This article considers several questions concerning death and its ramifications.
First, what constitutes death? It is clear enough that people die when their lives end, but less clear what constitutes the ending of a person's life.
Second, in what sense might death or posthumous events harm us? To answer this question, we will need to know what it is for something to be in our interests.
Third, what is the case for and the case against the harm thesis, the claim that death can harm the individual who dies, and the posthumous harm thesis, according to which events that occur after an individual dies can still harm that individual?
Fourth, how might we solve the timing puzzle? This puzzle is the problem of locating the time during which we incur harm for which death and posthumous events are responsible.
A fifth controversy concerns whether all deaths are misfortunes or only some. Of particular interest here is a dispute between Thomas Nagel, who says that death is always an evil, since continued life always makes good things accessible, and Bernard Williams, who argues that, while premature death is a misfortune, it is a good thing that we are not immortal, since we cannot continue to be who we are now and remain meaningfully attached to life forever.
A final controversy concerns whether or not the harmfulness of death can be reduced. It may be that, by adjusting our conception of our well-being, and by altering our attitudes, we can reduce or eliminate the threat death poses us. But there is a case to be made that such efforts backfire if taken to extremes.
- 1. Death
- 2. Misfortune
- 3. The Harm Theses
- 4. The Timing Puzzle
- 5. Is Death Always a Misfortune?
- 6. Can Death's Harmfulness be Reduced?
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- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Death is life's ending. To clarify death further, we will need to say a bit about the nature of life, and ask whether life can be suspended or restored, and how it relates to our continued existence. We can also distinguish between the concept of death and criteria by which death can be detected.
1.1 Life and Death
It is not easy to clarify the nature of life. Suppose we could construct a machine, the HAL 1.01, with (nearly) all of the psychological attributes of persons: would HAL 1.01 be alive? Probably not, given the nature of HAL's hardware. It seems that being conscious does not entail being alive. Still, to the extent that we are puzzled about the nature of life, we will be puzzled about what is entailed by the ending of life, that is, death.
Things that are alive have a distinctive capacity to develop or maintain themselves by engaging in various processes including chemosynthesis, photosynthesis, cellular respiration, cell generation, and maintenance of homeostasis. Let us call these vital processes. It is one thing to have the capacity to deploy these processes and another to actually deploy them, just as there is a difference between having the ability to run and actually running. For something to have the property ‘alive’ seems to be a matter of its having the capacity to sustain itself using processes that are saliently similar to these. (For accounts of life, see Van Inwagen 1990 and Bedau 2014.)
By contrast, the property ‘dead’ seems applicable to something that has lost this capacity. We can call this the loss of life account of death. The event by which the capacity to employ vital processes is lost is one thing and the condition of having lost it is another. ‘Death’ can refer to either.
Let us add that ‘the ending of life’ is itself potentially ambiguous. On one hand it might be a process wherein our lives are progressively extinguished, until finally they are gone. On the other it might be a momentary event. This event might be understood in three ways. First, it might be the ending of the dying process—the loss of the very last trace of life. Call this ‘denouement death’. Second, it might be the point in the dying process when extinction is assured, at least given the resources available to prevent it. Call this moment ‘threshold death’. A third possibility is that life ends when the physiological systems of the body have lost the capacity to function as an integrated whole, or when this loss becomes irreversible (Belshaw 2009; DeGrazia 2014). Call this ‘integration death’.
Thus death can be a state (being dead), the process of extinction (dying), or one of three events that occur during the dying process. Death in all of these senses can be further distinguished from events—such as being shot with an arrow—that cause death.
1.2 Death and Suspended Animation
The loss of life account of death has been challenged by theorists who claim that things placed in suspended animation are not alive (Feldman 1992, Christopher Belsaw 2009, Cody Gilmore 2013, and David DeGrazia 2014). When zygotes and embryos are frozen for later use in the in vitro fertilization procedure, their vital processes are brought to a stop, or very nearly so. The same goes for water bears that are dehydrated, and for seeds and spores. It seems clear that the zygotes and water bears are not dead, since their vital processes can easily be restarted—by warming the zygote or by wetting the water bear. They are not dead, but are they alive? If we deny that they are alive, presumably we would do so on the grounds that their vital processes are halted. If something's life can be ended by suspending its vital processes without its dying, then we must reject the loss of life account of death.
However, the loss of life account is thoroughly established in ordinary usage, and is easily reconciled with the possibility of suspended animation. In denying that frozen embryos are dead, it is clear that we mean to emphasize that they have not lost the capacity to deploy their vital processes. When we say that something is dead, we mean to emphasize that this capacity has been lost. Having used ‘dead’ to signal this loss, why would we want to use the word ‘alive’ to signal the fact that something is making active use of its vital processes? Our best option is to use a pair of contrasting terms. We can use ‘viable’ to indicate that something has the capacity to deploy vital processes and ‘unviable’ to indicate that it has lost this capacity. When instead we are concerned about whether or not something is engaging its vital processes, we can use different contrasting terms, say ‘vital’ and ‘nonvital’, the former to characterize something that is employing its capacity for vital processes and the latter to characterize something that is not making use of its capacity for vital processes. What seems relatively uncontroversial is that being dead consists in unviability. To retain the loss of life account, we have only to add that being alive consists in viability. We can then say that a frozen embryo is viable and hence alive despite its lack of vitality, and it will die if its life ends (it will die if it ceases to be viable). Of course, if we are willing to abandon the loss of life account, we could instead use ‘alive’ to characterize something that is both viable and vital. We would then say that a frozen embryo is not alive (since it lacks vitality) but also that it is not dead (since it remains viable).
It will be useful to sharpen the loss of life account if, as seems conceivable, it is possible to restore life to something that has died.
Restoration in this sense is quite different from the revival of something, such as a frozen embryo, whose vital processes have been halted. Something can be revived only if it is alive—only if it has the capacity to deploy vital processes, as in the case of a frozen zygote. It is revived when it regains vitality. Something's life can be restored only if it has lost its capacity for vital processes. Life is restored when this capacity is regained.
To bring the possibility of restoration into view, imagine a futuristic device, the Disassembler-Reassembler, that reduces me to small cubes, or individual cells, or disconnected atoms, which it stores and later reassembles just as they were before. Many of us will say that I would survive—my life would continue—after Reassembly, but it is quite clear that I would not live during intervals when my atoms are stacked in storage. I would not even exist during such intervals. If I can be Reassembled, my life would be restored, not revived. Restoration, not revival, is a way of bringing a creature back from the dead. Now imagine a device that repairs corpses: it moves molecules back to where they were prior to the death of the creature that left the corpse, and restarts its vital processes. Like the Disassembler-Reassembler, the corpse reanimator would resurrect the dead—it would restore the lives of people who have died.
Given the possibilities of restoration and revivification, it seems best to refine the loss of life account, as follows:
Dying is the loss of a thing's life—the loss of its capacity to perpetuate itself using vital processes. A thing dies at the time it loses this capacity. It is dead at all times afterwards, except while that capacity is regained.
1.4 Death and What We Are
Death for you and me is constituted by the loss of our capacity to sustain ourselves using vital processes. This characterization of death could be sharpened if we had a clearer idea of what we are, and the conditions under which we persist. However, the latter is a matter of controversy.
There are three main views: animalism, which says that we are human beings (Snowdon 1990, Olson 1997, 2007); personism, which says that we are creatures with the capacity for self-awareness; and mindism, which says that we are minds (which may or may not have the capacity for self-awareness) (McMahan 2002). Animalism suggests that we persist over time just in case we remain the same animal; mindism suggests that we persist just when we remain the same mind. Personism is usually paired with the view that our persistence is determined by our psychological features and the relations among them (Locke 1689, Parfit 1984).
If we are animals, with the persistence conditions of animals, our deaths are constituted by the cessation of the vital processes that sustain our existence as human beings. If we are minds, our deaths are constituted by the extinction of the vital processes that sustain our existence as minds. And if persistence is determined by our retaining certain psychological features, then the loss of those features will constitute death.
These three ways of understanding death have very different implications. Severe dementia can destroy a great many psychological features without destroying the mind, which suggests that death as understood by personists can occur even though death as understood by mindists has not. Moreover, human beings sometimes survive the destruction of the mind, as when the cerebrum dies but the brainstem does not, leaving an individual in a persistent vegetative state. It is also conceivable that the mind can survive the extinction of the human being: this might occur if the brain is removed from the body, kept alive artificially, and the remainder of the body is destroyed (assuming that a bare brain is not a human being). These possibilities suggest that death as understood by mindists can occur even though death as understood by animalists has not (and also that the latter sort of death need not be accompanied by the former.)
1.5 Death and Existence
What is the relationship between existence and death? May people and other creatures continue to exist after dying, or cease to exist without dying?
Take the first question: may you and I and other creatures continue to exist for some time after our lives end? The view that death entails our annihilation has been called the termination thesis (Feldman 1992). The position that we can indeed survive death we might call the dead survivors view. The dead survivors view has been defended by various theorists, most notably Fred Feldman (1992, 2000, 2013). One point cited in its favor is that we commonly refer to ‘dead animals’ (and ‘dead plants’) which may suggest that we believe that animals continue to exist, as animals, while no longer alive. The idea might be that an animal continues to count as the same animal if enough of its original components remain in much the same order, and animals continue to meet this condition for a time following death (Mackie 1997). On this view, if you and I are animals (as animalists say) then we could survive for a time after we are dead, albeit as corpses. In fact, we could survive indefinitely, by arranging to have our corpses preserved.
