First published Wed Sep 14, 2005; substantive revision Wed Feb 2, 2011

The causes and effects of corruption, and how to combat corruption, are issues that are increasingly on the national and international agendas of politicians and other policymakers. For example, the World Bank has relatively recently come around to the view that economic development is closely linked to corruption reduction (World Bank 1997) and there have been numerous anti-corruption initiatives in multiple jurisdictions (Heidenheimer and Johnston 2002; Preston and Sampford 2002). Moreover, the very recent Global Financial Crisis has revealed financial corruption, and spurred regulators to consider various anti-corruption measures by way of response. By contrast, the concept of corruption has not received much attention.[1] Existing conceptual work on corruption consists in little more than the presentation of brief definitions of corruption as a preliminary to extended accounts of the causes and effects of corruption and the ways to combat it.[2] Moreover, most of these definitions of corruption are unsatisfactory in fairly obvious ways.[3]

1. Varieties of Corruption

Consider one of the most popular of these definitions, namely, ‘Corruption is the abuse of power by a public official for private gain.’[4] No doubt the abuse of public offices for private gain is paradigmatic of corruption. But when a bettor bribes a boxer to ‘throw’ a fight this is corruption for private gain, but it need not involve any public office holder; the roles of boxer and bettor are usually not public offices.

One response to this is to distinguish public corruption from private corruption, and to argue that the above definition is a definition only of public corruption.[5] But if ordinary citizens lie when they give testimony in court, this is corruption; it is corruption of the criminal justice system. However, it does not involve abuse of a public office by a public official. And when police fabricate evidence out of a misplaced sense of justice, this is corruption of a public office, but not for private gain.

In the light of the failure of such analytical-style definitions it is tempting to try to sidestep the problem of providing a theoretical account of the concept of corruption by simply identifying corruption with specific legal and/or moral offences.

However, attempts to identify corruption with specific legal/moral offences are unlikely to succeed. Perhaps the most plausible candidate is bribery; bribery is regarded by some as the quintessential form of corruption (Noonan 1984 and Pritchard 1998). But what of nepotism? Surely it is also a paradigmatic form of corruption, and one that is conceptually distinct from bribery. The person who accepts a bribe is understood as being required to provide a benefit to the briber, otherwise it is not a bribe; but the person who is the beneficiary of an act of nepotism is not necessarily understood as being required to return the favour.

In fact, corruption is exemplified by a very wide and diverse array of phenomena of which bribery is only one kind, and nepotism another. Paradigm cases of corruption include the following. The commissioner of taxation channels public monies into his personal bank account, thereby corrupting the public financial system. A political party secures a majority vote by arranging for ballot boxes to be stuffed with false voting papers, thereby corrupting the electoral process. A police officer fabricates evidence in order to secure convictions, thereby corrupting the judicial process. A number of doctors close ranks and refuse to testify against a colleague who they know has been negligent in relation to an unsuccessful surgical operation leading to loss of life; institutional accountability procedures are thereby undermined. A sports trainer provides the athletes he trains with banned substances in order to enhance their performance, thereby subverting the institutional rules laid down to ensure fair competition. It is self-evident that none of these corrupt actions are instances of bribery.

Further, it is far from obvious that the way forward at this point is simply to add a few additional offences to the initial ‘list’ consisting of the single offence of bribery. Candidates for being added to the list of offences would include nepotism,[6] police fabricating evidence, cheating in sport by using drugs, fraudulent use of travel funds by politicians, and so on. However, there is bound to be disagreement in relation to any such list. For example, law enforcement practitioners often distinguish between fraud on the one hand, and corruption on the other.[7] Most important, any such list needs to be justified by recourse to some principle or principles. Ultimately, naming a set of offences that might be regarded as instances of corruption does not obviate the need for a theoretical, or quasi-theoretical, account of the concept of corruption.

As it happens, there is at least one further salient strategy for demarcating the boundaries of corrupt acts. Implicit in much of the literature on corruption is the view that corruption is essentially a legal offence, and essentially a legal offence in the economic sphere.[8] Accordingly, one could seek to identify corruption with economic crimes, such as bribery, fraud, and insider trading. To some extent this kind of view reflects the dominance of economically focused material in the corpus of academic literature on corruption. It also reflects the preponderance of proposed economic solutions to the problem of corruption. After all, if corruption is essentially an economic phenomenon, is it not plausible that the remedies for corruption will be economic ones?[9]

But many acts of corruption are not unlawful. That paradigm of corruption, bribery, is a case in point. Prior to 1977 it was not unlawful for US companies to offer bribes to secure foreign contracts; indeed, elsewhere such bribery was not unlawful until much later.[10] So corruption is not necessarily unlawful. This is because corruption is not at bottom simply a matter of law; rather it is fundamentally a matter of morality.

Secondly, corruption is not necessarily economic in character. An academic who plagiarises the work of others is not committing an economic crime or misdemeanour; and she might be committing plagiarism simply in order to increase her academic status. There might not be any financial benefit sought or gained. Academics are more strongly motivated by status, rather than by wealth. A police officer who fabricates evidence against a person he believes to be guilty of paedophilia is not committing an economic crime; and he might do so because he believes the accused to be guilty, and does not want him to go unpunished. Economics is not necessarily involved as an element of the officer's crime or as a motivation. When police do wrong they are often motivated by a misplaced sense of justice, rather than by financial reward. Again, a person in authority motivated by sadistic pleasure who abuses her power by meting out cruel and unjust treatment to those subject to her authority, is not engaging in an economic crime; and she is not motivated by economic considerations. Many of those who occupy positions of authority are motivated by a desire to exercise power for its own sake, rather than by a desire for financial reward.

