s philosophy of right, after abstract right and morality, mediates its liberal and conservative polarities:
The right and the moral must have the ethical as their support and foundation, for the right lacks…subjectivity, while morality in turn possesses this [alone]. (PR §141A)
While “morality” is subjective self-determination, Sittlichkeit or “ethical life” is both an attitude of individuals and a collective way of life, a set of values and practices or institutions. Its content is not derivable from a higher principle; it is externally a culture’s values and institutions, and internally an aspect of one’s identity. Hegel accepts that an ethical life is historically contingent, even arbitrary, in content, yet insists on its essential role in every society, and its need to develop organically. For him, some kinds of Sittlichkeit are more advanced than others; at any one time, a more advanced society drives world history forward by realising it in its institutions, customs, culture new ideas. This position goes beyond the minimal rationality and universality of conservatism, which makes no reference to historical advance.
Samuel Taylor Coleridge is the thinker chiefly responsible for introducing German Idealism to English-speaking readers, though in the person of Kant rather than Hegel. As Townshend comments, “it is quite normal [to] write the history of English conservatism…without reference to [him]” (1993: 32), perhaps because the conservative appeal to experience is wrongly taken to be empiricist. Coleridge was an ardent enthusiast for the French Revolution who, disillusioned with its excesses, came to share Burke’s “conservative constitutionalism”. He declared that
the consequences of the heroic medicines recommended by the Revolutionists [are] far more dreadful than the disease. (Coleridge 1812: 154)
However, revolutionary ideals often appeal to “noble and imaginative spirits”; one must offer superior ideals, and substantial reforms. Coleridge criticised Burke’s “absurd opposition of Theory to Practice”, since “the meanest of men has his Theory: and to think at all is to theorise”. Coleridge warned against unchecked industrialisation, and criticised the unfettered free-market, influencing Disraeli’s social-welfare conservatism.
Coleridge argued for a national Church exercising spiritual, moral and cultural leadership, maintaining schools in conjunction with the state. In a Burkean image, he writes that a “clerisy” of instructors—a disinterested class restraining against the self-interest of the others—would
guard the treasures, of past civilisation, and…bind the present with the past; to…add to the same, and thus to connect the present with the future. (CW : 189)
On the Constitution of the Church and State (1830) traced the underlying idea of the English state back to King Alfred. Coleridge asked whether institutions were “founded either in the nature of things or in the necessities of our nature”; ideals “can be profitably studied only as they are reflected in the particular institutions of a living political organism” (Coleridge 1829: 276). J.S. Mill ranked Coleridge’s influence on political thought as equal to Bentham’s, calling them “the two great seminal minds of England in their age”. Bentham wished to reform or replace venerable institutions which lacked utility, while Coleridge’s work was a necessary counterweight to Benthamite utilitarian liberalism, as
a Tory philosopher [rescues] truths which Tories have forgotten, and which the prevailing schools of Liberalism never knew. (Mill, CW X: 163, “Coleridge”—note the early use of “Liberalism” (1840))
The work of major Victorian thinker and writer Thomas Carlyle (1795–1881) bears a complex relationship with conservatism; in his later career he was a reactionary. Benjamin Disraeli (1804–81), founder of the essentially Burkean “One Nation” conservatism, was a politician first, writer and thinker second. Fitzjames Stephen (1829–94) wrote Liberty, Equality, Fraternity (1873), acclaimed as an important work of conservative thought; it has also been regarded as closer to Hobbes’ Leviathan (1651), a polemic defending law and order with little true conservative content (Townshend 1993).
Conservatism does not rest on a defence of a landed nobility, monarchy and established church, so even though the United States lacks these, an American conservatism is possible. However, it is argued that owing to its foundation as a constitutional republic, its essentially liberal political culture has determined American conservatism’s core commitments (Hartz 1955). Thus Gray argues that right-wing thought in the USA is almost exclusively neo-conservative and libertarian, with a
virtual absence…of anything comparable to European conservatism…United States conservative thought is merely an indigenous variation on classical liberal themes of limited government, individualism and economic progress [reflecting the] near-ubiquity in American intellectual culture of individualist, universalist and Enlightenment themes. (Gray 2010: 166)
James Madison, an author of The Federalist papers (1788), is claimed as an early American conservative; others are Alexander Hamilton, John Adams and John Calhoun. But it is probably true that Burkean conservatism has not produced thinkers in North America of the depth of its leading British representatives, Burke himself, Coleridge and Oakeshott. The original thinkers have instead been those such as Leo Strauss of the maverick or “heroic” right—a tradition including Carl Schmitt and Hayek, whose patron is Nietzsche—or Nozick, who belong to the libertarian right. These are not sceptical conservatives in the Burkean tradition (Skorupski 2015; on Burke’s influence in North America, see Deane 2012). Vannatta describes as “pragmatic conservatives” Holmes and Dewey, whose political starting-point is present experience, customs and tradition (Vannatta 2014).