However, this way of defending the dead survivors view may not be decisive. The terms ‘dead animal’ and ‘dead person’ seem ambiguous. Normally, when we use ‘dead people’ or ‘dead animal’ we mean to speak of persons or animals who lived in the past. One dead person I can name is Socrates; he is now a ‘dead person’ even though his corpse surely has ceased to exist. However, in certain contexts, such as in morgues, we seem to use the terms ‘dead animal’ and ‘dead person’ to mean “remains of something that was an animal” or “remains of something that was a person.” On this interpretation, even in morgues calling something a dead person does not imply that it is a person.
What about the second question: can creatures cease to exist without dying? Certainly things that never were alive, such as bubbles and statues, can be deathlessly annihilated. Arguably, there are also ways that living creatures can be deathlessly annihilated (Rosenberg 1983, Feldman 1992, Gilmore 2013). Perhaps an amoeba's existence ends when it splits, replacing itself with two amoebas, and the existence of chlamydomonas ends when pairs of them fuse to form a zygote. Yet when amoebas split, and chlamydomonas fuse, the vital processes that sustain them do not cease. If people could divide like amoebas, perhaps they, too could cease to exist without dying. (For a famous discussion of division, fusion, and their implications, see Parfit 1981.) If such ‘deathless exits’ are possible, we would have to modify the loss of life account of death.
However, proponents of that account can hold their ground. They can say that division, fusion, and other apparent examples of deathless exits are unusual ways of dying, because nonexistence is not brought about via the destruction of vital processes, but they are not ways of escaping death altogether. Proponents of the loss of life account might also turn the tables on its critics, and argue as follows: nothing can be alive unless it exists, so if something ceases to exist it ceases to be alive, but to cease to be alive is to die. So there are no deathless exits after all.
1.6 Criteria for Death
Defining death is one thing; providing criteria by which it can be readily detected or verified is another. A definition is an account of what death is; when, and only when its definition is met, death has necessarily occurred. A criterion for death, by contrast, lays out conditions by which all and only actual deaths may be readily identified. Such a criterion falls short of a definition, but plays a practical role. For example, it would help physicians and jurists determine when death has occurred.
In the United States, the states have adopted criteria for death modeled on the Uniform Determination of Death Act (developed by the President's Commission, 1981), which says that “an individual who has sustained either (1) irreversible cessation of circulatory and respiratory functions, or (2) irreversible cessation of all functions of the entire brain, including the brain stem, is dead. A determination of death must be made in accordance with accepted medical standards.” In the United Kingdom, the accepted criterion is brain stem death, or the “permanent functional death of the brain stem” (Pallis 1982).
These current criteria are subject to criticism, even if we put aside reservations concerning the qualifier ‘irreversible’. Animalists might resist the criteria since the vital processes of human beings whose entire brains have ceased to function can be sustained artificially using cardiopulmonary assistance. Mindists and personists might also resist the criteria, on the grounds that minds and all psychological features can be destroyed in human beings whose brain stems are intact. For example, cerebral death can leave its victim with an intact brain stem, yet mindless and devoid of self-awareness.
May death or posthumous events harm us? Might they benefit us? Perhaps; in order to decide, we will need an analysis of welfare, which tells us what well-being is and how well off we are. We will also need an account of personal interests, which tells us what it is for something to be in our interests or against our interests.
The most widely accepted account of our interests is comparativism. In order to clarify comparativism, it is best to distinguish different senses in which an event can have value.
Some events are intrinsically good (or bad) for a subject; such events are good (bad) for their own sakes, rather than in virtue of their contingent effects. By contrast, some events are extrinsically good (bad) for a subject; they are good (bad) because of their contingent effects. For example, many people count their pleasure as intrinsically good and their pain as intrinsically bad; aspirin would be extrinsically good, since it eliminates pain, and really bad puns would be extrinsically bad in that they are painful.
Events can have value in a different way: they can be overall good (bad) for a subject; that is, they can be good (bad) all things considered. Events are overall good (bad) for me when (and to the extent that) they make my life better (worse) than it would be if those events had not occurred. Contrast events that are partially good (bad) for me: these make my life better (worse) only in some respects. Partial goods may be overall bad for me. For example, playing video games every day gives me pleasure, and is hence partially good for me, but if it also causes me to neglect my job, health and family, it might well be overall bad for me.
According to comparativism, the value an event E has for me is roughly E's overall value for me. But let us attempt to formulate the comparativist account a bit more precisely.
To assess the value for me of an event E, we begin by distinguishing two possible situations, or possible worlds. One of these is the actual world, which is the world as it actually is, past present and future. The other is the possible world that is the way things would be if E had not occurred. We can assume that this is the world that is as similar to the actual world as possible, and in that way ‘closest’ to the actual world, except that E does not occur, and various other things are different because of E's nonoccurrence. We can call the actual world WE, in this way reminding ourselves that E actually occurred. And by W~E we can indicate the closest world to the actual world in which E does not occur. Here the tilde, ‘~’, stands for ‘not’.
The next step is to assess my welfare level in WE and my welfare level in W~E. My welfare level in WE is the intrinsic value for me of my life in WE; it is the value my life actually has for me, measured in terms of intrinsic goods and intrinsic evils. To calculate my welfare level in WE, we start by assigning a value to my intrinsic goods in WE. This will be a positive value representing the sum of these goods. Next we assign a value to my intrinsic evils in WE; this will be a negative value. Next we sum these values; the goods will raise this sum, while the evils will lower it. Some symbolism might help fix ideas (although it may give the false impression that our subject matter admits of more precision that is actually possible). Let G(S,W) stand for the sum of the values of S's intrinsic goods in world W, and let B(S,W) stand for the sum of the values of S's intrinsic evils in W. So far we have said that S's welfare level in WE equals G(S,WE) + B(S,WE). If we let IV(S,W) stand for the intrinsic value of world W for subject S, the claim is that
IV(S,WE) = G(S,WE) + B(S,WE).
My welfare level in W~E is assessed similarly; it is the sum of my intrinsic goods and evils in W~E.
Finally, we subtract the value for me of my life in W~E from the value for me of my life in WE. According to comparativism, this is the value E has for me. Letting V(S,E) stand for the value of E for subject S, comparativism says that
V(S,E) = IV(S,WE) − IV(S,W~E).
This value determines whether an event is overall bad (good) for a subject S. If E's value for S is negative, that is, if V(S,E) < 0, then E is overall bad for S. If E's value is positive, then E is overall good for S. The more negative (positive) E's value is, the worse (better) E is for S.
Consider an example. Suppose that we are looking to identify the value for me of drinking this cup of coffee. Call this event Drink. Then the first step is to distinguish the actual world, WDrink, in which I drank the coffee, from the closest world in which I did not, W~Drink. Then we calculate my welfare level in WDrink, IV(Luper,WDrink) and in W~Drink, IV(Luper,W~Drink). The former, IV(Luper,WDrink), equals the value of the intrinsic goods I will enjoy in my life plus the value of the intrinsic evils I will endure. For simplicity, let us pull a number out of the hat to indicate the value of the goods I will enjoy in my life before I drink the coffee, say 100, and another number to indicate the value of the evils I will endure in my life before I drink the coffee, say −50. Let us also assume that drinking the coffee will give me some pleasure for one hour, which has a value of 10, and drinking the coffee will not cause me to endure any evils. Finally, let us assume that after that hour of savoring my coffee, I will go on to enjoy goods with a value of 50, and evils with a value of −10. Then IV(Luper,WDrink) = 100 + 10 + 50 + −50 + 0 + −10 = 100. Assuming that my life one hour after drinking my coffee would be just like my life would have been were I not to drink my coffee, more or less, so that drinking my coffee benefits me only during the hour I savor it, we can say that IV(Luper,W~Drink) = 100 + 0 + 50 + −50 + 0 + −10 = 90. Given these assumptions, V(Luper,WDrink) = IV(Luper,WDrink) − IV(Luper,W~Drink) = 100 − 90 = 10. Drinking the coffee, then, was good for me, as 10 is a positive value.
We can now offer a rough statement of the comparativist account of interests.
An event E is in S's interests just in case E overall benefits (is good for) S, making S's life better than it would have been if E had not occurred, which E does just when its value for S is positive. An event E is against S's interests just in case E overall harms (is bad for) S, making S's life worse than it would have been if E had not occurred, which E does just when its value for S is negative. How much E benefits (harms) S depends on how much better (worse) S's life is in the actual world than it would have been if E had not occurred: the better (worse) S's life is, the more beneficial (harmful) E is.
In order to refine the comparativist account, we will need to distinguish between event tokens and event types. Event tokens are concrete events, such as the bombing of the World Trade Center. Event types are abstract entities such as bombings, leapings and burials. One token of the type bombing is the bombing of the World Trade Center. Earlier we used the letter ‘E’ to refer to event tokens rather than event types. What is more, we assumed that the event tokens to which ‘E’ referred were actual events, not merely possible events. But perhaps we can also offer a comparativist account of the value of the occurrence of an E-type event; that is, a comparativist account of how valuable it would be for a subject S if an event of type E were to occur.
To this end, we might assess the value for S of the occurrence of an E-type event by working out S's welfare level in the actual world (where presumably an E-type event did not occur) then S's welfare level in the closest world in which an E-type event does occur, and subtracting the first from the second. When the result is a positive value, the occurrence of an E-type event would be good for S; when negative, the occurrence would be bad for S.
In sum, the comparativist view may be stated as follows:
Comparativist Account of Interests:
- An event E is in S's interests just in case E overall benefits (is good for) S, making S's life better than it would have been if E did not occur, which E does just when its value for S is positive.