Economic corruption is an important form of corruption; however, it is not the only form of corruption. There are non-economic forms of corruption, including many types of police corruption, judicial corruption, political corruption, academic corruption, and so on. Indeed, there are at least as many forms of corruption as there are human institutions that might become corrupted. Further, economic gain is not the only motivation for corruption. There are a variety of different kinds of attractions that motivate corruption. These include status, power, addiction to drugs or gambling, and sexual gratification, as well as economic gain.

We can conclude that the various currently influential definitions of corruption, and the recent attempts to circumscribe corruption by listing paradigmatic offences, have failed. They failed in large part because the class of corrupt actions comprises an extremely diverse array of types of moral and legal offences.

That said, some progress has been made. At the very least, we have identified corruption as fundamentally a moral, as opposed to legal, phenomenon. Acts can be corrupt even though they are, and even ought to be, legal. Moreover, it is evident that not all acts of immorality are acts of corruption; corruption is only one species of immorality. Consider an otherwise gentle husband who in a fit of anger strikes his adulterous wife and accidentally kills her. The husband has committed an act that is morally wrong; he has committed murder, or perhaps culpable homicide, or at least manslaughter. But his action is not necessarily an act of corruption. Obviously the person who is killed (the wife) is not corrupted in the process of being killed. Moreover, the act of killing does not necessarily corrupt the perpetrator (the husband). Perhaps the person who commits a wrongful killing (the husband) does so just once and in mitigating circumstances, and also suffers remorse. Revulsion at his act of killing might cause such a person to embark thereafter on a life of moral rectitude. If so, the person has not been corrupted as a result of his wrongful act.[11]

An important distinction in this regard, is the distinction between human rights violations and corruption. Genocide is a profound moral wrong; but it is not corruption. This is not to say that there is not an important relationship between human rights violations and corruption; on the contrary, there is often a close and mutually reinforcing nexus between them (Pearson 2001). Consider the endemic corruption and large-scale human rights abuse that have taken place in authoritarian regimes, such as that of Idi Amin in Uganda and that of Suharto in Indonesia. And there is increasing empirical evidence of an admittedly complex causal connection between corruption and the infringement of subsistence rights; there is evidence, that is, of a causal relation between corruption and poverty. Indeed, some human rights violations are also acts of corruption. For example, wrongfully and unlawfully incarcerating one's political opponent is a human rights violation; but it is also corrupting the political and judicial processes.

Thus far, examples of different types of corrupt action have been presented, and corrupt actions have been distinguished from some other types of immoral action. However, the class of corrupt actions has not been adequately demarcated within the more general class of immoral actions. To do so, a definition of corrupt actions is needed, specifically for actions of corrupt institutions (Miller 2010). To this task we now turn.

2. Institutional Corruption

We begin with five hypotheses concerning institutional corruption before providing a summary of the concept.

2.1 Five Hypotheses Concerning the Concept of Institutional Corruption

First Hypothesis: The Personal Character of Corruption

Persons are relevantly involved in all corruption, and in institutional corruption in particular.

Let us assume that there are at least two general forms of corruption, namely institutional corruption and non-institutional personal corruption.[12] Non-institutional personal corruption is corruption of persons outside institutional settings. Such corruption pertains to the moral character of persons, and consists in the despoiling of their moral character. If an action has a corrupting effect on a person's character, it will typically be corrosive of one or more of a person's virtues. These virtues might be virtues that attach to the person qua human being, e.g. the virtues of compassion and fairness in one's dealings with other human beings. Alternatively — or in some cases, additionally — these virtues might attach to persons qua occupants of specific institutional roles, e.g. impartiality in a judge or objectivity in a journalist.

Our concern here is only with institutional corruption. Nevertheless, it is plausible that corruption in general, including institutional corruption, typically involves the despoiling of the moral character of persons and in particular, in the case of institutional corruption, the despoiling of the moral character of institutional role occupants qua institutional role occupants. To this extent institutional corruption involves personal corruption.

Note that personal corruption, i.e., being corrupted, is not the same thing as performing a corrupt action, i.e., being a corruptor. Typically, corruptors are corrupted, but this is not necessarily the case. Note also that corruptors are not simply persons who perform actions that corrupt, they are also morally responsible for this corruption. (As we shall see, there is one important category of corruptors which is an exception to this, namely corruptors who are not morally responsible for being corrupted, yet whose actions are both an expression of their corrupt characters and also have a corrupting effect.) The precise nature of corruptors and their relationship to the corrupted is discussed in more detail below.

Note also in relation to personal corruption that there is a distinction to be made between possession of a virtue and possession of a disposition to behave in certain ways. Virtues consist in part in dispositions, but are not wholly constituted by dispositions. A compassionate person, for example, is disposed to help people. But such a person also experiences certain emotional states, and understands other people in a certain light; compassion involves non-dispositional states. Moreover, a compassionate person has actually performed compassionate acts; he or she is not simply disposed to do so. Accordingly, while personal corruption may consist in part in the development or suppression of certain dispositions, e.g., in developing the disposition to accept bribes or in suppressing the disposition to refuse them, the development or suppression of such dispositions would not normally constitute the corruption of persons. Thus a person who has a disposition to accept bribes but who is never offered any is not corrupt, except perhaps in an attenuated sense.