Henry Sidgwick (1838–1900) arguably belongs in the ranks of modern conservatives. He rejected his utilitarian precursors’ reforming radicalism:
When all relevant facts are taken into consideration [he holds] it will scarcely ever be right on Utilitarian grounds for a Utilitarian openly to break or to recommend others to break the rules of morality commonly accepted in his society. (Broad 1930: 157; see also Collini 1992)
Sidgwick’s position has been described as a utilitarianism “grown sleek and tame”, as it uses Bentham’s principles to justify those of Burke (Boucher and Vincent 2012: 30). Sidgwick’s The Elements of Politics (1891) exhibits an intellectual and political conservatism, notably its rejection of then-popular social evolutionary approaches; as Collini argues, though sympathetic to socialism, he was drawn to an idiosyncratic variety of conservatism—somewhat perhaps as Ruskin and William Morris were (Collini 1992; see also Kloppenberg 1992). F.H. Hayward notes, with exasperation, that rather than insisting
that Sidgwick should be classified as this or that…it is extremely difficult to classify him at all. (Hayward in Schultz ed. 1992: 5)
An important issue that connects the conservatism of Hume, Burke, Sidgwick is what people have reason to expect over time. Suppose one holds that justice requires X, but that people have long been doing Y, which is incompatible with X, and have entered into life-plans that assume that X is how things are. If one tries to make society more just by preventing people doing Y, that in itself is an unjust action. Hence what Feinberg called Sidgwick’s paradox of conservative justice (Sidgwick 2011: III.5). As Feinberg writes, insofar as our institutions depart from Rawls’s basic principles of justice, we have a duty, he says, to work toward their reform. But in our actual imperfect world
Every reform of an imperfect practice or institution is likely to be unfair to someone …To change the rules in the middle of the game, even when those rules were not altogether fair, will disappoint the honest expectations of those whose prior commitments and life plans were made in genuine reliance on the…old rules. The propriety of changing the rules in a given case depends upon (inter alia) the degree of unfairness of the old rules and the extent and degree of the reliance placed upon them…we must weigh quite legitimate incompatible claims against each other in circumstances such that whichever judgment is reached it will be unfair to someone or other (Feinberg 1973: 268).
Rawls admits that intuitive balancing is unavoidable in dealing with problems of non-ideal theory, but Feinberg finds in his work little acknowledgment of the implications of Sidgwick’s paradox.
Michael Oakeshott (1901–90) was the last major exponent of the Idealist tradition, which enjoyed a period of eminence in Anglophone philosophy in the later 19th and early 20th century. He has been regarded as a liberal (Franco 2004), while others claim him for the afore-mentioned maverick right (Anderson 1992: 7). But Oakeshott is generally regarded as the most important modern conservative. His principal target is what he calls “Rationalism”, a position shared by liberals and socialists, which aims to achieve ends laid down by blueprint:
the conservative will have nothing to do with innovations designed to meet merely hypothetical situations; he will…delay a modification of the rules until it is clear that the change of circumstances it is designed to reflect has come to stay…he will be suspicious of…rulers who demand extra-ordinary powers in order to make great changes and whose utterances are tied to generalities like “the public good” or “social justice”. (Oakeshott 1991: 127)
In opposing rationalist planning, Oakeshott argues that the conservative disposition is not “connected with any particular beliefs…about the world in general or about the human condition”, nor “with moral right and wrong, it is not designed to make men good or even better…” (Ashford 1990: 43). He follows the logic of conservative pessimism, preferring “familiarity over perfection, the tried over the untried, and the actual over the possible”; “stability is more profitable than improvement…agreed error is superior to controversial truth” (Oakeshott 1991: 169–170). He contrasted a state that has an economy, with a state effectively reduced to an economy, and bemoaned the domination of politics by the pursuit of economic growth as opposed to the good life.