- An event E is against S's interests just in case E overall harms (is bad for) S, making S's life worse than it would have been if E did not occur, which E does just when its value for S is negative.
- The occurrence of an E-type event is in S's interests just in case it would overall benefit (be good for) S. The occurrence of an E-type event would benefit S if and only if its value for S is positive.
- The occurrence of an E-type event is against S's interests just in case it would overall harm (be bad for) S. The occurrence of an E-type event would harm S if and only if its value for S is negative.
- How much E benefits (harms) S depends on how much better (worse) S's life is in the actual world than it would have been if E had not occurred: the better (worse) S's life is, the more beneficial (harmful) E is. Similarly, how much the occurrence of an E-type event would benefit (harm) S depends on how much worse (better) S's life is in the actual world than it would have been if an E-type event had occurred: the worse (better) S's life is, the more beneficial (harmful) the occurrence of an E-type event would have been.
We sometimes say things that suggest that we can have interests at particular times which we lack at others. For example, we might say that having a tooth drilled by a dentist is not in our interests while we are undergoing the procedure, even though it is in our long-term interests. The idea seems to be that what makes a subject S better off at time t is in S's interests-at-time-t. But it is important to distinguish interests-at-t from interests. What is in our interests-at-time-t1 need not be in our interests-at-time-t2. This is not true of our interests. Whatever interests we have we have at all times. If something is in our interests, it is timelessly in our interests.
Comparativism analyses our interests in terms of our welfare, and is compatible with any number of views of welfare. There are three main ways of understanding welfare itself: positive hedonism, preferentialism, and pluralism. Let us briefly consider each of these three views.
Positive hedonism is the following position:
Positive Hedonism: for any subject S, experiencing pleasure at t is the one and only thing that is intrinsically good for S at t, while experiencing pain at t is the one and only thing that is intrinsically bad for S at t. The more pleasure (pain) S experiences at t, the greater the intrinsic good (evil) for S at t.
Positive hedonism has been defended (by J.S.Mill 1863) on the grounds that it resolves the problem of commensurability. The difficulty arises when we attempt to equate units of different sorts of goods. For example, how do we decide when one unit of love is worth one unit of achievements, assuming that both love and achievements are intrinsically good? The problem does not arise for hedonists, who evaluate all things in terms of the pleasure and pain that they give us.
However, most theorists consider positive hedonism to be implausible. Nagel argues that I would harm you if I were to cause you to revert to a pleasant infantile state for the rest of your life, yet by hedonist standards I have not harmed you at all. Similarly, it would be a grave misfortune for you if your spouse came to despise you, but for some reason pretended to love you, so that you underwent no loss of pleasure. And Nozick notes that we would refuse to attach ourselves to an Experience Machine that would give us extremely pleasant experiences for the rest of our lives. By hypothesis, the Machine would give us far more pleasure (and less pain) than is otherwise possible. Our reluctance to use the Machine suggests that things other than pleasure are intrinsically good: it is because we do not wish to miss out on these other goods that we refuse to use the Machine.
Preferentialism assesses welfare in terms of desire fulfillment. To desire is to desire that some proposition P hold; when we desire P, P is the object of our desire. According to preferentialism, our welfare turns on whether the objects of our desires hold:
Preferentialism: for any subject S, it is intrinsically good for S at t that, at t, S desires P and P holds; it is intrinsically bad for S at t that, at t, S desires P and ~P holds. The stronger S's desire for P is, the better (worse) it is for S that P holds (~P holds).
In this, its unrefined form, preferentialism is implausible. Many of the things we desire do not appear to contribute to our welfare. Consider, for example, Rawls' famous example of the man whose main desire is to count blades of grass. In response to the grass counter case, Rawls (1971) adopts critical preferentialism, which says that welfare is advanced by the fulfillment of rational aims. Assuming that counting grass blades is irrational because it is pointless, fulfilling the desire to count grass blades is not intrinsically good. However, even critical preferentialism seems vulnerable to attack, since the fulfillment of rational desires need not advance one's welfare. Parfit (1984) illustrates the point by supposing that you have the (rational) desire that a stranger's disease be overcome: the fulfilment of this desire advances the stranger's welfare, not yours. This example can be handled by egocentric preferentialism, which says that only desires that make essential reference to the self can advance our welfare when fulfilled (Overvold 1980). Thus the fulfilment of my desire that I be happy is intrinsically good for me, but the fulfilment of my desire that somebody or other be happy is not. A further variant of preferentialism might be called achievement preferentialism. This view says that subject S's accomplishing one of S's goals (or ends) is intrinsically good for S, and that being thwarted from accomplishing such a goal is intrinsically bad for S (Scanlon 1998; Keller 2004; Portmore 2007).
Pluralism is the third main account of welfare. Pluralists can agree with the hedonist position that a person's pleasure is intrinsically good for that person, and with the preferentialist's view that the fulfilment of a person's desire is intrinsically good for that person. However, pluralism says that various other sorts of things are intrinsically good, too. Some traditional examples are wisdom, friendship and love, and honor. Another example might be engaging in self-determination.
Typically, those who value life accept the harm thesis: death is, at least sometimes, bad for those who die, and in this sense something that ‘harms’ them. (Several theorists, including Barbara Levenbook (2013), emphasize that, in one sense of the term ‘harm’, events that are only partially bad for me might be said to harm me. In what follows the term ‘harm’ will be restricted to events that are overall bad for me.) It is important to know what to make of this thesis, since our response itself can be harmful. This might happen as follows: suppose that we love life, and reason that since it is good, more would be better. Our thoughts then turn to death, and we decide it is bad: the better life is, we think, the better more life would be, and the worse death is. At this point, we are in danger of condemning the human condition, which embraces life and death, on the grounds that it has a tragic side, namely death. It will help some if we remind ourselves that our situation also has a good side. Indeed, our condemnation of death is here based on the assumption that more life would be good. But such consolations are not for everyone. (They are unavailable if we crave immortality on the basis of demanding standards by which the only worthwhile projects are endless in duration, for then we will condemn the condition of mere mortals as tragic through and through, and may, as Unamuno (1913) points out, end up suicidal, fearing that the only life available is not worth having.) And a favorable assessment of life may be a limited consolation, since it leaves open the possibility that, viewing the human condition as a whole, the bad cancels much of the good. In any case it is grim enough to conclude that, given the harm thesis, the human condition has a tragic side. It is no wonder that theorists over the millennia have sought to defeat the harm thesis. We will examine their efforts, as well as the challenges to the posthumous harm thesis, according to which events occurring after we die can harm us. First, however, let us see how the harm theses might be defended.
3.1 The Main Defense
Those theorists who defend the harm theses typically draw upon some version of comparativism (e.g., Nagel 1970, Quinn 1984, Feldman 1991). According to comparativism, a person's death may well harm that person. Death may also be harmless. To decide whether a person's death is bad for that person, we must compare her actual welfare level to the welfare level she would have had if she had not died. Suppose, for example, that Hilda died on December 1, 2008 at age 25 and that, had she not died, she would have prospered for 25 years and suffered during her final five years. To apply comparativism, we must first select an account of welfare with which to assess Hilda's well-being. For simplicity, let us adopt positive hedonism. The next step is to sum the pleasure and pain she had over her lifetime. Suppose that she had considerably more pleasure than pain. We can stipulate that her lifetime welfare level came to a value of 250. Next we sum the pleasure and pain she would have had if she had not died on December 1, 2008. The first 25 years of her life would be just as they actually were, so the value of these would be 250. We can suppose that her next 25 years would also receive the value of 250. And let us stipulate that her final 5 years, spent mostly suffering, carry a value of −50. Then, had she not died, her lifetime welfare level would have been 250 + 250 − 50 = 450. Subtracting this value from her actual lifetime welfare level of 250 gives us −200. This is the value for her of dying on December 1, 2008. According to comparativism, then, her death was quite bad for her. Things would have been different if the last 30 years of her life would have been spent in unrelenting agony. On that assumption, her death would have been good for her.
Our example concerned a particular death at a specific time. Comparativism also has implications concerning whether dying young is bad for the one who dies, and whether it is bad for us that we die at all. In both cases the answer depends on how our lives would have gone had we not died. Usually dying young deprives us of many years of good life, so usually dying young is bad for us. As for whether or not it is bad to be mortal, that depends on whether the life we would lead as an immortal being would be a good one or not.
According to comparativism, when death is bad for us, it is bad for us because it precludes our coming to have various intrinsic goods which we would have had if we had not died. We might say that death is bad for us because of the goods it deprives us of, and not, or at least not always, because of any intrinsic evils for which it is responsible.
So much for the harm thesis. Now let us ask how the posthumous harm thesis might be defended.
Note first that we must reject the posthumous harm thesis if we adopt positive hedonism and combine it with comparativism, for nothing that happens after we die can boost or reduce the amounts of pleasure or pain in our lives.
However, posthumous events might well be bad for us on other accounts of welfare. Suppose that I want to be remembered after I die. Given preferentialism, something could happen after I die that might be bad for me, namely my being forgotten, because it thwarts my desire.
These ways of defending the harm theses seem quite plausible. Nevertheless, there are several strategies for criticizing the harm theses. Let us turn to these criticisms now, starting with some strategies developed in the ancient world by Epicurus and his follower Lucretius.
