Albert Camus (1913–1960) was a journalist, editor and editorialist, playwright and director, novelist and author of short stories, political essayist and activist—and arguably, although he came to deny it, a philosopher. He ignored or opposed systematic philosophy, had little faith in rationalism, asserted rather than argued many of his main ideas, presented others in metaphors, was preoccupied with immediate and personal experience, and brooded over such questions as the meaning of life in the face of death. Although he forcefully separated himself from existentialism, Camus posed one of the twentieth century's best-known existentialist questions, which launches The Myth of Sisyphus: “There is only one really serious philosophical question, and that is suicide” (MS, 3). And his philosophy of the absurd has left us with a striking image of the human fate: Sisyphus endlessly pushing his rock up the mountain only to see it roll back down each time he gains the top. Camus's philosophy found political expression in The Rebel, which along with his newspaper editorials, political essays, plays, and fiction earned him a reputation as a great moralist. It also embroiled him in conflict with his friend, Jean-Paul Sartre, provoking the major political-intellectual divide of the Cold-War era as Camus and Sartre became, respectively, the leading intellectual voices of the anti-Communist and pro-Communist left. Furthermore, in posing and answering urgent philosophical questions of the day, Camus articulated a critique of religion and of the Enlightenment and all its projects, including Marxism. In 1957 he won the Nobel Prize for literature. He died in a car accident in January, 1960, at the age of 46.
- 1. The Paradoxes of Camus's Absurdist Philosophy
- 2. Nuptials and Camus's Starting Point
- 3. Suicide, Absurdity and Happiness: The Myth of Sisyphus
- 4. Murder and Rebellion: The Rebel
- 5. Philosopher of the Present
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There are various paradoxical elements in Camus's approach to philosophy. In his book-length essay, The Myth of Sisyphus, Camus presents a philosophy that contests philosophy itself. This essay belongs squarely in the philosophical tradition of existentialism but Camus denied being an existentialist. Both The Myth of Sisyphus and his other philosophical work, The Rebel, are systematically skeptical of conclusions about the meaning of life, yet both works assert objectively valid answers to key questions about how to live. Though Camus seemed modest when describing his intellectual ambitions, he was confident enough as a philosopher to articulate not only his own philosophy but also a critique of religion and a fundamental critique of modernity (one that anticipated postmodernism). While rejecting the very idea of a philosophical system, Camus constructed his own original edifice of ideas around the key terms of absurdity and rebellion, aiming to resolve the life-or-death issues that motivated him.
The essential paradox arising in Camus's philosophy concerns his central notion of absurdity. Accepting the Aristotelian idea that philosophy begins in wonder, Camus argues that human beings cannot escape asking the question, “What is the meaning of existence?” Camus, however, denies that there is an answer to this question, and rejects every scientific, teleological, metaphysical, or human-created end that would provide an adequate answer. Thus, while accepting that human beings inevitably seek to understand life's purpose, Camus takes the skeptical position that the natural world, the universe, and the human enterprise remain silent about any such purpose. Since existence itself has no meaning, we must learn to bear an irresolvable emptiness. This paradoxical situation, then, between our impulse to ask ultimate questions and the impossibility of achieving any adequate answer, is what Camus calls the absurd. Camus's philosophy of the absurd explores the consequences arising from this basic paradox.
Camus's understanding of absurdity is best captured in an image, not an argument: of Sisyphus straining to push his rock up the mountain, watching it roll down, then descending after the rock to begin all over, in an endless cycle. Like Sisyphus, humans cannot help but continue to ask after the meaning of life, only to see our answers tumble back down. If we accept this thesis about life's essential absurdity, and Camus's anti-philosophical approach to philosophical questions, we cannot help but ask: What role is left for rational analysis and argument? Doesn't Camus the philosopher preside over the death of philosophy in answering the question whether to commit suicide by abandoning the terrain of argument and analysis and turning to metaphor to answer it? If life has no fundamental purpose or meaning that reason can articulate, we cannot help asking about why we continue to live and to reason. Might not Silenus be right in declaring that it would have been better not to have been born, or to die as soon as possible? And, as Francis Jeanson wrote long before his famous criticism of The Rebel that precipitated the rupture between Camus and Sartre, isn't absurdist philosophy a contradiction in terms, strictly speaking no philosophy at all but an anti-rational posture that ends in silence (Jeanson 1947)?
Was Camus actually a philosopher? He himself said no, in a famous interview with Jeanine Delpech in Les Nouvelles Littéraires in November of 1945, insisting that he did “not believe sufficiently in reason to believe in a system” (Camus 1965, 1427). This was not merely a public posture, since we find the same thought in his notebooks of this period: he describes himself as an artist and not a philosopher because “I think according to words and not according to ideas” (Camus 1995, 113). Still, Jean-Paul Sartre saw immediately that Camus was undertaking important philosophical work, and in his review of The Stranger in relation to Sisyphus, had no trouble connecting Camus with Pascal, Rousseau, and Nietzsche (Sartre 1962). After they became friends Sartre spoke publicly of his friend's “philosophy of the absurd,” which he distinguished from his own thought for which he accepted the “existentialist” label that Camus rejected.
This entry will negotiate Camus's deliberate ambivalence as a philosopher while discussing his philosophy. It is not just a matter of giving a philosophical reading of this playwright, journalist, essayist, and novelist but of taking his philosophical writings seriously—exploring their premises, their evolution, their structure, and their coherence. To do so is to see that his writing contains more than a mood and more than images and sweeping, unsupported assertions, although it contains many of both. Camus takes his skepticism as far as possible as a form of methodical doubt—that is, he begins from a presumption of skepticism—until he finds the basis for a non-skeptical conclusion. And he builds a unique philosophical construction, whose premises are often left unstated and which is not always argued clearly, but which develops in distinct stages over the course of his brief lifetime. Camus's philosophy can be thus read as a sustained effort to demonstrate and not just assert what is entailed by the absurdity of human existence. In the process Camus answers the questions posed by The Myth of Sisyphus, “Why should I not kill myself?”, and by The Rebel, “Why should I not kill others?”.
