Defaults in Semantics and Pragmatics

First published Fri Jun 30, 2006; substantive revision Sat Nov 13, 2010

The term ‘default meaning’ is used in a variety of ways in the literature, including statistically common interpretation, predictable meaning, or automatically retrieved meaning. To begin with a common-sense definition, default interpretation of the speaker's utterance is normally understood to mean salient meaning intended by the speaker, or presumed by the addressee to have been intended, and recovered (a) without the help of inference from the speaker's intentions or (b) without conscious inferential process altogether.

It has been accepted in post-Gricean pragmatics that communicators convey more information than is contained in the expressions they utter. For example, sentences (1a)–(2a) normally convey (1b)–(2b).

(1a) Tom finished writing a paper and went skating.
(1b) Tom finished writing a paper and then went skating.
(2a) Picasso's painting is of a crying woman.
(2b) The painting executed by Picasso is of a crying woman.

Such additions to the content of the uttered sentence were called by Grice (1975) generalized conversational implicature (GCI), that is, instances of context-independent pragmatic inference. Subsequently, the status of such context-independent additions has become the subject of heated debates. Some post-Griceans stay close to Grice's spirit and propose that there are salient, unmarked, presumed meanings that occur independently of context (Horn, e.g., 2004; Levinson 1995, 2000; Recanati 2003, 2004). Some allow for default meanings to draw on the situation of discourse (Jaszczolt, e.g., 2005, 2009, 2010). Others reject defaults tout court and subsume such salient meanings under the category of context-dependent pragmatic inference (Sperber and Wilson 1986; Carston, e.g., 1988, 2002). Some, following Grice, consider such pragmatic contributions to utterance meaning to be implicatures (Levinson), others classify them as pragmatic input to what is said (Recanati), explicature (Sperber, Wilson, Carston), or primary meaning (Jaszczolt), reserving the term ‘implicature’ for meanings that can be represented by separate logical form and that function independently from the content of the main utterance in reasoning. The reliance of this main content on the structure of the uttered sentence is also a matter of dispute (see e.g. Jaszczolt 2010).The third possibility is to regard them as a separate level of what is implicit in what is said (Bach 1994, 2007; Horn 2006). In short, the status of such ‘default’ meanings is still far from clear. However, at least in general terms, there is a reason for drawing a distinction between salient, automatic enrichments and costly pragmatic inference since some of these pragmatic contributions go through normally, as a matter of course. As Horn (2004: 4–5) puts it,

Whatever the theoretical status of the distinction, it is apparent that some implicatures are induced only in a special context (…), while others go through unless a special context is present (…).

The differences in using the term ‘default’ consist of the acceptance or rejection of at least the following properties:

  1. cancellability (also known as defeasibility) of preferred interpretations;
  2. availability of preferred interpretations without making use of conscious inference;
  3. shorter time required for their formation by the speaker and recognition by the addressee as compared with that required for the meanings induced through inference;
  4. the availability of preferred interpretations prior to the completion of the processing of the entire proposition (local, pre-propositional defaults).

The overview of the major perspective presented in Section 1 makes it clear that there is no consensus in the literature as to the unique set of properties that default interpretations should exhibit.

1. Default Interpretations in Semantics and Pragmatics

1.1 Default Reasoning

According to Kent Bach (1984), in utterance interpretation we use ‘jumping to conclusions’, or ‘default reasoning’. In other words, speakers know when context-dependent inference from the content of the sentence is required and when it is not. When it is not required, they progress, unconsciously, to the first available and unchallenged alternative. This step is cancellable when it becomes obvious to the addressee that the resulting meaning is not what the speaker had intended. What is important in this view is the proposed distinction between (conscious) inference and the unconscious act of ‘taking a step’, as Bach (1984: 40) calls it, towards the enriched, default interpretation. Such a move to the default meaning is not preceded by a conscious act of deliberation as to whether this meaning was indeed intended by the speaker. Rather, it just goes through unless it is stopped by some contextual or other factors that render it implausible.

Bach founds his account on the Gricean theory of intentional communication and therefore he has a ready explanation for the fact that different meanings come with different salience. He makes an assumption that intentions allow for different degrees of strength (Bach 1987b). He also adds that the salience has a lot to do with standardisation (Bach 1995; 1998) which consists of interpreting an utterance according to a pattern that is established by previous usage and as such shortcircuits the process of (conscious) inference. In short, ‘jumping to conclusions’ is performed unconsciously and effortlessly.

For Bach, such default meanings are neither implicatures nor what is said (or explicatures): they are implicit in what is said, or implicitures. They are a result of ‘fleshing out’ the meaning of the sentence in order to arrive at the intended proposition, or ‘filling in’ some conceptual gaps in the semantic representation that, only after this filling in, becomes a full proposition. But it has to be noted that default meanings do not exhaust the category membership of the impliciture: implicitures can be a result of default reasoning as well as a context-dependent process of inference.

