The Definition of Death

First published Fri Oct 26, 2007; substantive revision Thu Aug 25, 2011

The philosophical investigation of human death has focused on two overarching questions: (1) What is human death? and (2) How can we determine that it has occurred? The first question is ontological or conceptual. An answer to this question will consist of a definition (or conceptualization). Examples include death as the irreversible cessation of organismic functioning and human death as the irreversible loss of personhood. The second question is epistemological. A complete answer to this question will furnish both a general standard (or criterion) for determining that death has occurred and specific clinical tests to show whether the standard has been met in a given case. Examples of standards for human death are the traditional cardiopulmonary standard and the whole-brain standard. Insofar as clinical tests are primarily a medical concern, the present entry will not address them.

The philosophical issues concerning the correct definition and standard for human death are closely connected to other questions. How does the death of human beings relate to the death of other living things? Is human death simply an instance of organismic death, ultimately a matter of biology? If not, on what basis should it be defined? Whatever the answers to these questions, does death or at least human death have an essence—either de re or de dicto—entailing necessary and jointly sufficient conditions? Or do the varieties of death reveal only “family resemblance” relations? Are life and death exhaustive categories of those things that are ever animated, or do some individuals fall into an ontological neutral zone between life and death? Finally, how do our deaths relate, conceptually, to our essence and identity as human persons?

For the most part, such questions did not clamor for public attention until well into the twentieth century. (For historical background, see Pernick 1999 and Capron 1999, 120–124.) Sufficient destruction of the brain, including the brainstem, ensured respiratory failure leading quickly to terminal cardiac arrest. Conversely, prolonged cardiopulmonary failure inevitably led to total, irreversible loss of brain function. With the invention of mechanical respirators in the 1950s, however, it became possible for a previously lethal extent of brain damage to coexist with continued cardiopulmonary functioning, sustaining the functioning of other organs. Was such a patient alive or dead? The widespread dissemination in the 1960s of such technologies as mechanical respirators and defibrillators to restore cardiac function highlighted the possibility of separating cardiopulmonary and neurological functioning. Quite rapidly the questions of what constituted human death and how we could determine its occurrence had emerged as issues both philosophically rich and urgent.

Various practical concerns provided further impetus for addressing these issues. (Reflecting these concerns is a landmark 1968 report published by a Harvard Medical School committee led by physician Henry Beecher (Ad Hoc Committee of the Harvard Medical School 1968).) Soaring medical expenditures provoked concerns about prolonged, possibly futile treatment of patients who presented some but not all of the traditionally recognized indicators of death. Certainly, it would be permissible to discontinue life-supports if these patients were dead. Concurrent interest in the evolving techniques of organ transplantation motivated physicians not to delay unnecessarily in determining that a patient had died. Removing vital organs as quickly as possible would improve the prospect of saving lives. But removing vital organs of living patients would cause their deaths, violating both laws against homicide and the widely accepted moral principle prohibiting the intentional killing of innocent human beings (see the entry on doing vs. allowing harm). To be sure, there were—as there are now—individuals who held that procuring organs from, thereby killing, irreversibly unconscious patients who had consented to donate is a legitimate exception to this moral principle (see the entry on voluntary euthanasia), but this judgment strikes many as a radical departure from common morality. In any event, in view of concerns about the possibility of killing in the course of organ procurement, physicians wanted clear legal guidance for determining when someone had died.

The remainder of this entry takes a dialectical form, focusing primarily on ideas and arguments rather than on history and individuals. It begins with an approach that nearly achieved consensus status after these issues came under the spotlight in the twentieth century: the whole-brain approach. (Most of what are here referred to as “approaches” include a standard and a corresponding definition of death; a few offer more radical suggestions for how to understand human death.) The discussion proceeds, in turn, to the higher-brain approach, to an updated cardiopulmonary approach, and to several more radical approaches. The discussion of each approach examines its chief assertions, its answers to questions identified above, leading arguments in its favor, and its chief difficulties. The entry as a whole is intended to identify the main philosophical issues connected with the definition and determination of human death, leading approaches that have been developed to address these issues, and principal strengths and difficulties of these visions viewed as competitors.


1. The Current Mainstream View: The Whole-Brain Approach

According to the whole-brain standard, human death is the irreversible cessation of functioning of the entire brain, including the brainstem. This standard is generally associated with an organismic definition of death (as explained below). Unlike the older cardiopulmonary standard, the whole-brain standard assigns significance to the difference between assisted and unassisted respiration. A mechanical respirator can enable breathing, and thereby circulation, in a “brain-dead” patient—a patient whose entire brain is irreversibly nonfunctional. But such a patient necessarily lacks the capacity for unassisted respiration. On the old view, such a patient counted as alive so long as respiration of any sort (assisted or unassisted) occurred. But on the whole-brain account, such a patient is dead. The present approach also maintains that someone in a permanent (irreversible) vegetative state is alive because a functioning brainstem enables spontaneous respiration and circulation as well as certain primitive reflexes.[1]

Before turning to arguments for and against the whole-brain standard, it may be helpful to review some basic facts about the human brain, “whole-brain death” (total brain failure), and other states of permanent (irreversible) unconsciousness. (The most important terms for our purposes appear in italics.) We may think of the brain as comprising two major portions: (1) the “higher brain,” consisting of both the cerebrum, the primary vehicle of conscious awareness, and the cerebellum, which is involved in the coordination and control of voluntary muscle movements; and (2) the “lower brain” or brainstem. The brainstem includes the medulla, which controls spontaneous respiration, the reticular activating system, a sort of on/off switch that enables consciousness without affecting its contents (the latter job belonging to the cerebrum), as well as the midbrain and pons.

With these basic concepts in view, it may be easier to contrast various states of permanent unconsciousness. (For a helpful overview, see Cranford 1995.) “Whole-brain death” or total brain failure involves the destruction of the entire brain, both the higher brain and the brainstem. By contrast, in a permanent vegetative state (PVS), while the higher brain is extensively damaged, causing irretrievable loss of consciousness, the brainstem is largely intact. Thus, as noted earlier, a patient in a PVS is alive according to the whole-brain standard. Retaining brainstem functions, PVS patients exhibit some or all of the following: unassisted respiration and heartbeat; wake and sleep cycles (made possible by an intact reticular activating system, though destruction to the cerebrum precludes consciousness); pupillary reaction to light and eyes movements; and such reflexes as swallowing, gagging, and coughing. A rare form of unconsciousness that is distinct from PVS and tends to lead fairly quickly to death is permanent coma. This state, in which patients never appear to be awake, involves partial brainstem functioning. Permanently comatose patients, like PVS patients, can maintain breathing and heartbeat without mechanical assistance.

With this background, we turn to the advantages and disadvantages of the whole-brain approach. First, what considerations favor this approach over the traditional focus on cardiopulmonary function in determining death? The most prominent and arguably the most powerful case for the whole-brain standard appeals to two considerations: (1) the organismic definition of death and (2) an emphasis on the brain's role as the primary integrator of overall bodily functioning. (Some who regard a general definition of death as unnecessary have focused on consideration (2) in defending the whole-brain standard. Some others, as discussed later, have retained consideration (1) but dropped consideration (2).) An additional consideration that has been influential, yet is logically separable from the other two, is (3) the thesis that the whole-brain standard updates, without replacing, the traditional approach to defining death.

According to the organismic definition, death is the irreversible loss of functioning of the organism as a whole (Becker 1975; Bernat, Culver, and Gert 1981). Proponents of this approach emphasize that death is a biological occurrence common to all organisms. Although individual cells and organs live and die, organisms are the only entities that literally do so without being parts of larger biological systems. (Ideas, cultures, and machines live and die only figuratively.) So an adequate definition of death must be adequate in the case of all organisms. What happens when a paramecium, clover, tree, mosquito, rabbit, or human dies? The organism stops functioning as an integrated unit and breaks down, turning what was once a dynamic object that took energy from the environment to maintain its own structure and functioning into an inert piece of matter subject to disintegration and decay. In the case of humans, no less than other organisms, death involves the collapse of integrated bodily functioning.

