Epistemology

First published Wed Dec 14, 2005

Defined narrowly, epistemology is the study of knowledge and justified belief. As the study of knowledge, epistemology is concerned with the following questions: What are the necessary and sufficient conditions of knowledge? What are its sources? What is its structure, and what are its limits? As the study of justified belief, epistemology aims to answer questions such as: How we are to understand the concept of justification? What makes justified beliefs justified? Is justification internal or external to one's own mind? Understood more broadly, epistemology is about issues having to do with the creation and dissemination of knowledge in particular areas of inquiry. This article will provide a systematic overview of the problems that the questions above raise and focus in some depth on issues relating to the structure and the limits of knowledge and justification.


1. What is Knowledge?

1.1 Knowledge as Justified True Belief

There are various kinds of knowledge: knowing how to do something (for example, how to ride a bicycle), knowing someone in person, and knowing a place or a city. Although such knowledge is of epistemological interest as well, we shall focus on knowledge of propositions and refer to such knowledge using the schema ‘S knows that p’, where ‘S’ stands for the subject who has knowledge and ‘p’ for the proposition that is known.[1] Our question will be: What are the necessary and sufficient conditions for S to know that p? We may distinguish, broadly, between a traditional and a non-traditional approach to answering this question. We shall refer to them as ‘TK’ and ‘NTK’.

According to TK, knowledge that p is, at least approximately, justified true belief (JTB). False propositions cannot be known. Therefore, knowledge requires truth. A proposition S doesn't even believe can't be a proposition that S knows. Therefore, knowledge requires belief. Finally, S's being correct in believing that p might merely be a matter of luck.[2] Therefore, knowledge requires a third element, traditionally identified as justification. Thus we arrive at a tripartite analysis of knowledge as JTB: S knows that p if and only if p is true and S is justified in believing that p. According to this analysis, the three conditions — truth, belief, and justification — are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for knowledge.[3]

Initially, we may say that the role of justification is to ensure that S's belief is not true merely because of luck. On that, TK and NTK are in agreement. They diverge, however, as soon as we proceed to be more specific about exactly how justification is to fulfill this role. According to TK, S's belief that p is true not merely because of luck when it is reasonable or rational, from S's own point of view, to take p to be true. According to evidentialism, what makes a belief justified in this sense is the possession of evidence. The basic idea is that a belief is justified to the degree it fits S's evidence. NTK, on the other hand, conceives of the role of justification differently. Its job is to ensure that S's belief has a high objective probability of truth and therefore, if true, is not true merely because of luck. One prominent idea is that this is accomplished if, and only if, a belief originates in reliable cognitive processes or faculties. This view is known as reliabilism.[4]

1.2 The Gettier Problem

The tripartite analysis of knowledge as JTB has been shown to be incomplete. There are cases of JTB that do not qualify as cases of knowledge. JTB, therefore, is not sufficient for knowledge. Cases like that — known as Gettier-cases[5] — arise because neither the possession of evidence nor origination in reliable faculties is sufficient for ensuring that a belief is not true merely because of luck. Consider the well-known case of barn-facades: Henry drives through a rural area in which what appear to be barns are, with the exception of just one, mere barn facades. From the road Henry is driving on, these facades look exactly like real barns. Henry happens to be looking at the one and only real barn in the area and believes that there's a barn over there. Henry's belief is justified, according to TK, because Henry's visual experience justifies his belief. According to NTK, his belief is justified because Henry's belief originates in a reliable cognitive process: vision. Yet Henry's belief is plausibly viewed as being true merely because of luck. Had Henry noticed one of the barn-facades instead, he would also have believed that there's a barn over there. There is, therefore, broad agreement among epistemologists that Henry's belief does not qualify as knowledge.[6]

To state conditions that are jointly sufficient for knowledge, what further element must be added to JTB? This is known as the Gettier problem. According to TK, solving the problem requires a fourth condition. According to some NTK theorists, it calls for refining the concept of reliability. For example, if reliability could suitably be indexed to the subject's environment, reliabilists could say that Henry's belief is not justified because in his environment, vision is not reliable when it comes to discerning barns from barn-facades.[7]

Some NTK theorists bypass the justification condition altogether. They would say that, if we conceive of knowledge as reliably produced true belief, there is no need for justification. Reliabilism, then, comes in two forms: as a theory of justification or as a theory of knowledge. As the former, it views justification to be an important ingredient of knowledge but, unlike TK, grounds justification solely in reliability. As a theory of knowledge, reliabilism asserts that justification is not necessary for knowledge; rather, reliably produced true belief (provided the notion of reliability is suitably refined to rule out Gettier cases) is sufficient for it.[8]

2. What is Justification?

When we discuss the nature of justification, we must distinguish between two different issues: First, what do we mean when we use the word ‘justification’? Second, what makes beliefs justified? It is important to keep these issues apart because a disagreement on how to answer the second question will be a mere verbal dispute, if the disagreeing parties have different concepts of justification in mind. So let us first consider what we might mean by ‘justification’ and then move on to the non-definitional issues.[9]

2.1 Deontological and Non-Deontological Justification

How is the term ‘justification’ used in ordinary language? Here is an example: Tom asked Martha a question, and Martha responded with a lie. Was she justified in lying? Jane thinks she was, for Tom's question was an inappropriate one, the answer to which was none of Tom's business. What might Jane mean when she thinks that Martha was justified in responding with a lie? A natural answer is this: She means that Martha was under no obligation to refrain from lying. Due the inappropriateness of Tom's question, it wasn't Martha's duty to tell the truth. This understanding of justification, commonly labeled deontological, may be defined as follows: S is justified in doing x if and only if S is not obliged to refrain from doing x.[10]

Suppose, when we apply the word justification not to actions but to beliefs, we mean something analogous. In that case, the term ‘justification’ as used in epistemology would have to be defined this way:

Deontological Justification (DJ)
S is justified in believing that p if and only if S believes that p while it is not the case that S is obliged to refrain from believing that p.[11]

What kind of obligations are relevant when we wish to assess whether a belief, rather than an action, is justified or unjustified? Whereas when we evaluate an action, we are interested in assessing the action from either a moral or a prudential point of view, when it comes to beliefs, what matters is the pursuit of truth. The relevant kinds of obligations, then, are those that arise when we aim at having true beliefs. Exactly what, though, must we do in the pursuit of this aim? According to one answer, the one favored by evidentialists, we ought to believe in accord with our evidence. For this answer to be helpful, we need an account of what our evidence consists of. According to another answer, we ought to follow the correct epistemic norms. If this answer is going to help us figure out what obligations the truth-aim imposes on us, we need to be given an account of what the correct epistemic norms are.[12]

The deontological understanding of the concept of justification is common to the way philosophers such as Descartes, Locke, Moore and Chisholm have thought about justification. Today, however, the dominant view is that the deontological understanding of justification is unsuitable for the purposes of epistemology. Two chief objections have been raised against conceiving of justification deontologically. First, it has been argued that DJ presupposes that we can have a sufficiently high degree of control over our beliefs. But beliefs are akin not to actions but rather things such as digestive processes, sneezes, or involuntary blinkings of the eye. The idea is that beliefs simply arise in or happen to us. Therefore, beliefs are not suitable for deontological evaluation.[13] To this objection, some advocates of DJ have replied that lack of control over our beliefs is no obstacle to using the term ‘justification’ in its deontological sense.[14] Others have argued that it's a mistake to think that we can control our beliefs any less than our actions.[15]

According to the second objection to DJ, deontological justification does not tend to ‘epistemize’ true beliefs: it does not tend to make them non-accidentally true. This claim is typically supported by describing cases involving either a benighted, culturally isolated society or subjects who are cognitively deficient. Such cases involve beliefs that are claimed to be epistemically defective even though it would not seem that the subjects in these cases are under any obligation to refrain from believing as they do. What makes the beliefs in question epistemically defective is that they are formed using unreliable and intellectually faulty methods. The reason why the subjects, from their own point of view, are not obliged to believe otherwise is that they are either cognitively deficient or live in a benighted and isolated community. DJ says that such beliefs are justified. If they meet the remaining necessary conditions, DJ-theorists would have to count them as knowledge. According to the objection, however, the beliefs in question, even if true, could not possibly qualify as knowledge, due to the epistemically defective way they were formed. Consequently, DJ must be rejected.[16]

Those who reject DJ use the term ‘justification’ in a technical sense that deviates from how the word is ordinarily used. The technical sense is meant to make the term suitable for the needs of epistemology.[17] But how are we then to conceive of justification? What does it mean for a belief to be justified in a non-deontological sense? Recall that the role assigned to justification is that of ensuring that a true belief isn't true merely by accident. Let us say that this is accomplished when a true belief instantiates the property of proper probabilification. We may, then, define non-deontological justification as follows:

Non-Deontological Justification (NDJ)
S is justified in believing that p if and only if S believes that p on a basis that properly probabilifies S's belief that p.

If we wish to pin down exactly what probabilification amounts to, we will have to deal with a variety of tricky issues.[18] For now, let us just focus on the main point. Those who prefer NDJ to DJ would say that probabilification and deontological justification can diverge: it's possible for a belief to be deontologically justified without being properly probabilified. This is just what cases involving benighted cultures or cognitively deficient subjects are supposed to show.[19]

2.2 Evidence vs. Reliability

What makes justified beliefs justified? According to evidentialists, it is the possession of evidence. What is it, though, to possess evidence for believing that p? Some evidentialists would say it is to be in a mental state that represents p as being true. For example, if the coffee in your cup tastes sweet to you, then you have evidence for believing that the coffee is sweet. If you feel a throbbing pain in your head, you have evidence for believing that you have a headache. If you have a memory of having had cereal for breakfast, then you have evidence for a belief about the past: a belief about what you ate when you had breakfast. And when you clearly "see" or "intuit" that the proposition "If Jack had more than four cups of coffee, then Jack had more than three cups of coffee" is true, then you have evidence for believing that proposition. In this view, evidence consists of perceptual, introspective, memorial, and intuitional experiences, and to possess evidence is to have an experience of that kind. So according to this evidentialism, what makes you justified in believing that p is your having an experience that represents p as being true.