3.2 The Symmetry Argument
One challenge to the harm thesis is an attempt to show that the state death puts us in, nonexistence, is not bad. According to the symmetry argument, posed by Lucretius, a follower of Epicurus, we can prove this to ourselves by thinking about our state before we were born:
Look back at time … before our birth. In this way Nature holds before our eyes the mirror of our future after death. Is this so grim, so gloomy? (Lucretius 1951)
The idea is clear to a point: it is irrational to object to death, since we do not object to pre-vital nonexistence (the state of nonexistence that preceded our lives), and the two are alike in all relevant respects, so that any objection to the one would apply to the other. However, Lucretius' argument admits of more than one interpretation, depending on whether it is supposed to address death understood as the ending of life or death understood as the state we are in after life is ended (or both).
On the first interpretation, the ending of life is not bad, since the only thing we could hold against it is the fact that it is followed by our nonexistence, yet the latter is not objectionable, as is shown by the fact that we do not object to our nonexistence before birth. So understood, the symmetry argument is weak. Our complaint about death need not be that the state of nonexistence is ghastly. Instead, our complaint might be that death brings life, which is a good thing, to an end, and, other things being equal, what deprives us of good things is bad. Notice that the mirror image of death is birth (or, more precisely, becoming alive), and the two affect us in very different ways: birth makes life possible; it starts a good thing going. Death makes life impossible; it brings a good thing to a close.
Perhaps Lucretius only meant to argue that the death state is not bad, since the only thing we could hold against the death state is that it is nonexistence, which is not really objectionable, as witness our attitude about pre-vital nonexistence. So interpreted, there is a kernel of truth in Lucretius' argument. Truly, our pre-vital nonexistence does not concern us much. But that is because pre-vital nonexistence is followed by existence. Nor would we worry overly about post-vital nonexistence if it, too, were followed by existence. If we could move in and out of existence, say with the help of futuristic machines that could dismantle us, then rebuild us, molecule by molecule, after a period of nonexistence, we would not be overly upset about the intervening gaps, and, rather like hibernating bears, we might enjoy taking occasional breaks from life while the world gets more interesting. But undergoing temporary nonexistence is not the same as undergoing permanent nonexistence. What is upsetting is the permanence of post-vital nonexistence — not nonexistence per se.
There is another way to use considerations of symmetry to argue against the harm thesis: we want to die later, or not at all, because it is a way of extending life, but this attitude is irrational, Lucretius might say, since we do not want to be born earlier (we do not want to have always existed), which is also a way to extend life. As this argument suggests, we are more concerned about the indefinite continuation of our lives than about their indefinite extension. (Be careful when you rub the magic lamp: if you wish that your life be extended, the genie might make you older!) A life can be extended by adding to its future or to its past. Some of us might welcome the prospect of having lived a life stretching indefinitely into the past, given fortuitous circumstances. But we would prefer a life stretching indefinitely into the future.
Is it irrational to want future life more than past life? No; it is not surprising to find ourselves with no desire to extend life into the past, since the structure of the world permits life extension only into the future, and that is good enough. But what if life extension were possible in either direction? Would we still be indifferent about a lengthier past? And should our attitude about future life match our attitude about past life?
Our attitude about future life should match our attitude about past life if our interests and attitudes are limited in certain ways. If quantity of life is the only concern, a preference for future life is irrational. Similarly, the preference is irrational if our only concern is to maximize how much pleasure we experience over the course of our lives without regard to its temporal distribution. But our attitude is not that of the life- or pleasure-gourmand.
According to Parfit, we have a far-reaching bias extending to goods in general: we prefer that any good things, not just pleasures, be in our future, and that bad things, if they happen at all, be in our past. He argues that if we take this extensive bias for granted, and assume that, because of it, it is better for us to have goods in the future than in the past, we can explain why it is rational to deplore death more than we do our not having always existed: the former, not the latter, deprives us of good things in the future (he need not say that it is because it is in the past that we worry about the life-limiting event at the beginning of our lives less than the life-limiting event at the end). This preference for future goods is unfortunate, however, according to Parfit. If cultivated, the temporal insensitivity of the life- or pleasure-gourmand could lower our sensitivity to death: towards the end of life, we would find it unsettling that our supply of pleasures cannot be increased in the future, but we would be comforted by the pleasures we have accumulated.
Whether or not we have the extensive bias described by Parfit, it is true that the accumulation of life and pleasure, and the passive contemplation thereof, are not our only interests. We also have active, forward-looking goals and concerns. Engaging in such pursuits has its own value; for many of us, these pursuits, and not passive interests, are central to our identities. However, we cannot make and pursue plans for our past. We must project our plans (our self-realization) into the future, which explains our forward bias. (We could have been devising and pursuing plans in the past, but these plans will not, I assume, be extensions of our present concerns.) It is not irrational to prefer that our lives be extended into the future rather than the past, if for no other reason than this: only the former makes our existing forward-looking pursuits possible. It is not irrational to prefer not to be at the end of our lives, unable to shape them further, and limited to reminiscing about days gone by. As Frances Kamm (1998) emphasizes, we do not want our lives to be all over with.
Nevertheless, it does not follow that we should be indifferent about the extent of our pasts. Being in the grip of forward-looking pursuits is important, but we have passive interests as well, which make a more extensive past preferable. Moreover, having been devising and pursuing plans in the past is worthwhile. If fated to die tomorrow, most of us would prefer to have a thousand years of glory behind us rather than fifty. We want to have lived well.
3.3 Epicurean Challenges: Death Cannot Affect Us
Further challenges to the harm theses are offered by Epicurus (341–270) in his Letter to Menoeceus:
Death …, the most awful of evils, is nothing to us, seeing that, when we are, death is not come, and, when death is come, we are not.
We might restate Epicurus' brief argument as follows: if death harms the individual who dies, there must exist a subject who is harmed by death, a clear harm that is received, and a time when that harm is received. As to the timing issue, there seems to be two possible solutions, given that death follows immediately upon life: either death harms its victims while they are alive or later. If we opt for the second solution we appear to run head on into the problem of the subject, for assuming that we do not exist after we are alive, no one is left to incur harm. We also encounter the problem of specifying a harm that might be accrued by a nonexistent person. If we opt for the first solution — death harms its victims while they are alive — we have a ready solution to the problem of the subject but we face the problem of supplying a clear way in which death is bad: death seems unable to have any ill effect on us while we are living since it will not yet have occurred. Seeing that there is no coherent solution to all three issues, Epicurus rejects the harm thesis.
Epicurus focuses on death, but if his argument is good, it applies more generally, to include all events that follow death.
In some respects Epicurus's argument is not clear. One problem is that what he means by ‘death’ is unclear. For now let us assume that he meant to refer to the process by which our lives are ended. Another interpretive problem arises as well: his intent might be to show that neither death nor posthumous events can affect us at all. From this claim it would follow that death and posthumous events are harmless, assuming that an event harms us only if it somehow affects us at some time (perhaps well after it occurs).
Let us see if it is possible to show that death and posthumous events do not affect us. Then we can try out (in the next section) a weaker thesis: that death and posthumous events cannot affect us in a way that is bad for us. This weaker claim is easier to defend, but the stronger claim is worth exploring.
We can start with some assumptions about when an event can affect us. To this end, let us adopt the causal account of responsibility:
- An event (or state of affairs) can affect some subject (person or thing) S only by having a causal effect on S (the causal impact thesis).
- A subject S cannot be causally affected by an event while S is nonexistent.
- A subject cannot be causally affected by an event before the event occurs (the ban on backwards causation).
From the causal account, together with some plausible assumptions, it follows that a post-mortem event, such as the burning of one's corpse, cannot affect us after we are dead, since, by (a), to be affected is to be affected causally, but, by (b), nonexistent people cannot be causally affected by any event. It also follows that the state of being dead cannot affect us while we are dead. Here we are assuming that people cease to exist when they die (the termination thesis). From the causal account it also follows that neither being dead, nor any events that follow, can affect us while we are alive, given the ban on backwards causation:
- An event can affect us only by causally affecting us (the causal impact thesis).
- We cannot be causally affected by an event while we are nonexistent.
- We do not exist while dead (the termination thesis).
- So neither being dead, nor any posthumous event, can affect us while we are dead (by 1–3).
- We cannot be causally affected by an event before the event occurs (the ban on backwards causation).
- So neither being dead, nor any posthumous event, can affect us while we are alive (by 1 and 5).
- So neither being dead, nor any posthumous event, can ever affect us (by 4 and 6).
So far so good: neither the state of being dead nor any post-mortem event can ever affect us. However, it has not been shown that we cannot be affected by the dying process. Of course, the thesis that we must exist to be affected, together with the termination thesis, rule out the possibility that death affects us after it occurs (after we are nonexistent). And the ban on backwards causation rules out the possibility that death affects us before it occurs. Thus:
- Death cannot affect us after it occurs (by 1–3).
- Death cannot affect us before it occurs (by 1 and 5).
- So death can affect us, if at all, only when it occurs (by 8 and 9).
But nothing said so far rules out the possibility that death affects us exactly when it occurs. In particular, the problem of the subject does not arise since it is a living, existing person who is harmed by death while it occurs. Is there any way to establish that death cannot affect us even at the time it occurs? There might be two ways. First, we might claim that death occurs only after we are nonexistent. This assumption has the odd consequence that death can affect us only if posthumous events can. It will follow from (7) that death cannot ever affect us. Second, we might claim that death is instantaneous; it happens too quickly to affect us.