These are very Burkean themes. As Gray puts it,
For Oakeshott, human knowledge is not the mother of practice, but only its stepchild…an exfoliation from [practices] that we have inherited…When we theorise our practices, we are discerning coherences within them, not imposing form without any set of abstract principles. (Gray 2007, Other Internet Resources)
In his book of essays Rationalism in Politics (1991), Oakeshott is concerned with how the rationalist conception of knowledge has operated to the detriment of practice. This conception of knowledge holds that all genuine knowledge can be expressed entirely in propositional terms, in a theoretical system, or a set of rules or maxims. Oakeshott holds that in the modern world, the resulting instrumental rationality has penetrated inappropriate areas such as law, education and the arts—his thought thus interestingly parallels that of Critical Theorists such as Adorno, and also Heidegger. Means-end thinking concerning the state is particularly inappropriate, as we have no choice but to belong to it, Oakeshott maintains. In an important statement, Oakeshott regards politics as an “art” not a “science”:
Politics is not the science of setting up a permanently impregnable society, it is the art of knowing where to go next in the exploration of an already existing traditional kind of society. (“The Political Economy of Freedom”, in Oakeshott 1991: 406)
“Idealism” and “rationalism” tend to be “utopian”, and thus require uniformity and conformity, and deny individuality and originality, he believes; they do not recognise that members of society desire different ends. Oakeshott attacks “the ideological style of politics”, which pursues an “abstract idea” blind to the society’s actual arrangements and their moral and emotional “intimations”—“men in a hurry” who wish to plan and mobilise. Ideologists make everything political, but politics is only a part of human life, he holds.
For Oakeshott, civil associations, are fundamental to modern, free democracies, and opposed to the modern interventionist state. Enterprise associations, in contrast, are defined by a common purpose; society is not one of them. This distinction reflects another between “intellectual”—expressing “rationalism” in politics—and “practical”. Politics, for Oakeshott, belongs to the mode of practice, along with religion and morality; the two other modes are science and history. As well as attacking “rationalists”, who have a rational plan and believe in abstract rights, Oakeshott also criticised “empiricists”, who claim to be pragmatic, rejecting tradition in favour of mere reaction to events. We again see that conservatism, although a practical standpoint that appeals to experience, does not rest on philosophical empiricism.
Oakeshott is a Burkean particularist sceptic, for whom politics concerns people developing ways of living together in light of their history and traditions, not driven by universal extrinsic goals such as equality or elimination of poverty:
In political activity…men sail a boundless and bottomless sea: there is neither harbour for shelter nor floor for anchorage, neither starting-place nor appointed destination. The enterprise is to keep afloat on an even keel… (1991: 127)
The nautical image had been popularised by Neurath, but originated in conservative thought at least as early as Schiller, whose Letters on Aesthetic Education Of Man (1990 ) referred to the “clock” of society cannot be stopped for repairs:
When the mechanic has to mend a watch, he lets the wheels run out, but the living watchworks of the state have to be repaired while they act, and a wheel has to be exchanged for another during its revolutions. (Aesthetic Education, Letter 3
Conservatives do not believe any general purpose for government can be given, beyond “keeping the enterprise afloat”—not the substantive purpose of an enterprise association. Rather, “keeping afloat” is the thin commonality of purpose that characterises a civil association. As Graham writes, “the only purpose [conservatives] are prepared to accept is too vague to determine any actual activity” (1986: 185); historical context determines the criteria of successful government.
Oakeshott argues that “conservatism is not a creed or a doctrine, but a disposition” to enjoy the present (“On Being a Conservative”)—part of human nature, not an abstract political idea or ideal, let alone an ideology. Though he was a philosopher not a political theorist, Oakeshott denies that he is a “conservative philosopher”; philosophy is theoretical, a “theory of theories”, while conservatism is practical (Minogue 2009). However, Gamble adds, that disposition gains substance from its connection with national ways of life and traditions:
For Oakeshott, the past conceived in this way is intensely liberating because it is a repository of a wealth of practical knowledge, which is needed to live the good life. (Gamble 2012: 163)
But Oakeshott stresses that one must, through education in its history, be “released” from slavish commitment to one’s tradition, and then return to it newly enriched and informed. For him, conversation is the model of education.