Naturally, in the case of institutional corruption typically greater institutional damage is being done than simply the despoiling of the moral character of the institutional role occupants. Specifically, institutional processes are being undermined, and/or institutional purposes subverted.

However, the undermining of institutional processes and/or purposes is not a sufficient condition for institutional corruption. Acts of institutional damage that are not performed by a corruptor and also do not corrupt persons are better characterized as acts of institutional corrosion. Consider, for example, funding decisions that gradually reduce public monies allocated to the court system in some large jurisdiction. As a consequence, magistrates might be progressively less well trained and there might be fewer and fewer of them to deal with the gradually increasing workload of cases. This may well lead to a diminution over decades in the quality of the adjudications of these magistrates, and so the judicial processes are to an extent undermined. However, given the size of the jurisdiction and the incremental nature of these changes, neither the magistrates, nor anyone else, might be aware of this process of judicial corrosion, or even able to become aware of it (given heavy workloads, absence of statistical information, etc.). It seems that these judges have not undergone a process of personal corruption, and this is the reason we are disinclined to view this situation as one of institutional corruption.

One residual question here is whether or not institutional role corruption could exist in the absence of the undermining of institutional processes and/or institutional purposes. Perhaps it could not for the reason that an institutional role is defined in large part in terms of the institutional purposes that the role serves as well as the institutional processes in which the role occupant participates in the service of those institutional purposes. A possible counterexample might be that of a “sleeper”: an official who accepts regular pay from a foreign spy agency but has not and perhaps never will be asked for any reciprocal service. At any rate, the close relationship between institutional roles on the one hand, and institutional processes and purposes on the other, explains why institutional corruption typically involves both the despoiling of institutional role occupants qua institutional role occupants and the undermining of institutional processes and purposes.

Finally, we need to formulate the first hypothesis precisely. The hypothesis is that, to be corrupt, an action must involve a corruptor who performs the action or a person who is corrupted by it. Of course, corruptor and corrupted need not necessarily be the same person, and indeed there need not be both a corruptor and a corrupted; all that is required is that there be a corruptor or a corrupted person.

The first hypothesis expresses a necessary condition for an action being an instance of institutional corruption and, indeed, for its being an instance of corruption at all. This first hypothesis has turned out to be correct.

Second Hypothesis: The Causal Character of Corruption

If a serviceable definition of the concept of a corrupt action is to be found — and specifically, one that does not collapse into the more general notion of an immoral action — then attention needs to be focussed on the moral effects that some actions have on persons and institutions. An action is corrupt only if it corrupts something or someone — so corruption is not only a moral concept, but also a causal or quasi-causal concept.[13] That is, an action is corrupt by virtue of having a corrupting effect on a person's moral character or on an institutional process or purpose. If an action has a corrupting effect on an institution, undermining institutional processes or purposes, then typically — but not necessarily — it has a corrupting effect also on persons qua role occupants in the affected institutions.

In relation to the concept of institutional corruption, the second hypothesis states (as a necessary condition) that an action is corrupt only if it has the effect of undermining an institutional process or of subverting an institutional purpose or of despoiling the character of some role occupant qua role occupant. This hypothesis asserts the causal character of corruption.

In this regard, note that an infringement of a specific law or institutional rule does not in and of itself constitute an act of institutional corruption. In order to do so, any such infringement needs to have an institutional effect, e.g., to defeat the institutional purpose of the rule, to subvert the institutional process governed by the rule, or to contribute to the despoiling of the moral character of a role occupant qua role occupant. In short, we need to distinguish between the offence considered in itself and the institutional effect of committing that offence. Considered in itself the offence of, say, lying is an infringement of a law, rule, and/or a moral principle. However, the offence is only an act of institutional corruption if it has some effect, e.g., it is performed in a courtroom setting and thereby subverts the judicial process.[14]

A further point to be made here is that an act that has a corrupting effect might not be a moral offence considered in itself. For example, the provision of information by a corporate officer to an investor that will enable the investor to buy shares cheaply before they rise in value might not be a moral offence considered in itself; in general, providing information is an innocuous activity. However, in this corporate setting it might constitute insider trading, and do institutional damage; as such, it may well be an act of corruption.

A final point concerns the alleged responsibility for corruption of external non-institutional actors in contexts in which there are mediating internal institutional actors. In general, an act performed by an external non-institutional actor is not an act of institutional corruption if there is a mediating institutional actor who is fully responsible for the institutional harm. Consider an accountant who is besotted with a woman with expensive tastes. His obsession with the woman causes him to spend money on her that he does not have. Accordingly, he embezzles money from the company he works for. There is a causal chain of sorts from her expensive tastes to his act of embezzlement and the consequent institutional harm that his act in turn causes. However, she is not an institutional corruptor; rather he is. For he is fully responsible for his act of embezzlement, and it is this act — and this act alone — that constitutes an act of institutional corruption. It does so by virtue of the institutional harm that it does.