Camus's graduate thesis at the University of Algiers sympathetically explored the relationship between Greek philosophy and Christianity, specifically the relationship of Plotinus to Augustine. Nevertheless, his philosophy explicitly rejects religion as one of its foundations. Not always taking an openly hostile posture towards religious belief—though he certainly does in the novels The Stranger and The Plague—Camus centers his work on choosing to live without God. Another way to understand Camus's philosophy is that it is an effort to explore the issues and pitfalls of a post-religious world.
Camus's earliest published writing containing philosophical thinking, Nuptials, appeared in Algeria in 1938, and remain the basis of his later work. These lyrical essays and sketches describe a consciousness reveling in the world, a body delighting in nature, and the individual's immersion in sheer physicality. Yet these experiences are presented as the solution to a philosophical problem, namely finding the meaning of life in the face of death. They appear alongside, and reveal themselves to be rooted in, his first extended meditation on ultimate questions.
In these essays, Camus sets two attitudes in opposition. The first is what he regards as religion-based fears. He cites religious warnings about pride, concern for one's immortal soul, hope for an afterlife, resignation about the present and preoccupation with God. Against this conventional Christian perspective Camus asserts what he regards as self-evident facts: that we must die and there is nothing beyond this life. Without mentioning it, Camus draws a conclusion from these facts, namely that the soul is not immortal. Here, as elsewhere in his philosophical writing, he commends to his readers to face a discomforting reality squarely and without flinching, but he does not feel compelled to present reasons or evidence. If not with religion, where then does wisdom lie? His answer is: with the “conscious certainty of a death without hope” and in refusing to hide from the fact that we are going to die. For Camus “there is no superhuman happiness, no eternity outside of the curve of the days…. I can see no point in the happiness of angels” (N, 90). There is nothing but this world, this life, the immediacy of the present.
Camus is sometimes mistakenly called a “pagan” because he rejects Christianity as based on a hope for a life beyond this life. Hope is the error Camus wishes to avoid. Rejecting “the delusions of hope” (N, 74), Nuptials contains an evocation of an alternative. Camus relies for this line of thought on Nietzsche's discussion of Pandora's Box in Human, All Too Human: all the evils of humankind, including plagues and disease, have been let loose on the world by Zeus, but the remaining evil, hope, is kept hidden away in the box and treasured. But why, we may ask, is hope an evil? Nietzsche explains that humans have come to see hope as their greatest good, while Zeus, knowing better, has meant it as the greatest source of trouble. It is, after all, the reason why humans let themselves be tormented—because they anticipate an ultimate reward (Nietzsche 1878/1996, 58). For Camus, following this reading of Nietzsche closely, the conventional solution is in fact the problem: hope is disastrous for humans inasmuch as it leads them to minimize the value of this life except as preparation for a life beyond.
If religious hope is based on the mistaken belief that death, in the sense of utter and total extinction body and soul, is not inevitable, it leads us down a blind alley. Worse, because it teaches us to look away from life toward something to come afterwards, such religious hope kills a part of us, for example, the realistic attitude we need to confront the vicissitudes of life. But what then is the appropriate path? The young Camus is neither a skeptic nor a relativist here. His discussion rests on the self-evidence of sensuous experience. He advocates precisely what he takes Christianity to abjure: living a life of the senses, intensely, here and now, in the present. This entails, first, abandoning all hope for an afterlife, indeed rejecting thinking about it. “I do not want to believe that death is the gateway to another life. For me it is a closed door” (N, 76).
We might think that facing our total annihilation would be bitter, but for Camus this leads us in a positive direction: “Between this sky and the faces turned toward it there is nothing on which to hang a mythology, a literature, an ethic, or a religion—only stones, flesh, stars, and those truths the hand can touch” (N, 90). This insight entails obstinately refusing “all the ‘later on’s of this world,” in order to lay claim to “my present wealth” (N, 103), namely the intense here-and-now life of the senses. The “wealth” is precisely what hope cheats us out of by teaching us to look away from it and towards an afterlife. Only by yielding to the fact that our “longing to endure” will be frustrated and accepting our “awareness of death” are we able to open ourselves to the riches of life, which are physical above all.
Camus puts both sides of his argument into a single statement: “The world is beautiful, and outside there is no salvation” (N, 103). Only in accepting death and in being “stripped of all hope” does one most intensely appreciate not only the physical side of life, but also, he now suggests, its affective and interpersonal side. Taken together, and contrary to an unverifiable faith in God and afterlife, these are what one has and one knows: “To feel one's ties to a land, one's love for certain men, to know there is always a place where the heart can find rest—these are already many certainties for one man's life” (N, 90).
Only if we accept that Nietzsche is right, that God is dead and there is only nothingness after we die, will we then fully experience—feel, taste, touch, see, and smell—the joys of our bodies and the physical world. Thus the sensuous and lyrical side of these essays, their evocative character, is central to the argument. Or rather, because Camus is promoting intense, joyous, physical experience as opposed to a self-abnegating religious life, rather than developing an argument he asserts that these experiences are the right response. His writing aims to demonstrate what life means and feels like once we give up hope of an afterlife, so that in reading we will be led to “see” his point. These essays may be taken as containing highly personal thoughts, a young man's musings about his Mediterranean environment, and they scarcely seem to have any system. But they suggest what philosophy is for Camus and how he conceives its relationship to literary expression.
His early philosophy, then, may be conveyed, if not summed up, in this passage from “Nuptials at Tipasa”:
In a moment, when I throw myself down among the absinthe plants to bring their scent into my body, I shall know, appearances to the contrary, that I am fulfilling a truth which is the sun's and which will also be my death's. In a sense, it is indeed my life that I am staking here, a life that tastes of warm stone, that is full of the signs of the sea and the rising song of the crickets. The breeze is cool and the sky blue. I love this life with abandon and wish to speak of it boldly: it makes me proud of my human condition. Yet people have often told me: there's nothing to be proud of. Yes, there is: this sun, this sea, my heart leaping with youth, the salt taste of my body and this vast landscape in which tenderness and glory merge in blue and yellow. It is to conquer this that I need my strength and my resources. Everything here leaves me intact, I surrender nothing of myself, and don no mask: learning patiently and arduously how to live is enough for me, well worth all their arts of living. (N, 69)
The intense and glistening present tells us that we can fully experience and appreciate life only on the condition that we no longer try to avoid our ultimate and absolute death.