The whole-brain standard does not follow straightforwardly from the organismic conception of death. One might insist, after all, that a human organism's death occurs upon irreversible loss of cardiopulmonary function. Why think the brain so important? According to the mainstream whole-brain approach, the human brain plays the crucial role of integrating major bodily functions so only the death of the entire brain is necessary and sufficient for a human being's death (Bernat, Culver, and Gert 1981). Although heartbeat and breathing normally indicate life, they do not constitute life. Life involves integrated functioning of the whole organism. Circulation and respiration are centrally important, but so are maintenance of body temperature, hormonal regulation, and various other functions—as well as, in humans and other higher animals, consciousness. The brain makes all of these vital functions possible. Their integration within the organism is due to a central integrator, the brain.

This leading case for the whole-brain standard, then, consists in an organismic conception of death coupled with a view of the brain as the chief integrator of interdependent bodily functions. Another consideration sometimes advanced in favor of the whole-brain standard positions it as a part of time-honored tradition rather than a departure from tradition. (The argument may be understood either as an appeal to the authority of tradition or as an appeal to the practicality of not departing radically from tradition.) The claim is that the traditional focus on cardiopulmonary function is part and parcel of the whole-brain approach, that the latter does not revise our understanding of death but merely updates it with a more comprehensive picture that highlights the brain's crucial role:

Three organs—the heart, lungs, and brain—assume special significance … because their interrelationship is close and the irreversible cessation of any one very quickly stops the other two and consequently halts the integrated functioning of the organism as a whole. Because they were easily measured, circulation and respiration were traditionally the basic “vital signs.” But [they] are simply used as signs—as one window for viewing a deeper and more complex reality: a triangle of interrelated systems with the brain at its apex. [T]he traditional means of diagnosing death actually detected an irreversible cessation of integrated functioning among the interdependent bodily systems. When artificial means of support mask this loss of integration as measured by the old methods, brain-oriented criteria and tests provide a new window on the same phenomena (President's Commission 1981, 33).

According to this view, when the entire brain is nonfunctional but cardiopulmonary function continues due to a respirator and perhaps other life-supports, the mechanical assistance presents a false appearance of life, concealing the absence of integrated functioning in the organism as a whole.

The whole-brain approach clearly enjoys advantages. First, whether or not the whole-brain standard really incorporates, rather than replacing, the traditional cardiopulmonary standard, the former is at least fairly continuous with traditional practices and understandings concerning human death. Indeed, current law in the American states incorporates both standards into disjunctive form, most states adopting the Uniform Determination of Death Act (UDDA) while others have embraced similar language (Bernat 2006, 40). The UDDA states that “… an individual who has sustained either (1) irreversible cessation of circulatory and respiratory functions, or (2) irreversible cessation of all functions of the entire brain, including the brainstem, is dead,” (President's Commission 1981, 119). Similar legal developments have occurred in Canada (Law Reform Commission of Canada 1981; Canadian Congress Committee on Brain Death 1988). The close pairing of the whole-brain and cardiopulmonary standards in the law suggests that the whole-brain standard does not depart radically from tradition.

The present approach offers other advantages as well. For one, the whole-brain standard is prima facie plausible as a specification of the organismic definition of death in the case of human beings. Moreover, acceptance of whole-brain criteria for death facilitates organ transplantation by permitting a declaration of death and retrieval of still-viable organs while respiration and circulation continue, with mechanical assistance, in a “brain-dead” body. Another practical advantage is permitting, without an advance directive or proxy consent, discontinuation of costly life-support measures on patients who have incurred total brain failure. While most proponents of the whole-brain approach insist that such practical advantages are merely fortunate consequences of the biological facts about death, one might regard these advantages as part of the justification for a standard whose defense requires more than appeals to biology (see subsection 4.2 below).

The advantages proffered by this approach contributed to its widespread social acceptance and legal adoption in the last few decades of the 20th century. As mentioned, every American state has legally adopted the whole-brain standard alongside the cardiopulmonary standard as in the UDDA. It is worth noting, however, that a close cousin to the whole-brain standard, the brainstem standard, was adopted by the United Kingdom and various other nations. According to the brainstem standard—which has the practical advantage of requiring fewer clinical tests—human death occurs at the irreversible cessation of brainstem function. One might wonder whether a person's cerebrum could function—enabling consciousness—while this standard is met, but the answer is no. Since the brainstem includes the reticular activating system, the on/off switch that makes consciousness possible (without affecting its contents), brainstem death entails irreversible loss not only of unassisted respiration and circulation but also of the capacity for consciousness. Importantly, outside the English-speaking world, many or most nations, including virtually all developed countries, have legally adopted either whole-brain or brainstem criteria for the determination of death (Wijdicks 2002). Moreover, most of the public, to the extent that it is aware of the relevant laws, appears to accept such criteria for death (ibid). Opponents commonly fall within one of two main groups. One group consists of religious conservatives who favor the cardiopulmonary standard, according to which one can be brain-dead yet alive if (assisted) cardiopulmonary function persists. The other group consists of those liberal intellectuals who favor the higher-brain standard (to be discussed), which, notably, has not been adopted by any jurisdiction.

The widespread acceptance in the U.S. of the whole-brain standard and the broader international acceptance of some sort of “brain death” criteria—whether whole-brain or brainstem—are remarkable considering the subtlety of issues surrounding the definition and determination of death. Yet this near-consensus has been broader than it is deep. Increasingly, both in academic and clinical circles, doubts about “brain death” are being voiced. Following are several major challenges to the whole-brain standard—and, implicitly, to the brainstem standard. (Several additional challenges are implicit in arguments supporting the higher-brain approach.)

The first challenge is directed at proponents of the whole-brain approach who claim that its standard merely updates, without replacing, the traditional cardiopulmonary standard. A major contention that motivates this thesis is that irreversible cessation of brain function will quickly lead to irreversible loss of cardiopulmonary function (and vice versa). But extended maintenance on respirators of patients with total brain failure has removed this component of the case for the whole-brain standard (PCB 2008, 90). The remaining challenges to the whole-brain approach are not specifically directed to those who assert that its standard merely updates the traditional cardiopulmonary standard.

First, in the case of at least some members of our species, total brain failure is not necessary for death. After all, human embryos and early fetuses can die although, lacking brains, they cannot satisfy whole-brain criteria for death (Persson 2002, 22–23). An advocate could respond by introducing a modified definition: In the case of any human being in possession of a functioning brain, death is the irreversible cessation of functioning of the entire brain. While this may be practically useful in the world as we know it for the foreseeable future, this definition is not conceptually satisfactory if it is possible in principle for some human beings with brains (that is, who have functioning brains at any point in their existence) to die without destruction of their brains. The “in principle” is important here, for this is not possible in our world currently. But suppose we develop the ability to transplant brains. (The thought-experiment that follows appears in McMahan, 429.) Recall that the whole-brain standard is generally thought to receive support from an organismic definition of death. But such a conception of human death, one could argue, only makes sense on the assumption that we are essentially human organisms (see discussion of the essence of human persons in section 2.1)—as some proponents explicitly acknowledge (see, e.g., Olson 1997). According to the present critique, the brain is merely a part of the organism. Suppose the brain were removed from one of us, and kept intact and functioning, perhaps by being transplanted into another, de-brained body. Bereft of mechanical assistance, the body from which the brain was removed would surely die. But this body was the living organism, one of us. So, although the original brain continues to function, the human being, one of us, would have died. Total brain failure, then, is not strictly necessary for human death. A possible rebuttal to this challenge from one who accepts that we are essentially organisms is to argue that the existence of a functioning brain is sufficient for the continued existence of the organism (van Inwagen 1990, 173–174, 180–181). If so, then in the imagined scenario the original human being would survive the brain transplant in a new body. Thus, the rebuttal concludes, it is false that a human being could die although her brain continued to live.