It might be argued that while she did not corrupt any institutional process or purpose, she nevertheless corrupted him qua role occupant, e.g., by undermining his disposition to act honestly. But she has done no such thing. Rather his disposition to act honestly has been undermined by himself, and specifically by his desire to please her coupled with his lack of commitment to the ethical and institutional requirements of his institutional role as an accountant.

Summing up, the second hypothesis states a necessary condition for an action being an instance of institutional corruption and, indeed, for its being an instance of corruption at all. This second hypothesis has turned out to be correct.

Third Hypothesis: The Moral Responsibility of Corruptors

The third hypothesis states that an action is corrupt only if the person who performs it either intends or foresees the harm that it will cause — or, at the very least, could and should have foreseen it. Let us say that this further necessary condition expresses the moral responsibility of corruptors.[15]

As noted above, there is one important exception to the moral responsibility of corruptors hypothesis. The exception is that sub-class of corruptors who are: (a) corrupt, but not morally responsible for being so, and; (b) whose actions are an expression of their corrupted characters and also have a corrupting effect.

We need to invoke our earlier distinction between acts of institutional corruption and acts of institutional corrosion. An act might undermine an institutional process or purpose without the person who performed it intending this effect, foreseeing this effect, or indeed even being in a position such that they could or should have foreseen this effect. Such an act may well be an act of corrosion, but it would not necessarily be an act of corruption. Consider our magistrates example involving a diminution over time in the quality of the adjudications of these magistrates. Neither the government and other officials responsible for resourcing and training the magistracy, nor the magistrates themselves, intend or foresee this institutional harm; indeed, perhaps no-one could reasonably have foreseen the harmful effects of these shortcomings in training and failure to respond to increased workloads. This is judicial corrosion, but not judicial corruption.[16]

Because persons who perform corrupt actions (corruptors) intend or foresee — or at least should have foreseen —the corrupting effect their actions would have, these persons typically are blameworthy, but not necessarily so. For there are cases in which someone knowingly performs a corrupt action but is, say, coerced into so doing, and is therefore not blameworthy. So on this view it is possible to perform an act of corruption, be morally responsible for performing it, and yet remain blameless.

Moreover, we earlier distinguished between two species of corruptor. There are those corruptors who are morally responsible for their corrupt actions. And there are those corruptors who are not responsible for their corrupt character, but whose actions are: (a) an expression of their corrupted character, and; (b) actions that have a corrupting effect.

Accordingly, we now have a threefold distinction in relation to corruptors: (1) corruptors who are morally responsible for their corrupt action and blameworthy; (2) corruptors who are morally responsible for their corrupt action and blameless; (3) corruptors who are not morally responsible for having a corrupt character, but whose actions are: (a) expressive of their corrupt character, and; (b) actions that have a corrupting effect. The existence of the third category of corruptors demonstrates that the third hypothesis is incorrect.

Fourth Hypothesis: The Asymmetry between Corruptors and Those Corrupted.

The fourth hypothesis concerns persons — in the sense of institutional role occupants —who are corrupted. The contrast here is twofold. In the first place, persons are being contrasted with institutional processes and purposes that might be subverted. In the second place, those who are corrupted are being contrasted with those who corrupt (the corruptors).

Those who are corrupted have to some extent, or in some sense, allowed themselves to be corrupted; they are participants in the process of their corruption. Specifically, they have chosen to perform the actions which ultimately had the corrupting effect on them, and they could have chosen otherwise.[17] In this respect, the corrupted are no different from the corruptors.

Nevertheless, those who are corrupted and those who corrupt may be different in respect of their intentions and beliefs concerning the corrupting effect of their actions. Specifically, it may not be true of those who allow themselves to be corrupted that they intended or foresaw or should have foreseen this outcome. This is especially likely in the case of the young and other vulnerable groups who allow themselves to be corrupted, but cannot be expected to realise that their actions, or more likely omissions, would have this consequence.[18] Consider the case of children recruited into Hitler's Youth Movement (Hitler Jugend) who were inducted into the practice of spying on their classmates, teachers, and even parents, and reporting to the Nazis any supposedly suspicious or deviant activities.

Moreover, even normally endowed adults who are placed in environments in which there are subtle and incremental, but more or less irresistible, inducements to engage in legal or moral offences, can gradually and imperceptibly become corrupted. Consider a young police officer who has just started working in the narcotics area. Keen to ‘fit in’, he foolishly accepts a minor ‘gift’ of money from a senior police officer without knowing what it is for; he has committed a relatively minor legal infraction. Later on at a drunken party he reluctantly agrees to smoke a cannabis joint with some of his new colleagues (another minor legal infraction). Still later he is informed that the payment was his ‘cut’ of an unlawful drug deal. This is done in the context of his being enthusiastically welcomed as ‘one of them’, albeit the dire consequences of ‘ratting’ on one's fellow police officers are also made clear. Confused and scared he fails to report this unlawful payment; now he has committed a serious offence. The police officer is compromised, and compromised in a corrupt and intimidating police environment. He is on the proverbial slippery slope.

A corruptor of other persons or institutional processes can in performing these corrupt actions also and simultaneously be producing corrupting effects on him or herself. That is, acts of corruption can have, and typically do have, a side effect in relation to the corruptor. They not only corrupt the person and/or institutional process that they are intended to corrupt; they also corrupt the corruptor, albeit usually unintentionally. Consider bribery in relation to a tendering process. The bribe corrupts the tendering process; and it will probably have a corrupting effect on the moral character of the bribe-taker. However, in addition, it might well have a corrupting effect on the moral character of the bribe-giver.