1.2 Presumptive Meanings

Stephen Levinson (1995, 2000) argues for default interpretations that he calls presumptive meanings and classifies as implicatures. He uses the term borrowed from Grice, generalized conversational implicatures (GCIs), but ascribes some properties to them that differentiate them from Grice's GCIs. For Levinson, GCIs are neither properly semantic nor properly pragmatic. They should not be regarded as part of semantics as, for example, in Discourse Representation Theory (Kamp and Reyle 1993), nor should they be seen as a result of context-dependent inference performed by the hearer in the process of the recovery of the speaker's intention. Instead, “they sit midway, systematically influencing grammar and semantics on the one hand and speaker-meaning on the other.” (Levinson 2000: 25).

Such presumed meanings are the result of rational, communicative behaviour and arise through three assumed heuristics: (1) ‘What isn't said, isn't’; (2) ‘What is expressed simply is stereotypically exemplified’, and (3) ‘What's said in an abnormal way isn't normal’, called Q, I, and M heuristics (principles) respectively. Levinson's GCIs, unlike their Gricean progenitors, can arise at various stages in utterance processing: the hearer need not have processed the whole proposition before arriving at some presumed meanings. Also, unlike Grice's GCIs that are taken to be speaker's intended meanings, Levinson's presumptive meanings seem to be hearer's meanings, obtained by the hearer as a result of the assumptions he or she made in the process of utterance interpretation (see Saul 2002 and Horn 2006 for discussion). On the other hand, like Grice's GCIs, they are cancellable without contradiction. This feature of cancellability is, however, still a matter of dispute as it is difficult at present to decide between the rival views (i) that a particular GCI arose and was subsequently cancelled or (ii) did not arise at all due to being blocked by the context. There is not sufficient experimental evidence to support either stance. The answer to this question is closely dependent on the answer to the so-called globalism-localism dispute. If, as Levinson claims, default interpretations arise ‘locally’, out of the processing of a pre-propositional unit such as a word or a phrase, then they have to be subjected to frequent cancellation once the proposition has been processed. If, however, despite the incrementality of the interpretation process they arise post-propositionally, or ‘globally’, in accordance with Grice's original assumption, then utterance interpretation can proceed without costly backtracking (see Geurts 2009, Jaszczolt 2008, 2010, Noveck and Sperber 2004).

1.3 Rhetorical Structure Rules

Gricean pragmatics is not the only approach in which defaults are discussed. Defaults and nonmonotonic reasoning are also well entrenched in computational linguistics. Defaults are distinguished there with respect to various units of meaning, including morphemes and words (Asher and Lascarides 1995; Lascarides and Copestake 1998). The tradition can be traced back to Humboldt, Jespersen and Cassirer, and more recently to Reiter's (1980) default logic and his default rules of the form:


where C can be concluded if A has been concluded and B can be assumed (and not B cannot be proven). Such defaults can be built into standard logic:

It is just as valid to conclude ‘Presumably x is B’ from ‘x is A’ and ‘A's are normally B’ as it is to conclude ‘x is B’ from ‘x is A’ and the ‘All A's are B’. One does not have to set one's mind to a different mode of reasoning to get the former. Veltman (1996: 257).

But the resulting logic will become nonmonotonic because there are default rules and default operators in the language. The literature on the topic is vast and is best considered as a separate topic from our current concern (see e.g., Thomason (1997) for an overview).

The best example of how default interpretations can be accounted for in formal semantic theory is Segmented Discourse Representation Theory (SDRT, e.g., Asher and Lascarides 2003). SDRT is an offshoot of Discourse Representation Theory, a dynamic semantic approach to meaning according to which meaning arises incrementally through context change. In SDRT, defaults are regarded as highly probable routes that an interpretation of a sentence may take in a particular situation of discourse. There are rules of discourse, so-called rhetorical structure rules, that produce such default interpretations. These rules spell out the overall assumption that discourse is coherent and that this coherence can be further elaborated on by proposing a set of regularities. For example, two events represented as two consecutive utterances are presumed to stand in the relation of Narration, where the event described in the first utterance precedes the one from the second utterance. If the second utterance describes a state, then it stands in the relation of Background to the first one. There are many other types of such relations, among them Explanation and Elaboration. Axioms prevent a relation from being of two incompatible types at the same time. The relations between states and events are computed as strong probabilities, in the process called defeasible reasoning. The laws of reasoning are ‘defeasible’ in the sense that if the antecedent of a default rule is satisfied, then its consequent is normally, but not always, satisfied. The inference normally, but not always, obtains: ceteris paribus, the relation predicted by the law obtains, but in certain circumstances it may not. It is also nonmonotonic in that the relation may disappear with the growth of information.

SDRT includes the following components: (i) the semantics of sentences alone, that is the underspecified output of the syntactic processing of the sentences; (ii) the semantics of information content, that is, further addition to these underdetermined meaning, including default additions summarised by rhetorical structure rules; and (iii) the semantics of information packaging that ‘glues’ such enriched representations by means of the rules of the rhetorical structure of discourse. This ‘gluing together’ is defeasible, in that the rules result in the dependency A>B, that is ‘if A, then normally B’, where A and B stand for the enriched propositional representations of two sentences. In other words, they stand for the meanings of two consecutive utterances.