“There is only one really serious philosophical problem,” Camus says, “and that is suicide. Deciding whether or not life is worth living is to answer the fundamental question in philosophy. All other questions follow from that” (MS, 3). One might object that suicide is neither a “problem” nor a “question,” but an act. A proper, philosophical question might rather be: “Under what conditions is suicide warranted?” And a philosophical answer might explore the question, “What does it mean to ask whether life is worth living?” as William James did in The Will to Believe. For the Camus of The Myth of Sisyphus, however, “Should I kill myself?” is the essential philosophical question. For him, it seems clear that the primary result of philosophy is action, not comprehension. His concern about “the most urgent of questions” is less a theoretical one than it is the life-and-death problem of whether and how to live.
Camus sees this question of suicide as a natural response to an underlying premise, namely that life is absurd in a variety of ways. As we have seen, both the presence and absence of life (i.e., death) give rise to the condition: it is absurd to continually seek meaning in life when there is none, and it is absurd to hope for some form of continued existence after death given that the latter results in our extinction. But Camus also thinks it absurd to try to know, understand, or explain the world, for he sees the attempt to gain rational knowledge as futile. Here Camus pits himself against science and philosophy, dismissing the claims of all forms of rational analysis: “That universal reason, practical or ethical, that determinism, those categories that explain everything are enough to make a decent man laugh” (MS, 21).
These kinds of absurdity are driving Camus's question about suicide, but his way of proceeding evokes another kind of absurdity, one less well-defined, namely, the “absurd sensibility” (MS, 2, tr. changed). This sensibility, vaguely described, seems to be “an intellectual malady” (MS, 2) rather than a philosophy. He regards thinking about it as “provisional” and insists that the mood of absurdity, so “widespread in our age” does not arise from, but lies prior to, philosophy. Camus's diagnosis of the essential human problem rests on a series of “truisms” (MS, 18) and “obvious themes” (MS, 16). But he doesn't argue for life's absurdity or attempt to explain it—he is not interested in either project, nor would such projects engage his strength as a thinker. “I am interested … not so much in absurd discoveries as in their consequences” (MS, 16). Accepting absurdity as the mood of the times, he asks above all whether and how to live in the face of it. “Does the absurd dictate death” (MS, 9)? But he does not argue this question either, and rather chooses to demonstrate the attitude towards life that would deter suicide. In other words, the main concern of the book is to sketch ways of living our lives so as to make them worth living despite their being meaningless.
According to Camus, people commit suicide “because they judge life is not worth living” (MS, 4). But if this temptation precedes what is usually considered philosophical reasoning, how to answer it? In order to get to the bottom of things while avoiding arguing for the truth of his statements, he depicts, enumerates, and illustrates. As he says in The Rebel, “the absurd is an experience that must be lived through, a point of departure, the equivalent, in existence, of Descartes's methodical doubt” (R, 4). The Myth of Sisyphus seeks to describe “the elusive feeling of absurdity” in our lives, rapidly pointing out themes that “run through all literatures and all philosophies” (MS, 12). Appealing to common experience, he tries to render the flavor of the absurd with images, metaphors, and anecdotes that capture the experiential level he regards as lying prior to philosophy.
He begins doing so with an implicit reference to Sartre's novel, Nausea, which echoes the protagonist Antoine Roquentin's discovery of absurdity. Camus had earlier written that this novel's theories of absurdity and its images are not in balance. The descriptive and the philosophical aspects of the novel “don't add up to a work of art: the passage from one to the other is too rapid, too unmotivated, to evoke in the reader the deep conviction that makes art of the novel” (Camus 1968, 200). But in this 1938 review Camus praises Sartre's descriptions of absurdity, the sense of anguish and nausea that arises as the ordinary structures imposed on existence collapse in Antoine Roquentin's life. As Camus now presents his own version of the experience, “the stage sets collapse. Rising, streetcar, four hours in the office or the factory, meal, streetcar, four hours of work, meal, sleep, and Monday Tuesday Wednesday Thursday Friday Saturday and Sunday according to the same rhythm …” (MS, 12–3). As this continues, one slowly becomes fully conscious and senses the absurd.
Camus goes on to sketch other experiences of absurdity, until he arrives at death. But although Camus seeks to avoid arguing for the truth of his claims, he nevertheless concludes this “absurd reasoning” with a series of categorical assertions addressed to “the intelligence” about the inevitable frustration of the human desire to know the world and to be at home in it. Despite his intentions, Camus cannot avoid asserting what he believes to be an objective truth: “We must despair of ever reconstructing the familiar, calm surface which would give us peace of heart” (MS, 18). Turning to experiences that are seemingly obvious to large numbers of people who share the absurd sensibility, he declares sweepingly: “This world in itself is not reasonable, that is all that can be said” (MS, 21). Our efforts to know are driven by a nostalgia for unity, and there is an inescapable “hiatus between what we fancy we know and what we really know” (MS, 18).
“With the exception of professional rationalists, people today despair of true knowledge” (MS, 18). Camus asserts that the history of human thought is characterized by “its successive regrets and its impotences” (MS, 18), and that “the impossibility of knowledge is established” (MS, 25). When writing more carefully, he claims only to be describing a certain “climate,” but in any case his bedrock assumptions appear again and again: the world is unknowable and life is without meaning. Our efforts to understand them lead nowhere.
Avi Sagi suggests that in claiming this Camus is not speaking as an irrationalist—which is, after all, how he regards the existentialists—but as someone trying to rationally understand the limits of reason (Sagi 2002, 59–65). For Camus the problem is that by demanding meaning, order, and unity, we seek to go beyond those limits and pursue the impossible. We will never understand, and we will die despite all our efforts. There are two obvious responses to our frustrations: suicide and hope. By hope Camus means just what he described in Nuptials, the religion-inspired effort to imagine and live for a life beyond this life. Or, second, as taken up at length in The Rebel, bending one's energies to living for a great cause beyond oneself: “Hope of another life one must ‘deserve’ or trickery of those who live not for life itself but for some great idea that will transcend it, refine it, give it a meaning, and betray it” (MS, 8).
What is the Camusean alternative to suicide or hope? The answer is to live without escape and with integrity, in “revolt” and defiance, maintaining the tension intrinsic to human life. Since “the most obvious absurdity” (MS, 59) is death, Camus urges us to “die unreconciled and not of one's own free will” (MS, 55). In short, he recommends a life without consolation, but instead one characterized by lucidity and by acute consciousness of and rebellion against its mortality and its limits.
