The Epistemic Basing Relation

First published Thu Oct 31, 2002; substantive revision Thu Jan 21, 2010

The epistemic basing relation is the relation which holds between a reason and a belief if and only if the reason is a reason for which the belief is held. It is generally thought to be a necessary, but not sufficient, condition for a belief's being justified that the belief be based on a reason. The basing relation is what distinguishes good reasons which a person possesses that contribute to the personal justification of a given belief from good reasons which the person possesses but that do not contribute to the personal justification of the belief.

Basing relations may be involved in both inferential and non-inferential justification. For example, one may hold that sensory states count as reasons, and thus require that a sensory belief be based on a reason if it is to be justified by that reason. In addition, one might understand at least some self-evident beliefs to be based on the meanings of the various terms of the sentence expressing the proposition believed. For example, one's belief that all bachelors are unmarried men may be understood to be based on the meanings of ‘all’, ‘bachelors’, ‘are’, etc.

The basing relation is most frequently analyzed in terms of a reason's causing a belief.[1] In such analyses, the reason and the belief are understood to be mental states of a person. The cause may be a contributing cause or a sufficient cause. However, the basing relation has also been analyzed as an appropriate counterfactual cause of a belief and also as depending on an appropriate meta-belief to the effect that a reason is a good reason to hold the belief.

Analysis of the basing relation is relevant to a variety of fundamental epistemological issues. It is relevant to the nature of epistemic rationalization and to questions regarding the internalism/externalism debate. In addition, it has been argued that reliabilist theories of justification are incompatible with the correct analysis of the basing relation.


1. Causal Theories of the Basing Relation

Causal theories of the basing relation hold that for a belief to be based on a reason, the reason must cause the belief in an appropriate way. Causal theories of the basing relation must not be confused with causal theories of knowledge or justification. One might take a causal theory of the basing relation to explain how one has taken into account the reasons one possesses when forming or evaluating a belief, regardless of whether the reason actually contributes to the justification of the belief. Also, one might hold that a belief's being justified requires not only being based on a good reason, but also requires, e.g., the fulfillment of various epistemic duties, coherence within an appropriate cognitive system, etc.

Paul Moser offers the following example of a causal theory of the basing relation for propositional reasons (Moser, 1989, p. 157):

S's believing or assenting to P is based on his justifying propositional reason Q =df S's believing or assenting to P is causally sustained in a nondeviant manner by his believing or assenting to Q, and by his associating P and Q.


Moser limits this account of the basing relation to instances of inferential knowledge, unlike the more general characterization of the basing relation given above.

A belief is causally sustained by a reason when the reason maintains the belief, much like a rope might sustain the height and position of a hanging plant. On Moser's account, the belief must be causally sustained in a nondeviant manner by both the believing of or assenting to Q and by the association of P and Q.

Moser defines the appropriate occurrent association relation as follows (Moser 1989, pp. 141–142):

S occurrently satisfies an association relation between E and P =df (i) S has a de re awareness of E's supporting P, and (ii) as a nondeviant result of this awareness, S is in a dispositional state whereby if he were to focus his attention only on his evidence for P (while all else remained the same), he would focus his attention on E.

The association relation may also be non-occurrent and the belief still justified by the reason in question. In this case, condition (i) will have been satisfied in the past and the dispositional state described in condition (ii) will still be present. The “de re awareness” is a non-propositional, direct awareness of E's supporting P. This is the sort of awareness one might have of being thirsty or cold before thinking “I'm thirsty” or “I'm cold”. This awareness is non-propositional in that you need not put it into words in order to have it, and it is direct in the sense that no sensation state (mental image, sense datum) need come between being thirsty and being aware of one's thirst. By contrast, some have held that, for example, our awareness that there is a table in the room is indirect in that it is mediated by a sensation state (mental image, sense-datum) which represents the table.