It has been argued that in his later work, Oakeshott’s justifications for the conservative disposition developed in a liberal direction (Franco 2004). While the scepticism of Rationalism in Politics aims to protect tradition, “On Being Conservative” cites the human disposition to individuality. In a position reminiscent of J.S. Mill, Oakeshott argued empirically that people want to pursue their own life plans, and it is for this reason that governing ought to provide “general rules of conduct” and not “plans for imposing substantive activity” (1991: 424). Unlike many (non-Millian) liberals, however, Oakeshott does not base his requirement of limited government in an abstract theory of human nature, and abstract rights.
Other notable 20th century conservative thinkers include historian Maurice Cowling and philosopher Anthony Quinton. Probably the leading living thinker is Roger Scruton, who bases conservatism on three concepts: authority, allegiance and tradition (Scruton 1980: 27). He rejects post-Hobbesian contractualism, which presupposes
shared institutions and a conception of human freedom which could not have their origin in a social contract which they serve to make possible. (1980: 30)
Scruton compares the bond of society to
the behaviour of children towards their parents…a bond that is ‘transcendent’ [and] outside the sphere of individual choice. (1980: 32)
Hence conservatism’s structuring concept of tradition, and its deference to historical, non-state institutions, Burke’s “little platoons” in civil society, including family, community and church. Scruton called his The Meaning of Conservatism “a somewhat Hegelian defence of Tory values in the face of their betrayal by the free marketeers”. It is only somewhat Hegelian, because for Burkean conservatives, history lacks the moral or spiritual direction that Hegel discerned; there is no moral or spiritual progress, and people think collectively toward a common goal only during a crisis such as war.
As we saw, established power that originates in revolution poses a problem for conservatism. Non-relativistic conservatives (1.4 above) would oppose French Revolutionary government even if it endured for a century, and have rejected the Soviet system until its collapse after 1989. They would not regard this as “tradition” in the manner of long-standing, organically-evolving institutions such as English Common Law. Relativistic conservatives, in contrast, might accept these systems. Thus Oakeshott in Rationalism in Politics refers to the Russian tradition of autocracy, merely perpetuated by the Bolshevik revolution; it is not “good” or “bad” tradition, but the only one that Russia knows. On his view, tradition is inescapable, and societies rather rigid.
Gordon Graham argues that conservatives cannot consistently “reject” revolutionary regimes. Their ideology “[cannot] avoid connivance with evil”, and is recommended “only when conditions are reasonably, and perhaps unusually, good”:
True conservatism is a decidedly English doctrine with little appeal…in other countries [because] only English and hence British institutions have ever been decent enough to allow a decent [person] to be conservative. (Graham 1986: 188–9)
Graham’s conclusion, that the state is not an “instrument of salvation”, and we should have “no very high expectations of politics”, is—despite what he suggests—itself a conservative view (1986: 189). However, a conservative response to totalitarianism would be quietist pessimism—not “connivance with evil”, but realism in the face of it. As conservatives such as Burke supported the 1688 Revolution, so they should support the non-violent uprisings of 1989.
Modern communitarians MacIntyre and Sandel misinterpret conservatives when they condemn liberal individualism for abandoning the notion of tradition to the Burkeans, whose concept of it is “static” when it should be
living tradition [as] a historically extended, socially embodied argument…in part about the goods which constitute a tradition. (MacIntyre, 2007: 222)
For MacIntyre, we find meaning for our lives through what he calls traditional “narratives”; modes of thought that help us to reason and make moral judgements, and so we are not as free to reason or act as liberal cosmopolitans believe (2007: 205). Communitarians such as MacIntyre criticise modern thinkers “except for Newman in theology, and perhaps Coleridge who influenced him” for failing to develop a theory of the rationality of traditions. (We saw that Burke regarded tradition and individual reason as contradictory principles, but may have endorsed a notion of collective reason (Beveridge and Turnbull 1997).)