In his statement of the problem and its solution, Camus's tone, ideas, and style are reminiscent of Nietzsche. “God is dead” is of course their common starting point, as is the determination to confront unpleasant truths and write against received wisdom. At the same time Camus argues against the specific philosophical current with which Nietzsche is often linked as a precursor, and to which he himself is closest—existentialism. The Myth of Sisyphus is explicitly written against existentialists such as Shestov, Kierkegaard, Jaspers, and Heidegger, as well as against the phenomenology of Husserl. Camus shares their starting point, which he regards as the fact that they all somehow testify to the absurdity of the human condition. But he rejects what he sees as their ultimate escapism and irrationality, claiming that “they deify what crushes them and find reason to hope in what impoverishes them. That forced hope is religious in all of them” (MS, 24).
Sartre, too, is subject to Camus's criticisms—and not just politically as will be described in the following section. Although some of the ideas in The Myth of Sisyphus drew on Sartre's Nausea (as noted above), in 1942 Sartre was not yet regarded as an “existentialist”. But as Sartre's philosophy developed, he went on to explore how human activity constitutes a meaningful world from the brute, meaningless existence unveiled in his novel (Aronson 1980, 71–88). In the process, the absurdity of Nausea becomes the contingency of Being and Nothingness, the fact that humans and things are simply there with no explanation or reason. As Sartre described it, the absurd is “the universal contingency of being which is, but which is not the basis of its being; the absurd is the given, the unjustifiable, primordial quality of existence” (quoted in Sagi 2002, 57). Having rooted human existence in such contingency, Sartre goes on to describe other fundamental structures of existence, core human projects, and characteristic patterns of behavior, including freedom and bad faith, all of which arise on this basis. The original contingency leads to our desire to undo it, to the futile project to “found being,” in other words the “useless passion” of the project to become God.
For Sartre absurdity is obviously a fundamental ontological property of existence itself, frustrating us but not restricting our understanding. For Camus, on the other hand, absurdity is not a property of existence as such, but is an essential feature of our relationship with the world. It might be argued that Sartre and Camus are really quite similar, and that the core futility of Sartre's philosophy parallels the “despair” Camus describes. After all, if Sisyphus's labor is ultimately futile, so is the project to become God. But Sartre rejects the “classical pessimism” and “disillusionment” he finds in Camus and instead possesses an unCamusean confidence in his ability to understand and explain this project and the rest of the human world. Camus, on the contrary, builds an entire worldview on his central assumption that absurdity is an unsurpassable relationship between humans and their world. He postulates an inevitable divorce between human consciousness, with its “wild longing for clarity” (MS, 21) and the “unreasonable silence of the world” (MS, 28). As discussed above, Camus views the world as irrational, which means that it is not understandable through reason.
According to Camus, each existentialist writer betrayed his initial insight by seeking to appeal to something beyond the limits of the human condition, by turning to the transcendent. And yet even if we avoid what Camus describes as such escapist efforts and continue to live without irrational appeals, the desire to do so is built into our consciousness and thus our humanity. We are unable to free ourselves from “this desire for unity, this longing to solve, this need for clarity and cohesion” (MS, 51). But it is urgent to not succumb to these impulses and to instead accept absurdity. In contrast with existentialism, “The absurd is lucid reason noting its limits” (MS, 49).
Camus clearly believes that the existentialist philosophers are mistaken but does not argue against them, because he believes that “there is no truth but merely truths” (MS, 43). His disagreement rather takes the subtler and less assertive form of an immanent critique, pointing out that each thinker's existentialist philosophy ends up being inconsistent with its own starting point: “starting from a philosophy of the world's lack of meaning, it ends up by finding a meaning and depth in it” (MS, 42). These philosophers, he insists, refuse to accept the conclusions that follow from their own premises. Kierkegaard, for example, strongly senses the absurd. But rather than respecting it as the inevitable human ailment, he seeks to be cured of it by making it an attribute of a God who he then embraces.
Camus's most sustained analysis is of Husserl's phenomenology. Along with Sartre, Camus praises the early Husserlian notion of intentionality. Sartre saw this notion as revealing a dynamic consciousness without contents—the basis for his conception of freedom—while Camus is pleased that intentionality follows the absurd spirit in its “apparent modesty of thought that limits itself to describing what it declines to explain” (MS, 43). However, Camus criticizes Husserl's later search in Ideas for Platonic extra-temporal essences as a quasi-religious leap inconsistent with his original insight.
How then to remain consistent with absurd reasoning and avoid falling victim to the “spirit of nostalgia”? The Myth of Sisyphus finds the answer by abandoning the terrain of philosophy altogether. Camus describes a number of absurdist fictional characters and activities, including Don Juan and Dostoevsky's Kirolov (The Possessed), theater, and literary creation. And then he concludes with the story of Sisyphus, who fully incarnates a sense of life's absurdity, its “futility and hopeless labor” (MS, 119). Camus sees Sisyphus's endless effort and intense consciousness of futility as a triumph. “His scorn of the gods, his hatred of death, and his passion for life won him that unspeakable penalty in which the whole being is exerted toward accomplishing nothing” (MS, 120). After the dense and highly self-conscious earlier chapters, these pages condense the entire line of thought into a vivid image. Sisyphus demonstrates that we can live with “the certainty of a crushing fate, without the resignation that ought to accompany it” (MS, 54). For Camus, Sisyphus reminds us that we cannot help seeking to understand the reality that transcends our intelligence, striving to grasp more than our limited and practical scientific understanding allows, and wishing to live without dying. Like Sisyphus, we are our fate, and our frustration is our very life: we can never escape it.
But there is more. After the rock comes tumbling down, confirming the ultimate futility of his project, Sisyphus trudges after it once again. This “is the hour of consciousness. At each of those moments when he leaves the heights and gradually sinks towards the lairs of the gods, he is superior to his fate. He is stronger than his rock” (MS, 121). Why use the words “superior” and “stronger” when he has no hope of succeeding the next time? Paradoxically, it is because a sense of tragedy “crowns his victory.” “Sisyphus, proletarian of the gods, powerless and rebellious, knows the whole extent of his wretched condition: it is what he thinks of during his descent” (MS, 121). Tragic consciousness is the conclusion of “absurd reasoning”: living fully aware of the bitterness of our being and consciously facing our fate.