Perhaps more threatening to the whole-brain approach is the growing empirical evidence that total brain failure is not sufficient for human death —assuming the latter is construed, as whole-brain advocates generally construe it, as the breakdown of organismic functioning mediated by the brain. Many of our integrative functions, according to the challenge, are not mediated by the brain and can therefore persist in individuals who meet whole-brain criteria for death by standard clinical tests. Such somatically integrating functions include homeostasis, assimilation of nutrients, detoxification and recycling of cellular wastes, elimination, wound healing, fighting of infections, and cardiovascular and hormonal stress responses to unanesthetized incisions (for organ procurement); in a few cases, brain-dead bodies have even gestated a fetus, matured sexually, or grown in size (Shewmon 2001; Potts 2001). It has been argued that most brain functions commonly cited as integrative merely sustain an existing functional integration, suggesting that the brain is more an enhancer than an indispensable integrator of bodily functions (Shewmon 2001).

Another, related problem for the sufficiency of total brain failure for human death arises from reflection on locked-in syndrome. People with locked-in syndrome are conscious, and therefore alive, but completely paralyzed with the possible exception of their eyes. With intensive medical support they can live. The interesting fact for our purposes is that some patients with this syndrome exhibit no more somatic functioning integrated by the brain than some brain-dead individuals. Whatever integration of bodily functions remains is maintained by external supports and by bodily systems other than the brain, which merely preserves consciousness (Bartlett and Youngner 1988, 205–6). If total brain failure is supposed to be sufficient for death, and if this is true only because the former entails the loss of somatic functioning integrated by the brain, then the loss of those functions should also be sufficient for death. But these patients, who are clearly alive, show that this is not so. Either the whole-brain definition must be rejected or this particular reason for accepting the whole-brain approach must be rejected and some other good reason for accepting it found.

Recently, a new rationale—distinct from the one that understands human death in terms of loss of organismic functioning mediated by the brain—has been advanced in support of the whole-brain standard (PCB 2008, ch. 4). According to this rationale, a human being dies upon irreversibly losing the capacity to perform the fundamental work of an organism, a loss that occurs with total brain failure. The fundamental work of an organism is characterized as follows: (1) receptivity to stimuli from the surrounding environment; (2) the ability to act upon the world to obtain, selectively, what the organism needs; and (3) the basic felt need that drives the organism to act as it must to obtain what it needs and what its receptivity reveals to be available (ibid, 61). According to a sympathetic reading of the ambiguous discussion in which this analysis is advanced, any patient who meets even one of these criteria is alive and therefore not dead. A patient with total brain failure meets none of these criteria, even if a respirator permits the continuation of cardiopulmonary function. By contrast, PVS patients meet at least the second criterion through spontaneous respiration (a kind of acting upon the world to obtain what is needed: oxygen); and locked-in patients meet the first criterion if they can see or experience bodily sensation and certainly meet the third insofar as they are conscious. One difficulty with this “fundamental work” rationale for the whole-brain standard, a rationale that is intended to capture “what distinguishes every organism from non-living things” (ibid), is that present-day robots, which are certainly not alive, seem to satisfy the first two criteria. If one insisted, contrary to the reading deemed sympathetic, that a being must satisfy all three criteria—as robots do not since they lack felt needs—in order to qualify as living, the same may be asserted not only of insentient animal life but also of presentient human fetuses and of unconscious human beings of any age. Whether any variation or modification of the present rationale for the whole-brain standard can survive critical scrutiny is an open question.

Some traditional defenders of the cardiopulmonary approach believe that the insufficiency of whole-brain criteria for death is evident not only in exceptional cases, such as those described earlier, but in all cases in which patients with total brain failure exhibit respirator-assisted cardiopulmonary function. Anyone who is breathing and whose heart functions cannot be dead, they claim. The champion of whole-brain criteria may retort that such a body is not really breathing and circulating blood; the respirator is doing the work. The traditionalist, in response, will likely contend that what is important is not who or what is powering the breathing and heartbeat, just that they occur. Even complete dependence on external support for vital functions cannot entail that one is dead, the traditionalist will continue, as is evident in the fact that living fetuses are entirely dependent on their mothers' bodies.

A third major criticism of the whole-brain approach—at least in its legally authoritative formulation in the United States—concerns its conceptual and clinical adequacy. The whole-brain standard, taken at its word, requires for human death permanent cessation of all brain functions. Yet many patients who meet routine clinical tests for this standard continue to have minor brain functions such as electroencephalographic activity, isolated nests of living neurons, and hypothalamic functioning (see, e.g., Potts 2001, 482; Veatch 1993, 18). Indeed, the latter, which controls neurohormonal regulation, is indisputably an integrating function of the brain (Brody 1999, 73). Now one could maintain the coherence of the whole-brain approach by insisting that the individuals in question are not really dead and that physicians ought to use more thorough clinical tests before declaring death (see, e.g., Capron 1999, 130–131). But whole-brain theorists tend to agree that these individuals are dead—that the residual functions are too trivial to count against a judgment of death (see, e.g., President's Commission 1981, 28–29; Bernat 1992, 25)—suggesting that the problem lies with the formulation of the whole-brain standard rather than with its spirit.

Within this spirit and in response to this challenge, a leading proponent of the whole-brain approach has revised both (1) the organismic definition of death to “the permanent cessation of the critical functions of the organism as a whole” and (2) the corresponding standard to permanent cessation of the critical functions of the whole brain (Bernat 1998, 17). The organism's critical functions may be identified by reference to its emergent functions—that is, properties of the whole organism that are not possessed by any of its component parts—as follows: “The irretrievable loss of the organism's emergent functions produces loss of the critical functioning of the organism as a whole and therefore is the death of the organism,” (Bernat 2006, 38). The emphasis on critical functions, of course, allows one to declare dead those patients with only trivial brain functions. According to this revised whole-brain approach, the critical functions of the organism are (1) the vital functions of spontaneous breathing and autonomic circulation control, (2) integrating functions that maintain the organism's homeostasis, and (3) consciousness. A human being dies upon losing all three. Whether this or some similar modification of the whole-brain approach adequately addresses the present challenge is a topic of ongoing debate (see, e.g., Brody 1999, Bernat 2006). What seems reasonably clear is that not all functions of the brain will count equally in any cogent defense of the whole-brain approach.

The judgment that some brain functions are trivial in this context invites a reconsideration of what is most significant about what the human brain does. According to an alternative approach, what is far and away most significant about human brain function is consciousness.

2. A Progressive Alternative: The Higher-Brain Approach

According to the higher-brain standard, human death is the irreversible cessation of the capacity for consciousness. “Consciousness” here is meant broadly, to include any subjective experience, so that both wakeful and dreaming states count as instances. Reference to the capacity for consciousness indicates that individuals who retain intact the neurological hardware needed for consciousness, including individuals in a dreamless sleep or reversible coma, are alive. One dies on this view upon entering a state in which the brain is incapable of returning to consciousness. This implies, somewhat radically, that a patient in a PVS or permanent coma is dead despite continued brainstem function that permits spontaneous cardiopulmonary function. Although no jurisdiction has adopted the higher-brain standard, it enjoys the support of many scholars (see, e.g., Veatch 1975; Engelhardt 1975; Green and Wikler 1980; Gervais 1986; Bartlett and Youngner 1988; Puccetti 1988; Rich 1997; and Baker 2000). These scholars conceptualize, or define, human death in different ways—though in each case as the irreversible loss of some property for which the capacity for consciousness is necessary. This discussion will consider four leading argumentative strategies in support of the higher-brain approach.

2.1 Appeals to the Essence of Human Persons

One strategy for defending the higher-brain approach is to appeal to the essence of human persons on the understanding that this essence requires the capacity for consciousness (see, e.g., Bartlett and Youngner 1988; Veatch 1993; Engelhardt 1996, 248; Rich 1997; and Baker 2000, 5). “Essence” here is intended in a strict ontological sense: that property or set of properties of an individual the loss of which would necessarily terminate the individual's existence. From this perspective, we human persons—more precisely, we individuals who are at any time human persons—are essentially beings with the capacity for consciousness such that we cannot exist at any time without having this capacity at that time. We go out of existence, it is assumed, when we die, so death involves the loss of what is essential to our existence.