In addition to Moser's theory, there are a variety of other possible causal theories of the basing relation which might be proposed. For example, one might eliminate the association condition, requiring only that the reason cause the belief in some appropriate way. One motivation for such a theory might be the view that one need not be aware of a reason for it to be the basis of a belief, as in the case of subliminal reasons. One issue here would be whether such subconscious states can be justifying reasons. Alternatively, one might hold that the reason need not sustain the belief, but only have caused the belief to come into existence. One motivation for such a view might be that one may justifiably believe things on the basis of reasons one has forgotten (Goldman 2001, pp. 214–216). For example, most people cannot remember on what basis they came to believe that tigers are native to Asia, but it seems obvious that such people are still justified in believing this. In such cases, the reason no longer sustains the belief — in fact, the reason is no longer possessed. Nonetheless, it might be argued, one's belief that tigers are native to Asia is still based on the reason which originally caused it. On the other hand, one consideration against this view is the intuition that a belief cannot be justified if one possesses no reason for it. In addition, it may be argued that there are other ways of accounting for how a belief may be justified even if the original reason for it has been forgotten. For instance, one might reason as follows: “I can't recall where I first learned this, but I feel sure it is true, and such feelings have proved to be reliable in the past. Hence, my belief that tigers are native to Asia is probably true.”

A variety of objections have been raised against causal theories of the basing relation generally.[2] The most common of these is the problem of deviant causal chains, a problem which plagues causal analyses in general. With regard to the basing relation, the problem is that not every instance of a reason's causing a belief will establish a basing relation. Alvin Plantinga illustrates the problem well (Plantinga 1993, p. 69, n.8):

Suddenly seeing Sylvia, I form the belief that I see her; as a result, I become rattled and drop my cup of tea, scalding my leg. I then form the belief that my leg hurts; but though the former belief is a (part) cause of the latter, it is not the case that I accept the latter on the evidential basis of the former.[3]

What makes the problem so difficult is that there are a variety of ways the causal chain of events can go wrong and thereby fail to establish a basing relation. For example, glitches in the brain, wandering thoughts, wishful thinking, strong emotions, etc., may all be implicated in deviant causal chains. It is quite difficult to clearly explain what non-deviant causation amounts to, yet without such an explanation causal theories are ultimately unsatisfactory.

A second line of objection to causal theories of the basing relation involves what I will call Gypsy-Lawyer style counterexamples, after the first such example, formulated by Keith Lehrer (Lehrer 1971).[4] Lehrer's example goes like this: suppose a series of eight grisly murders has been committed, all the available evidence indicates that the lawyer's client committed the first seven of those murders, and everyone believes that he committed the eighth murder as well. However, the lawyer, being a practicing member of the gypsy religion, has absolute faith in the cards. The cards indicate that his client is innocent of the eighth murder, and the lawyer comes to believe this on the basis of his faith in the cards. The lawyer then re-examines the evidence and finds a very complicated line of reasoning showing that his client is innocent of the eighth murder. The lawyer recognizes that the complicated line of reasoning shows that his client is innocent. However, due to the grisly nature of the case, the lawyer (and everyone else) strongly desires to believe that the murderer of all eight victims has been found. Thus, the lawyer's belief that the complicated line of reasoning is correct lacks the overwhelming emotional conviction needed to overcome the lawyer's desire, and thus cannot cause the lawyer to believe that his client is innocent of the eighth murder. It is only his unshakable faith in the cards that is sufficient to cause the lawyer to believe that his client is innocent. Nonetheless, since the lawyer takes the line of reasoning seriously, it seems reasonable to believe that the complicated line of reasoning could give the lawyer knowledge that his client is innocent.

The idea behind Lehrer's example is to conjoin the intuition that the lawyer is justified in believing that his client is innocent with the view that being justified in holding a belief requires that the belief be based on a good reason in order to arrive at the conclusion that the lawyer's belief that his client is innocent is based on the complicated line of reasoning.

The case of the gypsy lawyer is very complicated and Lehrer's argument has frequently been criticized. Alvin Goldman, for example, has claimed that “...I find this example unconvincing. To the extent that I clearly imagine that the lawyer fixes his belief solely as a result of the cards, it seems intuitively wrong to say that he knows — or has a justified belief — that his client is innocent.” (Goldman 1979, p. 22, n. 8)[5] Goldman does not elaborate on this objection, but the concern is that the lawyer has not taken his good reason into proper account when forming his belief that his client is innocent. One way of responding to this concern is presented below in the discussion of the causal-doxastic theory of the basing relation.