What then is Camus's reply to his question about whether or not to commit suicide? Full consciousness, avoiding false solutions such as religion, refusing to submit, and carrying on with vitality and intensity: these are Camus's answers. This is how a life without ultimate meaning can be made worth living. As he said in Nuptials, life's pleasures are inseparable from a keen awareness of these limits. Sisyphus accepts and embraces living with death without the possibility of appealing to God. “All Sisyphus's silent joy is contained therein. His fate belongs to him. His rock is his thing” (MS, 123).
Lucidly living the human condition, Sisyphus “knows himself to be the master of his days.” By becoming conscious of it, Camus is saying, he takes ownership of it. In this sense Sisyphus reshapes his fate into a condition of “wholly human origin.” “Wholly” may be an exaggeration, because after all, death is “inevitable and despicable,” but by acknowledging this, Sisyphus consciously lives out what has been imposed on him, thus making it into his own end. In the same way, Meursault, protagonist of The Stranger, comes to consciousness in that book's second part after committing the inexplicable murder that ends the book's first part. He has lived his existence from one moment to the next and without much awareness, but at his trial and while awaiting execution he becomes like Sisyphus, fully conscious of himself and his terrible fate. He will die triumphant as the absurd man.
The Myth of Sisyphus is far from having a skeptical conclusion. In response to the lure of suicide, Camus counsels an intensely conscious and active non-resolution. Rejecting any hope of resolving the strain is also to reject despair. Indeed, it is possible, within and against these limits, to speak of happiness. “Happiness and the absurd are two sons of the same earth. They are inseparable” (MS, 122). It is not that discovering the absurd leads necessarily to happiness, but rather that acknowledging the absurd means also accepting human frailty, an awareness of our limitations, and the fact that we cannot help wishing to go beyond what is possible. These are all tokens of being fully alive. “The struggle itself toward the heights is enough to fill a man's heart. One must imagine Sisyphus happy” (MS, 123).
We can compare his conclusion with Pyrrho's skepticism and Descartes's methodical doubt. First of all, like Pyrrho, Camus has solved his pressing existential issue, namely, avoiding despair, by a kind of resolution entailed in accepting our mortality and ultimate ignorance. But there are two critical differences with Pyrrho: for Camus we never can abandon the desire to know, and realizing this leads to a quickening of our life-impulses. This last point was already contained in Nuptials, but here is expanded to link consciousness with happiness. For Camus, happiness includes living intensely and sensuously in the present coupled with Sisyphus's tragic, lucid, and defiant consciousness, his sense of limits, his bitterness, his determination to keep on, and his refusal of any form of consolation.
Obviously, Camus's sense of happiness is not a conventional one but Sagi argues it may place him closer to Aristotle than to any other thinker insofar as he is championing the full realization of human capacities (Sagi 2002, 79–80) Camus is also similar in this to Nietzsche, who called upon his readers to “say yes to life,” and live as completely as possible at every moment. Nietzsche's point was that to be wholly alive means being as aware of the negative as of the positive, feeling pain, not shunning any experience, and embracing life “even in its strangest and hardest problems” (Nietzsche 1888/1954, 562). But how is it possible that, by the end of The Myth of Sisyphus, Camus has moved from skepticism (about finding the truth) and nihilism (about whether life has meaning) to advocating an approach to life that is clearly judged to be better than others? How does he justify embracing a normative stance, affirming specific values? This contradiction reveals a certain sleight of hand, as the philosopher gives way to the artist. It is as an artist that Camus now makes his case for acceptance of tragedy, the consciousness of absurdity, and a life of sensuous vitality. He advocates this with the image of Sisyphus straining, fully alive, and happy.
At the beginning of The Rebel, Camus writes as a philosopher again, returning to the terrain of argument by explaining what absurdist reasoning entails. Its “final conclusion” is “the repudiation of suicide and the acceptance of the desperate encounter between human inquiry and the silence of the universe” (R, 6). Since to conclude otherwise would negate its very premises, absurdism must logically accept life as the one necessary good. “To say that life is absurd, consciousness must be alive” (R, 6, tr. changed). Living and eating “are themselves value judgments” (Camus 1968, 160). “To breathe is to judge” (R, 8). As in his criticism of the existentialists, Camus advocates a single standpoint from which to argue for objective validity, that of consistency. With such statements he has clearly abandoned skepticism.
At first blush, however, the book's subject seems to have more of a historical theme than a philosophical one. “The purpose of this essay is … to face the reality of the present, which is logical crime, and to examine meticulously the arguments by which it is justified; it is an attempt to understand the times in which we live. One might think that a period which, in a space of fifty years, uproots, enslaves, or kills seventy million human beings should be condemned out of hand. But its culpability must still be understood” (R, 3).
Scholars disagree over whether the shift to such questions represents an entirely new philosophy or is continuous with The Myth of Sisyphus. The issue is not resolved by the explanations that Camus gives for his shift in the first pages of The Rebel—which range from the example of the Sisyphean individual confronting absurdity to the mass murders of the middle third of the twentieth century. “The age of negation,” he says, once fostered a concern for suicide, but now in “the age of ideologies, we must examine our position in relation to murder” (R, 4). Have the “ages” changed in the less than ten years between the two books, or have Camus's interests changed? He may be right to say that whether murder has rational foundations is “the question implicit in the blood and strife of this century,” but in changing his focus from suicide to murder, it is also clear that Camus is changing his optic from the individual to our social belonging.
Camus had been a political activist beginning with his membership in the Algerian branch of the French Communist Party in the mid-1930s. He spoke of taking a new intellectual step beginning with his experience as a member of the Resistance living in France during the German occupation, which he expressed artistically by describing collective action against the evil threatening the community in his novel, The Plague. As Camus himself later said, “if there is an evolution from The Stranger to The Plague, it has gone in the direction of solidarity and participation” (Camus 1965, 758). This line of reflection culminated in Camus applying the philosophy of the absurd in new, social directions, and in answering new, historical questions. He tries to spell out the logic of this at the beginning of The Rebel.