Many reliabilists, too, would say that the experiences mentioned in the previous paragraph matter. However, they would deny that justification is solely a matter of having suitable experiences. Rather, they hold that a belief is justified if, and only if, it results from cognitive origin that is reliable: an origin that tends to produce true beliefs and therefore properly probabilifies the belief. Reliabilists, then, would agree that the beliefs mentioned in the previous paragraph are justified. But according to a standard form of reliabilism, what makes them justified is not the possession of evidence, but the fact that the types of processes in which they originate — perception, introspection, memory, and rational intuition — are reliable.

2.3 Internal vs. External

In contemporary epistemology, there has been an extensive debate on whether justification is internal or external. Internalists claim that it is internal; externalists deny it. How are we to understand these claims?

To understand what the internal-external distinction amounts to, we need to bear in mind that, when a belief is justified, there is something that makes it justified. Likewise, if a belief is unjustified, there is something that makes it unjustified. Let's call the things that make a belief justified or unjustified J-factors. The dispute over whether justification is internal or external is a dispute about what the J-factors are.

Among those who think that justification is internal, there is no unanimity on how to understand the concept of internality. We can distinguish between two approaches. According to the first, justification is internal because we enjoy a special kind of access to J-factors: they are always recognizable on reflection.[20] Hence, assuming certain further premises (which will be mentioned momentarily), justification itself is always recognizable on reflection.[21] According to the second approach, justification is internal because J-factors are always mental states.[22] Let's call the former accessibility internalism and the latter mentalist internalism. Externalists deny that J-factors meet either one of these conditions.

Evidentialism is typically associated with internalism, and reliabilism with externalism.[23] Let us see why. Evidentialism says, at a minimum, two things:

E1   Whether one is justified in believing p depends on one's evidence regarding p.
E2   One's evidence consists of one's mental states.

By virtue of E2, evidentialism is obviously an instance of mentalist internalism.

Whether evidentialism is also an instance of accessibility internalism is a more complicated issue. The conjunction of E1 and E2 by itself implies nothing about the recognizability of justification. Recall, however, that in Section 1.1 we distinguished between TK and NTK: the traditional and the nontraditional approach to the analysis of knowledge and justification. TK advocates, among which evidentialism enjoys widespread sympathy, tend to endorse the following two claims:

Luminosity
One's own mind is cognitively luminous: Relying on introspection, one can always recognize on reflection what mental states one is in.[24]

Necessity
a priori recognizable, necessary principles say what is evidence for what.[25] Relying on a priori insight, one can therefore always recognize on reflection whether one's mental states are evidence for p.[26]

Although E1 and E2 by themselves do not imply access internalism, it is quite plausible to maintain that evidentialism, when embellished with Luminosity and Necessity, becomes an instance of access internalism.[27]

Next, let us consider why reliabilism is an externalist theory. Reliabilism says that the justification of one's beliefs is a function of, not one's evidence, but the reliability of one's belief sources such as memorial, perceptual and introspective states and processes. Whereas the sources might qualify as mental, their reliability does not. Therefore, reliabilists reject mentalist internalism. Moreover, if the justification of one's beliefs is determined by the reliability of one's belief sources, justification will not always be recognizable on reflection. Hence reliabilists reject access internalism as well.[28]

Let's use an example of radical deception to illustrate the difference between evidentialism as an internalist theory and reliabilism as an externalist theory. If evidentialism is true, a subject who is radically deceived will be mislead about what is actually the case, but not about what he is justified in believing. If, on the other hand, reliabilism is true, then such a subject will be misled about both what is actually the case and what he is justified in believing. Let us see why.

Distinguish between Tim and Tim*: one and the same person whom we imagine in two altogether different situations. Tim's situation is normal, like yours or mine. Tim*, however, is a brain in a vat. Suppose a mad scientist abducted and "envatted" Tim* by removing his brain from his skull and putting it in a vat in which his brain is kept alive. Next, the mad scientist connects the nerve endings of Tim*'s brain with wires to a machine that, controlled by a powerful computer, starts stimulating Tim*'s brain in such a way that Tim* does not notice what actually happened to him. He is going to have perfectly ordinary experiences, just like Tim. Indeed, let's assume that the mental states of Tim and the mental states of Tim* are alike. But, since Tim* is a brain in a vat, he is, unlike Tim, radically deceived about his actual situation. For example, when Tim believes he has hands, he is right. When Tim* believes he has hands, he is mistaken. (His hands were discarded, along with the rest of his limbs and torso.) When Tim believes he is drinking coffee, he is right. When Tim* believes he is drinking coffee, he is mistaken. (Brains don't drink coffee.) Now suppose Tim* asks himself whether he is justified in believing that he has hands. Since Tim* is just like Tim, Tim* will say that his belief is justified, just as Tim would if he were to ask himself whether he is justified in believing that he has hands. Evidentialism implies that Tim*'s answer is correct. For even though he is deceived about his external situation, he is not deceived about his evidence: the way things appear to him in his experiences. This illustrates the internality of evidentialist justification. Reliabilism, on the other hand, suggests that Tim*'s answer is incorrect. Tim*'s belief that he has hands originates in cognitive processes — "seeing" and "feeling" his (nonexisting) hands — that now yield virtually no true beliefs. To the extent that this implies their unreliability, the resulting beliefs are unjustified. Consequently, he is deceived not only about his external situation (his not having hands), but also about the justificational status of his belief that he has hands. This illustrates the externality of reliabilist justification.

The example of Tim and Tim* may serve as well to illustrate a further way in which we may conceive of the difference between internalism and externalism. Some internalists take the following principle to be characteristic of the internalist point of view:

Mentalism
If two subjects, S and S*, are alike mentally, then the justificational status of their beliefs is alike as well: the same beliefs are justified or unjustified for them to the same extent.[29]

When we apply this principle to the Tim/Tim* example, it tells us that evidentialism is an internalist and reliabilism an externalist theory. Even though there are significant physical differences between Tim and Tim*, mentally they are alike. Evidentialism implies that, since Tim and Tim* are mentally alike, they have the same evidence, and thus are justificationally alike as well. For example, they are both justified in believing that they have hands. This makes evidentialism an internalist theory. Reliabilism, on the other hand, allows that, even though Tim and Tim* are mentally alike, they differ justificationally, since Tim's beliefs are (by and large) produced by reliable cognitive faculties, whereas the faculties that produce Tim*'s beliefs may count as unreliable. For example, some versions of reliabilism imply that Tim is justified in believing that he has hands, whereas Tim* is not. This makes reliabilism an externalist theory.[30]

2.4 Why Internalism?

Why think that justification is internal? One argument for the internality of justification goes as follows: "Justification is deontological: it is a matter of duty-fulfillment. But duty-fulfillment is internal. Therefore, justification is internal." Another argument appeals to the brain-in-the-vat scenario we considered above: "Tim*'s belief that he has hands is justified in the way that Tim's is justifed. Tim* is internally the same as Tim and externally quite different. Therefore, internal factors are what justify beliefs." Finally, since justification resulting from the possession of evidence is internal justification, internalism can be supported by way of making a case for evidentialism. What, then, can be said in support of evidentialism? Evidentialists would appeal to cases in which a belief is reliably formed but not accompanied by any experiences that would qualify as evidence. They would say that it's not plausible to claim that, in cases like that, the subject's belief is justified. Hence such cases show, according to evidentialists, that a belief can't be justified unless it's supported by evidence.[31]

2.5 Why Externalism?

Why think that justification is external? To begin with, externalists about justification would point to the fact that animals and small children have knowledge and thus have justified beliefs. But their beliefs can't be justified in the way evidentialists conceive of justification. Therefore, we must conclude that the justification their beliefs enjoy is external: resulting not from the possession of evidence but from origination in reliable processes. And second, externalists would say that what we want from justification is the kind of objective probability needed for knowledge, and only external conditions on justification imply this probability. So justification has external conditions.[32]

3. The Structure of Knowledge and Justification

The debate over the structure of knowledge and justification is primarily one among those who hold that knowledge requires justification. From this point of view, the structure of knowledge derives from the structure of justification. We will, therefore, focus on the latter.

3.1 Foundationalism

According to foundationalism, our justified beliefs are structured like a building: they are divided into a foundation and a superstructure, the latter resting upon the former. Beliefs belonging to the foundation are basic. Beliefs belonging to the superstructure are nonbasic and receive justification from the justified beliefs in the foundation.[33]

For a foundationalist account of justification to be plausible, it must solve two problems. First, by virtue of exactly what are basic beliefs justified? Second, how do basic beliefs justify nonbasic beliefs? Before we address these questions, let us first consider the question of what it is that makes a justified belief basic in the first place. Once we have done that, we can then move on to discuss by virtue of what a basic belief might be justified, and how such a belief might justify a nonbasic belief.

According to one approach, what makes a justified belief basic is that it doesn't receive its justification from any other beliefs. The following definition captures this thought:

Doxastic Basicality (DB)
S's justified belief that p is basic if and only if S's belief that p is justified without owing its justification to any of S's other beliefs.

Let's consider what would, according to DB, qualify as an example of a basic belief. Suppose you notice (for whatever reason) someone's hat, and you also notice that that hat looks blue to you. So you believe

(B) It appears to me that that hat is blue.

Unless something very strange is going on, (B) is an example of a justified belief. DB tells us that (B) is basic if and only if it does not owe its justification to any other beliefs of yours. So if (B) is indeed basic, there might be some item or other to which (B) owes its justification, but that item would not be another belief of yours. We call this kind of basicality ‘doxastic’ because it makes basicality a function of how your doxastic system (your belief system) is structured.

Let us turn to the question of where the justification that attaches to (B) might come from, if we think of basicality as defined by DB. Note that DB merely tells us how (B) is not justified. It says nothing about how (B) is justified. DB, therefore, does not answer that question. What we need, in addition to DB, is an account of what it is that justifies a belief such as (B). According to one strand of foundationalist thought, (B) is justified because it can't be false, doubted, or corrected by others. So (B) is justified because (B) carries with it an epistemic privilege such as infallibility, indubitability, or incorrigibility.[34] The idea is that (B) is justified by virtue of its intrinsic nature, which makes it possess some kind of an epistemic privilege.