Unfortunately, the use of terminology in these arguments can be confusing because the same term may be used in different ways and terms are frequently used without precise definition. It is sometimes claimed, for example, that we are essentially persons. But what, exactly, is a person? Some authors (e.g., Engelhardt 1996, Baker 2000) use the term to refer to beings with relatively complex psychological capacities such as self-awareness over time, reason, and moral agency. Then the claim that we are essentially persons implies that we die upon losing such advanced capacities. But this means that at some point during the normal course of progressive dementia the demented individual dies—upon losing complex psychological capacities, however these are defined—despite the fact that a patient remains, clearly alive, with the capacity for (basic) consciousness. This view is extraordinarily radical and appears inconsistent with the higher-brain approach, which equates death with the permanent loss of the capacity for (any) consciousness. A proponent of the view that we are essentially persons in the present sense, however, may hold that practical considerations—such as the impossibility of drawing a clear line between sentient persons and sentient nonpersons, and the potential for abuse of the elderly—recommend the capacity for consciousness as the only safe line to draw, thereby vindicating the higher-brain view (Engelhardt 1996, 250). Meanwhile, other proponents of the view that we are essentially persons (e.g., Bartlett and Youngner 1988) apparently hold that any member of our species who retains the capacity for consciousness qualifies as a person. This view, unlike the previous one, straightforwardly supports the higher-brain standard. Still other authors (e.g., Veatch 1993) hold that we are essentially human beings where this term refers not to all members of our species but just to those judged to be persons by the previous group of authors: members of our species who have the capacity for consciousness. And some authors who defend the higher-brain standard (e.g., McMahan 2002) assert that we are essentially minds or minded beings, which is to say beings with the capacity for consciousness. In each case, an appeal to our essence is advanced to support the higher-brain standard.

Taking this collection of arguments together, the reasoning might be reconstructed as follows:

  1. For humans, the irreversible loss of the capacity for consciousness entails (is sufficient for) the loss of what is essential to their existence;
  2. For humans, loss of what is essential to their existence is (is necessary and sufficient for) death;

Therefore,

  1. For humans, irreversible loss of the capacity for consciousness entails (is sufficient for) death.

We have noted that various commentators who advance this reasoning hold that we are essentially persons in a sense requiring complex psychological capacities. We have noted that this implies that for those of us who become progressively demented, we die—go out of existence—at some point during the gradual slide to permanent unconsciousness. Even if practical considerations recommend safely drawing a line at irreversible loss of the capacity of consciousness for policy purposes, the implication that, strictly speaking, we go out of existence during progressive dementia will strike many as incredible. At the other end of life there is another problematic implication. For if we are essentially persons (in this sense), then inasmuch as human newborns lack the capacities that constitute personhood, each of us came into existence after what is ordinarily described as his or her birth.

For those attracted to the general approach of understanding our essence in terms of psychological capacities, a promising alternative thesis is that we are essentially beings with the capacity for at least some form of consciousness who die upon irreversibly losing that very basic capacity. Stated more simply, we are essentially minded beings, or minds, and we die when we completely “lose our minds.” (Note that this thesis is consistent with the claim that we are also essentially embodied.)

What, then, about the human organism associated with one of us minded beings? Surely the fetus that gradually developed prior to the emergence of sentience or the capacity for consciousness—that is, prior to the emergence of a mind—was alive. On the other end of life, a patient in a PVS who is spontaneously breathing, circulating blood, and exhibiting a full range of brainstem reflexes appears to be alive. Consider also anencephalic infants, who are born without cerebral hemispheres and never have the capacity for consciousness: They, too, seem to be living organisms, their grim prognosis notwithstanding. In response to this challenge, a proponent of the higher-brain approach may either (1) assert that the presentient fetus, PVS patient, and anencephalic infant are not alive despite appearances (Puccetti 1988) or (2) allow that these organisms are alive but are not of the same fundamental kind as we are: minded beings (McMahan 2002, 423–6). Insofar as life is a biological concept, and the organisms in question satisfy commonly accepted criteria for life, option (1) seems at best hyperbolic. At best, the claim is really that these organisms, though alive, are not alive in any state that matters much, so we may count them as dead or nonliving for our purposes. This claim, in turn, may be understood as depending on option (2), on which we may focus. This option implies that for each of us minded beings, there is a second, closely associated being: a human organism. The prospects of the present strategy for defending the higher-brain approach turn significantly on its ability to make sense of this picture of two closely associated beings: (1) the organism, which comes into existence at conception or shortly thereafter (perhaps after twinning is no longer possible) and dies when organismic functioning radically breaks down, and (2) the minded being, who comes into existence when sentience emerges and might—in the event of PVS or permanent coma—die before the organism does. (For doubts on this score, see DeGrazia 2005, ch. 2).

Appealing to the authority of biologists and common sense, some philosophers (e.g., Olson 1997) charge as indefensible the claim that we (who are now) human persons were never presentient fetuses. One might also find puzzling the thesis that there is one definition of death, appealing to the capacity for consciousness, for human beings or persons and another definition, appealing to organismic functioning, for nonhuman animals and the human organisms associated with persons. It is open to the higher-brain theorist, however, to allow that there are also two closely associated beings in the case of sentient nonhuman animals—the minded being and the organism—with the death of, say, Lassie (the minded dog) occurring at her irreversible loss of consciousness (McMahan 2002, ch. 1). But some will find unattractive the failure to furnish a single conception of death that applies to all living things. To be sure, not everyone finds these objections compelling.

One of the most significant challenges confronting the present approach is to characterize cogently the relationship between one of us and the associated human organism. The relationship is clearly not identity—that is, being one and the same thing—because the organism originates before the mind, might outlive the mind, and therefore has different persistence conditions. This strongly suggests, perhaps surprisingly, that we human persons are not animals. If you are not identical to the human organism associated with you, then since there is at most one animal sitting in your chair, you are not she and are therefore not an animal (Olson 1997). Yet many consider it part of educated common sense that we are animals.

Might you be part of the organism associated with you—namely, the brain (more precisely, the portions of the brain associated with consciousness) (McMahan 2002, ch. 1)? But the brain seems capable of surviving death, when you are supposed to go out of existence. Are you then a functioning brain, which goes out of existence at the irreversible loss of consciousness? But it seems odd to identify the functioning brain—as distinct from the brain—as you. How could you be some organ only when it functions? Presumably you are a substance (see the entry on substance), a bearer of properties, not a substance only when it has certain properties. One might reply that the functioning brain is itself a substance, a substance distinct from the brain, but that, too, strains credibility. Might you instead be not the brain, but the mind understood as the conscious properties of the brain? That would imply that you are a set of properties, rather than a substance, which is no less counterintuitive. Note that the charge of incredibility is not directed at the assertion that the mind is the functioning brain, or is a set of brain properties, and not a distinct substance—a thesis in good standing in the philosophy of mind (see the entries on identity theory of mind and functionalism). The charge of incredibility is directed at the assertion that you are a set of properties and not a substance.[2]

Another possibility regarding the person/organism relationship is that the human organism constitutes the person it eventually comes to support (Baker 2000). One might even claim the legitimacy of saying—employing an “is” of constitution—that we are animals (or organisms), just as we can say that a statue constituted by a hunk of bronze, shaped in a particular way, is a hunk of bronze (ibid). Challenges to this reasoning includes doubts that we may legitimately speak of an “is” of constitution; if not, then the constitution view implies that we are not animals after all. Another challenge, which applies equally to the view that we minds are parts of organisms, concerns the counting of conscious beings. On either the constitution view or the part-whole view, you are essentially a being with the capacity for consciousness. Closely associated with you—without being (identical to) you, due to different persistence conditions—is a particular animal. But that animal, having a functioning brain, would also seem to be a conscious being. Either of these views, then, apparently suggests that for each of us there are two conscious beings, seemingly one too many. Despite such difficulties as these, the thesis that we are essentially minded beings remains a significant basis for the higher-brain approach to human death.