If the absence of God is the key theme of Nuptials, and the inevitability of absurdity is the key theme of The Myth of Sisyphus, Camus incorporates both of these into The Rebel, but alongside them he now stresses revolt. The act of rebellion assumes the status of a primary datum of human experience, like the Cartesian cogito taken by Sartre as his point of departure. Camus first expressed this directly under the inspiration of his encounter with Being and Nothingness. But in calling it “revolt” he takes it in a direction sharply different than Sartre, who built from the cogito an “essay in phenomenological ontology.” Ignoring completely the ontological dimension, Camus is now concerned with immediate issues of human social experience. Revolt, to be sure, still includes the rebellion against absurdity that Camus described in The Myth of Sisyphus, and once again he will speak of rebelling against our own mortality and the universe's meaninglessness and incoherence. But The Rebel begins with the kind of revolt that rejects oppression and slavery, and protests against the world's injustice.
It is at first, like The Myth of Sisyphus, a single individual's rebellion, but now Camus stresses that revolt creates values, dignity, and solidarity. “I revolt, therefore we are” (R, 22) is his paradoxical statement. But how can an I lead to a we? How does “we are” follow from “I revolt”? How can the individual's experience of absurdity, and the rebellion against it, stem from, produce, imply, or entail the wider social sense of injustice and solidarity? The we in fact is the subject of The Rebel, although the title L'Homme revolté suggests that one's original motivation may be individual. Acting against oppression entails having recourse to social values, and at the same time joining with others in solidarity.
In The Rebel Camus takes the further step, which occupies most of the book, of developing his notion of metaphysical and historical rebellion in opposition to the concept of revolution. Applying his philosophical themes directly to politics in the years immediately after the Liberation of France in 1944, Camus had already concluded that the Marxists, and especially Communists, were guilty of evading life's absurdity by aiming at a wholesale transformation of society, which must necessarily be violent. And now, in The Rebel, he describes this as a major trend of modern history, using similar terms to those he had used in The Myth of Sisyphus to describe the religious and philosophical evasions.
What sort of work is this? In a book so charged with political meaning, Camus makes no explicitly political arguments or revelations, and presents little in the way of actual social analysis or concrete historical study. The Rebel is, rather, a historically framed philosophical essay about underlying ideas and attitudes of civilization. David Sprintzen suggests these taken-for-granted attitudes operate implicitly and in the background of human projects and very rarely become conscious (Sprintzen 1988, 123).
Camus felt that it was urgent to critically examine these attitudes in a world in which calculated murder had become common. Applying his absurdist ideas and insights to politics, in The Rebel Camus explains what he regards as the modern world's increasingly organized and catastrophic refusal to face, accept, and live with absurdity. The book provides a unique perspective—presenting a coherent and original structure of premise, mood, description, philosophy, history, and even prejudice.
Camus insisted that both Communism's appeal and its negative features sprang from the same irrepressible human impulse: faced with absurdity and injustice, humans refuse to accept their existence and instead seek to remake the world. Validating revolt as a necessary starting point, Camus criticizes politics aimed at building a utopian future, affirming once more that life should be lived in the present and in the sensuous world. He explores the history of post-religious and nihilistic intellectual and literary movements; he attacks political violence with his views on limits and solidarity; and he ends by articulating the metaphysical role of art as well as a self-limiting radical politics. In place of striving to transform the world, he speaks of mésure—“measure”, in the sense of proportion or harmony—and of living in the tension of the human condition. He labels this outlook “Mediterranean” in an attempt to anchor his views to the place he grew up and to evoke in his readers its sense of harmony and appreciation of physical life. There is no substantive argument for the label, nor is one possible given his method of simply selecting who and what counts as representative of the “Mediterranean” view while excluding others—e.g., some Greek writers, not many Romans. In place of argument, he paints a concluding vision of Mediterranean harmony that he hopes will be stirring and lyrical, binding the reader to his insights.
As a political tract The Rebel asserts that Communism leads inexorably to murder, and then explains how revolutions arise from certain ideas and states of spirit. But he makes no close analysis of movements or events, gives no role to material needs or oppression, and regards the quest for social justice as a metaphysically inspired attempt to replace “the reign of grace by the reign of justice” (R, 56). After his initial general discussion of rebellion against slavery and oppression, in the historical and largest section of the book he treats actual historical assertions of human dignity as little more than efforts to overthrow God.
Furthermore, Camus insists that these attitudes are built into Marxism. In a series of newspaper articles in 1946 entitled “Neither Victims nor Executioners” he declared himself a socialist but not a Marxist. He rejected the Marxist acceptance of violent revolution and the consequentialist maxim that “the end justifies the means.” “In the Marxian perspective,” he wrote sweepingly, “a hundred thousand deaths is a small price to pay for the happiness of hundreds of millions” (Camus 1991, 130). Marxists think this, Camus asserted, because they believe that history has a necessary logic leading to human happiness, and thus they accept violence as legitimate.
In The Rebel Camus takes this assertion a further step: Marxism is not primarily about social change but is rather a revolt that “attempts to annex all creation.” Revolution emerges when revolt seeks to ignore the limits built into human life. By an “inevitable logic of nihilism” Communism climaxes the modern trend to deify man and to transform and unify the world. Today's revolutions yield to the blind impulse, originally described in The Myth of Sisyphus, “to demand order in the midst of chaos, and unity in the very heart of the ephemeral” (MS, 10). As does the rebel who becomes a revolutionary who kills and then justifies murder as legitimate.
According to Camus, the execution of King Louis XVI during the French Revolution was the decisive step demonstrating the pursuit of justice without regard to limits. It contradicted the original life-affirming, self-affirming, and unifying purpose of revolt. This discussion belongs to Camus's “history of European pride,” which is prefaced by certain ideas from the Greeks and certain aspects of early Christianity, but begins in earnest with the advent of modernity. Camus focuses on a variety of major figures, movements, and literary works: the Marquis de Sade, romanticism, dandyism, The Brothers Karamazov, Hegel, Marx, Nietzsche, surrealism, the Nazis, and above all the Bolsheviks. Camus describes revolt as increasing its force over time and turning into an ever more desperate nihilism, overthrowing God and putting man in his place, wielding power more and more brutally. Historical revolt, rooted in metaphysical revolt, leads to revolutions seeking to eliminate absurdity by using murder as their central tool to take total control over the world. Communism is the contemporary expression of this Western sickness.