Note that (B) is not a belief about the hat. Rather, it's a belief about how the hat appears to you. So (B) is an introspective belief about a perceptual experience of yours. According to the thought we are considering here, a subject's basic beliefs are made up of introspective beliefs about the subject's own mental states, of which perceptual experiences make up one subset. Other mental states about which a subject can have basic beliefs include such things as having a headache, being tired, feeling pleasure, or having a desire for a cup of coffee. Beliefs about external objects do not and indeed cannot qualify as basic, for it is impossible for such beliefs to own the kind of epistemic privilege needed for the status of being basic.

According to a different version of foundationalism, (B) is justified not by virtue of possessing some kind of privileged status, but by some further mental state of yours. That mental state, however, is not a further belief of yours. Rather, it is the very perceptual experience that (B) is about: the hat's looking blue to you. Let ‘(E)’ represent that experience. According to this alternative proposal, (B) and (E) are distinct mental states. The idea is that what justifies (B) is (E). Since (E) is an experience, not a belief of yours, (B) is, according to DB, basic.

Let's call the two versions of foundationalism we have distinguished privilege foundationalism and experiential foundationalism. Privilege foundationalism restricts basic beliefs to beliefs about one's own mental states. Experiential foundationalism is less restrictive. According to it, beliefs about external objects can be basic as well. Suppose instead of (B), you believe

(H) That hat is blue.

Unlike (B), (H) is about the hat itself, and not the way the hat appears to you. Such a belief is not one about which we are infallible or otherwise epistemically privileged. Privilege foundationalism would, therefore, classify (H) as nonbasic. It is, however, quite plausible to think that (E) justifies not only (B) but (H) as well. If (E) is indeed what justifies (H), and (H) does not receive any additional justification from any further beliefs of yours, then (H) qualifies, according to DB, as basic.

Experiential Foundationalism, then, combines to two crucial ideas: (i) when a justified belief is basic, its justification is not owed to any other belief; (ii) what in fact justifies basic beliefs are experiences.

Under ordinary circumstances, perceptual beliefs such as (H) are not based on any further beliefs about one's own perceptual experiences. It is unclear, therefore, how privilege foundationalism can account for the justification of ordinary perceptual beliefs like (H). Experiential foundationalism, on the other hand, has no trouble at all explaining how ordinary perceptual beliefs are justified: they are justified by the perceptual experiences that give rise to them. This could be viewed as a reason for preferring experiential foundationalism to privilege foundationalism.

Above, we noted that how to think of basicality is not uncontroversial. DB defines just one kind of basicality. Here's an alternative conception of it:

Epistemic Basicality (EB)
S's justified belief that p is basic if and only if S's justification for believing that p does not depend on any justification S possesses for believing a further proposition, q.[35]

EB makes it more difficult for a belief to be basic than DB does. To see why, we turn to the chief question (let's call it the ‘J-question’) that advocates of experiential foundationalism face:

The J-Question
Why are perceptual experiences a source of justification?

One way of answering the J-question can be viewed as a compromise position, since it is meant to be a compromise between foundationalism and its competitor, coherentism. The compromise position will be of interest to us because it illustrates how DB and EB differ. For if we adopt the compromise position, beliefs such as (H) will qualify as basic according to DB, but according to EB as nonbasic. So let's see what the compromise position says.

From a coherentist point of view, we might answer the J-question as follows: Perceptual experiences are a source of justification because we are justified in believing them to be reliable. As we will see below, making perceptual justification dependent on the existence of reliability-attributing beliefs is quite problematic. There is, however, an alternative answer to the J-question that appeals to reliability without making perceptual justification dependent upon beliefs that attribute reliability to perceptual experiences. According to this second answer to the J-question, perceptual experiences are a source of justification because we have justification for taking them to be reliable. That's the view we shall call the compromise position.[36]

Note that your having justification for believing that p doesn't entail that you actually believe p. For example, if you believe that the person next to you wears a blue hat, you have justification for believing that the person next to you wears a blue hat or a red hat. But of course you are unlikely to believe the latter even though you have justification for it. Likewise, your having justification for attributing reliability to your perceptual experiences doesn't entail that you have given thought to the matter and actually formed the belief that they are reliable. According to the kind of coherentism we considered above, if your perceptual experiences are a source of justification for you, it must be the case that you have considered the matter and believe them to be reliable. The compromise position says no such thing. It says merely that, if your perceptual experiences are a source of justification for you, you must have justification for believing them to be reliable.

What might give us justification for thinking that our perceptual experiences are reliable? That's a complicated issue. For our present purposes, let's consider the following answer: We remember that they have served us well in the past. We are supposing, then, that justification for attributing reliability to your perceptual experiences consists of memories of perceptual success. According to the compromise position, it is never a perceptual experience (E) by itself that justifies a perceptual belief, but only (E) in conjunction with suitable track-record memories that give you justification for considering (E) reliable. Let ‘(E)’ again stand for the hat's looking blue to you, and ‘(H)’ for your belief that that hat is blue. According to the compromise position, (E) justifies (H) only if (E) is accompanied by track-record memories (M) that give you justification for attributing reliability to your visual experiences. So what, according to the compromise position as we have described it, justifies (H) is the conjunction of (E) and (M).

We can now see how DB and EB differ. According to the compromise position, your having justification for (H) depends on your having justification for believing something else in addition to (H), namely that your visual experiences are reliable. As a result (H) is not basic in the sense defined by EB. However, (H) might still be basic in the sense defined by DB. As long as your justification for (H) is owed solely to (E) and (M), neither of which includes any beliefs, DB tells us that (H) is basic. It follows that an experiential foundationalist who wishes to classify beliefs such as (H) as basic cannot adopt the compromise position. Such a foundationalist would have to say that (E) by itself is sufficient for making (H) a justified belief.

How do experiential foundationalists who prefer EB to DB answer the J-question? Because of the way they conceive of basicality, they cannot say that perceptual experiences are a source of justification for you because you have a reason, R, for believing that they do. For R would be justification for believing something else — the very thing that, according to EB, is an obstacle to basicality. One option for EB-foundationalists would be to endorse externalism. If they do, they could say that perceptual experiences are a source of justification if, and only if, they are of types that are reliably associated with true resulting beliefs. On that view, it would be the fact of reliability, not evidence of reliability, that makes perceptual experiences a source of justification.[37] Another internalist option would be to say that perceptual experiences are a source of justification because it couldn't be otherwise: it's a necessary truth that certain perceptual experiences can justify certain perceptual beliefs. This would be an internalist answer to the J-question because perceptual experiences would be a source of justification whether or not they are reliable.[38]

To conclude this section, let us briefly consider how justification is supposed to be transferred from basic to nonbasic beliefs. There are two options: the justificatory relation between basic and nonbasic beliefs could be deductive or non-deductive. If we take the relation to be deductive, each of one's nonbasic beliefs would have to be such that it can be deduced from one's basic beliefs. This seems excessively demanding. If we consider a random selection of typical beliefs we hold, it is not easy to see from which basic beliefs they could be deduced. Foundationalists, therefore, typically conceive of the link between the foundation and the superstructure in non-deductive terms. They would say that, for a basic belief, B, to justify a nonbasic belief, B*, it isn't necessary that B entails B*. Rather, it is sufficient that, given B, it is likely that B* is true.

3.2 Coherentism

Foundationalism says that knowledge and justification are structured like a building, consisting of a superstructure that rests upon a foundation. According to coherentism, this metaphor gets things wrong. Knowledge and justification are structured like a web where the strength of any given area depends on the strength of the surrounding areas. Coherentists, then, deny that there are any basic beliefs. As we saw in the previous section, there are two different ways of conceiving of basicality. Consequently, there are two corresponding ways of construing coherentism: as the denial of doxastic basicality or as the denial of epistemic basicality. Consider first coherentism as the denial of doxastic basicality:

Doxastic Coherentism
Every justified belief receives its justification from other beliefs in its epistemic neighborhood.

Let us apply this thought to the hat example we considered in Section 3.1. Suppose again you notice someone's hat and believe

(H) That hat is blue.

Let's agree that (H) is justified. According to coherentism, (H) receives its justification from other beliefs in the epistemic vicinity of (H). They constitute your evidence or your reasons for taking (H) to be true. Which beliefs might make up this set of justification-conferring neighborhood beliefs?

We will consider two approaches to answering this question. The first is known as inference to the best explanation. Such inferences generate what is called explanatory coherence.[39] According to this approach, we must suppose you form a belief about the way the hat appears to you in your perceptual experiences, and a second belief to the effect that your perceptual experience, the hat's looking blue to you, is best explained by the assumption that (H) is true. So the relevant set of beliefs is the following:

(1) I am having a visual experience (E): the hat looks blue to me.

(2) My having (E) is best explained by assuming that (H) is true.

There are of course alternative explanations of why you have (E). Perhaps you are hallucinating that the hat is blue. Perhaps an evil demon makes the hat look blue to you when in fact it is red. Perhaps you are the sort of person to whom hats always look blue. An explanatory coherentist would say that, compared with these, the hat's actual blueness is a superior explanation. That's why your are justified in believing (H). Note that an explanatory coherentist can also explain the lack of justification. Suppose you remember that you just took a hallucinatory drug that makes things look blue to you. That would prevent you from being justified in believing (H). The explanatory coherentist can account for this by pointing out that, in the case we are considering now, the truth of (H) would not be the best explanation of why you are having experience (E). Rather, your having taken the hallucinatory drug would be an explanation at least as good as the assumption as (H) is true. That's why, according to the explanatory coherentist, in this variation of our original case you wouldn't be justified in be believing (H).

One problem for explanatory coherentists is to make us understand, in nonepistemic terms, why the favored explanation is really better than the competing explanations. Let's use the evil demon hypothesis to illustrate that difficulty. What we need is an explanation of why you are having (E). According to the evil demon hypothesis, you are having (E) because the evil demon is tricking you. The explanatory coherentist would say that this is a bad explanation of why you are having (E). But why would it be bad? What we need to answer this question is a general and principled account of what makes one explanation better than another. Suppose we appeal to the fact that you are not justified in believing in the existence of evil demons. The general idea would be this: If there are two competing explanations, E1 and E2, and E1 consists of or includes a proposition that you are not justified in believing whereas E2 does not, then E2 is better than E1. The problem with this idea is that it puts the cart before the horse. Explanatory coherentism is supposed to make us understand where justification comes from. It doesn't do that if it accounts for the difference between better and worse explanations by making use of the difference between justified and unjustified belief. If explanatory coherentism were to proceed in this way, it would be a circular, and thus uninformative, account of justification. So the challenge to which explanatory coherentism must rise is to give an account, without using the concept of justification, of what makes one explanation better than another.