Conservatives would reply that Burke does stress the importance of incremental change, while Oakeshott, like MacIntyre, has an interrogative attitude to tradition. Moreover, the communitarian opposition to liberal values is limited, and does not extend to advocacy of religious intolerance and homogeneity or patriarchal authority (see Taylor 1977; Waldron 1992)—though neither does the anti-liberalism of Burkean conservatives. It could be argued that since the conservative tradition is older, and more substantial, than communitarianism, the liberal-conservative debate is more fundamental than the liberal-communitarian one; “communitarianism” is a mixture of liberalism and conservatism. (But see Skorupski 2015, on “liberal communitarianism”). (A further consideration is that traditional methods may not always yield the most practical responses (Scott 1998: 331).)
While acknowledging his prescience about the Terror, liberals found Burke’s fears concerning the French Revolution excessive—not the view they took when confronted with the Bolshevik Revolution of October 1917, which Marxists regard as completing its “bourgeois” predecessor. Thus the conservative historian Richard Pipes holds that the French Terror was a “brief… countercurrent”, while the Red Terror was an “essential element of the regime” (Pipes 1990: 789).
Conservatives criticise “atomistic” liberalism for treating society as a mere collection of self-regarding individuals, held together by rational norms and abstract laws rather than gaining their identity through an organic community; like communitarians, conservatives object to the primacy of abstract rights. Liberals reply that “atomism” simply refers to the conviction that although people live in society, individuals are, as Rawls writes, “self-authenticating sources of valid claims”, claims that do not require validation by larger social structures. (Millian liberalism is less subject to the conservative charge of rationalism.) As Gamble puts it,
Oakeshott rejects the universal claims of liberalism, because he is only interested in claims that are grounded in English political experience.
The great American charters of the late 18th century are, for him,
abridgements of British political experience, solidified into an eternal document. (Gamble 2012: 161)
Bentham and—on some views—Burke seem to conceive only of legal rights; but if one can make sense of moral obligation, one can make sense of abstract rights.
Some writers on the left find value in conservatism. Raymond Williams’ Culture and Society (1971) begins by showing the lessons that Burke offers. But many left critics argue that “organised selfishness is [its only] rationale” (Honderich 2005: 302). Minogue holds that
the conservative enjoys the resources of his culture and is not forever fidgeting about big changes promising a better life (2009);
but for socialist critics, those in poverty cannot be said to “enjoy” many resources at all, and so any aspiration they have for big changes cannot be “fidgeting”. When Oakeshott describes conservatism as a “disposition” to enjoy the present, Manchester factory workers of the 1840s, or slum dwellers in contemporary Mumbai or Mexico City, are excluded. As O’Hear (1998) comments, those who see society riddled with defects are impatient with conservative resistance to change; for them, the conservative emphasis on human ignorance and traditional wisdom is an evasion at best.
As Neiman comments, “the rights of man have come to guide us far more than [Burke] could ever have imagined” (Neiman 2011: 148). As Kant wrote,
One must take people as they are, our politicians tell us, and not as the world’s uninformed pedants or good-natured dreamers fancy that they ought to be. But as they are ought to read as we have made them by unjust coercion, by treacherous designs which the government is in a good position to carry out. (Kant 1792)
much of our experience is…often deliberately constructed… in order to perpetuate a social system that benefits the very people who say it’s inevitable. (Neiman 2011: 148–9)
Marxists reject Burke’s inference that since all social processes and institutions are interconnected, change must be cautious; they conclude instead that to change anything we must change everything. For Marx, in The Eighteenth Brumaire of Louis Bonaparte, tradition is a dead weight:
Men make their own history, but [not] under circumstances chosen by themselves…The tradition of all dead generations weighs like a nightmare on the brains of the living. (Marx 1852: 15)
But while rejecting its conclusion that change can only be piecemeal, many on the left share conservatism’s distrust of rational planning. While Lenin aimed to impose a socialist blueprint through a vanguard party of specialists, for his Marxist critics Luxemburg and Kollontai, revolutionary tasks are unknowable in advance:
Given the uncertainty of the endeavour, a plurality of experiments and initiatives will best reveal which lines of attack are fruitful…[and produce] a creative, conscious…and empowered working class. (Scott 1998: 187–9)
On this view, radical change need not involve a fixed blueprint.
Lord Hugh Cecil postulates within modern conservatism what he calls innate conservatism: a psychological characteristic found in all people to some degree (Cecil 1912). For C.D Broad, it has two sides:
The more worthy side [rational scepticism] [says] that social problems are so very complex that there is always a strong probability that some factor has been overlooked in any scheme of change…The less respectable side [mental inertia] is the dislike of novelty as such.