In the twentieth century, Camus claims, murder has become “reasonable,” “theoretically defensible,” and justified by doctrine. People have grown accustomed to “logical crimes”—that is, mass death either planned or foreseen, and rationally justified. Thus Camus calls “logical crime” the central issue of the time, seeks to “examine meticulously the arguments by which it is justified” (R, 3), and sets out to explore how the twentieth century became a century of slaughter.
We might justly expect an analysis of the arguments he speaks of, but The Rebel changes focus. Human reason is confused by “slave camps under the flag of freedom, massacres justified by philanthropy or by a taste for the superhuman” (R, 4) —the first two refer to Communism, the third to Nazism. In the body of the text, Nazism virtually drops out (it was, he says, a system of “irrational terror”—not at all what interested Camus), sharply narrowing the inquiry. His shift is revealed by his question: How can murder be committed with premeditation and be justified by philosophy? It turns out that the “rational murder” Camus was concerned with is not committed by capitalists or democrats, colonialists or imperialists, or by Nazis—but only by Communists.
He does not address the Holocaust, and although his had been a voice of protest against Hiroshima in the summer of 1945, he does not now ask how it happened. As a journalist he had been one of the few to indict French colonialism, but he does not mention it, except in a footnote. How was it possible for Camus to focus solely on the violence of Communism in the very midst of the French colonial war in Vietnam, and when he knew that a bitter struggle over Algeria lay ahead? It seems he became blinded by ideology, separating Communism from the other evils of the century and directing his animus there. Camus's ideas, of course, had developed and matured over the years since he first began writing about revolt. But something else had happened: his agenda had changed. Absurdity and revolt, his original themes, had been harnessed as an alternative to Communism, which had become the archenemy. The philosophy of revolt became Cold-War ideology.
Because The Rebel claimed to describe the attitude that lay behind the evil features of contemporary revolutionary politics, it became a major political event. Readers could hardly miss his description of how the impulse for emancipation turned into organized, rational murder as the rebel-become-revolutionary attempted to order an absurd universe. In presenting this message, Camus sought not so much to critique Stalinism as its apologists. His specific targets were intellectuals attracted to Communism—as he himself had been in the 1930s.
One of these targets was Jean-Paul Sartre, and toward the end of The Rebel Camus now took aim at his friend's politics. Camus focuses on “the cult of history” against which the entire book is directed and his belief that “the existentialists,” led by Sartre, had fallen victim to the idea that revolt should lead to revolution. Within Camus's framework, Sartre is challenged as trying, like the predecessors criticized in The Myth of Sisyphus, to escape the absurdity with which his own thinking began by turning to Marxism. This is a bit of a stretch because Sartre was still several years from declaring himself a Marxist, and it shows Camus's tendency towards sweeping generalization rather than close analysis. But it also reflects his capacity for interpreting a specific disagreement in the broadest possible terms—as a fundamental conflict of philosophies.
The text of The Rebel is punctuated with emphatic words of conclusion (alors, donc, ainsi, c'est pourquoi), which are rarely followed by consequences of what comes before and often introduce further assertions, without any evidence or analysis. And it is studded with carefully composed topic sentences for major ideas—which one expects to be followed by paragraphs, pages, and chapters of development but, instead, merely follow one another and sit undeveloped until the next equally well-wrought topic sentence. This is especially so in the book's final three chapters, which appear to be drawing conclusions from earlier discussions but time and again launch new themes. Still, despite its many weaknesses, the book remains an original and probing effort to understand how the great modern impulse to freedom went awry. And it shows the interpretative power of Camus's basic themes. The Rebel continues to attract readers today because of its critique of Western civilization, progress, and the modern world itself.
In The Rebel, a complex and sprawling essay in philosophy, the history of ideas and literary movements, political philosophy, and even aesthetics, Camus extends the ideas he asserted in Nuptials and developed in The Myth of Sisyphus: the human condition is inherently frustrating, but we betray ourselves and solicit catastrophe by seeking religious solutions to its limitations. “The rebel obstinately confronts a world condemned to death and the impenetrable obscurity of the human condition with his demand for life and absolute clarity. He is seeking, without knowing it, a moral philosophy or a religion” (R, 101). Our alternatives are to accept the fact that we are living in a Godless universe—or to become a revolutionary, who, like the religious believer committed to the abstract triumph of justice in the future, refuses to live in the present.
Having critiqued religion in Nuptials, Camus is self-consciously exploring the starting points, projects, weaknesses, illusions, and political temptations of a post-religious universe. He describes how traditional religion has lost its force, and how younger generations have been growing up amid an increasing emptiness and a sense that anything is possible. He further claims that modern secularism stumbles into a nihilistic state of mind because it does not really free itself from religion. “Then the only kingdom that is opposed to the kingdom of grace must be founded—namely, the kingdom of justice—and the human community must be reunited among the debris of the fallen City of God. To kill God and to build a church are the constant and contradictory purpose of rebellion” (R, 103). Our modern need to create kingdoms and our continuing search for salvation is the path of catastrophe. This is the path of the metaphysical rebel, who does not see that “human insurrection, in its exalted and tragic forms, is only, and can only be, a prolonged protest against death” (R, 100).
Camus's work can be seen as a precursor to postmodernism. The postmodernists never wholly embraced Camus as their predecessor, no doubt because of his central metaphysical concern with absurdity and revolt, and his penchant for sweeping judgments and reductive analyses—which differentiates The Rebel from far less ambitious and more descriptive books like Adorno and Horkheimer's Dialectic of Enlightenment. But in many ways The Rebel was a model “genealogy” describing the appearance of intrinsic contradictions of the modern spirit, and Camus's vision of self-limiting revolt is a prescient articulation of a post-Marxist and postmodern leftist politics.
Camus remains relevant for having looked askance at Western civilization, at progress, and at the modern world, but at the heart of his analyses is his ambivalent exploration of what it is like to live in a Godless universe. “When the throne of God is overturned, the rebel realizes that it is now his own responsibility to create the justice, the order, and the unity that he sought in vain within his own condition, and in this way to justify the fall of God. Then begins the desperate effort to create, at the price of crime and murder if necessary, the dominion of man” (R, 25). But to restrain oneself from this effort is to feel bereft of justice, order, and unity. Camus recognizes that hope and the revolutionary drive are essential directions of the Western spirit, stemming from its entire world of culture, thought, and feeling.