Let us move on to the second way in which the coherentist approach might be carried out. Recall what a subject's justification for believing p is all about: possessing a link between the belief that p and p's truth. Suppose the subject knows that the origin of her belief that p is reliable. So she knows that beliefs coming from this source tend to be true. Such knowledge would give her an excellent link between the belief and its truth. So we might say that the neighborhood beliefs which confer justification on (H) are the following:

(1) I am having a visual experience (E): the hat looks blue to me.

(3) Experiences like (E) are reliable.

Call coherentism of this kind reliability coherentism. If you believe (1) and (3), you are in possession of a good reason for thinking that the hat is indeed blue. So you are in possession of a good reason for thinking that the belief in question, (H), is true. That's why, according to reliability coherentism, you are justified in believing (H).

Like explanatory coherentism, this view faces a circularity problem. If (H) receives its justification in part because you also believe (3), (3) itself must be justified. But where would your justification for (3) come from? One answer would be: from your memory of perceptual success in the past. You remember that your visual experiences have had a good track record. They have rarely led you astray. The problem is that you can't justifiably attribute a good track record to your perceptual faculties without using your perceptual faculties. So if reliability coherentism is going to work, it would have to be legitimate to use a faculty for the very purpose of establishing the reliability of that faculty itself. Some epistemologists think that would not be legitimate.[40]

We have seen that explanatory coherentism and reliability coherentism each face its own distinctive circularity problem. Since both are versions of doxastic coherentism, they both face a further difficulty: Do people, under normal circumstances, really form beliefs like (1), (2), and (3)? It would seem they do not. It could be objected, therefore, that these two versions of coherentism make excessive intellectual demands of ordinary subjects who are unlikely to have the background beliefs that, according to these versions of coherentism, are needed for justification. This objection could be avoided by stripping coherentism of its doxastic element. The result would be the following version of coherentism, which results from rejecting EB (the epistemic conception of basicality):

Dependence Coherentism
Whenever one is justified in believing a proposition p1, one's justification for believing p1 depends on justification one has for believing some further propositions, p1, p2, … pn.

An explanatory coherentist might say that, for you to be justified in believing (H), it's not necessary that you actually believe (1) and (2). However, it is necessary that you have justification for believing (1) and (2). It is your having justification for (1) and (2) that gives you justification for believing (H). A reliability coherentist might make an analogous point. She might say that, to be justified in believing (H), you need not believe anything about the reliability of your belief's origin. You must, however, have justification for believing that your belief's origin is reliable; that is, you must have justification for (1) and (3). Both versions of dependence coherentism, then, rest on the supposition that it is possible to have justification for a proposition without actually believing that proposition.

Dependence coherentism is a significant departure from the way coherentism has typically been construed by its advocates. According to the typical construal of coherentism, the view says that a given belief is justified, the subject must have certain further beliefs that constitute reasons for the given belief. Dependence coherentism rejects this. According to it, justification need not come in the form of beliefs. It can come in the form of introspective and memorial evidence that gives a subject justification for beliefs about either reliability or explanatory coherence. In fact, dependence coherentism allows for the possibility that a belief is justified, not by receiving any of its justification from other beliefs, but solely by suitable perceptual experiences and memory content. Above, we called this view the "compromise position". The compromise position, then, may be characterized as follows:

  1. it allows for doxastic basicality;
  2. it does not allow for epistemic basicality;
  3. it is inconsistent with doxastic coherentism;
  4. it qualifies as a version of coherentism, namely dependence coherentism.

Note that (iii) follows from (i), and (iv) from (ii). An uncompromising foundationalist would reject dependence coherentism. A foundationalist of that kind views a basic belief that p as a belief whose justification does not depend on having any justification for believing another proposition q. Foundationalism of this sort could be called independence foundationalism, since it asserts that a basic belief's justification is completely independent of having justification for any other beliefs. The logic of the conflict between foundationalism and coherentism seems to suggest that, ultimately, the conflict between the two views boils down to that between dependence coherentism and independence foundationalism.[41]

Next, let us examine the reasons for and against in the debate over foundationalism and coherentism.

3.3 Why Foundationalism?

The main argument for foundationalism is called the regress argument. It's an argument from elimination. With regard to every justified belief, B1, the question arises of where B1's justification comes from. If B1 is not basic, it would have to come from another belief, B2. But B2 can justify B1 only if B2 is justified itself. If B2 is basic, the justificatory chain would end with B2. But if B2 is not basic, we need a further belief, B3. If B3 is not basic, we need a fourth belief, and so forth. Unless the ensuing regress terminates in a basic belief, we get two possibilities: the regress will either loop back to B1 or continue ad infinitum. According to the regress argument, both of these possibilities are unacceptable. Therefore, if there are justified beliefs, there must be basic beliefs.[42]

This argument suffers from various weaknesses. First, we may wonder whether the alternatives to foundationalism are really unacceptable. In the recent literature on this subject, we actually find an elaborate defense of the position that infinitism is the correct solution to the regress problem.[43] Nor should circularity be dismissed too quickly. The issue is not whether a simple argument of the form p therefore p is acceptable. Of course it is not. Rather, the issue is ultimately whether, in the attempt to show that trust in our faculties is reasonable, we may make use of the input our faculties deliver. Whether such circularity is as unacceptable as a p-therefore-p inference is an open question. Moreover, the avoidance of circularity does not come cheap. Experiential foundationalists claim that perception is a source of justification. Hence they need to answer the J-question: Why is perception a source of justification? As we saw above, if we wish to answer this question without committing ourselves to the kind of circularity dependence coherentism involves, we must choose between externalism and an appeal to brute necessity. Neither choice is unproblematic.

The second weakness of the regress argument is that its conclusion merely says this: If there are justified beliefs, there must be justified beliefs that do not receive their justification from other beliefs. Its conclusion does not say that, if there are justified beliefs, there must be beliefs whose justification is independent of any justification for further beliefs. So the regress argument, if it were sound, would merely show that there must be doxastic basicality. Dependence coherentism, however, allows for doxastic basicality. So the regress argument merely defends experiential foundationalism against doxastic coherentism. It does not tell us why we should prefer independence foundationalism to dependence coherentism.

Experiential foundationalism can be supported by citing cases like the blue hat example. Such examples make it plausible to assume that perceptual experiences are a source of justification. But they do not arbitrate between dependence coherentism and independence foundationalism, since either one of these views appeals to perceptual experiences to explain why perceptual beliefs are justified.

Finally, foundationalism can be supported by advancing objections to coherentism. One prominent objection is that coherentism somehow fails to ensure that a justified belief system is in contact with reality. This objection derives its force from the fact that fiction can be perfectly coherent. Why think, therefore, that a belief system's coherence is a reason for thinking that the belief in that system tend to be true? Coherentists could respond to this objection by saying that, if a belief system contains beliefs such as "Many of my beliefs have their origin in perceptual experiences" and "My perceptual experiences are reliable", it is reasonable for the subject to think that her belief system brings her into contact with external reality. This looks like an effective response to the no-contact-with-reality objection. Moreover, it is not easy to see why foundationalism itself should be better positioned than coherentism when contact with reality is the issue. What is meant by "ensuring" contact with reality? If foundationalists expect a logical guarantee of such contact, basic beliefs must be infallible. That would make contact with reality a rather expensive commodity. Given its price, foundationalists might want to lower their expectations. According to an alternative construal, we expect merely the likelihood of contact with reality. But if coherentists account for the importance of perception in one way or another, they can meet that expectation as well as foundationalists.

Since coherentism can be construed in different ways, it is unlikely that there is one single objection that succeeds in refuting all possible versions of coherentism. Doxastic coherentism, however, seems particularly vulnerable to criticism coming from the foundationalist camp. One of these we considered already: It would seem that doxastic coherentism makes excessive intellectual demands on believers. When dealing with the mundane tasks of everyday life, we don't normally bother to form beliefs about the explanatory coherence of our beliefs or the reliability of our belief sources. According to a second objection, doxastic coherentism fails by being insensitive to the epistemic relevance of perceptual experiences. Foundationalists could argue as follows. Suppose Kim is observing a chameleon that rapidly changes its colors. A moment ago it was blue, now it's purple. Kim still believes it's blue. Her belief is now unjustified because she believes the chameleon is blue even though it looks purple to her. Then the chameleon changes its color back to blue. Now Kim's belief that the chameleon is blue is justified again because the chameleon once again looks blue to her. The point would be that what's responsible for the changing justificatory status of Kim's belief is solely the way the chameleon looks to her. Since doxastic coherentism does not attribute epistemic relevance to perceptual experiences by themselves, it cannot explain why Kim's belief is first justified, then unjustified, and eventually justified again.[44]

3.4 Why Coherentism?

Coherentism is typically defended by attacking foundationalism as a viable alternative. To argue against privilege foundationalism, coherentists pick an epistemic privilege they think is essential to foundationalism, and then argue that either no beliefs, or too few beliefs, enjoy such a privilege. Against experiential foundationalism, different objections have been advanced. One line of criticism is that perceptual experiences don't have propositional content. Therefore, the relation between a perceptual belief and the perceptual experience that gives rise to it can only be causal. Consider again, however, the hat example from above. When you see the hat and it looks blue to you, doesn't your visual experience — its looking blue to you — have the propositional content that the hat is blue? It would seem it does. If it does, there seems to be no reason to deny that your perceptual experience can play a justificatory role.[45]

Another line of thought is that, if perceptual experiences have propositional content, they cannot stop the justificatory regress because they would then be in need of justification themselves. That, however, appears to be a strange thought. In our actual epistemic practice, we never demand of others to justify the way things appear to them in their perceptual experiences. Indeed, such a demand would seem absurd. Suppose I ask you: "Why do you think that the hat is blue?" You answer: "Because it looks blue to me." There are sensible further questions I might ask at that point. For instance, I might ask: "Why do you think its looking blue to you gives you a reason for thinking it is blue?" Or I might ask: "Couldn't you be mistaken in believing it looks blue to you?" The latter question might irritate you, but it would not be illegitimate. After all, we can reasonably doubt that introspective beliefs about how things appear to us are infallible. But now suppose I ask you: "Why do you suppose the perceptual experience in which the hat looks blue to you is justified?" In response to that question, you should accuse me of misusing the word ‘justification’. I might as well ask you what it is that justifies your headache when you have one, or what justifies the itch in your nose when you have one. The latter questions, you should reply, would be as absurd as my request for stating a justifying reason for your perceptual experience.[46]

Experiential foundationalism, then, is not easily dislodged. On what grounds could coherentists object to it? To raise problems for experiential foundationalism, coherentists could press the J-question: Why are perceptual experiences a source of justification? If foundationalists answer the J-question appealing to evidence that warrants the attribution of reliability to perceptual experiences, experiential foundationalism morphs into dependence coherentism, or, as we have called it, the compromise position. To avoid this outcome, foundationalists would have to give an alternative answer. One way of doing this would be to advocate independence foundationalism, which adopts the epistemic conception of basicality and views it as a matter of brute necessity that perception is a source of justification. So ultimately, the task of defending coherentism might come down to the task of showing that dependence coherentism as a compromise position is preferable to independence foundationalism. To back up such a preference, it might be argued that dependence coherentism gives us a more satisfying answer to the J-question than independence foundationalism does. But is that really so?