2. Counterfactual Theories of the Basing Relation

Among the most widely discussed theories of the basing relation is that presented by Marshall Swain (1979, 1981, and 1985). Concerned about Gypsy-Lawyer style counterexamples, Swain suggests that a counterfactual analysis of causation may avoid them without doing violence to the intuitions underlying causal theories of the basing relation. A counterfactual statement is a statement of the form “If A were to occur, then B would occur”, where ‘A’ and ‘B’ denote events. Roughly, the idea is that a belief is based on a reason if the reason either non-deviantly causes or would have caused (in the appropriate circumstances) the belief in question. Very roughly, where the reason would have caused the belief (in the appropriate circumstances), the reason is, in Swain's terminology, a pseudo-overdeterminant of the belief, and hence the belief is based on it. Swain argues that the complicated line of reasoning is a pseudo-overdeterminant of the lawyer's belief that his client is innocent, and hence that there is a kind of causal connection between the complicated line of reasoning and the lawyer's belief by virtue of which the lawyer's belief is based on the reasoning. Swain more precisely defines pseudo-overdeterminants as follows (1981, p. 70):

(DPO) Where c and e are occurrent events, c is a pseudo-overdeterminant of e if and only if:
  1. c is not a cause of e(that is, there is no causal chain from c to e and c is not a genuine overdeterminant of e);  and
  2. there is some set of occurrent events, D = {d1, d2,..., dn} (possibly having only one member), such that
    1. each di in D is a cause of e; and
    2. if no member of D had occurred, but c and e had occurred anyway, then there would have been a causal chain from c to e, and c would have been causally prior to e.

Here ‘c’ stands for a cause and ‘e’ for an effect. If we restrict the application of (DPO) to reasons and beliefs, c will be the reason and e will be the belief caused by the reason. The “di” will stand for the actual reason(s) for the belief. So, (DPO) in effect states that if the actual reason(s) di for the belief had not occurred, then if another reason c and the belief had occurred anyway, and only the minimum necessary changes in the person's epistemic situation (e.g., the person's other beliefs, reasons, etc.) are made, then reason c would have caused the belief and is therefore a pseudo-overdeterminant of the belief.

It's important to note that a potential reason will not pseudo-overdetermine a belief simply because there is some possible world in which the actual reason does not cause the belief yet the potential reason does. This is much too broad, for it would allow beliefs to be based on reasons when it seems obvious that they are not so based in the actual world. Rather, the various stipulations in (DPO) are intended to limit the relevant domain of possible worlds to those as close as possible to the actual world.

Swain's theory of the basing relation counts pseudo-overdeterminants of a belief as reasons upon which a belief is based, as we can see from the definition of the basing relation Swain offers (Swain 1981, p. 74 and pp. 86–87)[6]:

(DB) S's belief that h is based upon the set of causal reasons R at a time t =df
  1. S believes that h at t; and
  2. For every member rj of R, there is some time tn (which may be identical with or earlier than t) such that
    1. S has (or had) rj at tn; and
    2. Either
      1. S's having rj at tn is a cause (including genuine overdetermination) of S's believing h at t or S's having rj at tn is a pseudo-overdeterminant of S's believing that h at t; or
      2. for some ri and ti that satisfy condition (i), with ‘ri’ substituted for ‘rj’ and ‘ti’ for ‘tn’, S's having rj at tn is either a cause or a pseudo-overdeterminant of S's having ri at ti, or
      3. ... , etc.

Genuine causal overdeterminants occur when two or more causes both occur and each is sufficient to generate a particular effect. For example, perhaps a table has five legs, four at the corners and one at the center. It may be the case that the four legs at the corners are sufficient to cause the table to remain upright, but if the four legs at the corners were removed, the center leg would also be sufficient to keep the table upright. Here, the effect of the table's remaining upright is overdetermined by the center leg, on the one hand, and the four legs at the corners, on the other. Similarly, perhaps a person has two good reasons for holding a belief, and either one alone would be sufficient to cause the belief. In this case, the two reasons would be said to overdetermine the belief. Assuming that the causal relations were not deviant, the belief would be based on both of the reasons. The ‘ri’ and ‘rj’ in (DB) are simply reasons on which the belief is based. Condition (ii) allows that a reason rj, which is in turn a reason for ri, which in turn is a reason for the belief that h, is also a reason on which the belief that h is based, and the “or ... , etc.” clause is intended to include each of the reasons in a long chain of reasoning leading to the belief to count as reasons upon which the belief is based.