2.2 Appeals to Personal Identity

A second argumentative strategy in defense of the higher-brain approach claims to appeal to our personal identity while remaining agnostic on the question of our essence (Green and Wikler 1980). The fundamental claim is that, whatever we are essentially, it is clear that one of us has gone out of existence once the capacity for consciousness has been irreversibly lost, supporting the higher-brain standard of death. Clearly, though, any view of our numerical identity over time—our persistence conditions—is conceptually dependent on a view of what we essentially are (DeGrazia 1999; DeGrazia 2005, ch. 4). If we are essentially human animals, and not essentially beings with psychological capacities, then, contrary to the above argument, it is not clear—indeed, it is false—that we go out of existence upon irreversible loss of the capacity for consciousness; rather, we die upon the collapse of organismic functioning. The appeal to personal identity in support of the higher-brain standard depends on the thesis that we are essentially minded beings and therefore inherits the challenges facing this view, as discussed in the previous subsection. Nevertheless, the appeal to personal identity, construed as a distinct argumentative strategy, has been somewhat influential (see, e.g., President's Commission 1981, 38–9).

2.3 The Claim that the Definition of Death is a Moral Issue

Another prominent argumentative strategy in support of the higher-brain approach contends that the definition of death is a moral issue and that confronting it as such vindicates the higher-brain approach (see, e.g., Veatch 1975, 1993; Gervais 1986, ch. 6). In asking how to determine that a human has died, according to this argument, what we are really asking is when we ought to discontinue certain activities such as life-support efforts and initiate certain other activities such as organ donation, burial or cremation, grieving, change of a survivor's marital status, and transfer of property. The question, in other words, is when “death behaviors” are appropriate. This, the argument continues, is a moral question, so an answer to this question should be moral as well. Understood thus, the issue of defining human death is best addressed with the recognition that irreversible loss of the capacity for consciousness marks the time at which it is appropriate to commence death behaviors.

Is the definition of death really a moral issue? To say that someone has died does seem tantamount to saying that certain behaviors are now appropriate while certain others are no longer appropriate. But it hardly follows that the assertion of death is itself a moral claim. An alternative hypothesis is that the sense of moral import derives from the fact that certain moral premises—for example, that we shouldn't bury or cremate prior to death—are shared by virtually everyone. Moreover, the concept of death is (at least originally) at home in biology, which offers many instances in which a determination of death—say, of a gnat or a clover—seems morally unimportant. Rather than asserting that death itself is a moral concept, it might be more plausible to assert that death, a biological phenomenon, is generally assumed to be morally important—at least in the case of human beings—given a relatively stable background of social institutions and attitudes about “death behaviors.” Furthermore, due to the moral salience of human death, discussions about its determination are often prompted by a moral or pragmatic agenda such as interest in organ transplantation or concerns about expensive, futile treatment. But these observations do not imply that death is itself a moral concept.

Even if it were, it would hardly follow that the higher-brain standard is preferable to other standards. A person with relatively conservative instincts might hold that death behaviors are morally appropriate only when the whole-brain or cardiopulmonary standard has been met. We need to ask, therefore, what grounds exist for the claim—advanced by proponents of the higher-brain standard—that death behaviors are appropriate as soon as someone has irreversibly lost the capacity for consciousness. Perhaps the best possible grounds are that irreversible loss of consciousness entails an existence lacking in value for the unconscious individual herself. It appears, then, that the strongest specification of the present line of reasoning actually relies upon the next (and final) argumentative strategy to be considered—and may, as we will see, lead to the conclusion that we should permit individuals to select among several standards of death.

2.4 The Appeal to Prudential Value

The idea here is to defend the higher-brain approach on the basis of claims about prudential value (for a discussion, see DeGrazia 2005, 134–8). Conscious life, it is argued, is a precondition for virtually everything that we value in our lives. We have an enormous stake in continuing our lives as persons and little or no stake in continuing them when we are permanently unconscious. The capacity for consciousness is therefore essential not in a metaphysical sense connected to our persistence conditions, but in the evaluative sense of indispensable to us. One need not claim that the capacity for consciousness underlies everything of prudential value, just that it underlies the overwhelmingly greater part of what matters to us prudentially. And although, for many people, consciousness may not be sufficient for what matters prudentially—insofar as they find indispensable, say, some degree of self-awareness and meaningful interaction with others—it is certainly necessary; and the basic capacity for consciousness (as opposed to self-consciousness or personhood) is the only safe place to demarcate death for policy and social purposes. We should therefore regard irreversible loss of the capacity for consciousness as a human being's death—even if the original concept of death is biological and biological considerations favor some less progressive standard.

How persuasive is this case for the higher-brain approach? One might challenge the assumption that prudential, as opposed to moral, considerations ought to be decisive in adopting a standard for human death. On the other hand, as suggested in our discussion of the previous argumentative strategy, moral considerations may not favor a particular standard of death except insofar as they rest on prudential considerations—our present concern. But even if we accept the claim that human death should be understood on the basis of prudential values, we confront the prospect of reasonable pluralism about prudential value. While supporters of the higher-brain approach (who tend to be liberal intellectuals) are likely to have prudential values in line with this approach, many other people do not. If a patient has a stake in his family's need for closure should he enter a PVS—an interest that may be self-regarding as well as other-regarding—this fact would count against allowing the PVS to constitute death in his case. If an Orthodox Jew or conservative Christian believes that (biological) life is inherently precious to its possessor, even if the individual cannot appreciate its value at a given time, this would count against the higher-brain standard in the case of the individual in question. Perhaps, then, the appeal to prudential value favors not the higher-brain standard for everyone but a pro-choice view about standards of death. A jurisdiction might, for example, have one default standard of death but permit conscientious exemption from that standard and selection of a different one within some reasonable range of options.

In reply to this argument, a proponent of the appeal to prudential value might contend that it is simply irrational to value biological existence without the possibility of returning to consciousness. But this reply assumes the experience requirement: that only states of affairs that affect one's experience can affect one's well-being (for a discussion, see Griffin 1986, 16–19). The experience requirement is not self-evident. Some people believe that they are worse off for being slandered even if they never learn of the slander and its repercussions never affect their experience. Some even believe, following Aristotle's suggestion, that the quality of one's life as a whole can be affected by posthumous states of affairs such as tragedy befalling a loved one. Although the intelligibility of this belief in posthumous interests is questionable, the following is surely intelligible: States of affairs that don't affect one's experience but connect importantly with one's values can affect one's interests at least while one exists. Desire-based accounts of well-being (see, e.g., Hare 1981) standardly accept this principle, for what is desired may occur without one's awareness of its occurrence and without affecting one's experience. These considerations illuminate the intelligibility of one's prudential values extending to a period of time when one is alive but irreversibly unconscious.

In view of apparently reasonable pluralism regarding prudential values, including reasonable disagreement about the experience requirement, it seems doubtful that appeal to prudential value alone can support the higher-brain standard for everyone. At the same time, and more generally, the higher-brain approach remains an important contender in the debate over the definition of death.

3. A Proposed Return To Tradition: An Updated Cardiopulmonary Approach

Prior to the brain-death movement, death was traditionally understood along the lines of the cardiopulmonary standard: death as the irreversible cessation of cardiopulmonary function. In the supportive background of this consensus on the cardiopulmonary standard hovered several general definitions or conceptualizations of death. Some champions of the traditional standard (e.g., Becker 1975) have conceptualized death in the same organismic terms that proponents of the whole-brain standard invoke: death as the irreversible cessation of functioning of the organism as a whole. Other champions of tradition have conceptualized death in more spiritual terms such as the departure of the animating (or vital) principle or loss of the soul.

In determining whether someone was dead, one could check for a pulse, moisture on a mirror held in front of the mouth, or other indications that the heart and lungs were working. Before the development of respirators and other modern life-supports, a working heart and lungs indicated continuing brainstem function. As we have seen, however, modern life-supports permitted cardiopulmonary function without brain function, setting up a competition between traditional and whole-brain criteria for determining death. Although, as noted above, the whole-brain approach achieved near-consensus status, this approach is increasingly questioned and faces significant difficulties. Its difficulties and those facing the more radical higher-brain alternative have contributed to renewed interest in the traditional approach.