Suppose we ask "Why is the sum of two and two four?" Isn't the answer "It couldn't be any other way" perfectly satisfactory? So sometimes, at least, a request for explaining the truth of p is met in a satisfying way by pointing out that p is necessarily true. Why, then, should we not be satisfied when independence foundationalists answer the J-question by saying that perceptual experiences are necessarily a source of justification? To find out whether we should be satisfied, we might employ thought experiments. We might try to describe a possible world in which, to use our example again, someone sees an object that looks blue to her, but the object's looking blue to her does not give her any justification at all for believing that the object is actually blue. If we can conceive of such a possible world, then we have reason to think that independence foundationalists are mistaken when they say that perceptual experience is necessarily a source of justification.

4. Sources of Knowledge and Justification

Beliefs arise in people for a wide variety of causes. Among them, we must list psychological factors such as desires, emotional needs, prejudice, and biases of various kinds. Obviously, when beliefs originate in sources like these, they don't qualify as knowledge even if true. For true beliefs to count as knowledge, it is necessary that they originate in sources we have good reason to consider reliable. These are perception, introspection, memory, reason, and testimony. Let us briefly consider each of these.

4.1 Perception

Our perceptual faculties are our five senses: sight, touch, hearing, smelling, and tasting. We must distinguish between an experience that can be classified as perceiving that p (for example, seeing that there is coffee in the cup and tasting that it is sweet), which entails that p is true, and a perceptual experience in which it seems to us as though p, but where p might be false. Let us refer to this latter kind of experience as perceptual seemings. The reason for making this distinction lies in the fact that perceptual experience is fallible. The world is not always as it appears to us in our perceptual experiences. We need, therefore, a way of referring to perceptual experiences in which p seems to be the case that allows for the possibility of p being false. That's the role assigned to perceptual seemings. So some perceptual seemings that p are cases of perceiving that p, others are not. When it looks to you as though there is a cup of coffee on the table and in fact there is, the two states coincide. If, however, you hallucinate that there is a cup on the table, you have perceptual seeming that p without perceiving that p.

One family of epistemological issues about perception arises when we concern ourselves with the psychological nature of the perceptual processes through which we acquire knowledge of external objects. According to direct realism, we can acquire such knowledge because we can directly perceive such objects. For example, when you see a tomato on the table, what you perceive is the tomato itself. According to indirect realism, we acquire knowledge of external objects by virtue of perceiving something else, namely appearances or sense-data. An indirect realist would say that, when you see and thus know that there is a tomato on the table, what you really see is not the tomato itself but a tomato-like sense-datum or some such entity.

Direct and indirect realists hold different views about the structure of perceptual knowledge. Indirect realists would say that we acquire perceptual knowledge of external objects by virtue of perceiving sense data that represent external objects. Sense data, a species of mental states, enjoy a special status: we know directly what they are like. So indirect realists think that, when perceptual knowledge is foundational, it is knowledge of sense data and other mental states. Knowledge of external objects is indirect: derived from our knowledge of sense data. The basic idea is that we have indirect knowledge of the external world because we can have foundational knowledge of our own mind. Direct realists can be more liberal about the foundation of our knowledge of external objects. Since they hold that perceptual experiences get you in direct contact with external objects, they can say that such experiences can give you foundational knowledge of external objects.

We take our perceptual faculties to be reliable. But how can we know that they are reliable? For externalists, this might not be much of a challenge. If the use of reliable faculties is sufficient for knowledge, and if by using reliable faculties we acquire the belief that our faculties are reliable, then we come to know that our faculties are reliable. But even externalists might wonder how they can, via argument, show that our perceptual faculties are reliable. The problem is this. It would seem the only way of acquiring knowledge about the reliability of our perceptual faculties is through memory, through remembering whether they served us well in the past. But should I trust my memory, and should I think that the episodes of perceptual success that I seem to recall were in fact episodes of perceptual success? If I am entitled to answer these questions with ‘yes', then I need to have, to begin with, reason to view my memory and my perceptual experiences as reliable. It would seem, therefore, that there is no non-circular way of arguing for the reliability of one's perceptual faculties.[47]

4.2 Introspection

Introspection is the capacity to inspect the, metaphorically speaking, "inside" of one's mind. Through introspection, one knows what mental states one is in: whether one is thirsty, tired, excited, or depressed. Compared with perception, introspection appears to have a special status. It is easy to see how a perceptual seeming can go wrong: what looks like a cup of coffee on the table might be just be a clever hologram that's visually indistinguishable from an actual cup of coffee. But could it be possible that it introspectively seems to me that I have a headache when in fact I do not? It is not easy to see how it could be. Thus we come to think that introspection has a special status. Compared with perception, introspection seems to be privileged by virtue of being less error prone. How can we account for the special status of introspection?

First, it could be argued that, when it comes to introspection, there is no difference between appearance and reality; therefore, introspective seemings are necessarily successful introspections. According to this approach, introspection is infallible. Alternatively, one could view introspection as a source of certainty. Here the idea is that an introspective experience of p eliminates all possible doubt as to whether p is true. Finally, one could attempt to explain the specialness of introspection by examining the way we respond to first-person reports: typically, we attribute a special authority to such reports. According to this approach, introspection is incorrigible. Others are not, or at least not typically, in a position to correct first-person reports of one's own mental states.

Introspection reveals how the world appears to us in our perceptual experiences. For that reason, introspection has been of special interest to foundationalists. Perception is not immune to error. If certainty consists in the absence of all possible doubt, perception fails to yield certainty. Hence beliefs based on perceptual experiences cannot be foundational. Introspection, however, might deliver what we need to find a firm foundation for our beliefs about external objects: at best outright immunity to error or all possible doubt, or perhaps more modestly, an epistemic kind of directness that cannot be found in perception.

Is it really true, however, that, compared with perception, introspection is in some way special? Critics of foundationalism have argued that introspection is certainly not infallible. Might one not confuse an unpleasant itch for a pain? Might I not think that the shape before me appears circular to me when in fact it appears slightly elliptical to me? If it is indeed possible for introspection to mislead, then it is hard to see why introspection should eliminate all possible doubt. Yet it isn't easy to see either how, if one clearly and distinctly feels a throbbing headache, one could be mistaken about that. Introspection, then, turns out to be a mysterious faculty. On the one hand, it does not seem to be in general an infallible faculty; on the other hand, when looking at appropriately described specific cases, error does seem impossible.[48]

4.3 Memory

Memory is the capacity to retain knowledge acquired in the past. What one remembers, though, need not be a past event. It may be a present fact, such as one's telephone number, or a future event, such as the date of the next elections. Memory is, of course, fallible. Not every instance of taking oneself to remember that p is an instance of actually remembering that p. We should distinguish, therefore, between remembering that p (which entails the truth of p) and seeming to remember that p (which does not entail the truth of p).

One issue about memory concerns the question of what distinguishes memorial seemings from perceptual seemings or mere imagination. Some philosophers have thought that having an image in one's mind is essential to memory, but that would appear to be mistaken. When one remembers one's telephone number, one is unlikely to have an image of one's number in one's mind. The distinctively epistemological questions about memory are these: First, what makes memorial seemings a source of justification? Is it a necessary truth that, if one has a memorial seeming that p, one has thereby prima facie justification for p? Or is memory a source of justification only if, as coherentists might say, one has reason to think that one's memory is reliable? Or is memory a source of justification only if, as externalists would say, it is in fact reliable? Second, how can we respond to skepticism about knowledge of the past? Memorial seemings of the past do not guarantee that the past is what we take it to be. We think that we are a bit older than just five minutes, but it is logically possible that the world sprang into existence just five minutes ago, complete with our dispositions to have memorial seemings of a more distant past and items such as apparent fossils that suggest a past going back millions of years. Our seeming to remember that the world is older than a mere five minutes does not entail, therefore, that it really is. Why, then, should we think that memory is a source of knowledge about the past?[49]

4.4 Reason

Some beliefs would appear to be justified solely by the use of reason. Justification of that kind is said to be a priori: prior to any kind of experience. A standard way of defining a priori justification goes as follows:

A Priori Justification
S is justified a priori in believing that p if and only if S's justification for believing that p does not depend on any experience.

Beliefs that are true and justified in this way (and not somehow "gettiered") would count as instances of a priori knowledge.[50]

What exactly counts as experience? If by ‘experience’ we mean just perceptual experiences, justification deriving from introspective or memorial experiences would count as a priori. For example, I could then know a priori that I'm thirsty, or what I ate for breakfast this morning. While the term ‘a priori’ is sometimes used in this way, the strict use of the term restricts a priori justification to justification derived solely from the use of reason. According to this usage, the word ‘experiences' in the definition above includes perceptual, introspective, and memorial experiences alike. On this narrower understanding, paradigm examples of what I can know on the basis of a priori justification are conceptual truths (such as "All bachelors are unmarried"), and truths of mathematics, geometry and logic.

Justification and knowledge that is not a priori is called ‘a posteriori’ or ‘empirical’. For example, in the narrow sense of ‘a priori’, whether I'm thirsty or not is something I know empirically (on the basis of introspective experiences), whereas I know a priori that 12 divided by 3 is 4.