Some theorists have indeed defined ‘death’ — the ending of life — in such a way as to imply that it occurs only after we are nonexistent. For example, Feinberg (1984), following Levenbook (1984), defines death as “the first moment of the subject's nonexistence.” Perhaps this definition is motivated by the awkwardness of attaching ‘death’ to a moment in the dying process when a spark of life persists. However, it is at least as awkward to attach ‘death’ to a moment after the dying process is over — to suggest that the ending of life occurs while we are in a state of death. It is also to concede too much to the Epicurean, who could then establish that death is no evil merely by showing that posthumous events are innocuous.
What about the suggestion that death happens too quickly to affect us?
Recall that ‘death’ can be used in the process as well as the denouement sense (Section 1). Death, in the process sense, unfolds over a period of time, and it obviously affects us while it occurs. — even if instantly.
What if we opt for the denouement sense of ‘death’? Is it plausible to say that losing the very last of life can have no affect on us? It is difficult to see why. If we were correct when we said that the complete destruction of our vital capacities affects us, surely we are also affected, albeit less, by losing the very last of the vital capacities that sustain us.
Let's review. Granting them some leeway, Epicureans can show:
- Neither being dead, nor any posthumous event, can ever affect us, and the dying process itself can affect us, if at all, only while it occurs (by 7 and 10).
They can then argue as follows:
- An event harms us only if it somehow affects us at some time.
- So neither being dead, nor any posthumous event, can harm us, and the dying process can harm us, if at all, only while it occurs (by 11 and 12).
For a more rigorous presentation of the above argument, see the supplementary document:
But Epicureans lack a convincing argument against the possibility that the dying process and some of its effects overlap in time; hence they cannot refute the harm thesis. We have a subject, harm, and time: the subject of death is a live creature who endures its effects at the very time the creature dies.
3.4 Epicurean Challenges: Death Is Harmless
Instead of trying to establish that death cannot affect us at all, Epicureans might argue that death cannot affect us in a way that is bad for us. To that end, they can provide a condition for something's being bad for us and argue that death fails to meet it.
The condition which Epicurus himself supplied is this: an event (or state of affairs) harms us only if it causes in us the presence of some condition we find unpleasant. For simplicity, we can call all such conditions pain or suffering. That condition, the suffering, need not occur at the same time as the event that causes its presence in us. An event may occur long before it has any direct impact on us; it may occur even before we exist, as when someone times a bomb to go off 150 years later, killing everyone around. Epicurus himself did not spell out a complete view of welfare. He did not make it entirely clear when things are, overall, beneficial or harmful to a person. But he surely did think that something harms us only if it causes us to suffer.
Some theorists prefer to phrase Epicurus's condition in terms of experience, thusly: we are harmed only by what we experience. Given that one never experiences one's death, it would follow that it cannot harm those who die. A variant of this experience condition was proposed by Rosenbaum (1986): we are harmed only by what we can experience. Other theorists state Epicurus's condition in terms of existence, thus attributing to him the existence condition: something harms us only at times when we exist. (For good discussions of the experience condition and its plausibility, see Nussbaum 2013, Silverstein 2013, and Fischer 2014.)
On the Epicurean view, clearly neither the state nor process of death is inherently harmful — it is, in itself, not bad for us. For death is not necessarily painful. One can die painlessly, as when one dies while unconscious. But Epicurus did not say merely that death need not be harmful; he claimed that death was never harmful; on his criterion, this means that death never causes the subject to suffer.
To show that death can have no salient effect on us, Epicureans might argue that death cannot be responsible for any condition's presence in us, salient or otherwise. It can only be responsible for our ceasing to be in a condition. However, this thesis is clearly false on the process sense of ‘death:’ moving from being wholly alive to completely lacking life might well introduce the presence of some bad condition in us, such as pain. No doubt Epicureans gravitate to the denouement sense of death since the ending of the final trace of life might occur extremely quickly, perhaps so quickly that it has no salient effect on us while it happens. Nevertheless, Epicureans may argue, with some degree of plausibility, that denouement death cannot harm us:
- Denouement death occurs too quickly to be responsible for the presence of any unpleasant condition in us at the time it occurs.
- Only something responsible for the presence of an unpleasant condition in us is harmful to us.
- So denouement death cannot harm us at the time it occurs (by 14 and 15).
By combining 16 with 13, established earlier, Epicureans may conclude that:
- Neither posthumous events nor the state of death nor denouement death may ever harm us, and process death may harm us only while it occurs.
However, this conclusion will disappoint people who wonder whether dying is a misfortune: they want to know whether losing their lives is a bad thing, not just whether, having nearly completely lost life, it is bad to lose the very last of it (Luper 2004). Even for Epicurus himself this conclusion is not entirely adequate. For it leaves in place the possibility that the dying process can be harmful.
So why did Epicurus say that death is nothing to us? He surely knew that the dying process can be harmful to us. One possibility is that he did not really intend to show that death is innocuous. Many commentators insist that he wanted only to show that being dead, that is, the state of death, is nothing to us, and that he realized that dying is often a misfortune. It is also possible that Epicurus did not believe that what we have called ‘process death’ is part of death; instead, death is what we have called ‘denouement death’. This line of thought would position him to admit that ‘process death’ is bad for us, but it is only the precursor to death.
However, if Epicurus meant to show only that denouement death is harmless, or that the state of being dead is harmless, his efforts are disappointing given his own goal, which was to enable us to achieve ataraxia, or complete tranquility. He cannot reach this goal if he does not free us from our concern about the dying process or the events leading up to the dying process.
The best Epicurus could do is to downplay the painfulness of process death and its cause, and this he appears to do:
Continuous pain does not last long in the flesh; on the contrary, pain, if extreme, is present a very short time. … Illnesses of long duration even permit of an excess of pleasure over pain in the flesh (Principal Doctrines, Doctrine 4)
Unfortunately, Epicurus was wrong; the dying process and its cause can be excruciating.
There are things other than death that seem bad for us. To prepare us for complete tranquility in the fact of these things, Epicurus would need to address them as well. Let us consider some examples, and what Epicurus might say about them.
One example is obvious: we suffer when we anticipate death. Epicurus would probably admit that anticipating death is a bad thing if it upsets us. But he emphasizes that our (present) anticipatory fear is not caused by our (future) death, since future events are powerless to affect the past. Hence, by the painfulness criterion, the fear of death is not grounds for saying that death is harmful. Moreover, fear is irrational unless its object is genuinely evil in some way, which death is not:
He speaks idly who says the he fears death, not because it will be painful when present but because it is painful in anticipation. For if something causes no distress when present, it is fruitless to be pained by the expectation of it (Letter to Menoeceus).
Something else that is related to death seems bad for us: namely, the grief others experience when we die. But Epicurus would urge us to distinguish what is bad for us from what is bad for others. At most, the fact that your family grieves at your death supports the claim that your demise harms them, not that it harms you. (Too, your distress at anticipating your family's grief over your death is not grounds for you to regard your death as a bad thing: the suffering your death brings them cannot affect you, and your anticipatory grief is irrational.) Furthermore, their grief should be mitigated by the fact that your death is not bad for you. Their grief is entirely self-centered, exactly like the self-pity a stamp collector might feel at the destruction of a treasured stamp, in that the stamp is not harmed by its own destruction.
These examples illustrate that Epicurus can address some death-related concerns by showing that they are misguided, if we grant him his claim that we can be harmed only by what causes us to suffer. However, some death-related concerns cannot be handled this way. For example, the fact that everyone dies causes us distress and is therefore harmful to us even on Epicurus' criterion. At most Epicurus can say that mortality need not be harmful to us, and that it will not be if we can manage not to be distressed by it (Luper 2009).
3.5 Further Objections to the Harm Theses
Epicurus' case against the harm theses hinged on the assumption that we can be harmed only by what causes us to suffer. However, in section 3.1 we supported the harm theses by combining comparativism with one of the three leading accounts of welfare. We noted that death and posthumous events seem harmful because they deprive us of goods we would otherwise have had. If our argument was correct, then Epicurus' assumption must be mistaken. It must be false that harm requires incurring pain. Instead, harm can consist in being deprived of goods.
Are there ways Epicureans could resist the view that being deprived of goods can be bad for us? Perhaps. Epicureans could criticize comparativism. They could also defend some view of welfare that is more congenial to their position. Let us consider each strategy, starting with the second.
Epicurus may have accepted the following view of welfare:
Negative Hedonism: for any subject S, S's experiencing pain is the one and only thing that is intrinsically bad for S, and nothing is intrinsically good for S.
When paired with comparativism, this view has implications that Epicurus would have welcomed. It implies that harm is limited to what increases our pain, and benefit is limited to what reduces it. Consequently death is harmless to those who die painlessly, no matter how good the life they would have had would have been. Moreover, death can be beneficial: it can preclude our suffering.
However, the implications of negative hedonism are quite absurd. For example, it implies that we never have reason to endure pain for the sake of pleasure or any other good. It also implies that we should end our lives as quickly and painlessly as we can since living on will harm us and cannot possibly benefit us. The negative hedonist account of welfare is clearly false.
Perhaps Epicureans would have better success if they were to reject comparativism itself. To that end, they might adopt one of four strategies which we will discuss in turn.
It is quite possible that Epicurus himself rejected comparativism, as formulated above. Perhaps he thought that the harmfulness of an event E is not a matter of the good it deprives us of, but rather a matter of how much intrinsic harm it causes, and the goodness of E is a matter of how much intrinsic good it causes. Earlier we let B(S,W) stand for the sum of the values of the things which are intrinsically bad for S in world W, and we let G(S,W) stand for the sum of the values of the things which are intrinsically good for S in world W. Using this symbolism, we can state the following alternative to comparativism:
Bifurcated Comparativism: E harms S if and only if B(S,WE) < B(S,W~E); E benefits S if and only if G(S, WE) > G(S,W~E).