Further contributing to renewed interest in the traditional approach—and warranting a brief digression—is an approach to organ donation that capitalizes on the fact that current American legal standards for death are disjunctive, permitting satisfaction of either the whole-brain standard or the cardiopulmonary standard, whichever applies first, for a declaration of death. This approach to organ donation, called donation after cardiac death (DCD) or non-heart-beating organ donation, was very rare until instituted with much publicity by the University of Pittsburgh in the early 1990s in response to a perception that awaiting a neurological determination of death for (heart-beating, respirator-maintained) organ donors was insufficient to meet the demand for viable organs. In the Pittsburgh program, a respirator-dependent patient who had previously agreed to forgo life supports and donate vital organs is taken to an operating room and disconnected from the respirator, leading predictably to cardiac arrest. Two minutes after cardiac arrest, the patient is declared dead on the basis of the cardiopulmonary standard: “irreversible cessation of circulatory and respiratory functions.” This procedure allows organ procurement to commence very shortly after cardiac arrest, providing relatively fresh organs for transplant. (Organs, of course, would not be viable if medical staff awaited a declaration of total brain failure—which requires confirmatory tests hours after initial tests—in the patients in question, who will not incur total brain failure unless respirator support is discontinued.)

The practice of DCD, which has expanded to several medical centers, has provoked considerable controversy. Critics have charged that in DCD vital organs are removed before patients are really dead, implying that organ procurement kills the patients. Some proponents of the whole-brain approach argue that the patients are not yet dead because only total brain failure (or perhaps that of the brainstem) constitutes human death. But current law in its disjunctive form suggests otherwise—at least for legal purposes. Other critics of DCD charge that a patient cannot be dead two minutes after cardiac arrest because the loss of cardiopulmonary functioning is not irreversible: Victims of heart attack are sometimes revived more than two minutes after the arrest. One might reply that the loss of functioning is irreversible because, the patient having requested removal of life supports, no one may violate the patient's rights by resuscitating him or her (Tomlinson 1993). It seems fair to reply, however, that a decision not to resuscitate does not mean that resuscitation is impossible as suggested by the concept of irreversibility. Has the latter concept been conflated in DCD with the concept of permanence? Permanent loss of function does not imply that resuscitation is impossible, just that it will not occur.[3] These concerns about abandoning the standard of irreversible loss of cardiopulmonary function apply even to more modest proposals, such as that advanced by the Institute of Medicine (2000), in which a declaration of death and DCD proceed after a waiting period of five minutes: Resuscitation is sometimes possible more than five minutes after a heart attack. Proponents of DCD might reply that permanence, rather than irreversibility, is the appropriate standard in this context (see, e.g., Bernat 2006, 41) or that DCD represents an instance where it is permissible to remove vital organs from someone who is dying but not yet dead. Certainly, any proponent of DCD will see the current law's (disjunctive) acceptance of cardiopulmonary criteria for death as offering a major practical advantage over any policy that accepted only whole-brain criteria.

We return to the view of those who champion only the cardiopulmonary standard. Proponents of this approach believe that it correctly implies, contrary to competing standards, that a human body that is breathing and maintaining circulation is alive regardless of whether continuation of these functions requires external support (as with “brain-dead” patients, locked-in patients, and normal fetuses) (Shewmon 2001; Potts 2001). At the same time, the usual characterization of the traditional approach is problematic in suggesting that the difference between human life and death comes down to the state of two organs: heart and lungs. This reductionistic picture arguably obscures the holistic nature of bodily functioning.

A more realistic picture, some argue, features integrative unity as existing diffusely throughout the organism. As a leading proponent puts it, “What is of the essence of integrative unity is neither localized nor replaceable: namely the anti-entropic mutual interaction of all the cells and tissues of the body, mediated in mammals by circulating oxygenated blood” (Shewmon 2001, 473). On this view, the brain, like the heart and lungs, is a very important component of the interaction among body systems, but is not the supremely important integrator as suggested by the (mainstream) whole-brain approach. Nor is the functioning of other organs and bodily systems passively dependent on the brain. The brain's capacity to augment other systems presupposes their preexisting capacity to function. This is true even of a brain function as somatically integrating as the maintenance of body temperature: the “thermostat” may be in the brain, but the “furnace” is the energy metabolism diffused throughout the body. If not covered with blankets, brain-dead bodies will grow colder—but not comparably to corpses (ibid, 471).

Although a realistic picture of organismic functioning must be holistic, according to this updated traditional approach, it should also portray certain functions as central. Tradition is correct that respiration and circulation are especially crucial, but respiration is not simply lung function and circulation is not just a working heart. Both organs, after all, can be artificially replaced as the organism maintains integrated functioning. Respiration and circulation occur throughout the body as oxygenated blood circulates to different organs and bodily systems—a condition necessary and sufficient for the integrated organismic functioning that constitutes life. Unlike whole-brain and higher-brain death, loss of respiration and circulation leads relentlessly to the breakdown of cells, tissues, organs, bodily systems, and eventually the organism as a whole. Hence an updated traditional standard, which we might call the circulatory-respiratory standard: death as the irreversible cessation of circulatory-respiratory function.

The chief advantage of such an updated traditional approach, according to proponents, is that it most adequately characterizes the difference between life and death—where the latter is understood in terms of organismic functioning—in a full range of cases. Such cases include several that the whole-brain and higher-brain standards handle less plausibly such as prenatal human organisms prior to brain development as well as locked-in patients and “brain-dead” individuals whose vital functions are maintained with mechanical assistance. The present approach also avoids some of the conceptual problems facing the higher-brain approach, as discussed earlier.

Nevertheless, the traditional approach, whether updated or not, faces significant issues. One concern is that the approach overemphasizes our biological nature, suggesting we are nothing more than organisms, and by demoting the brain from prominence underemphasizes the mental life that is generally thought to distinguish our species from others. We human beings are not merely organisms or animals, the argument continues; we are also (after normal development) conscious beings and persons whose nature, one might say, is to transcend nature with culture. Our conception of human death should be faithful to a species self-image that does justice not only to our animality but also to our personhood. (Cf. Pallis 1999, 96).

Whole-brain (or brainstem) theorists and higher-brain theorists will extend this line of argument in different directions. The higher-brain theorist will suggest that our capacity for consciousness, a precondition for higher capacities and personhood, is so important that permanent loss of the basic capacity should count as death. The whole-brain theorist who develops the present line of reasoning will maintain greater contact with the organismic conception of death, stressing the brainstem's role in integrating vital functions and claiming either that (a) consciousness is a critical function of the organism, permitting it to interact adaptively to its environment (Bernat 1998), (b) consciousness is a characteristic aspect of the fundamental work of organisms like us, or (c) consciousness is crucial to our personhood, a feature no less important to what we are than our animality. The latter option, in effect, would move the whole-brain theorist to a dual-aspect understanding of human nature, as just discussed: human persons as essentially both persons and animals (or organisms).

A second major challenge confronting any traditional approach is the specter of highly unpalatable practical consequences. Currently the whole-brain standard is enshrined in law. Suppose we reversed legislative course and returned to traditional criteria (whether updated in formulation or not). Then a patient who satisfied whole-brain criteria would count as alive. Unless we overturned the “dead-donor rule”—the policy of permitting extraction of vital organs only from dead bodies—then it would be illegal to procure organs from these living patients who have incurred total brain failure; yet the viability of their organs would require maintaining respiration and circulation with life-supports. There is broad agreement that having to wait until traditional criteria are met to harvest organs would constitute a great setback to organ transplantation (even if donation after cardiac death, which invokes traditional criteria, is permitted). Moreover, a legal return to traditional criteria for death might lead physicians to feel they had lost the authority to discontinue treatment unilaterally—when a family requests continued treatment—upon a determination of total brain failure despite what many would consider the futility of further treatment. Furthermore, laws for determining death would have to be revised.