Here we need to distinguish between a corrupt action that has no effect on an institutional process or on another person, but which contributes to the corruption of the character of the would-be corruptor; and a non-corrupt action which is a mere expression of a corrupt moral character but which has no corrupting effect either on the agent or on anyone or anything else. In this connection consider two sorts of would-be bribe-givers whose bribes are rejected. Suppose that in both cases their action has no corrupting effect on an institutional process or other person. Now suppose that in the first case the bribe-giver's action of offering the bribe weakens his disposition not to offer bribes; so the offer has a corrupting effect on his character. However, suppose that in the case of the second bribe-giver, his failed attempt to bribe generates in him a feeling of shame and a disposition not to offer bribes. So his action has no corrupting effect, either on himself or externally on an institutional process or other person. In both cases, the action is the expression of a partially corrupt moral character. However, in the first, but not the second case the bribe-giver's action is corrupt by virtue of having a corrupt effect on himself.

I have argued that the corrupted are not necessarily morally responsible for being corrupted. I have also argued that typically corruptors are morally responsible for performing their corrupt actions. Accordingly, I have offered the hypothesis of an asymmetry between the corruptors and the corrupted. But what of those corruptors who are not morally responsible for their corrupt characters? Surely, at least in some cases, such people are not morally responsible for their corrupt actions, so strictly speaking — and contrary to our hypothesis — there is no asymmetry between the corrupted and the corruptors. This seems correct so far as it goes. However, some of those who are not morally responsible for having been corrupted are, nevertheless, morally responsible for not now trying to combat their corrupt characters. To that extent they might be held morally responsible for their corrupt actions, even if not for having been corrupted. Further, there is a difference between an action which corrupts and which is an expression of a corrupt character, and an action which has a corrupting effect but which is in no sense under the control of the person who performed it, e.g. they did not intend to perform it or their intention to perform it was caused by some agent external to themselves. For one thing, the former action, but not the latter action, is the action of a corruptor (as we have defined corruptors). Moreover, even if a person has a corrupt character and can do little about this, it does not follow that they have no control over the actions which are an expression of that character. Consider an official who finds it very hard to refuse bribes but who, nevertheless, tries to avoid opportunities in which he will be offered bribes. The upshot of this is that the hypothesis of an asymmetry between all corruptors and the corrupted may not hold up in anything other than an attenuated form. There is an asymmetry between the corrupted and those corruptors who are morally responsible for their actions, viz. the former are not necessarily morally responsible for being corrupted. However, some of those corruptors who are not responsible for being corrupted might not be responsible for their corrupt actions either. Accordingly, the fourth hypothesis is incorrect.

Fifth Hypothesis: Institutional Corruption involves Institutional Actors who Corrupt or are Corrupted.

The fifth and final hypothesis to be discussed concerns non-institutional agents who culpably perform acts that undermine legitimate institutional processes or purposes. As concluded above, corruption, even if it involves the abuse of public office, is not necessarily pursued for private gain. Dennis Thompson also makes this point in relation to political corruption (1995: 29). However, Thompson also holds that political corruption, at least, necessarily involves abuse of public office. We have canvassed arguments that contra this view acts of corruption, including acts of political corruption, might be actions performed by persons who do not hold public office. However, we now need to invoke a distinction between persons who hold a public office and persons who have an institutional role. Citizens are not necessarily holders of public offices, but they do have an institutional role qua citizens, e.g., as voters.

Consider the case of a citizen and voter who holds no public office but who, nevertheless, breaks into his local electoral office and falsifies the electoral role in order to assist his favored candidate to get elected. This is an act of corruption; specifically, it is corruption of the electoral process. However, it involves no public office holder, either as corruptor or as corrupted. By contrast, consider a fundamentalist Muslim from Saudi Arabia who is opposed to democracy and who breaks into an electoral office in an impoverished African state and falsifies the electoral roll in order to facilitate the election of an extremist right wing candidate who is likely, if elected, to polarise the already deeply divided community and thereby undermine the fledgling democracy. Let us further assume that the fundamentalist does so without the knowledge of the candidate, or indeed of anyone else. We are disinclined to view this as a case of corruption for two reasons: Firstly, the offender is not an occupant of a relevant institutional role; he is not a citizen or even a resident of the state in question. Secondly, while the offender undermined a legitimate institutional process, viz. the electoral process, he did not corrupt or undermine the character of the occupant of an institutional role.

Accordingly, we can conclude that acts of institutional corruption necessarily involve a corruptor who performs the corrupt action qua occupant of an institutional role and/or someone who is corrupted qua occupant of an institutional role.

This enables us to distinguish not only acts of corruption from acts of corrosion, but also from moral offences that undermine institutional processes and purposes but are, nevertheless, not acts of corruption. The latter are not acts of corruption because no person in their capacity as institutional role occupant either performs an act of corruption or suffers a diminution in their character. There are many legal and moral offences in this latter category. Consider individuals not employed by, or otherwise institutionally connected to, a large corporation who steal from or defraud the corporation. These offences may undermine the institutional processes and purposes of the corporation, but given the non-involvement of any officer, manager or employee of the corporation, these acts are not acts of corruption.