Rational scepticism, as a motive for rejecting a scheme that offers to remove admitted evils, involves two applications of probability. The first is…that social affairs are so complex that it is very improbable that all the effects of a given social change have been foreseen. But…we must have some ground for judging further that the unforeseen effects are more likely to be bad than good…this judgment cannot rest on the known nature of the effects of this particular measure [but only] on some general proposition, such as: It is more probable that the unforeseen effects of any social change will be bad than that they will be good. [There is] no reason to think [this]. (Broad 1913: 397)
Broad is alluding to the fact that every philosophical standpoint must confront the problem of how to treat its own defining claims, by its own lights. Conservatives declares that there are no general prescriptions, but must address the status of its own general prescription, “There are no general prescriptions”?
Conservatism seems unduly pessimistic about the possibility of individual, explicit knowledge of society, therefore. There are some things about society that we can come to know—and government economic policy, for instance, seems justifiably dedicated to finding them out. Conservatives must concede that radical change is sometimes acceptable; some major changes, for instance votes for women, are good. These must be prepared for—as they were in Britain in 1918, compared with, say, 1832—and preparing for change makes it less radical. What conservatives will insist is it that revolutionary change is unacceptable.
Especially since the advent of green politics, there have been conservatives advocates for ecological conservation. Scruton argues that “conservatism and conservation” are two aspects of a single policy of husbanding resources, including social capital embodied in laws, customs, and institutions, and material capital of the environment (Scruton 2007). A less noticed parallel is that between the opposition of cultural conservation and modernism, and that of conservatism and revolutionary Jacobinism (Cohen 2007, Other Internet Resources). In Britain after World War II, for instance, restorable bomb-damaged buildings made way for modernist schemes later revealed as shoddy and cheap; at the same time, in Continental Europe, classical composers treated 1945 as “year zero”, rejecting all tradition. Conservatives would criticise both developments.
Leading modernist poet T.S. Eliot (1988–1965) was also an important conservative thinker, and so occupies an ambivalent position. His essay “Tradition and the Individual Talent” (1919) argued that true originality is possible only in a tradition, a living presence in the modern world, not a museum relic (Eliot 1919; see Hamilton 2009). Eliot’s notion of an artistic tradition, and the related notion of a living classic, elucidates the conservative notion of a living tradition—something that has stood the test of time and is the subject of continuing reference and allusion. There are “dead classics” or “dead traditions”—performing arts with rigid repertoires such as the repertory of Gregorian chant, which became closed by the time of the Renaissance. In contrast, the classical repertoire of Western art music is open and flexible, operating—when circumstances are propitious—as a living presence in contemporary culture. On a less exalted aesthetic level, the tuxedo is a living sartorial classic in this sense.
These cultural issues are central to G.A. Cohen’s work on conservatism in political and cultural spheres, which argues for a truth in Burkean conservatism that is compatible with liberalism and socialism, viz. that we accept something as given:
[the rationalist claim that] everything can, or should, be shaped to our aims and requirements…violates intrinsic value and contradicts our own spiritual requirements. (2007: 9)
In this sense, everyone is conservative to some degree—for instance, in preferring to have cash in their pocket rather than converting to a cashless society. Thus a William Morris-based socialism is conservative in rejecting what planners and developers do to the environment that one loves; Robert Conquest allegedly commented that “everyone is conservative about what they know best” (quoted in Kates 2014). Conservationism originated in the Victorian era. The Camden Society, in early Victorian Cambridge, was concerned with the “proper” and edifying construction and restoration of Gothic churches and other public buildings. Later in the 19th century, William Morris’s “anti-scrape” campaign introduced the idea that good buildings of different periods should be cherished and will complement each other. Morris argued that one should take delight in the history of old public buildings, and not seek to restore them to some pristine state of perfection.