A defender of tradition might respond that we can avoid most of these unsavory consequences while legally adopting traditional criteria for determining death (see, e.g., DeGrazia 2005, 152–8). We could, for one thing, abandon the dead-donor rule, permitting the harvesting of vital organs when authorized by appropriate prospective consent of the donor even though taking the organs, by causing the donor's death, would instantiate killing. We could also authorize physicians—through hospital policies, professional guidelines, or laws—unilaterally to withdraw life-supports upon a declaration of total brain failure (perhaps even upon a determination of irreversible unconsciousness) in cases where continued treatment is unnecessary for organ procurement and appears otherwise futile. Not all of what are traditionally considered “death behaviors” need to be permanently anchored to a declaration of death. Thus we currently use advance directives and other considerations to justify withdrawal of life-supports in some circumstances, although several decades ago such withdrawal had to await a determination of death. There is no reason to regard further reforms of our practices surrounding death as beyond responsible consideration. Thus, despite rowing against the tide of the brain-death movement, the traditional approach has reclaimed the status of a serious contender in the debate over the definition of death.

4. Further Possibilities

In recent decades, the debate over the definition of death has generally been understood as a competition between the approaches discussed here: traditional, whole-brain (or brainstem), and higher-brain standards and their corresponding conceptualizations. Each of these approaches, however, makes certain assumptions that might be contested: (1) that death is more or less determinate, more event-like than process-like, (2) that there is a uniquely correct definition of death, which can be formulated in terms of necessary and jointly sufficient conditions, and (3) that human death is morally a very important marker. Now we will consider three nonstandard ways of thinking about death, each of which directly challenges one of these assumptions.

4.1 Death as a Process, Not a Determinate Event

Each of the approaches considered so far asserts the correctness of a single standard of death. Might different standards be appropriate for different purposes? If so, then the debate characterized in previous sections has reflected, to some extent, an exercise in futility: a search that wrongly seeks a determinate event, which can be captured by a single standard, rather than a process.

According to two authors who develop this line of reasoning, the nearly simultaneous emergence of organ transplantation and mechanical ventilators provoked three practical questions: (1) When may doctors take organs for transplantation? (2) When may doctors unilaterally discontinue treatment? (3) When is a patient dead for legal purposes and appropriately transferred to an undertaker? (Halevy and Brody 1993). Rather than assuming that one standard for death will adequately answer these three questions—a possibility rendered doubtful by the interminable debate over standards—we should answer each question on its merits, disaggregating death accordingly.

Providing one example of how these practical questions might be answered, the authors argue that organ procurement is appropriate when the whole-brain standard has been met (apparently precluding DCD), unilateral discontinuation of treatment is appropriate when the higher-brain standard has been met, and a patient should legally count as dead when traditional criteria have been met (ibid). (Here we need not consider the authors' specific arguments for these determinations.)

But why must each answer invoke a standard of death? An alternative would be to adopt an updated traditional standard, which would supply legal criteria for death, while denying that unilateral discontinuation of treatment and organ procurement must await death. To be sure, harvesting vital organs from living patients would require an exception to the dead-donor rule, the social risks of which might well be avoided if death were disaggregated along the lines suggested. But the alternative possibility of separating death from particular “death behaviors” motivates the question of whether there are further grounds for disaggregating death into a process.

A possible further ground is the thesis that life and death, although mutually exclusive states, are not exhaustive: “Although no organism can fully belong to both sets [life and death], organisms can be in many conditions (the very conditions that have created the debates about death) during which they do not fully belong to either. … Death is a fuzzy set,” (Brody 1999, 72). What are we to think of this proposal?

It seems undeniable that the boundary between life and death is not perfectly sharp. The specification of any standard will require some arbitrary line-drawing. Operationalizing the whole-brain standard requires a decision about which brain functions are too trivial to count and need not be tested for. Making a traditional standard clinically useful requires a cut-off point of some number of minutes without heartbeat or respiration for the loss of functioning to count as irreversible. A higher-brain approach needs criteria for determining what sorts of brain damage constitute irreversible loss of the capacity for consciousness and which count as reversible. Yet, while some arbitrariness is inevitable, and highlights a blurred boundary, the blurring in each instance concerns very specific criteria and clinical tests for determining that a standard has been met, not the standard itself. None of the blurred boundaries just considered is inconsistent with the claim that some standard is uniquely correct. Moreover, if essentialism regarding human persons is true—that is, if we human persons have an essence locating us in our most basic kind (e.g., animal, minded being)—this would strengthen the case for a uniquely correct standard by suggesting a foundation for one.

But we must consider the possibility that there is no correct standard. Perhaps death is no more determinate than adulthood. Some people are clearly adults and some people are clearly not adults. But, as any college professor knows, many people are ambiguously adults—mature enough to count as adults in some ways but not in others. Socially and legally, we treat 16-year-olds as adults for purposes of driving, 18-year-olds as adults for purposes of voting and bearing the full weight of criminal law, 21-year-olds as adult enough to drink alcoholic beverages, and so on. Nor is this disaggregation of adulthood incoherent or even particularly awkward; rather, it seems to fit the facts about the gradual development of maturity, acquisition of experience, and accumulation of birthdays. Disaggregating death, one might argue, would be similarly faithful to facts about the frequently very gradual demise of human persons.

Even if this argument persuades us that death is more process-like than event-like—and to do this it must persuade us that it is death itself, not dying, that is process-like—it does not follow that we ought to draw several lines for the determination of death. Consider the confusion that would likely result from such statements as “Grandmother is partly dead, but less dead than Grandfather, although he's not fully dead.” People are so accustomed to thinking of life and death as mutually exclusive, exhaustive sets that there would be considerable practical advantage in insisting on some sensible line that demarcates death in this way. It is true that disaggregating adulthood poses no insuperable practical difficulties, but death is importantly different. For we generally assume that one goes out of existence (at least in this world) at death, a rather momentous change with—at least in the status quo—far-reaching social and legal ramifications. Confusion as a result of plural lines for death may be more troubling and more likely, for the idea of someone's only partly existing is of questionable intelligibility. On the other hand, a proponent of disaggregating death might reply that (1) we could either reserve the language of death for the traditional standard or get used to the language of someone's being partially dead, and (2) we should appreciate that existence is sometimes partial as in the case of a half-assembled car.

4.2 Death as a Cluster Concept not Amenable to Classical Definition

Most discussions of the definition and determination of death assume that there is a uniquely correct definition of death. Definitions, classically understood, are supposed to state necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for the correct application of a word or concept. They may be thought to capture de re essences existing independently of human thought, language, and interests, or de dicto essences determined solely by linguistic meaning. The major approaches we have considered have tried both to define death by capturing its essence and to advance a standard for determining human death that coheres with the definition. But what if the term “death” cannot be defined in any such way?

One might insist that death can be defined, as the competing definitions demonstrate. But, of course, the trick is to define the term adequately. For example, the organismic definition—death as the irreversible cessation of functioning of the organism as a whole—makes no reference to consciousness. Yet surely, one might argue, any organism that maintains consciousness should count as alive even if the organism as a whole has irreversibly ceased to function (whether or not this possibility is merely theoretical). Definitions associated with the higher-brain approach—such as human death as the irreversible loss of mind—implausibly imply that a PVS patient is dead despite exhibiting spontaneous breathing and circulation, brainstem-mediated reflexes, and the like. The best explanation for the shortcomings of leading efforts to define death, the argument continues, is that death is not amenable to definition in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions (Chiong 2005). Let's consider two distinct ways this thesis might be developed.

First, one might argue that the concept of death exhibits only “family resemblance” relations among its instances, as Wittgenstein argued was the case for the concepts of game, language, and many others (Wittgenstein 1953). There are various features of an organism that count towards its being dead, yet there is no authoritative list of features all of which must be satisfied for it to be dead. Each of the following, for example, seems relevant: unconsciousness, absence of spontaneous efforts to breathe, absence of heartbeat, inertness, lack of integrated bodily functions, incapacity to grow, and physical decay. If all of these conditions are present, an organism has surely died. But producing an authoritative shortlist of necessary and sufficient conditions seems futile. One scholar has advanced a parallel claim about the concept of life:

When some property is central to the cluster—as I've argued consciousness is—then possessing only this one property may be sufficient for membership in [the class of living things]. However, merely possessing one or several properties that are peripheral to the cluster may not be sufficient for membership. [S]ome robots are organizationally complex and functionally responsive, though intuitively not alive (Chiong 2005, 26).