2.2 Summary of the Concept of Institutional Corruption

In light of the discussion of the five hypotheses concerning the concept of institutional corruption, the following summary definitional account of institutional corruption is available:

An act x performed by an agent A is an act of institutional corruption if and only if:

  1. x has an effect, E1, of undermining, or contributing to the undermining of, some institutional process and/or purpose of some institution, I, and/or an effect, Ec, of contributing to the despoiling of the moral character of some role occupant of I, agent B, qua role occupant of I;
  2. At least one of (a) or (b) is true:
    1. A is a role occupant of I, and in performing x, A intended or foresaw E1 and/or Ec, or A should have foreseen E1 and/or Ec;
    2. There is a role occupant of I, agent B, and B could have avoided Ec, if B had chosen to do so.[19]

Note that (2)(a) tells us that A is a corruptor and is, therefore, either (straightforwardly) morally responsible for the corrupt action, or A is not morally responsible for A's corrupt character and the corrupt action is an expression of A's corrupt character.

According to the above account, an act of institutional corruption brings about, or contributes to bringing about, a corrupt condition of some institution. But this condition of corruption exists only relative to an uncorrupted condition, which is the condition of being a morally legitimate institution or sub-element thereof. Aside from specific institutional processes and purposes, such sub-elements also include institutional roles and the morally worthy character traits that are associated with the proper acting out of these institutional roles.

Consider the uncorrupted judicial process. It consists of the presentation of objective evidence that has been gathered lawfully, of testimony in court being presented truthfully, of the rights of the accused being respected, and so on. This otherwise morally legitimate judicial process may be corrupted, if one or more of its constitutive actions are not performed in accordance with the process as it ought to be. Thus to present fabricated evidence, to lie under oath, and so on, are all corrupt actions. In relation to moral character, consider an honest accountant who begins to ‘doctor the books’ under the twin pressures of a corrupt senior management and a desire to maintain a lifestyle that is only possible if he is funded by the very high salary he receives for doctoring the books. By engaging in such a practice he risks the erosion of his moral character; he is undermining his disposition to act honestly.

On this view, the corrupt condition of the institution exists only relative to some moral standards, which are definitional of the uncorrupted condition of that institution, including the moral characters of the persons in institutional roles. The moral standards in question might be minimum moral standards, or they might be moral ideals. Corruption in relation to a tendering process is a matter of a failure in relation to minimum moral standards enshrined in laws or regulations. On the other hand, gradual loss of innocence might be regarded as a process of corruption in relation to an ideal moral state.

If the process of corruption proceeds far enough then we no longer have a corrupt official or corruption of an institutional process or institution; we cease to have a person who can properly be described as, say, a judge, or a process that can properly be described as, say, a judicial process — as opposed to proceedings in a kangaroo court. Like a coin that has been bent and defaced beyond recognition, it is no longer a coin; rather it is a piece of scrap metal that can no longer be exchanged for goods.

The corruption of an institution does not assume that the institution in fact existed at some past time in a pristine or uncorrupted condition. Rather an action, or set of actions, is corruptive of an institution in so far as the action, or actions, have a negative moral effect on the institution. This notion of a negative moral effect is determined by recourse to the moral standards constitutive of the processes, roles and purposes of the institution as that institution morally ought to be in the socio-historical context in question. Consider a police officer who fabricates evidence, but who is a member of a police service whose members have always fabricated evidence. It remains true that the officer is performing a corrupt action. His action is corrupt by virtue of the negative moral effect it has on the institutional process of evidence gathering and evidence presentation. To be sure in general in this institution this process is not what it ought to be, given the corrupt actions of the other police in that particular police force. But the point is his action contributes to the further undermining of the institutional process; it has a negative moral effect as judged by the yardstick of what that process ought to be in that institution at that time.

In relation to institutions, and institutional processes, roles and purposes, I have insisted that if they are to have the potential to be corrupted then they must be morally legitimate, and not merely legitimate in some weaker sense, e.g. lawful. Perhaps there are non-moral senses of the term “corruption”. For example, it is sometimes said that some term in use in a linguistic community is a corrupted form of a given word, or that some modern art is a corruption of traditional aesthetic forms. However, the central meaning of the term “corruption” carries strong moral connotations; to describe someone as a corrupt person, or an action as corrupt, is to ascribe a moral deficiency and to express moral disapproval. Accordingly, if an institutional process is to be corrupted it must suffer some form of moral diminution, and therefore in its uncorrupted state it must be at least morally legitimate. So although marriage across the colour bar was unlawful in apartheid South Africa, a priest, Priest A, who married a black man and a white woman was not engaged in an act of corruption. On the other hand, if another priest, Priest B, married a man and a woman, knowing the man to be already married, the priest may well be engaged in an act of corruption. Why was Priest B's act corrupt? Because it served to undermine a lawful, and morally legitimate, institutional process, viz. marriage between two consenting adults who are not already married. But Priest A's act was not corrupt. Why? Because a legally required, but morally unacceptable, institutional procedure — refusing to marry two consenting adults because they are from different race groups — cannot be corrupted. It cannot be corrupted because it was not morally legitimate to start with. Indeed, the legal prohibition on marriage across the colour bar is in itself a corruption of the institution of marriage. So Priest A's act of marrying the black man and the white woman was not corrupt.[20]