Bifurcated comparativism implies that goods do not offset evils, but might eliminate them: that is, the goods E brings do not reduce the harmfulness of E unless they cause us to have less pain or less of some other evil. Similarly, evils do not offset goods. Combined with positive hedonism, bifurcated comparativism implies that we are harmed only by what increases our suffering, and benefitted only by what increases our pleasure; all else is a matter of indifference. Epicurus might have been drawn to this combination because it implies that death can neither harm nor benefit us, ignoring the pain it can cause while it occurs.
However, bifurcated comparativism is implausible. One problem is its implication that that goods and evils do not offset each other. Another worry is that surely some events or states of affairs harm us without causing us pain or some other intrinsic evil, and benefit us without giving us pleasure or some other intrinsic good. It is better to be anaethetized before surgery, but not if bifurcated comparativism is true. Moreover, if I slip into a temporary coma, which precludes my suffering from injuries inflicted upon me in a car crash, the coma benefits me, even though it does not give me pleasure or other goods. Similarly, a coma that precludes my enjoying a week's worth of good life harms me, yet gives me no pain or other evils.
Surely death is capable of benefitting us the same way that anesthetization and unconsciousness can. It can preclude our enduring great suffering. Similarly, like anesthetization and unconsciousness, death can harm us by precluding our living well. Comparativism gets things right and bifurcated comparativism gets things wrong in all of these examples.
Comparativism assesses our interests in a temporally neutral way. It implies that, at each point in my life, it is in my interests that my welfare be as high as possible across my entire life, so that it is prudent for me now to do what will boost my welfare later, other things being equal. Famously, Derek Parfit (compare McMahan 2002) supplies grounds for assessing our interests in a temporally relative way instead of a temporally neutral way. Assessing our interests in a temporally relative way may help Epicureans to undermine the harm theses.
Consider that sometimes we have no reason whatever to satisfy a desire. Parfit gives two examples. First, a desire might be implicitly conditional on its own persistence, in the sense that we want to satisfy it only on condition that we still have it. The desire to play cards is like this. We lose all reason to satisfy such desires as soon as we cease to have them. Compare desires, mentioned earlier, that are conditional on our persistence. We might have reason to satisfy these right up until our last day, even if we cease to have them much earlier. Second, Parfit notes, we might change our values or ideals, which might lead us to condemn some of our desires. In this case it is reasonable to forego any opportunity to satisfy them. When a property, such as conditionality, undermines the importance of satisfying a desire for P, so that P's holding is not intrinsically good for us (and ~P's holding is not intrinsically bad for us), let us say that it is an undermining feature.
When we no longer want something, we may speak of a past desire. Perhaps a desire is undermined by being past, as Parfit has claimed (compare Suits 2001). Then Epicureans may be able to revive their attack on the posthumous harm thesis: dying ensures that we cannot be harmed by posthumous events, since we are without desires long before these occur (Vorobej, 1998). This strategy does not seem to vindicate death itself, since death may preclude the fulfillment of some of the very desires it destroys. However, the die-hard Epicurean might suggest that a desire is undermined, in passing, at the very moment of its destruction; if it is later thwarted, no harm is done.
In any case, it is far from clear that our interests should be assessed in a temporally relative way. The matter is quite controversial. Consider Parfit's claim that our desires are undermined by their pastness: neutralists, who assess our interests in the temporally neutral way prescribed by comparativism, can resist Parfit's claim by finding a feature other than pastness that tends to undermine desires that we no longer have. One possibility becomes evident once we notice that most of our aims are tentative in the sense that we adopt them in the expectation that we may later revise them. An extreme way to revise a desire for P is to stop wanting P altogether — to end the desire for P, say on the grounds that it conflicts with other, more pressing interests. We defer to future exercises of our own autonomy, realizing that we may reassess our priorities, until our life plan matures. In particular, we are always prepared to revise desires in light of the projects and commitments with which we identify, and loath to abandon projects and commitments which have become parts of our identities. We favor some of the ways our desires change, and take what steps we can to coax them in preferred directions. As a rough approximation, we may say that, unless our desires change in ways we (do or) would oppose, the changes are voluntary (Cf. Harry Frankfurt 1971). For our purposes we can even count, as voluntary, the intentional elimination of a desire using artificial means, as when we take pills to remove the desire to smoke cigarettes. If we voluntarily stop wanting P, ~P can no longer harm us. It will not harm us during the time we wanted P, or later, when our desire is thwarted. So we undermine a desire when we voluntarily abandon it (Luper 1987). On this view, Epicureans cannot show that desires are harmlessly thwarted by death and posthumous events on the grounds that such desires are past at the time death or posthumous events thwart them.
Comparativism says that the value of my dying at time t depends on the intrinsic goods (and evils) I would have accrued after t had I not died, even though I am actually dead after t. Being dead, I am incapable of accruing any intrinsic goods or evils after t, and in that sense I am unresponsive after t. Interest actualism denies that the value of my dying at t can depend on these goods. It says that the value for S of event E is not affected by the intrinsic goods or evils S would have accrued had E not occurred, if S would have accrued them after S has actually become unresponsive.
Accepting interest actualism would force us to modify comparativism. The actualist view would be this:
Actualist Comparativism: E's value for S equals the intrinsic value for S of S's life in WE, the actual world in which E occurs, minus the intrinsic value for S of S's life in the closest world, W~E, in which E does not occur excluding any intrinsic value S would accrue in W~E after S ceases to be responsive in WE.
However, actualist comparativism does not appear to be more plausible than standard comparativism. If I die at t, accruing goods after t is not in my interests-after-t, but it does not follow that it is not in my interests. If developing and fulfilling certain desires is entailed in making my life as a whole as good as possible, then it is in my interests to develop and fulfill those desires. Even though I will die before I develop and fulfill the desires, it is in my interests to develop and fulfill them, and bad for me not to develop and fulfill them.
One other line of thought might be pressed against the comparativist account of interests. Comparativism says that something harms me when it makes my life worse than it would have been. However, there seem to be events and states of affairs that do not harm me even though their value for me is negative. I am not harmed, it seems, by failing to be a genius, or rich and beautiful. But compare my life as it is, with my unimpressive IQ, income and looks, to my life as it would be were I brilliant or rich or beautiful: the former is considerably worse than the latter. By failing to be brilliant, rich and beautiful, I am precluded from having many goods, but we might say that the preclusion is moot, in the sense that it is harmless to me. Epicureans might renew their attack on the harm thesis by exploiting examples like these. The examples appear to show that things can have enormous negative value for me without harming me. Similarly, Epicureans might insist, the preclusion of goods by death is moot: cut short, my life is worse than it would be were I not to die, but this comparative difference does not show that I am harmed.
It seems that the comparative criteria work well when we evaluate losses, such as the loss of my arms, and also when we evaluate some lacks, such as the inability to see or to feel pleasure. But the criteria have worrisome implications when we evaluate certain other lacks, such as my lack of genius. It is relatively clear that a person is harmed by the inability to see but less clear that he is harmed by the lack of genius. Why is that?
There are various responses to the problem of moot preclusion. One is to deny that it makes any sense to speak of ‘negativities', or events that consist in things not happening. This does not stop us from evaluating the event or process of dying (as opposed to the state of death) which is not a ‘negativity’. Comparativists are right to claim that things harm us by making our lives worse than they would have been otherwise; negativities are not counterexamples, since they do not exist. Another response is that moot preclusion involves cases in which the events or states of affairs that would be good for us if they held are highly improbable (Draper 1999). A further explanation involves the relative importance of having some goods rather than others. In some moods, we may consider it harmful to be deprived of a good just when it is important for us to have it. The troublesome lacks we have been discussing might be lacks of goods it is unimportant to have; such lacks would not be harmful even though we would be better off without them.
In section 3 we showed that the harm theses can be defended on the basis of comparativism together with a plausible view of welfare. We also considered ways of attacking this defense, and some possible responses. In this section we consider another worry about the view that death may harm its victims by depriving them of goods (or benefit them by precluding their incurring evils). Roughly, the worry is this: suppose we accept the presumption that something can harm a subject only if there is a (period of) time when it does so. Let us call this the Epicurean presumption. Then death can harm us by depriving us of goods only if there is a time during which we are harmfully deprived. However, it is not clear that there is such a time. If the Epicurean presumption is really true, then proponents of the harm thesis will need to clarify when it is that being deprived of goods harms a victim. In this section we will consider several possibilities. First, however, we will examine the Epicurean presumption itself.
4.1 The Epicurean Presumption
There is more than one way to understand the Epicurean presumption. It might mean this:
P1: An event E harms a subject S only if there is a time when E is against S's interests.
On this reading, the presumption is surely true. But it is also quite easy to supply the time when something such as death is against the interests of its victim. All it takes for an event to be against my interests is that it makes my life as a whole worse than it would have been had the event not occurred. Suppose, for example, that I will be infected tomorrow and, because of its effects on me during next week, the infection will worsen my life as a whole. Then being infected is against my interests, period. That means it is against my interests now and at all other times I exist. This may seem mysterious, unless we notice that something's being against my interests, according to the terms of comparativism, is not an event, and hence not an event occurring at some time.
There is another way to understand the Epicurean presumption. Recall the distinction made earlier (at the end of 2.1) between my interests, on one hand, and my interests-at-time-t, or what makes me better or worse off at time t, on the other. The Epicurean presumption might be that harm affects my interests-at-t, at some time t, rather than my interests. That is, the presumption might be understood as follows:
P2: E harms S only if at some time t, E is against S's interests-at-time-t.