Another direction in which to take the thesis that death is not amenable to classical definition is to argue that death is a natural kind whose essence may be obscure. Kripke influentially argued that natural kinds—kinds determined by nature rather than by human thinking, language, or interests—often resist adequate definition because their essential features may be entirely unknown to those referring to the kind in question (Kripke 1970). To define a term by reference to the features people originally used to pick out the kind in question won't do, because those features may be accidental, not essential, and speakers may even be mistaken about them. Those naming the kind whale might have thought whales were the largest fish in the ocean, but whales aren't fish and their size relative to other creatures is a contingent matter. We can refer meaningfully to whales, to the creatures picked out by the term whale (the name for the kind), without knowing the essential features of whales, features likely to involve subtle biological details. Perhaps death, too, is a natural kind whose essence is obscure (a possibility entertained in Chiong 2005, 24–25). A likely challenge to this argument is that we already know a great deal about the physical processes involved in death, making it unlikely that death has a hidden essence the failure to discover which impedes adequate definition.

Importantly, though, one can claim that death is a natural kind without accepting any kind of essentialism. An alternative to the essentialist conception is the homeostatic property cluster theory of natural kinds (Millikan 1999). On this view, natural kinds do not, or at least need not, share essential properties. They are comprised by members sharing a stable cluster of similarities, which are brought about by “homeostatic causal mechanisms” (such as, in the case of species, common developmental programs and selective pressures). On this view, X (e.g., a fetus) might be a member of a natural kind (e.g., our species) despite lacking one of the properties (e.g., potentiality for rationality) among the cluster of similarities. Death and its opposite, life, might similarly be natural kinds lacking essences, each kind being associated with a cluster of properties that tend to go together and support one another without being necessarily coinstantiated (see, e.g., Chiong 2005). If so, death cannot be defined in a set of necessary and sufficient conditions—in which case no such definition can justify a particular standard.

If death has no essence and resists definition, what is the upshot? One possible inference—that the boundaries of death are vague—would partially merge this approach with the previous one, which construed death as a process. We have noted that one response to the claim of vague boundaries (the response favored in the previous approach) is to embrace several lines, each for a different purpose, in determining death. Another possibility is to understand the vague boundaries as inviting discretion in the matter of producing a single standard of death. So long as a particular standard does not have clear and highly implausible implications, it is admissible for consideration on this view. Society may then select, among admissible standards, whichever is most attractive for practical purposes. It has been argued, along these lines, that the higher-brain standard is inadmissible for implying that those in PVS are dead while the traditional cardiopulmonary standard is inadmissible for implying (in principle) that a still-conscious individual might be dead, clearing the ground for the whole-brain standard, which has no fatal implications and is attractive from a practical standpoint (Chiong 2005).

Having already explored difficulties (and strengths) of each standard, how might we evaluate the more general thesis that death is not amenable to classical definition? One strategy open to critics of this reasoning, of course, is to argue that some definition is adequate. Another is to defend the disaggregation of death, as previously discussed. A third strategy would be to argue that our failure thus far to produce an adequate definition does not mean that none is possible. Some concepts can be adequately captured by classical definitions even if it is difficult to produce them. It would appear premature, therefore, to render a judgment on the success of the present approach to understanding human death.

4.3 Death as Separable from Moral Concerns

A final assumption underlying the mainstream discussion of the definition of death is that human death is a morally crucial marker. Were it not, then accuracy in the definition of death would be of purely ontological, conceptual, or scientific interest. This attitude, of course, is not the prevailing one. Not only do we tend to regard many behaviors as appropriate only if an individual has died; the criminal law treats as momentous the question of whether one person has killed—that is, caused the death of—another person, even if such considerations as motive, deliberation, and special circumstances are also important.

It is not difficult to see, though, how one might challenge this presumption of death's moral salience. After all, we have already begun to remove certain behaviors from the class of death behaviors. For example, in many circumstances termination of life supports need not await a patient's death. And, as we have noted, there are calls to abandon the dead-donor rule in the context of organ transplantation. We might go further in separating death from the cluster of moral concerns traditionally associated with it. For example, without embracing the higher-brain approach to death, we could hold that irreversible loss of the capacity of consciousness entails a loss of moral status, at which point traditional death behaviors are appropriate (Persson 2002). We might even overhaul the criminal law with respect to killing:

It is then the irrevocable loss of the capacity for consciousness that is the great loss; so it is for the causing of it that criminal law should mete out the severest punishment. Killing, or the causing of (biological) death, should be punished to this degree only if, as is normally the case, it brings along the irrevocable loss of the capacity for consciousness (ibid, 32).

One implication of this proposal is that harvesting organs from PVS patients, thereby killing them, would not be punishable insofar as these patients, having irrevocably lost the capacity for consciousness, have already suffered “the great loss” and no longer possess moral status. Some attracted to this approach will want to argue further that the crime of murder is really that of causing the irrevocable loss of the capacity for consciousness without first obtaining voluntary, informed consent from the person to be killed. The italicized qualification would create conceptual space for a justification of active euthanasia (see the entry on voluntary euthanasia).

The present proposal to separate the issue of death from what is morally important is somewhat radical. Yet its chief ground for doing so, the claim that the capacity for consciousness is what underlies moral status, cannot be dismissed. On the other hand, this claim apparently relies on the thesis (which we considered in connection with the higher-brain approach) that only what affects one's experience can affect one's interests. As we saw, this thesis is far from self-evident. For those who disagree with it, the time of death—the time at which one no longer exists (at least in this world)—is likely to retain some of the moral importance traditionally accorded to it. Moreover, even if the philosophical case for demoting the moral importance of death were airtight, we cannot responsibly dismiss widely held sensibilities, including those at odds with the present approach, in constructing public policies concerning death. Certainly it is contestable to what extent the public could embrace further demotion of the moral importance of death, and to what extent its limited ability to do so matters for public policy.

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Other Important Works

  • Bernat, J.L., 2006, “Are Organ Donors after Cardiac Death Really Dead?” Journal of Clinical Ethics 17: 122–32.
  • Culver, C. and B. Gert, 1982, Philosophy in Medicine, New York: Oxford University Press, ch. 10.
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  • Institute of Medicine, 2006, Organ Donation: Opportunities for Action, Washington, DC: National Academy Press.
  • Jonas, H., 1974, “Against the Stream,” in H. Jonas, Philosophical Essays: From Ancient Creed to Technological Man, Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • KIEJ, 1993, “Ethical, Psychosocial, and Public Policy Implications of Procuring Organs from Non-Heart-Beating Cadavers,” Kennedy Institute of Ethics Journal, 3 (2): 103–278.
  • Lizza, J., 2007, Persons, Humanity, and the Definition of Death (Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 2007)
  • Pallis, C., 1983, The ABC of Brain Death, London: British Medical Journal Publishers.
  • Shewmon, D. A., 2004, “The ‘Critical Organ’ for the Organism as a Whole: Lessons from the Lowly Spinal Cord,” Advances in Experimental Medicine and Biology, 550: 23–42.
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  • Veatch, R., 1976, Death, Dying, and the Biological Revolution, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Youngner, S., R. Arnold, and R. Shapiro (eds.), 1999, The Definition of Death: Contemporary Controversies, Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Zaner, R. (ed.), 1988, Death: Beyond Whole-Brain Criteria, Dordrecht, the Netherlands: Kluwer.

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afterlife | consciousness | death | doing vs. allowing harm | euthanasia: voluntary | functionalism | mind/brain identity theory | necessary and sufficient conditions | personal identity | personal identity: and ethics | self: the biological notion of | substance | vagueness

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