A further point arising from this example pertains to the possibility of one institution (the apartheid South African government) corrupting another institution (the church in apartheid South Africa). Other things being equal, in so far as the priests (and other relevant institutional actors) in the church acted as Priest A did, i.e., resisted the apartheid laws, the church as an institution would not have been corrupted. Moreover, the apartheid government's undermining of the institutional processes of the church did not in itself constitute corruption, since the government and its leaders are not per se — at least in a secular state — role occupants of the institution of the church. What of those priests who complied with the apartheid laws and did not marry mixed race couples? Here we need to distinguish mere compliance with the apartheid laws from embracing the laws. A priest might have complied with the apartheid law, but done so only because no mixed race couple ever approached him to marry them. Presumably, such a priest was neither a corruptor nor a person corrupted. What of a priest who actively supported the apartheid law by condemning such mixed-race marriages as not legitimate in the eyes of God, denouncing the priests who performed them, and so forth? Presumably, this priest has been corrupted and — in so far as he is successful in his endeavours — he is a corruptor of the institution of marriage.

There are two residual points to be made in conclusion.

Firstly, the despoiling of the moral character of a role occupant, or the undermining of institutional processes and purposes, would typically require a pattern of actions — and not merely a single one-off action. So a single free hamburger provided to a police officer on one occasion usually does not corrupt, and is not therefore an act of corruption. Nevertheless, a series of such gifts to a number of police officers might corrupt. They might corrupt, for example, if the hamburger joint in question ended up with (in effect) exclusive, round the clock police protection, and if the owner intended that this be the case.[21]

Note here the pivotal role of habits. We have just seen that the corruption of persons and institutions typically requires a pattern of corrupt actions. More specifically, corrupt actions are typically habitual. Yet, as noted by Aristotle, one's habits are in large part constitutive of one's moral character; habits make the man (and the woman). The coward is someone who habitually takes flight in the face of danger; by contrast, the courageous person has a habit of standing his or her ground. Accordingly, morally bad habits — including corrupt actions — are extremely corrosive of moral character, and therefore of institutional roles and ultimately institutions.

However, there are some cases in which a single, one-off action would be sufficient to corrupt an instance of an institutional process. Consider a specific tender. Suppose that one bribe is offered and accepted, and the tendering process is thereby undermined. Suppose that this is the first and only time that the person offering the bribe and the person receiving the bribe are involved in bribery. Is this one-off bribe an instance of corruption? Surely it is, since it corrupted that particular instance of a tendering process.

The second residual point is that among instances of corruption there are ones in which corruptors are culpably negligent; they do, or allow to be done, what they reasonably ought to have known should not be done, or should not have been allowed to be done. For example, a safety inspector within an industrial plant who is negligent with respect to his duty to ensure that safety protocols are being complied with, might be guilty of corruption by virtue of contributing to the undermining of those safety protocols.[22]

There are complexities in relation to corruption involving culpable negligence that are not necessarily to be found in other forms of corruption. Consider a company official who has a habit of allowing industrial waste products to be discharged into a river because this is the cheapest way to get rid of the unwanted products. But now assume that the official does so prior to the availability of any relevant scientific knowledge concerning the pollution which results from such discharges, and prior to the existence of any institutional arrangement for monitoring and controlling pollution. It seems that the official is not necessarily acting in a corrupt manner. However, the same action might well be a case of corporate corruption in a contemporary setting in which this sort of pollution is well and widely understood, and anti-pollution arrangements are known to be in place in many organisations. While those who actively corrupt institutional processes, roles, and purposes are not necessarily themselves the occupants of institutional roles, those who are culpably negligent tend to the occupants of institutional roles who have failed to discharge their institutional obligations.

3. Noble Cause Corruption: A Non-standard Case

As we saw earlier, in the paradigm cases corrupt actions are a species of morally wrong, habitual, actions. What of the motive for corrupt actions? We saw above that there are many motives for corrupt actions, including desires for wealth, status, and power. However, there is apparently at least one motive that we might think ought not to be associated with corruption, namely, acting for the sake of good. Here we need to be careful. For sometimes actions that are done for the sake of good are, nevertheless, morally wrong actions. Indeed, some actions that are done out of a desire to achieve good are corrupt actions, namely, acts of so-called noble cause corruption.

This is not the place to provide a detailed treatment of the phenomenon of noble cause corruption.[23] Rather let us simply note that even in cases of noble cause corruption — contra what the person who performs the action thinks — the ‘corrupt’ action morally ought not to be performed; or at least paradigmatically the ‘corrupt’ action morally ought not to be performed. Accordingly, the person who performs it is either deceiving him or herself, or is simply mistaken when they judge that the action morally ought to be performed. So their motive, i.e., to act for the sake of what is right, has a moral deficiency. They are only acting for the sake of what they believe is morally right, but in fact it is not morally right; their belief is a false belief. So we can conclude that corrupt actions are, at least in the paradigm case, habitual actions that are morally wrong, and therefore not motivated by the true belief that they are morally right.