One advantage of Swain's theory (which could be easily incorporated into many other theories of the basing relation) is that reasons are not limited to beliefs. Things like perceptual states (such as seeing something) or what Swain calls sensation states (such as experiencing hunger, thirst, pain, or other things which we sense but not necessarily through the five senses) are counted (by stipulation) as non-propositional reasons for the purposes of his theory. Thus, a unified account of belief basing is provided.

As already noted, Swain's theory is intended to avoid Lehrer's objection regarding Gypsy-Lawyer style counterexamples. The complicated line of reasoning is not a cause or causal overdeterminant of the lawyer's belief that his client is innocent because the lawyer's strong desire to believe that his client is guilty of the eighth murder prevents the complicated line of reasoning from causing the belief that his client is innocent. The degree of conviction the lawyer has in the complicated line of reasoning is sufficient for the lawyer to believe the complicated line of reasoning (once his strong desire to believe that his client is guilty is overridden by his strong faith (or rational belief, as the case may be) in the cards), but alone is not sufficient to override his strong desire to believe that his client is innocent. Swain argues that (DB) avoids Lehrer's objection because the complicated line of reasoning pseudo-overdetermines the lawyer's belief that his client is innocent (Swain 1981, p. 74 and pp. 86–87). We can see how this is to work by examining condition (2)(b) of (DPO). Suppose that the actual cause of his belief that his client is innocent (di) (namely, the lawyer's belief about the result of the card reading) had not occurred, and that both the complicated line of reasoning (c) and the belief that his client is innocent (e) had occurred anyway. On this supposition, the lawyer's strong desire to believe that his client is guilty of all eight crimes could not have occurred, because if it had it would have prevented the lawyer from believing that his client is innocent. Since the lawyer's strong desire is the only thing that prevents the complicated line of reasoning from causing the lawyer's belief that his client is innocent, the complicated line of reasoning would then have caused the lawyer to believe that his client is innocent. Thus, the complicated line of reasoning pseudo-overdetermines the lawyer's belief that his client is innocent, and hence, on (DB), the lawyer's belief is based on the complicated line of reasoning in Lehrer's original example. So on Swain's theory, the lawyer's belief is based on the complicated line of reasoning, in accordance with Lehrer's intuitions about the case. Contrary to Lehrer, however, Swain argues that there is a counterfactual causal connection between the reasoning and the lawyer's belief that his client is innocent, thus providing a theory of the basing relation consistent with the intuition that the basing relation is best analyzed in terms of a reason's causing a belief.

A variety of objections to Swain's theory have been proposed in the literature.[7] Perhaps the best of these is that presented by Joseph Tolliver (1982, pp. 151–155). Tolliver's counterexample, which he calls the pendulum case, goes like this: suppose a physics student has learned that from the period of a pendulum (i.e., the time it takes to complete a swing) one can calculate its length and vice versa.  The student measures a particular pendulum and discovers that it has a length L, and calculates that it must have period P. The student also has two general beliefs about pendulums, namely (1) that if x is a pendulum of period P, then x is a pendulum of length L, and (2) that if x is a pendulum of length L, then x is a pendulum of period P. We may suppose that it is clear in this case that the student's belief about the period is based (at least in part) on her belief about its length, but her belief about its length is not based on her belief about the period. But, Tolliver claims, the student's belief about the period pseudo-overdetermines her belief about the length of the pendulum, and hence gets counted, on Swain's theory, as the basis of her belief about the length of the pendulum. This is so because, according to Tolliver, if the actual cause of the student's belief about the length had not occurred, and if the student still had both her belief about the period and her belief about the length, then her belief about the period would have caused her belief about the length.

One natural line of reply to this sort of counterexample to Swain's theory would be to further specify the sorts of changes in one's epistemic situation that are consistent with pseudo-overdetermination. For example, perhaps the student in the above example would have to engage in further reasoning, inferring the length of the pendulum from her two general beliefs about pendulums and her belief about the period of the pendulum. If such additional inferences could be ruled out as being unwarranted changes in the student's epistemic situation, then the student's belief about the period would not pseudo-overdetermine her belief about the length of the pendulum.