Several important issues arise about a priori knowledge. First, does it exist at all? Skeptics about apriority deny its existence. They don't mean to say that we have no knowledge of mathematics, geometry, logic, and conceptual truths. Rather, what they claim is that all such knowledge is empirical.

Second, if a priori justification is possible, exactly how does it come about? What makes a belief such as "All bachelors are unmarried" justified solely on the basis of reason? Is it an unmediated grasp of the truth of this proposition? Or does it consist of grasping that the proposition is necessarily true? Or is it the purely intellectual experience of "seeing" (with they "eye of reason") or "intuiting" that this proposition is true (or necessarily true)? Or is it, as externalists would suggest, the reliability of the cognitive process by which we come to recognize the truth of such a proposition?

Third, if a priori knowledge exists, what is its extent? Empiricists have argued that a priori knowledge is limited to the realm of the analytic, consisting of propositions of a somehow inferior status because they are not really "about the world". Propositions of a superior status, which convey genuine information about world, are labeled synthetic. a priori knowledge of synthetic propositions, empiricists would say, is not possible. Rationalists deny this. They would say that a proposition such as "If a ball is green all over, then it doesn't have black spots" is synthetic and knowable a priori.

A fourth question about the nature of a priori knowledge concerns the distinction between necessary and contingent truths. The received view is that whatever is known a priori is necessarily true, but there are epistemologists who disagree with that.[51]

4.5 Testimony

Testimony differs from the sources we considered above because it isn't distinguished by having its own cognitive faculty. Rather, to acquire knowledge of p through testimony is to come to know that p on the basis of someone's saying that p. "Saying that p" must be understood broadly, as including ordinary utterances in daily life, postings by bloggers on their web-logs, articles by journalists, delivery of information on television, radio, tapes, books, and other media. So, when you ask the person next to you what time it is, and she tells you, and you thereby come to know what time it is, that's an example of coming to know something on the basis of testimony. And when you learn by reading the Washington Post that the terrorist attack in Sharm el-Sheikh of July 22, 2005 killed at least 88 people, that, too, is an example of acquiring knowledge on the basis of testimony.

The epistemological puzzle testimony raises is this: Why is testimony a source of knowledge? An externalist might say that testimony is a source of knowledge if and only if it comes from a reliable source. But here, even more so than in the case of our faculties, internalists will not find that answer satisfactory. Suppose you hear someone saying ‘p’. Suppose further that person is in fact utterly reliable with regard to the question of whether p is the case or not. Finally, suppose you have no evidential clue whatever as to that person's reliability. Wouldn't it be plausible to conclude that, since that person's reliability is unknown to you, that person's saying ‘p’ does not put you in a position to know that p? But if the reliability of a testimonial source is not sufficient for making it a source of knowledge, what else is needed? Thomas Reid suggested that, by our very nature, we accept testimonial sources as reliable and tend to attribute credibility to them unless we encounter special contrary reasons. But that's merely a statement of the attitude we in fact take toward testimony. What is it that makes that attitude reasonable? It could be argued that, in one's own personal experiences with testimonial sources, one has accumulated a long track record that can be taken as a sign of reliability. However, when we think of the sheer breadth of the knowledge we derive from testimony, one wonders whether one's personal experiences constitute an evidence base rich enough to justify the attribution of reliability to the totality of the testimonial sources one tends to trust. An alternative to the track record approach would be to declare it a necessary truth that trust in testimonial sources is justified. This suggestion, alas, encounters the same difficulty as the externalist approach to testimony: it does not seem we can acquire knowledge from sources the reliability of which is utterly unknown to us.[52]

5. The Limits of Knowledge and Justification

5.1 The Case for Skepticism

According to skeptics, the limits of what you know are narrower than you would like to think. There are many things that you think you know but actually fail to know. For example, you think you know that you have hands, but in fact you don't. How can the skeptics expect you to take such a strange conclusion seriously? Here's how. As a first step, the skeptics will focus on another proposition, about which you are likely to agree that you don't know it. As a second step, they will get you to agree that, since you don't know that second proposition, you don't know the first one either: the proposition that you have hands.

When the skeptics get their argument started with some other proposition about which you are likely to agree you don't know it, what do they have in mind? They direct your attention to what is called a skeptical hypothesis. According to a skeptical hypothesis, things are radically different from what you take them to be. Here are several examples:

  • I'm lying in my bed dreaming.
  • I'm deceived by an evil demon.
  • I'm a mere brain-in-a-vat (a BIV).
  • I'm in the matrix world.

What the skeptics will point out, and what they think you will easily agree with, is this: For any particular hypothesis on the list, you don't know that it is false. This works better for some than for others. It works really well for the BIV hypothesis, which we discussed already in section 2.2. The idea is that, if you are a BIV, you are reduced to a mere brain which is stimulated in such a way that the delusion of a normal life results. So the experiences you have as a BIV and the experiences you have as a normal person are perfectly alike, indistinguishable, so to speak, "from the inside." It doesn't look to you as though you are a BIV. After all, you can see that you have a body, and you can freely move about in your environment. The problem is that it looks that way to a BIV, too. As a result, the evidence you have as a normal person and the evidence you have as a BIV do not relevantly differ. Consequently, your evidence can't settle the question of whether or not you are a BIV. Based on this thought, the skeptics claim you don't know that you are not a BIV. That's the first step of the case for skepticism.

Let us now focus on the second step. The basic thought is that, if you don't know you're not a BIV, you don't know you have hands. That thought is extremely plausible. After all, if you are a BIV, you don't have any hands. So if you can't distinguish between being and not being a BIV, you can't distinguish either between having and not having hands. But if you can't distinguish between having and not having hands, surely you don't know that you have hands. Putting the two steps of the skeptic's reasoning together, we get the following argument:

The BIV Argument
(1)   I don't know that I'm not a BIV.
(2)   If I don't know that I'm not a BIV, then I don't know that I have hands.
    Therefore:
(3)   I don't know that I have hands.

As we have just seen, (1) and (2) are very plausible premises. It would seem, therefore, that the BIV Argument is sound. If it is, we must conclude we don't know we have hands. But surely that conclusion can't be right. So we are confronted with a difficult challenge: On what grounds can we reject the conclusion of this seemingly sound argument?[53]

5.2 Skepticism and Closure

The second premise is closely connected to the principle that knowledge is closed under known entailment, for short, the closure principle. Setting complications aside, it says the following:

The Closure Principle
If I know that p, and I know that p entails q, then I know that q.[54]

This principle is exceedingly plausible. Here's an example to illustrate it. Suppose you had exactly two beers. Your having had exactly two beers entails that you had less than three beers. If you know both of these things, then you know that you had less than three beers. This much, certainly, seems beyond dispute.

How is the closure principle related to the skeptical argument? The connection can be seen when you replace ‘p’ and ‘q’ with the relevant propositions:

p: I have hands.
q: I'm not a BIV.

Making these replacements, we get the following application of the closure principle to the BIV argument:

BIV Closure
If I know that I have hands, and I know that my having hands entails my not being a BIV, then I know that I'm not a BIV.

According to the skeptical argument, you can't know that you are not a BIV. So the consequent of BIV closure is false. Therefore, the antecedent of BIV closure must be false. The antecedent of BIV closure is a conjunction. The second conjunct can't be argued with. If you understand what is meant by the BIV hypothesis, then you know that you don't have hands if you are a BIV. If follows that the antecedent of BIV Closure is false because its first conjunct is false. So starting out with the closure principle, we arrive at the skeptical conclusion: You don't know that you have hands.[55]

5.3 Relevant Alternatives and Closure Denial

Next, we will examine various responses to the BIV argument. According to the first, we should distinguish between relevant and irrelevant alternatives. An alternative to a state of affairs or proposition p is any state of affairs or proposition that is incompatible with p. Your having hands and your being a BIV are alternatives: if the former is true, the latter is false, and vice versa. According to the thought that motivates the second premise of the BIV argument, you know that you have hands only if you can discriminate between your actually having hands and the alternative of being a (handless) BIV. But you can't discriminate between these two states of affairs. That's why you don't know that you have hands. In response to such reasoning, a relevant alternatives theorist would say that your inability to discriminate between these two states of affairs is not an obstacle to your knowing that you have hands because your being a BIV is not a relevant alternative to your having hands. What would be a relevant alternative? This, for example: your arms ending in stumps rather than hands, or your having hooks instead of hands, or your having prosthetic hands. But these alternatives don't prevent you from knowing that you have hands — not because they are irrelevant, but rather because you can discriminate between these alternatives and your having hands. The relevant alternative theorist holds, therefore, that you do know that you have hands.

The BIV argument is valid. Relevant alternative theorists must therefore deny one of its premises. Since they agree that you don't know that your are not a BIV, so they accept the first premise. Consequently, they reject the second premise. You know that you have hands even though you don't know that you are not a BIV. This means, in effect, that relevant alternative theorists deny the closure principle. Let's consider the details of this point. Relevant alternative theorists say:

  1. You know you have hands.
  2. You know that your having hands entails your not being a BIV.
  3. You don't know that you are not a BIV.

Relevant alternative theorists, then, assert the antecedent and deny the consequent of BIV closure, as stated in the previous section. They are, therefore, committed to the claim that the closure principle is false.[56]

There are two chief problems for this approach. The first is that denouncing the BIV alternative as irrelevant is ad hoc unless it is supplemented with a principled account of what makes one alternative relevant and another irrelevant. The second is that the closure principle enjoys a high degree of intrinsic plausibility. Denying it generates so-called abominable conjunctions. Here is one:

An Abominable Conjunction
I know that I have hands but I do not know that I am not a (handless) BIV.

Many epistemologists would agree that this conjunction is indeed abominable because it blatantly violates the basic and extremely plausible intuition that you can't know you have hands without knowing that you are not a BIV.[57]

5.4 The Moorean Response

Next, let us consider a response to the BIV argument according to which it's not the second but the first premise that must be rejected. G. E. Moore has pointed out that an argument succeeds only to the extent that its premises are more plausible than the conclusion. So if we encounter an argument whose conclusion we don't like, and notice that the denial of the conclusion is actually quite plausible, in fact more plausible than the assertion of the premises, then we can turn the argument on its head. According to this approach, we can respond to the BIV argument as follows:

Counter BIV
(1)  I know that I have hands.
(2)  If I don't know that I'm not a BIV, then I don't know that I have hands.
    Therefore:
(3)  I know that I am not a BIV.