Here there are more complex excuses and justifications available for what might first appear to be an act of noble cause corruption. Perhaps a police officer did not know that some form of evidence was not admissible. The police officer's false belief that an action is right (putting forward the evidence in a court of law) was rationally dependent on some false non-moral belief (that the evidence was admissible); and the police officer came to hold that non-moral belief as a result of a rational process (he was informed, or at least misinformed, that the evidence was admissible by a senior officer). This would incline us to say that the putative act of noble cause corruption was not really an act of corruption — although it might serve to undermine a morally legitimate institutional process - and therefore not an act of noble cause corruption. This intuition is consistent with our account of corruption. The police officer in question did perform an action that undermined a legitimate criminal justice process. However, his action was not corrupt because he is not a corruptor. He did not intend to undermine the process, he did not foresee that the process would be undermined, and he could not reasonably have been expected to foresee that it would be undermined. Nor is his action the expression of a corrupt character.

Earlier, it was suggested that acts of noble cause corruption are paradigmatically actions that morally ought not to be performed, contra what the actor believes. However, it is conceivable that some acts of noble cause corruption are morally justified. Perhaps the act of noble cause corruption while wrong in itself, nevertheless, was morally justified from an all things considered standpoint. If so, we might conclude either that the action was not an act of corruption (and therefore not an act of noble cause corruption). Alternatively, we might conclude that it was an act of corruption, but one of those few acts of corruption that was justified in the circumstances. Perhaps both options are possibilities.

Suppose an undercover police officer offers a ‘bribe’ to a corrupt judge for the purpose, supposedly, of getting the judge to pass a lenient sentence on a known mafia crime boss. The police officer is actually engaged in a so-called sting operation as part of an anti-corruption strategy. The judge accepts the bribe and is duly convicted of a criminal offence and jailed. (Let us also assume that the judge is already so corrupt that he will not be further corrupted by being offered the bribe.) The police officer offers the bribe for the purpose of achieving a moral good, i.e. convicting a corrupt official. However, we are disinclined to call this a case of corruption. Presumably the reason for this is that in this context the ‘bribe’ does not have a corrupting effect; in particular, it does not succeed in undermining the judicial process of sentencing the crime boss. So this is a case in which a putative act of noble cause corruption turns out not be an act of corruption, and therefore not an act of noble cause corruption.[24]

On the other hand, suppose someone bribes an immigration official in order to ensure that his friend — who is ineligible to enter Australia — can in fact enter Australia, and thereby have access to life-saving hospital treatment. This act of bribery is evidently an act of institutional corruption; a legitimate institutional process has been subverted. However, the person acted for the sake of doing what he believed to be morally right; his action was an instance of noble cause corruption. Moreover, from an all things considered standpoint — and in particular, in the light of the strength of the moral obligations owed to close friends when their lives are at risk — his action may well be morally justified. Accordingly, his act of corruption may well not have a corrupting effect on himself. Plausibly, this explains any tendency we might have not to describe his action as an action of corruption. But from the fact that the person was not corrupted it does not follow that the act did not corrupt. Moreover, it does not even follow that some person or other was not corrupted. Clearly, in our example, the immigration official was corrupted.

Now consider a police officer in India whose meagre wages are insufficient to enable him to feed, clothe, and educate his family, and who is prohibited by law from having a second job. Accordingly, he supplements his income by accepting bribes from certain households in a wealthy area in return for providing additional surveillance and thus greater protection from theft; this has the consequence that other wealthy households tend to suffer a somewhat higher level of theft than otherwise would be the case. The police officer is engaged in corruption, and his corruption has a noble cause, viz. to provide for the minimal wellbeing of his family. Moreover, arguably his noble cause corruption is morally justified by virtue of the moral obligations he has to provide for the basic needs of his family.

In this section the following propositions have been advanced: (a) the phenomenon of noble cause corruption is a species of corruption, and it is seen to be so by the lights of this account of corruption; (b) conceivably, some acts of noble cause corruption are morally justified.

4. Conclusion

In the light of the diverse range of corrupt actions, and the generic nature of the concept of corruption, it is unlikely that any precise and detailed definition of institutional corruption is possible. Nor is it likely that the field of corrupt actions can be neatly circumscribed by recourse to a set of self-evident criteria. Rather we should content ourselves with the somewhat vague and highly generic definition of institutional corruption provided above; and then proceed in a relatively informal and piecemeal manner to try to identify a range of moral and/or legal offences that are known to contribute under certain conditions to the undermining of morally legitimate institutions. Such offences obviously include bribery, nepotism, and some — but not all — cases of fraud. But under certain circumstances they might also include breaches of confidentiality that compromise investigations, the making of false statements that undermines court proceedings or selection committee processes, selective enforcement of laws or rules by those in authority, and so on and so forth.

The wide diversity of corrupt actions has at least two further implications. Firstly, it implies that acts of institutional corruption as a class display a correspondingly large set of moral deficiencies. Certainly, most corrupt actions will be morally wrong, and morally wrong at least in part because they undermine morally legitimate institutions. However, since there are many and diverse offences at the core of corrupt actions, there will also be many and diverse moral deficiencies associated with different forms of corruption. Some acts of corruption will be moral deficient by virtue of involving deception, others by virtue of infringing a moral right to property, still others by virtue of infringing a principle of impartiality, and so on.

Secondly, the wide diversity of corrupt actions implies that there may well need to be a correspondingly wide and diverse range of anti-corruption measures to combat corruption in its different forms, and indeed in its possibly very different contexts.


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