3. Doxastic Theories of the Basing Relation

Doxastic theories of the basing relation hold that having an appropriate meta-belief to the effect that a reason is a good reason to hold a belief is sufficient for the belief's being based on the reason. Such a theory appears to be a natural fit for certain kinds of epistemic internalism. For such an account, see Leite (2008). Some theories of the basing relation, such as those of Helen Longino and Robert Audi, state that such a meta-belief is a necessary but not sufficient condition for a belief's being based on a reason (Longino 1978; Audi 1986). Such theories hold that if a belief is to be based on a reason, the reason must non-deviantly cause the belief, and an appropriate meta-belief must be present. Such theories tend to be vulnerable to the objections to causal theories of the basing relation as well as the objections — to be discussed shortly — to doxastic theories of the basing relation.

Here, we will examine Joseph Tolliver's account of the basing relation. Roughly, Tolliver's view is that a belief is based on a reason for a person S if and only if S believes that the reason provides evidence for the belief, and also believes that it is likely that the probability that the belief is true increased at the time the reason was accepted. Tolliver's aim is to avoid the pendulum objection to Swain's theory while affirming Swain and Lehrer's intuition in the case of the gypsy lawyer that the lawyer's belief that his client is innocent is based on the complicated line of reasoning. Tolliver's account is as follows (Tolliver 1982, p. 159):[8]

(B) S bases his or her belief that b on reason r at a time t if and only if

(1) S believes that b at t and S believes that r at t, and

(2) S believes that the truth of r is evidence for the truth of b at t, and

(3) Where S's estimate of the likelihood of b equals h at t (h being greater than 0 and less than or equal to 1), if it were the case that S came to believe r for the first time at t, then S's estimate of the likelihood of the proposition “the likelihood of b is greater than or equal to h” would be greater at t then it was prior to t.

Condition (3) is intended to handle the pendulum case discussed above. In the pendulum case, the student measures the length of a pendulum and thereby comes to believe that it has length L. On the basis of this measurement and other truths she knows about pendulums, the student is able to calculate the period of the pendulum. Thus, the student's belief about the length serves as a reason for her belief about the period. The apparent problem for Swain's view was that the students belief about the period also seemed to be counted as a reason on which her belief about the length was based, when in fact the basing relation went in the reverse direction. Tolliver's theory attempts to handle this problem by means of condition (3), which is intended to specify the direction of the evidential support relation. Once the student measures the length and makes the inference about the period, the student's estimate of the likelihood that the pendulum has period P would increase. However, the student's belief about the period of the pendulum would not, according to Tolliver, increase the estimate of the likelihood that the pendulum has length L because the student's belief about the length is needed to calculate the period.

One common line of objection to doxastic theories of the basing relation has to do with individuals who do not possess the epistemic concepts needed to form the meta-belief (that a reason is a good reason to hold a belief) required by doxastic theories, but who nonetheless seem to base beliefs on reasons. For example, young or uneducated persons may seem perfectly capable having reasons for beliefs even if they lack the appropriate concepts of epistemic evidence required by condition (2) of Tolliver's theory. One possible line of reply to this sort of objection would be to stipulate that one may have either an appropriate meta-belief or some appropriate form of awareness that need not involve any particular fully developed epistemic concept. For example, one might allow, as does Moser's theory discussed in the foregoing, that one merely have a de re awareness of the evidential relation holding between the reason and the belief.

Another common line of objection to doxastic theories concerns the possibility of meta-beliefs (to the effect that a reason is a good reason to hold a belief) which do not establish basing relations. For example, suppose Ezekiel belongs to a religious cult and slavishly believes whatever the cult leader, Exidor, tells him. One day Exidor tells Ezekiel that his belief in God is a good reason to believe everything else Ezekiel believes, and Ezekiel slavishly comes to believe this. Nonetheless, it would seem highly counter-intuitive to accept that, now, everything else Ezekiel believes is in fact based on his belief in God. Perhaps one way to avoid this sort of objection is to add additional conditions as to which meta-beliefs are capable of establishing basing relations. One such solution is discussed below, in the section regarding causal-doxastic theories of the basing relation.

A third common line of objection to doxastic theories is that we may sometimes base beliefs on reasons of which we are unaware. For example, perhaps beliefs can be based on subconscious reasons. If so,then beliefs may be based on reasons even though an appropriate meta-belief (that the reason is a good reason to hold the belief) cannot be formed because the person remains unaware of the reason.