This leads to one of the most interesting and perplexing aspects of Camus's thought: his determination to criticize attitudes that he finds to be natural and inevitable. The possibility of suicide haunts humans, as does the fact that we seek an impossible order and an unachievable permanence. Camus never directly attacks existentialist writers, but largely confines himself to describing their inability to remain consistent with their initial insight. Similarly, he is clear throughout The Rebel that the metaphysical need that leads to Communism's terror and Gulag is universal: he describes it and its consequences so that we can better resist it in ourselves as well as others. His reflexive anti-Communism notwithstanding, an underlying sympathy unites Camus to those he opposes, because he freely acknowledges that he and they share the same starting points, outlook, stresses, temptations, and pitfalls. Although in political argument he frequently took refuge in a tone of moral superiority, Camus makes clear through his skepticism that those he disagrees with are no less and no more than fellow creatures who give in to the same fundamental drive to escape the absurdity that we all share.
This sense of moral complexity is most eloquent in his short novel The Fall, whose single character, Clamence, has been variously identified as everyman, a Camus-character, and a Sartre-character. He was all of these. Clamence is clearly evil, guilty of standing by as a young woman commits suicide. In him Camus seeks to describe and indict his generation, including both his enemies and himself. Clamence's life is filled with good works, but he is a hypocrite and knows it. His monologue is filled with self-justification as well as the confession of someone torn apart by his guilt but unable to fully acknowledge it. Sitting at a bar in Amsterdam, he descends into his own personal hell, inviting the reader to follow him. In telling Clamence's story, Camus was clearly seeking to empathize as well as describe, to understand as well as condemn. Clamence is a monster, but Clamence is also just another human being.
Camus won the Nobel Prize for literature in 1957, after The Fall was published. The story, a literary masterpiece, demonstrates a unique capacity at the heart of his philosophical writing. Life is no one single, simple thing, but a series of tensions and dilemmas. The most seemingly straightforward features of life are in fact ambiguous and even contradictory. Camus recommends that we avoid trying to resolve them. We need to face the fact that we can never successfully purge ourselves of the impulses that threaten to wreak havoc with our lives. Camus's philosophy, if it has a single message, is that we should learn to tolerate, indeed embrace the frustration and ambivalence that humans cannot escape.
Collected Works in French
- Théâtre, Récits, Nouvelles, R. Quillot (ed.), Paris: Gallimard, 1962.
- Essais, R. Quillot and L. Fauçon (eds.), Paris: Gallimard, 1965.
- Œuvres Complètes, Vols. I–IV, R. Gay-Crosier (ed.) Paris: Gallimard, 2006–09.
Works in English
Reference marks are given for cited English translations.
- The Plague, New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1948.
- The Rebel: An Essay on Man in Revolt, New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1954 [R].
- The Myth of Sisyphus and Other Essays, New York: Alred A. Knopf, 1955 [MS].
- The Fall, New York: Alred A. Knopf, 1957.
- Caligula, and Three Other Plays, New York: Alred A. Knopf, 1958.
- Resistance, Rebellion, and Death, New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1961.
- “Nuptials at Tipasa”, in Lyrical and Critical Essays, 1968 [N].
- Lyrical and Critical Essays, New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1968.
- The Stranger, New York: Vintage, 1988.
- Between Hell and Reason, Hanover, NH: Wesleyan University Press, 1991 [Available online].
- “Christian Metaphysics and Neoplatonism”, in J. McBride, Albert Camus: Philosopher and Littérateur, New York: St. Martin's Press, 1992, pp. 93–16.
- Notebooks 1942–1951, New York: Marlowe, 1995.
- Notebooks 1935–1942, New York: Marlowe, 1996.
- Camus at Combat: Writing 1944–47, J. Lévi-Vatensi (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2006.
Camus and Sartre
- Sartre, J.P., “Camus's The Outsider,” in Literary and Philosophical Essays, New York: Collier Books, 1962.
- Sprintzen, D.A., and A. van den Hoven (eds.), Sartre and Camus: A Historic Confrontation, Amherst, NY: Humanity Books, 2004.
- Aronson, R., 1980, Jean-Paul Sartre: Philosophy in the World, London: Verso.
- –––, 2004, Camus and Sartre: The Story of a Friendship and the Quarrel That Ended It, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
- Foley, J., 2008, Albert Camus: From the Absurd to Revolt, Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press.
- Hanna, T., 1958, The Thought and Art of Albert Camus, Chicago: H. Regnery Co.
- Hughes, E. J. (ed.), 2007, The Cambridge Companion to Camus, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Isaac, J.C., 1992, Arendt, Camus and Modern Rebellion, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- James, W., 1896, “Is Life Worth Living?” The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, New York: Longmans, Green, and Co. [Reprint available online]
- Jeanson, F., 1947, “Albert Camus ou le mensonge de l'absurdité,” Revue Dominicaine no. 53.
- Lazere, D., 1973, The Unique Creation of Albert Camus, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Lottman, H. R., 1997, Albert Camus: A Biography, Corte Madera, CA: Ginko.
- Mélançon, M., 1976, Albert Camus: Analyse de sa Penseé, Fribourg: Éditions universitaires.
- McBride, J., 1992, Albert Camus: Philosopher and Littérateur, New York: St. Martin's Press.
- McCarthy, P., 1982, Camus, New York: Random House.
- Nietzsche, F. W., 1878/1996, Human, All Too Human: A Book for Free Spirits, M. Faber and S. Lehmann, (trans.). Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press.
- –––, 1888/1968, “Twilight of the Idols”, in W. Kaufmann (trans.), The Portable Nietzsche, pp. 463–563, Harmondsworth: Penguin Books.
- O'Brien, C. C., 1970, Albert Camus of Europe and Africa, New York: Viking.
- Plutarch, Moralia, Vol. II, F. C. Babbitt (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- Rizzuto, A., 1981, Camus's Imperial Vision, Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press.
- Sagi, A., 2002, Albert Camus and the Philosophy of the Absurd, Amsterdam: Editions Rodopi B.V.
- Sprintzen, D., 1988, Camus: A Critical Examination, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
- Thody, P., 1973, Albert Camus 1913–60, London: Hamish Hamilton.
- Todd, O., 1997, Albert Camus: A Life, New York: Knopf.
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- The Camus Studies Association
- The Albert Camus Society of the UK
- Ovid, “Heroides”, trans. A. S. Kilne