Unless we are skeptics or opponents of closure, we would have to concede that this argument is sound. It is valid, and its premises are true. Yet few philosophers would agree that Counter BIV amounts to a satisfying response to the BIV argument. What needs to be accomplished is more than a mere assertion of (3), based on knowledge of one's hands. What we need to have explained to us is how one can know that one is not a BIV. The observation that the premises of the BIV argument are less plausible than the denial of its conclusion doesn't help us understand how such knowledge is possible. That's why the Moorean response falls short of being a successful rebuttal of the skeptical argument.[58]

5.5 The Contextualist Response

We have looked at two responses to the BIV argument. The relevant alternatives response denies the second premise. Because of the plausibility of the second premise, this might strike us as a desperation move. The Moorean response denies the first premise. The problem with that move is this: Unless we are provided with a convincing explanation of how one can know that one isn't a BIV, it's not more than just digging in one's non-skeptical heels. According to contextualism, it's possible to articulate a more satisfying reply to the BIV argument. The trick is to focus on how we actually use the word ‘know’. If we do that, we'll notice that our use of that word varies from one situation — from one context — to another. What so varies is what we mean by that word.

Three questions arise immediately. First, what are these various meanings of the word ‘know’? Second, why and how does what we mean by ‘know’ change from one context to another? Third, how does the context-sensitivity of ‘know’ help us respond to the BIV argument? Let us consider each question in turn.

First, when what we mean by ‘know’ changes from one context to another, what changes is the standards that we think must be met if someone is to have knowledge of something. For the sake of keeping things simple, let's distinguish between just two sets of standards: very high and not so high. Let's refer to them as ‘high’ and ‘low’ standards. In some contexts, when we use the word ‘know’, we have low standards of knowledge in mind: standards that are easy to meet. We will then ascribe knowledge liberally. In other contexts, our use of the word ‘know’ is guided by more demanding high standards. Meeting these is very difficult. In such contexts, we will ascribe knowledge only reluctantly. Second, what effects such changes in what we mean by ‘know’? According to some contextualists, it is the salience of error-possibilities. In an ordinary, low-standard context, you don't worry about being a BIV. It's an error possibility you ignore. As a result, your standards of knowledge remain low. In such a context, all it takes for you to know you have hands is that you can discriminate between having hands and having stumps, hooks, or prosthetic hands. That's a condition you easily meet. Hence you will not be reluctant at all to ascribe to yourself knowledge of your hands. But suppose you start thinking about the problem of skepticism. You're wondering how you could know that you are not a BIV. You come to note that it's very difficult to know that one isn't a BIV. The BIV alternative is now salient to you. This makes your standards of knowledge rise. Bearing in mind that BIVs don't have hands, you now think that, for you to know that you have hands, you must be able to eliminate the error possibility of being a BIV. Since you realize you can't eliminate that possibility, you are no longer willing to ascribe to yourself knowledge of your hands.

Third, how does all of that help us find a reply to the BIV argument? Contextualists view the BIV argument as presenting us with a paradox. We think it's crazy to deny knowledge of our hands. At the same time, we don't think one can know that one isn't a BIV. How can the conflict between these thoughts be resolved? Contextualists propose to resolve it by saying this: In low standard contexts (when skeptical hypotheses are not salient), the first premise and the conclusion of the BIV argument are both false. In such contexts, a speaker who says "You don't know that you have hands" or "You don't know that you are not a BIV" is mistaken. The speaker is mistaken because we do in fact meet low standards of knowledge. So relative to what we mean by ‘know’ in such contexts, we know that we have hands and that we are not BIVs. However, in high standard contexts (when an error possibility such as being a BIV is salient), the first premise and the conclusion of the BIV argument are both true. Now, when speakers say "You don't know that you have hands" or "You don't know that you are not a BIV", they are correct, for with regard to having hands and being or not being a BIV, our epistemic position is not strong enough for us to meet high standards of knowledge. Therefore, relative to what we mean by ‘know’ when we are confronted with a salient error possibility such as being a BIV, we know neither that we have hands nor that we are not BIVs.

Contextualism is intended as a closure preserving response to skepticism. The closure principle is true even relative to "knowledge" attributions that are subject to high standards. Hence, according to contextualism, things fall into place as follows:

  1. we know the closure principle whether the meaning of ‘know’ is fixed by high or low standards;
  2. when the meaning of ‘know’ is fixed by low standards, we know both that we have hands and that we are not BIVs;
  3. when the meaning of ‘know’ is fixed by high standards, we know neither that we have hands nor that we are not BIVs.

As a result, closure is preserved. Contextualism is also meant to be an improvement over the Moorean response. According to that response, the first premise of the BIV argument is false. This conflicts with our intuition that we cannot know that we are not BIVs. Contextualism resolves this conflict by saying that the first premise is false only in low standards contexts. In high standards contexts, that premise is true.

Naturally, contextualism has elicited many objections. According to one, what's wrong with contextualism is that it replaces our interest in knowledge itself with focus on the word ‘know’. This objection (let us call it the replacement objection) is based on a misunderstanding of contextualism. In the next section, we will see why.

According to another objection, contextualism overemphasizes the importance of the context sensitivity of the word ‘know’. Let us distinguish between two elements of contextualism. The first is semantic ascent. If we endorse the semantic ascent element, we think that a satisfactory response to skepticism in general and the BIV argument in particular requires of us to distinguish between a high-standards and a low-standards meaning of "knowledge." The semantic ascent thesis remains squarely within the limits of traditional epistemology. Indeed, in any area of philosophy, it's always going to be a good idea to remain aware of the possibility that the problems in which one finds oneself entangled might, at least to some extent, be due to subtle (and sometimes not so subtle) shifts in meaning. The other element of contextualism could be called strict context-sensitivity, as opposed to loose context sensitivity. Consider the thesis that the meaning of the word ‘know’ varies with context. There is an innocuous interpretation of this thesis: people do not always mean the same when they use the word ‘know’. Sometimes they mean one thing by ‘know’, at other times they mean another thing by ‘know’. This is loose context sensitivity. It's hard to see on what grounds such a weak claim might be disputed. Contextualists, however, make a stronger claim. They assert that what one means by ‘know’ is determined, in a way that's very difficult to resist, by the salience or non-salience of error possibilities. That's strict context sensitivity. If we endorse strict context sensitivity, there's something important that drops out: how one intends to use the word ‘know’. An alternative semantics of the word ‘know’ will de-emphasize the importance of the salience or non-salience of error possibilities, and ascribe a much higher degree of semantic independence to the subjects who use the word ‘know’. Next, let's consider a response to the BIV argument that retains the semantic ascent element of contextualism, but rejects strong context sensitivity.[59]

5.6 The Ambiguity Response

What proposition a "knowledge"-attributing sentence expresses depends on what concept of knowledge the person who uses that sentence (in spoken or written form) has in mind when using the word ‘know’. Let's distinguish between two concepts: a high-standards and a low-standards concept. There are various ways of cashing out this distinction. We will understand it in terms of fallible and infallible evidence. High-standards or infallible knowledge of p requires p-entailing evidence. Low-standards of fallible knowledge of p requires adequate evidence for p, where evidence for p can be adequate without entailing p.

According to the ambiguity response, a "knowledge"-attributing sentence is ambiguous unless we can tell whether the word ‘know’, as it occurs in that sentence, refers to fallible or infallible knowledge. Suppose we think that fallible knowledge of one's hands is possible, whereas infallible knowledge of one's hands is not. Suppose further we hear Jane say ‘Carl knows that he has hands.’ Finally, suppose we have no idea whether Jane uses the word ‘know’ in the fallible or infallible sense. In that case, we would have to say that Jane's utterance is true if interpreted as a claim about fallible knowledge, but false if interpreted as a claim about infallible knowledge. Now, with regard to the BIV argument, we are in a similar situation. We have not been instructed on whether the word ‘know’ in its premises and its conclusion is to be understood in the fallible or infallible sense. Consequently, when assessing the merits of the BIV argument, we must consider three versions of it:

The Mixed Version
In the premises, the word ‘know’ refers to infallible knowledge, whereas in the conclusion, it refers to fallible knowledge.

The High-Standards Version
The word ‘know’ refers to infallible knowledge in both the premises and the conclusion.

The Low-Standards Version
The word ‘know’ refers to fallible knowledge in both the premises and the conclusion.

Distinguishing between these three versions, proponents of the ambiguity response can reply to the BIV argument as follows:

  1. The mixed version is an instance of equivocation and thus invalid.
  2. The high-standards version is sound but uninteresting. Its conclusion asserts that we don't have infallible knowledge of our hands. That's nothing to worry about. What really matters to us is whether we have fallible knowledge of our hands. But that question simply isn't addressed by the high-standards version.
  3. The low-standards version is interesting but unsound. Its conclusion — we do not even have fallible knowledge of our hands — is indeed disturbing. If this conclusion were true, then we would be in a radical way mistaken about what we think we know. However, we don't have to accept this conclusion because the argument's first premise is false. According to that premise, one cannot even have fallible knowledge of one's not being a BIV. That's false. There is, after all, good evidence for thinking that one's is not a BIV. This evidence is good enough for knowing that one isn't a BIV even though it does not entail that one isn't a BIV.

Suppose an opponent of the ambiguity response were to employ the replacement objection, claiming that the response focuses on the word ‘know’ instead of knowledge itself. This objection would be misguided. The ambiguity response mentions the word ‘know’ only at the initial stage, and then immediately shifts its focus to non-linguistic entities such as concepts and propositions. So advocates of the ambiguity response would point out that, when we distinguish between versions (i) through (iii), we are concerned with which propositions the premises and the conclusion of the BIV argument express, and thus are ultimately concerned with knowledge itself. The upshot of their reply, then, is to distinguish between the following two propositions:

(Kif) I knowif that I have hands.
(Kf) I knowf that I have hands.

where the term ‘knowif’ in (Kif) refers to infallible knowledge, whereas the term ‘knowf’ in Kf refers to fallible knowledge. Both of these proposition are about knowledge itself, or, more precisely, about different kinds of knowledge. The ambiguity response, therefore, is not vulnerable to the replacement objection. Neither is contextualism. For according to contextualism, what context determines is precisely which proposition the conclusion of the BIV argument expresses: (Kif) or (Kf).[60] Hence contextualism, is, notwithstanding initial appearance, just as much about knowledge itself as is the ambiguity response.