Now, if comparativism is true, this version of the Epicurean presumption is false. To see why, let us distinguish between two ways in which something might be bad for me. On the one hand, something might bring it about that, for a while, I am worse off than I would have been. For example, a coma might prevent me from enjoying a week's worth of pleasant activities, so that, while comatose, my welfare level would be lower than it would have been had I not fallen into a coma. On the other hand, something might cause it to be the case that my life as a whole is worse than it would have been. Usually, things that make our lives as wholes worse (such as comas) do so by making us worse off for a while. However, what makes our lives worse need not make us worse off for any period of time. Death can prevent me from enjoying years of pleasant activities, making my life as a whole worse than it would have been had I not died, even if I am not worse off at any time during my life. Death is an injury to my life as a whole.
The Epicurean presumption can be sustained if it is equated with P1, but it is easy to point to the time when death is against the interests of its victims: if it is against their interests at all, it is timelessly against their interests, according to comparativism. We might call this view atemporalism, borrowing the term from Jens Johansson (2013). (Johansson defines atemporalism this way: ‘death is bad for the deceased but not at any time.’) If, by contrast, we equate the presumption with P2, we will look for the time during which we are worse off because of death than we would have been had we not died, and worry about the fact that it is difficult to supply that time. However, there is good reason to reject P2. We have already seen that comparativism is extremely plausible, and P2 is false if comparativism is true.
Even if P2 is false, and death can harm us without leaving us worse off, there might still be times when, due to death or posthumous events, we are worse off. Many theorists have offered explanations of when it is that we incur such harm. There seem to be five possibilities (and various combinations thereof):
- at all times (eternalism)
- after they occur (subsequentism)
- before they occur (priorism)
- at the time they (the mortem events) occur (concurrentism)
- at an indeterminate time (indefinitism).
Let us consider each of the five.
Feldman (1991) seems to argue for the eternalist view that my death is always bad for me if bad for me at all. If my death harms me, it harms me while I am alive, while I am dead, and even before I came into existence. However, theorists (among them Lamont 1998, Silverstein 2000 and Feit 2002) who interpret Feldman this way argue that he is wrong to accept eternalism. Suppose I stubbed my toe, and we ask ‘when was the stubbing bad for me?’ What exactly do we want to know? Perhaps we want to know when it is true that the stubbing was bad for me. If so, the answer is: ‘eternally, if ever.’ However, our question might be: ‘at which times do I incur harm for which the stubbing was responsible?’ If so, the answer is: ‘I incur that harm at all and only those times when my toe is throbbing as a result of the stubbing.’ A question concerning the timing of death's harmfulness might be similarly ambiguous. In asking, ‘when is Lincoln's death bad for him?’ we might want to know when it is true that his death is bad for him. The answer is presumably that it is an eternal truth. Feldman appears to answer this first question. But his critics are looking for an answer to a second question, namely this: ‘at which times does Lincoln incur the harm for which his death is responsible?’ To this latter question it is absurd to reply that Lincoln is always incurring harm.
The termination thesis poses a significant obstacle to the subsequentist view that, due to death and posthumous events, we may incur harm while we are dead, for it implies that death annihilates its victims, from which it appears to follow that there is no subject who is a candidate for further harm. How can we make sense of the idea that death or posthumous events can harm an individual after she has died?
Subsequentists might adopt a metaphysical view that is sometimes called metaphysical eternalism (defended by Nagel 1970 and Silverstein 1980, among others). On this view, past and future objects are ontologically on a par with present objects. Existing things are spread out in both space and time. Suppose it is possible to refer to anything that is ontologically on a par with present objects. Then, given metaphysical eternalism, we can still refer to Socrates even though ‘Socrates’ refers to something whose existence is temporally located wholly in the past, and say of him that he is not alive. Perhaps, then, we can also make sense of the idea that people undergo harm while dead, assuming that harm can consist in the absence of some salient good: we can interpret “Socrates' death harmed him while his life was over” as “The living Socrates lacked various salient goods during a time following his death.”
Is it plausible to argue that dead people can still incur harm? There are significant obstacles to this view. Here are some relevant considerations:
Many kinds of things whose reality few would question— boulders, numbers, and my shoe, for example—cannot be harmed at all, and certainly cannot incur harm at particular times, yet clearly lack goods at particular times. Hence its lacking goods at some time does not imply, of a thing, that it is incurring harm at that time. Let us say that a creature is responsive at t just in case it has the capacity to accrue at t the intrinsic goods or evils in which welfare consists. At those times when (living) people are responsive, they may incur harm; because shoes are never responsive, they can never incur harm. It seems reasonable to assume that while Socrates is dead he is not responsive, even if, by virtue of existing in the past, Socrates is ontologically on a par with things that exist while he is dead. Assuming he is unresponsive while dead, it is hard to take seriously the idea that he incurs harm then.
Recent defenses of subsequentism seem vulnerable to the charge from unresponsiveness. According to Neil Feit (2002), Lincoln's death was bad for him, if at all, throughout the period he was deprived of life. To determine whether, and when, dying at time t harms me, we compare the situation in which I die at t to the situation (the nearest possible world W) I would be in were I not to die at t. If I would fare better in W, my dying at t harms me; roughly, it begins to harm me at the time when I begin to fare better in W, and ends at the time when I cease to fare better in W. Ben Bradley (2004, 2009) refines Feit's version of subsequentism. According to Bradley, “death is bad for the person who dies at all and only those times when the person would have been living well, or living a life worth living, had she not died when she did.” Is subsequentism defensible on the Feit-Bradley approach? Perhaps, but they owe us an explanation of how it is that we can incur harm, albeit by deprivation, during a stretch of time when we are unresponsive.
Palle Yourgrau offers an alternative to metaphysical eternalism given which it might be possible to support subsequentism. He speaks of two modes of reality: the mode he calls ‘being,’ enjoyed by ‘objects’ such as Socrates, you, your future grandchildren's possessions, and some persons who will never exist, and the mode he calls ‘existing,’ enjoyed only by some beings, such as live creatures and the array of things surrounding them. Yourgrau says that “possible people, like the dead and the unborn, are not a peculiar kind of abstract existent, but rather a perfectly ordinary kind of concrete object like you and me, who merely have the bad luck not to enjoy existence…. What separates actual, living people from merely possible people is precisely their existence” (Yourgrau 1987, p. 147; 2013, pp. 143–4). In another passage Yourgrau affirms the proposition, credited to Aristotle, that “for living things, it is living that is existing” (2013, p. 139). Together, these passages suggest that an object is alive only if it presently exists and is actual, and dead only if it does not presently exist and is not actual. So Socrates is not an actual person who is presently dead (as many modal logicians, such as David Lewis, would say). Instead, Socrates is a dead object that is no longer actual. And like other dead people, and the unborn, Socrates is unfortunate in enduring “the deprivation of nonexistence,” according to Yourgrau (1987, p. 149).
Could Yourgrau's metaphysical view serve as a plausible basis for subsequentism? Substantial obstacles lie in the way.
First, on Yourgrau's view, it seems entirely impossible for any individuals to live any longer than they actually do. Suppose that (say) Socrates might have lived an additional 10 years. Wouldn't it follow that over the course of the 10 years following his actual death Socrates was an object living outside of the actual world? Yet Yourgrau contends that no nonactual objects are alive. Typically, people who consider Socrates unfortunate because he died have it in mind that he might have had more good years of life.
Second, together with the reasonable assumption that life is an essential attribute of persons, Yourgrau's view implies that it is impossible for any merely possible objects to be people. In that case we would have to reject Yourgrau's claim that dead and unborn people are real objects (who have the bad luck not to enjoy existence).
In response to this second worry, Yourgrau would deny that life is an essential attribute of persons. His view seems to be that Socrates is an object that, at one time, was a nonalive, nonactual person, that later came to be both alive and actual, that, still later, died yet remained a person, albeit one that is nonactual once again, and that continues to be a person now, long after Socrates's corpse has turned to dust. (Could such an object really be “a perfectly ordinary kind of concrete object”?) Instead of denying that life is essential to persons, Yourgrau could retreat to the position that some objects that are now merely possible are unlucky in that they will never be living persons, or because they will never again be living persons. However, unless luck can hinge on the impossible, Yourgrau would have to justify the claim that some objects that at one time were nonalive nonpersons, later came to be live persons, and, still later, the very same objects continued their careers—as dead nonpersons. If Yourgrau wanted to add that Socrates is such an object, he would have to make sense of how an object can be Socrates even though it is not a person.
In any case, if Socrates is no longer alive, it seems pretty clear that he is now unresponsive and hence not incurring harm.
Concurrentism says we incur mortal harm precisely when death occurs. It also says that those posthumous events that are bad for us harm us precisely when they occur. One concurrentist, Julian Lamont (1998), puts the view this way: we incur deprivation harm at the time some event ensures that we will not retain or attain some good that is otherwise available. Call such an event an ensuring event. Death may itself be an ensuring event, so death and at least many deprivation harms may occur simultaneously. Similar reasoning might support the concurrentist story about when posthumous events harm us, for, like death, posthumous events ensure that we will not attain some goods we otherwise would have had, such as our not being slandered posthumously. The upshot is a unified story about when death and posthumous events harm us.