4. Causal-Doxastic Theories of the Basing Relation

The basic idea of causal-doxastic theories is that a belief may be based on a reason if either an appropriate meta-belief is present (as in doxastic theories of the basing relation) or the reason causes the belief in an appropriate way (as in causal theories of the basing relation). One motive for such a view is to avoid Gypsy-Lawyer style counterexamples while preserving the intuition that a reason's causing a belief can sometimes establish a basing relation. A second, more fundamental motive begins with the observation that a belief is based on a reason when one has, with regard to the belief, taken proper account of the evidential import of the reason. It would be odd if, e.g., the conscious evaluation and acceptance of the evidential import of a potential reason for a belief was, in principle, completely irrelevant to whether the belief was based on the reason. Intuitively, it seems that taking proper account of a reason may merely involve thinking about the evidential import of the reason in the appropriate way, and whether, in addition, the reason non-deviantly causes (or, causally sustains) the belief is merely a contingent, empirical matter.

Keith Allen Korcz's version of a causal-doxastic theory, somewhat simplified, is as follows (Korcz 2000):

(CD) A person S's belief that p is based on a reason r possessed by S at time t if and only if
  1. S believes that p at t, and
  2. Either
    1. the following two conditions are met:
      1. r is an (or contributes to the) internal cause, internal causal overdeterminant or internal causal sustainer, at or prior to t, of S's belief that p, and
      2. r is not rejected at t,

      or

    2. the following four conditions are met:
      1. S at t has a meta-belief or de re awareness to the effect that r is a good reason to believe p, and
      2. the causal explanation of S's having this meta-belief or state of awareness involves both S's belief that p and r, and
      3. r, the belief that p, and any other reason the meta-belief or state of awareness is causally based on meets all the requirements of condition (2)(a), and
      4. S has no other meta-belief or state of awareness contrary to the meta-belief described in condition (b)(i).

Note that (CD) makes no allowance for a belief's being based on a reason when the reason is no longer possessed. There are no such basing relations, given (CD).

An internal cause is a causal chain of events such that each link in the chain is either a belief, a reason (construed to include perceptual and sensation states, as well as beliefs), or an inference. One's beliefs, reasons, and inferences collectively constitute what Korcz calls one's cognitive structure. The various sorts of causes mentioned in (a)(i) are required to be internal to S's cognitive structure so as to avoid problems with deviant causal chains. Deviant causal chains seem to occur when the chain of causal events from a putative reason to a belief veers outside the persons cognitive structure. For instance, in Plantinga's example of Sylvia discussed above, the causal chain of events includes the event of dropping a cup of tea, and this event is not one which occurs within the person's cognitive structure. However, Korcz acknowledges that this is not a fully satisfactory solution to the problem of deviant causal chains, given the difficulties of specifying exactly which events are internal to one's cognitive system in the appropriate way.

Condition (a)(ii) (and, in effect, condition (b)(iv)) requires that the reason a belief is based on not be rejected. A reason for a belief is rejected when the following two conditions are met:

  1. S has a meta-belief to the effect that the reason is no longer a good reason to hold the belief, and
  2. one has no meta-beliefs which contradict the meta-belief described in (I).

By virtue of condition (I), this account of rejecting a reason for a belief allows for a belief to cease to be based on a reason even when the reason is still retained (not, e.g., forgotten). For example, suppose I believe that Pablo Neruda was a great poet because all great poets are revolutionaries and Neruda was a revolutionary. Later, I come to believe that this inference is invalid, yet also come to believe that all Nobel Prize winners in literature are great poets and that Neruda won the Nobel prize in literature. Thus, I never lose my belief that Neruda is a great poet and I never lose (at least some of) my original reasons for believing that Neruda was a great poet (I still believe that all great poets are revolutionaries and that Neruda was a revolutionary). Instead, the reasons for which I believe that Neruda was a great poet have shifted, in part by virtue of the fact that I have come to believe that my original reasons did not support my belief.