For Cohen, conservatives aim to conserve particular valuable things, rather than maximising value. This is “conservation of value”, but not on the model of “conservation of energy”:
value itself is conserved, when you destroy something valuable and replace it by a thing of the same value. The conservative policy is not to keep the value rating high but to keep the things that now contribute to that rating. (2007: 10, Other Internet Resources)
Conservatism in this sense rules out utility-maximising consequentialism:
Unlike the conservative, the utilitarian is indifferent between adding to what we’ve now got, at no cost, something that has five units of value, and adding something worth ten units of value at the expense of destroying something worth five. (Cohen 2007: 15, Other Internet Resources)
Conservatism is a relatively expensive taste, because it sacrifices value, in order not to sacrifice things that have value.
It does not follow that conservatives welcome good new things any less than non-conservatives do, Cohen argues. One can admire Byzantine icons partly because of their antiquity, and admire Frank Gehry’s architecture partly because of its newness. However, Cohen continues, conservatives can regard modernisation as beneficial overall, while lamenting what has been lost—admiring a splendid new building, yet grieving over what it replaced. Both the economic market, and state planning, are inimical to “sentimental” or personal value, Cohen argues.
Some planners might accept that a building’s existing is a reason to keep it, Cohen allows, but usually they require a general consideration—something that it does well, or a majority’s desire that it remain. This is not the majority’s reason for keeping it, however:
Market and planning logics tend against the truth that people want particular valuable things, not just satisfaction of general desiderata…market mania is deeply anti-conservative…If you want everything to be optimal, nothing will be good. Some things have to just be…there, if anything is to be good. (2012: 27)
Cohen echoes Burke in his explanation of our desire to conserve particular things:
We are attached to particular things because we need to belong to something… We do not keep the cathedrals just because they’re beautiful, but also because they are part of our past…[We] value our particular past in the respectful way that we value any past culture, but [also] in a more personal way. We want to be part of [Burke’s] “partnership…between those who are living, those who are dead, and those who are to be born”. (Cohen 2007: 28, Other Internet Resources)
Cohen here assumes that all parties agree on how “value” is to be measured and what therefore contributes to the value rating. But although relativistic conservatives accept socially prevalent valuations, revising them piecemeal on the basis of internal inconsistency or impracticality, non-relativistic conservatives might deny that value can be quantified at all.
Cohen’s conservative model would encourage the organic development exhibited by medieval English towns and buildings—perhaps especially by churches—and which parallels the organic model of political development. This model rejects the blueprint model involving an individual creator. Rather, the town or building evolves—apparently spontaneously, over generations—without reference to a blueprint, and often without stylistic consistency. The church as a building—or on the conservative model, a society—are like organisms, seemingly not the product of individual intentional action, but evolving naturally. Most English parish churches of medieval foundation were not built according to a single design, but developed by addition and subtraction; in the Middle Ages there was no profession of architect, and apparently little idea of an intentional, uniform schema generated prior to construction:
A church building is inherently conservative, and except for the extraordinary intervention, changed very slowly. A large proportion of churches had been founded by at least the late 12th century, many appearing in the Doomsday census of 1089. Elements from these early buildings often survive in the doorways or the base of towers, showing typical rounded arches and massive walls of the Norman style. Additions over time could include a reconstructed window, a new baptismal font, a tomb sculpture, or a series of carved wooden choir stalls for the clergy, attesting to differing eras of piety and style. (Stanbury and Raguin 2009, Other Internet Resources)
The parallel with conservative political thought is suggested by Scruton in his discussion of public space (Scruton 1994; see also Hamilton, forthcoming).
Scruton advocates a public art form on an urban scale, in the manner of treatises on urban decorum from the Renaissance onwards, which subordinate the style of the individual building to the whole. Unlike models that achieve this subordination by conscious planning, Scruton envisages a process akin to the self-ordering of an ideal competitive market. He applies Adam Smith’s metaphor of the invisible hand to the emergence of urban order, rejecting the utopian, social revolutionary visions of Gropius, Le Corbusier and other modernists, who sharply separate architecture and “mere” building in a way opposed to Scruton’s vernacularism. A district of London such as North Kensington, where planning was at best rudimentary, and which has few “public spaces” in the planner’s sense, is “eminently public”, Scruton argues (1994).
The debate in architecture and aesthetics parallels that in the political sphere. Does cultural or artistic conservatism in Cohen’s sense conserve everything in the past, or only what is good? For the conservative, there has to be some criterion of value in past things, involving in part their participation in a living tradition. To develop and defend such a criterion is one of the major challenges facing conservative thinkers, in both political and cultural spheres.
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