How, then, do contextualism and the ambiguity response differ? Both share the semantic ascent element. A satisfactory response to skepticism requires of us to distinguish between various meanings of the word ‘know’. Beyond that, they proceed in different directions. Whereas according to contextualism, whether we reject or endorse the conclusion of the BIV argument is a function of which context we are in, the ambiguity response makes context irrelevant. It makes context irrelevant because, no matter which context we are in, we can always disambiguate. So, when we are thinking about or discussing the BIV argument and are thus confronted with a salient error possibility, we need not adopt a high-standards meaning of ‘know’. Rather, we can respond to the argument by saying that, if it is about infallible knowledge its conclusion is true but unremarkable, whereas if it is about fallible knowledge its conclusion is remarkable but false.[61]

5.6 Knowing One Isn't a BIV

Contextualism and the ambiguity response, as discussed in the previous two sections, leave out one important detail. Contextualists say that, relative to the standards of knowledge operational in low-standards contexts, one can know that one isn't a BIV. Ambiguity theorists say that, in the fallibilist sense of ‘know’, one can know that one isn't a BIV. It might be objected that this is a bit optimistic. Let us look at the issue from the evidentialist point of view. An evidentialist who employs the ambiguity response would have to say that one's evidence for thinking one isn't a BIV is good enough for knowledge. But when the BIV hypothesis was introduced, we noted that part of the hypothesis is the following point: whehter you are a normal person or a BIV makes no difference with regard to your evidence: it's the same in either case. Call this the identical evidence thesis. This thesis is simply part of the hypothesis in question and must therefore be granted. How, then, could one possibly know, even in the fallibilist sense of ‘know’, that one isn't a BIV?

It would be a mistake to think the identical evidence thesis entails that, as a normal person, one doesn't have good evidence for thinking that one isn't a BIV. Nor does it entail that, as a BIV, one doesn't have good evidence for thinking that one isn't a BIV. What it entails is merely this: Whatever evidence one has, as a normal person regarding the question of whether one is a BIV, one would have that very same evidence if one were a BIV. This leaves open the possibility that in either case, as a BIV or as a normal person, one has excellent evidence for thinking that one is not a BIV.

What might evidence for thinking that one isn't a BIV consist of? For reasons of space, we will merely hint, by way of analogy, at how this question might be answered. Note that the BIV hypothesis entails various rather problematic propositions:

(a) At least one BIV exists.
(b) The know-how needed for envatting people exists.
(c) The technology needed for envatting people exists.

Compare:

(d) At least one spaceship exists that can be used for traveling to another galaxy and coming back within a couple of months.
(e) The know-how needed for building such a spaceship exists.
(f) The technology needed for building such a spaceship exists.

According to the evidentialist anti-skepticism under consideration here, you know, on the basis of your knowledge of how the world works, that (d)–(f) are all false.[62] In the very least, you can come to know this by consulting suitable experts. But what about (a) through (c)? Well, if you know or can come to know that (d)–(f) are all false, isn't it plausible to claim that you also know or can come to know that (a)–(c) are all false? If a skeptic were to argue that you know that (d)–(f) are all false, while you do not know that any proposition in (a)–(c) is false, that skeptic would incur the burden of having to dislodge the analogy, of having to explain why, whereas knowledge that (d)–(f) are all false is easily obtainable, knowledge of the falsehood of each (a)–(c) is beyond our reach. This might not be easily accomplished.

Suppose you do know that (a)–(c) are all false. Then you know that any proposition that entails (a)–(c) is false. The BIV hypothesis entails (a)–(c). Hence you know that the BIV hypothesis, is false. But if you know that you are not a BIV, then premise (1) of the BIV argument is false.[63]

6. Additional Issues

6.1 Virtue Epistemology

Epistemology, as commonly practiced, focuses on the subject's beliefs. Are they justified? Are they instances of knowledge? When it comes to assessing how the subject herself is doing with regard to the pursuit of truth and the seeking of knowledge, this assessment is carried out by looking at the epistemic quality of her beliefs. According to virtue epistemology, the order of analysis ought to be reversed. We need to begin with the subject herself and assess her epistemic virtues and vices: her "good" and her "bad" ways of forming beliefs. Careful and attentive reasoning would be an example of an epistemic virtue; jumping to conclusions would be an example of an epistemic vice. It is only after we have determined which ways of forming beliefs count as epistemic virtues that we can, as a second step, determine the epistemic quality of particular beliefs. Its proponents construe virtue epistemology more or less stringently. According to pure virtue epistemology, epistemic virtues and vices are sui generis. They cannot be analyzed in terms of more fundamental epistemic or nonepistemic concepts. Proponents of a less stringent approach disagree with this; they would say that epistemic virtues and vices can fruitfully be analyzed by employing other concepts. Indeed, according to an externalist strand of virtue epistemology, it is the very notion of reliability that we should employ to capture the difference between epistemic virtues and vices. Stable ways of forming beliefs are epistemic virtues if and only if they tend to result in true beliefs, epistemic vices if and only if they tend to result in false beliefs. Virtue epistemology, thus conceived, is a form of reliabilism.[64]

6.2 Naturalistic Epistemology

According to an extreme version of naturalistic epistemology, the project of traditional epistemology, pursued in an a priori fashion from the philosopher's armchair, is completely misguided. The "fruits" of such activity are demonstrably false theories such as foundationalism, as well as endless and arcane debates in the attempt to tackle questions to which there are no answers. To bring epistemology on the right path, it must be made a part of the natural sciences and become cognitive psychology. The aim of naturalistic epistemology thus understood is to replace traditional epistemology with an altogether new and redefined project. According to a moderate version of naturalistic epistemology, one primary task of epistemology is to identify how knowledge and justification are anchored in the natural world, just as it is the purpose of physics to explain phenomena like heat and cold, or thunder and lightning in terms of properties of the natural world. The pursuit of this task does not require of its proponents to replace traditional epistemology. Rather, this moderate approach accepts the need for cooperation between traditional conceptual analysis and empirical methods. The former is needed for the purpose of establishing a conceptual link between knowledge and reliability, the latter for figuring out which cognitive processes are reliable and which are not.[65]

6.3 Religious Epistemology

In the history of philosophy, there are several famous arguments for the existence of God: the ontological argument, the cosmological argument, and the argument from design. From an epistemological point of view, the question is whether such arguments can constitute a rational foundation of faith, or even give us knowledge of God. A further question is whether, if God exists, knowledge of God might not also be possible in other ways, for example, on the basis of perception or perhaps mystical experiences. There is also a famous problem casting doubt on the existence of God: Why, if God is an omniscient, omnipotent, and benevolent being, is there evil in the world? Here, the epistemological question is whether, based on this problem, we can know that God (thus conceived) does not exist. Another, central issue for religious epistemology is raised by evidentialism. According to evidentialism, knowledge requires adequate evidence. However, there does not seem to be any adequate evidence of God's existence. Is it possible, then, for theists to endorse evidentialism?[66]

6.4 Moral Epistemology

The basic moral categories are those of right and wrong action. When we do theoretical ethics, we wish to find out what it is that makes a right action right and a wrong action wrong. When we do practical or applied ethics, we attempt to find out which actions are right and which are wrong. The epistemological question these areas of philosophy raise is this: How can we know any of that? Traditionally, philosophers have attempted to answer the questions of ethics via intuition, a priori reasoning, and the consideration of hypothetical cases. Some philosophers who belong to the naturalistic camp consider this approach misguided because they think that it is unreliable and liable to produce results that merely reflect our own cultural and social biases. Among those who think that moral knowledge can be acquired via intuition and a priori reasoning, a primary question is whether the kind of justification such methods can generate is coherentist or foundationalist. Finally, a further important question is whether moral knowledge is at all possible. Knowledge requires truth and thus objective reality. According to anti-realists, there is no objective reality of, and thus no truth about, moral matters. Since what is known must be true, it is not easy to see how, if anti-realism were correct, there could be knowledge of moral matters.[67]

6.5 Social Epistemology

When we conceive of epistemology as including knowledge and justified belief as they are positioned within a particular social and historical context, epistemology becomes social epistemology. How to pursue social epistemology is a matter of controversy. According to some, it is an extension and reorientation of traditional epistemology with the aim of correcting its overly individualistic orientation. According to others, social epistemology ought to amount to a radical departure from traditional epistemology, which they see, like the advocates of radical naturalization, as a futile endeavor. Those who favor the former approach retain the thought that knowledge and justified belief are essentially linked to truth as the goal of our cognitive practices. They hold that there are objective norms of rationality that social epistemologists should aspire to articulate. Those who prefer the more radical approach would reject the existence of objective norms of rationality. Moreover, since many view scientific facts as social constructions, they would deny that the goal of our intellectual and scientific activities is to find facts. Such constructivism, if weak, asserts the epistemological claim that scientific theories are laden with social, cultural, and historical presuppositions and biases; if strong, it asserts the metaphysical claim that truth and reality are themselves socially constructed.[68]

6.5 Feminist Epistemology

When construed in a non-controversial way, the subject matter of feminist epistemology consists of issues having to do with fair and equal access of women to, and their participation in, the institutions and processes through which knowledge is generated and transmitted. Viewed this way, feminist epistemology can be seen as a branch of social epistemology. When we move beyond this initial characterization, what feminist epistemology is will become a matter of controversy. According to some, it includes the project of studying and legitimizing special ways in which only women can acquire knowledge. According to others, feminist epistemology should be understood as aiming at the political goal of opposing and rectifying oppression in general and the oppression of women in particular. At the extreme end, feminist epistemology is closely associated with postmodernism and its radical attack on truth and the notion of objective reality.[69]

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Acknowledgments

The author would like to thank Earl Conee for his help, both philosophical and editorial. The editors would like to thank Michael Beaton and Harry McCauley for suggesting improvements to the wording of some of the above sentences.

Copyright © 2005 by
Matthias Steup <steup@purdue.edu>

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