Condition (II) of this account of rejecting reasons excludes contradictory meta-beliefs in order to account for some cases in which it is unclear whether the reasons for a belief have been rejected. Were a person to have contradictory meta-beliefs (perhaps not recognizing they are contradictory as the result of thinking in different terms which in fact have the same referent), it would be unclear whether the reasons were still the basis of the belief.

Condition (b)(i) of (CD), by allowing that the meta-belief (or state of awareness) merely be to the effect that the reason is a good reason to hold the belief, is intended to allow the meta-belief to contain any appropriate epistemic concept the individual may possess. Conditions (b)(ii) and (b)(iii) are intended to exclude cases of meta-beliefs which do not establish basing relations, as in the example of Ezekiel discussed above. Ezekiel has the meta-belief that his belief in God is a good reason to believe everything else he believes. According to (CD), the reason this meta-belief does not establish a basing relation is that it is not non-deviantly caused by both his belief in God and every other belief he has. Instead, it is based on his cult leader, Exidor, telling him that his belief in God is a good reason to believe everything else he believes. For the meta-belief to establish a basing relation, it must be based on (i.e., non-deviantly caused by) the belief and reason(s) it is about. This helps to ensure that the person has taken appropriate account of the evidential import of the reason for the belief, much as it does in causal theories of the basing relation.

One line of objection to Korcz's causal-doxastic theory is that simply combining causal and doxastic theories is ad hoc, i.e., lacks appropriate theoretical support. In turn, this would appear to prevent the theory from helping us to understand the basing relation. The basing relation is presumably a unified epistemic concept calling for a unified analysis, not a haphazard conglomeration of different conditions, as a disjunctive analysis of the basing relation as either causes or meta-beliefs would suggest. While the analysis may be unified in the sense that it is a causal analysis through and through, one would not expect the kinds of causes to be so different. This objection gains further support if it is mistakenly thought that the primary motive for the theory is merely to avoid Gypsy-Lawyer style counter-examples.

One possible line of response to this sort of objection is to note that an important motive for the theory is a fundamental fact about human thinking, and not merely the desire to avoid Gypsy-Lawyer style counter-examples. Intuitively, a belief's being based on a reason involves taking into account the epistemic import of the reason, and such a mental operation may be of two sorts: either directly causal (where a reason non-deviantly causes a belief) or intentional (where one has a meta-belief to the effect that a reason is a good reason to hold a belief). The ability to reflect on our beliefs and thereby evaluate them is often thought to be an ability which distinguishes human cognition from that of many other non-human animals. And to properly evaluate a belief is simply to take into proper account its evidential import. Thus, it would be highly implausible if such reflective evaluations were absent from an account of a belief's being based on a reason. Yet on causal theories of the basing relation, such reflective evaluations are superfluous. On the other hand, such reflective evaluations do not appear necessary for a belief to be based on a reason, as previously argued. There seem to be situations in which non-deviant causes are sufficient to establish basing relations, again as previously argued. Therefore, the disjunctive analysis of (CD) appears to be essential if we are to do justice to the various ways the human mind may take into account the evidential import of reasons.

5. The Basing Relation and Epistemology

Given that a necessary condition of a belief's being justified is that it be based on an appropriate reason, which theory of the basing relation one adopts may have significant implications for one's theory of epistemic justification. For example, accepting a doxastic or a causal-doxastic theory of the basing relation would appear to be at odds with the fundamental intuition behind causal theories of justification (e.g., reliabilism), which assert that a belief is justified merely by being caused in an appropriate way. On a doxastic or causal-doxastic theory, a belief may be based on a good reason (and thus, we may suppose, be justified) even if the belief were not caused in the appropriate way or even if the belief were, somehow, not caused at all.

Accepting some doxastic theories of the basing relation will commit one to a strong form of access internalism. Strong access internalism is the view that one must be aware of one's reasons for a belief in order for the belief to be justified in light of those reasons. Plausible doxastic theories of the basing relation will likely have built in this requirement of access to one's reasons by virtue of requiring that, for a belief to be based on a reason, one must believe or be aware that the reason is a good reason to hold the belief. Plausible doxastic theories will likely stipulate that one cannot have an appropriate meta-belief or state of awareness without being directly aware of the reason in question, in order to avoid counting meta-beliefs such as that of Ezekiel's, in the example discussed above, as sufficient to establish basing relations.

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epistemology | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of | knowledge: analysis of

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