However, the concurrentist story about when posthumous events harm their victims seems worrisome. The view is that posthumous events that are bad for us harm us precisely when they occur. The problem, of course, is that by the time posthumous events occur nothing remaining of us is capable of incurring harm. This is the point that was just pressed against subsequentism. Nevertheless, concurrentists could be correct about when death harms us even if they are wrong about the time we incur harm from posthumous events. Indeed, they could say that while death can harm us, posthumous events cannot.
To solve the timing puzzle, we might try rejecting one or more elements of the Epicurean's causal account of responsibility, and see if there is a way to defend the priorist claim that death and posthumous events can harm the living. To defend priorism, we will need to deny the assumption that a thing can affect us only causally. For that assumption, together with the ban on backwards causation, forces us to dismiss the idea that harm can occur before the event that precipitates it takes place. Yet, as George Pitcher (1984) says, this is precisely the idea we need in order to understand the harmfulness of post-mortem events. They can harm us by being responsible for truths that affect our interests. For example, being slandered while I am dead makes it true that my reputation is to be damaged, and this harms me at all and only those times when I desire that my reputation be untarnished. It is while I am alive that I care about my reputation's always being intact, and it is while I am alive that my well-being is brought lower by posthumous slander. The posthumous events themselves harm me only indirectly; directly I am harmed by their making things true that bear on my interests.
Pitcher's idea can be applied to death as well as post-mortem events. Death can harm us by making things true that negatively affect our interests, in which case we incur harm during such time as our well-being is lower than it otherwise would have been. For example, dying before I complete some treasured project ensures that “I shall never complete my project” is true of me; because of this, my well-being is lower than it would have been, at such times as I am interested in the success of my project.
Assuming that comparativism is correct, priorism is not a complete account of the harmfulness of death and posthumous events, for comparativism, supplemented with some form of the preferentialist account of welfare, implies that death can be objectionable, in part, because it thwarts desires which we would have had and fulfilled had we not died. Because we never actually will have such desires, we can never be worse off if they are thwarted. Comparativism also suggests that death is objectionable insofar as it precludes the pleasure which we would have enjoyed had we not died, even if we never desired the pleasure of which death deprives us.
There is another way to extend priorism. We might object to the state of death, since coming to be dead makes it true of us that we have desires that will be unfulfilled. But instead of saying that being dead is objectionable, it seems better to say something else, once we notice that the state of death is simply the state of nonexistence initiated by the event of death. Perhaps being dead is powerless to harm us since any harm that might be associated with it is entailed in, and brought about by, death itself, which is responsible for limiting the duration of our lives, and all that that entails.
The last possibility — that death and posthumous events harm us but at no determinate time (Nagel 1979; Silverstein 1980) — is criticized by Julian Lamont (1998) on the grounds that it implies that some events take place but at no particular time. But William Grey (1999) counters that Lamont has misunderstood Nagel's (and Grey's) indefinitist position, which is that the harm death causes is incurred during a stretch of time that has blurry boundaries (compare: the time of the onset of baldness).
As Grey understands it, indefinitism is correct only if subsequentism, priorism or concurrentism is true (Grey opts for subsequentism), for even a period of time with blurry edges must occur before, after or at the same time as a mortem event (eternalism is an exception since an infinite period has no boundaries to blur).
4.7 Summing Up
Eternalism, the position that those who are harmed by death are always incurring harm, is surely wrong. Subsequentism is more plausible, but it is hard to make sense of the idea of incurring harm posthumously, since we are not responsive while dead. The indefinitist view, as we have understood it, is also unhelpful; it tells us that the boundaries of the time death harms us are blurry, yet fails to say when that time is. Concurrentism or priorism, or some combination of the two, seem to provide the most promising answers to the timing problem (the problem of specifying when a victim incurs the harm for which death and posthumous events are responsible). It does seem reasonable to say that death may harm us while it occurs. It is far less plausible to say that posthumous events may harm us while they occur, since we are not responsive then. It is also plausible to say that both death and posthumous events may harm us while we are alive, for living people may have interests that depend on what happens in the future.
At this time it is worth repeating what was stated in section 4.1: proponents of the harm theses do not need a solution to the timing puzzle, for something can harm us timelessly; that is, it can be against our interests even if there is no time t at which, because of it, we are worse off at t than we would have been otherwise. As comparativism says, anything that makes our lives worse than they otherwise would have been is against our interests. This death usually does. But at no time after death are we worse off than we would have been had we not died, for the simple reason that we do not exist. Death might make us worse off while it occurs; however, it, and a posthumous event, might also make us worse off before it occurs, since it may be against the interests we once had.
Are all deaths misfortunes? Perhaps, but there is a strong case to the contrary.
5.1 Only Premature Death Is a Misfortune
To support the conclusion that death is not always a misfortune, we might adopt some version of preferentialism. Perhaps it is not bad to die at an advanced enough age, for people who live long enough may be ground down by life until they give up many of their goals. Also, they will have attained many of their aspirations. If already satisfied, or given up, a desire cannot be thwarted, even by death, so as we lose our motivation for living, death ceases to be objectionable to us. Perhaps death is bad for us only if premature in the sense that it comes when we still have interests such as salient desires that propel us forward in life, and only if meeting these interests is a real prospect.
5.2 Immortality Is a Misfortune
We are left to wonder whether death would ever cease to be objectionable were we not ravaged by bad health and other hardships. Bernard Williams argues that it would be bad to live forever, even under the best of circumstances. His view is based on an assumption about the relationship between our identities and the desires that motivate us to live.
Consider a woman who wants to die. She might still take the view that if she is to live on, then she should be well fed and clothed. She wants food and clothing on condition she remain alive. In this sense her desires are conditional, and do not give her reason to live. Contrast a father who is committed to rearing a beloved daughter: he desires unconditionally that the child do well, and his desire gives him reason to live, because he can rear his child only if he survives. In this sense, his desire is categorical, or unconditional. Williams thinks that categorical desires are essential to identity, and give meaning to life. Through categorical desires, we are attached to projects or relationships that are definitive of the self; faced with their destruction, we would feel our lives are meaningless, and that in an important sense we cannot survive as the persons we once were.
The bearing on death, according to Williams, is, first, that people have good reason to condemn a death that is premature in the sense that it thwarts their categorical desires. Second, mortality is good, since people who live long enough eventually will lose the categorical desires with which they identify. Life will lose its novelty, and oppressive boredom will set in. To avoid ennui, superseniors would have to replace their fundamental desires, again and again. But this is to abandon their identities; it is tantamount to death.
As Williams says, lives of unimaginative routine will eventually grow stale if extended long enough. Of course, this is not supposed to comfort ordinary mortals, most of whom will die long before routine undermines the joy in living. However, as several theorists, including Nagel (1986, p. 224, n. 3) Glover (1977, p. 57), and Fischer (1994) have suggested, it is not obvious that life must become dull. Williams may have overlooked how rich and complex life can be, especially for superseniors who pursue multiple open-ended projects in the company of other superseniors. His response to this kind of criticism is that even rich and open-ended projects eventually will become routine (say after a few billion years), so our pursuits must be replaced periodically if we are to remain interested in life. But to phase in wholly new projects is to lose our identity.
Williams's response faces objections. First, we might avoid boredom by adding to our pursuits, and varying the way we approach them, without abandoning certain core interests that define us. Second, Williams is working with a view of identity that may be too narrow. Many of us would welcome a possibility that he downplays: gradually transforming our interests and projects over time. Transformation is not death. It is distinct from, and preferable to, annihilation. Transformation would be death only if identity were wholly a matter of retaining (most of) our psychological features over time. However, it is questionable that persistence requires this kind of connectedness. Even if our persistence hinges on our psychological features, transformation need not be death, since transformation is consistent with the gradual, continuous change of our psychological features. If we could live endlessly, the stages of our lives would display reduced connectedness, yet they could be continuous, which is a property that is important in the kind of survival most of us prize. Even after drinking at the fountain of eternal youth, we would tend to focus on relatively short stretches of our indefinitely extensive lives, and over these periods we would prize connectedness, since we are animated by specific projects and relationships that can be developed only if there are strong interconnections among the temporal stages of our lives. However, sometimes we would turn our attention to relatively long stretches of life, and then, prizing continuity, we would phase in new and worthwhile undertakings that build upon, and do not wholly replace, the old.
Even if death is usually bad for those who die, perhaps it need not be bad for us, if we prepare ourselves suitably. This might be possible if some form of preferentialism is true, and if, by altering our desires, we could cease to have any interests that dying would impair. For then we might be able to thanatize our desires, in this sense: abandon all desires that death might thwart. Among these are desires we can satisfy only if we live on for a few days, but also desires we cannot possibly satisfy within the span of a normal lifetime, and the desire for immortality itself. Instead of desiring that some project of mine succeed, which is a desire that might be thwarted by my death, I might instead adopt a conditionalized version of this desire, namely: should I live on, let my project succeed. If all goes well, thanatizing would insulate us from harm from death by leaving us with no interests with which dying interferes.
Unfortunately, this strategy will backfire. The main problem is that death can interfere with desire fulfillment not just by falsifying the objects of our desires but also by precluding our having desires (Luper 2013). So even if we resolve, from now on, to limit ourselves to desires whose objects cannot be falsified by death, we are still vulnerable to the harm death will do us if it precludes our having and fulfilling desires. Hence thanatizing would force us to avoid having any desires whose fulfillment would have benefitted us, and to deny ourselves such desires would be as bad for us as the harm we are trying to avoid.
However, the core idea of adapting our desires is useful, if not taken to an extreme. It is prudent to avoid taking on goals we cannot possibly attain, and hence prudent to eschew projects that cannot possibly be completed during the course of a normal lifetime.
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