The main strength of this approach is that it is fully formalized and it allows for computational modelling of discourse that takes pragmatic links between utterances seriously and incorporates them in the semantics. Next, it also aspires to cognitive reality and although the cognitive reality of the particular rules can be disputed, the view of discourse processing that they jointly produce is highly plausible. Finally, as the authors often stress, SDRT allows them, for most part, to model discourse without recourse to speakers' intentions. However, a direct comparison with Gricean accounts of defaults is precluded by the fact that we would not be comparing like with like. In SDRT, the default interpretations are the defaults that are formalized with respect to the actually occurring discourse: there are rules that tell us how to take two events represented in two consecutive sentences, there are also rules that specify the relation between them depending on some features of their content. Gricean defaults are, on the contrary, defaults for speakers' overall knowledge state: they may arise because the speaker did not say something he or she could have said or because the speaker assumed some cultural or social information to be shared knowledge. For example, we cannot formalize the interpretation of (3a) as (3b) by means of rhetorical structure rules. The interpretation of (3a) as (3b) fits under the SDRT component (ii) rather than (iii) above, i.e., the semantics of information content rather than packaging.

(3a) Pablo's painting is of a crying woman.
(3b) Picasso's painting is of a crying woman.

1.4 Defaults in Optimality-Theory Pragmatics

Optimality-Theory pragmatics (OT pragmatics, Blutner 2000; Blutner and Zeevat 2004) is another attempt at a computational modelling of discourse but unlike SDRT it makes use of a post-Gricean, intention-based account of discourse interpretation. The process of interpretation is captured in a set of pragmatic constraints. The pragmatic additions to the underdetermined output of syntax are governed by a rationality principle called an optimization procedure that is spelled out as a series of constraints. These constraints are ranked as to their strength and they are defeasible, that is, they can be violated (see Zeevat 2000, 2004). The resulting interpretation of an utterance is the outcome of the working of such constraints. OT pragmatics formalizes and extends the Gricean principles of cooperative communicative behaviour found in Horn (1984) and Levinson (1995, 2000). For example, STRENGTH means preference for readings that are informationally stronger, CONSISTENCY means preference for interpretations that do not conflict with the extant context, FAITH-INT stands for ‘faithful interpretation’, that is interpreting the utterance without leaving out any aspect of what the speaker says. The ordering of these constraints is FAITH-INT, CONSISTENCY, STRENGTH. The interaction of such constraints, founded on Levinson's heuristics, explains how the hearer arrives at the intended interpretation. At the same time, this model can be regarded as producing default, presumed interpretations. With respect to finding an antecedent for an anaphor, for example, the interaction of the constraints explains the general tendency to look for the referent in the immediately preceding discourse rather than in the more remote fragments or, rather than constructing a referent ad hoc. In other words, it explains the preference for binding over accommodation (van der Sandt 1992).

Defaults in OT pragmatics combine the precision of a formal account with the psychological reality of Gricean intention-based explanations. The main difference is that they don't seem to be defeasible: OT pragmatics tells us how an actual interpretation arose, rather than what the default interpretation could be. Constraints are ranked, so to speak, post hoc: they explain what actually happened and why, rather than what should happen according to the rules of rational communicative behaviour. In other words, context is incorporated even sooner into the process of utterance interpretation than in Gricean accounts and allows for non-defeasible, albeit standard, default, interpretations. With respect to this feature they resemble defaults of Default Semantics discussed in Section 1.6.

1.5 Defaults in Truth-Conditional Pragmatics

In truth-conditional pragmatics (Recanati's 2002, 2003, 2004, 2007), the meaning of an utterance consists of the output of syntactic processing combined with the output of pragmatic processing. Pragmatic processing, however, is not necessarily fulfilled by conscious inference: processes that enrich the output of syntax are sub-doxastic, direct, and automatic. The resulting representation of utterance meaning is the only representation that has cognitive reality and it is subject to truth-conditional analysis. On this account, the content of an utterance is arrived at directly, similar to the act of perception of an object. Recanati calls this view anti-inferentialist in that “communication is as direct as perception” (Recanati 2002: 109): the processing of the speaker's intentions is direct, automatic, and unreflective. Such processes enriching the actually uttered content are called primary pragmatic processes. Some of them make use of contextual information, others are context-independent. So, they include some cases of Grice's GCIs as well as some particularised implicatures (PCIs) – but only the ones which further develop the logical form of the uttered sentence. When the pragmatic addition constitutes a separate thought, it is, on this account, an implicature proper, arrived at through a secondary, conscious, and reflective pragmatic process.

There are two kinds of enrichment of the content obtained through the syntactic processing: (i) completing of a semantically incomplete proposition as in (4b), called saturation, and (ii) further elaboration of the meaning of the sentence that is not guided by any syntactic or conceptual gaps but instead is merely triggered by the hearer's opinion that something other than the bare meaning of the sentence was intended, as in (5b). The latter process is called free enrichment.

(4a) The fence isn't strong enough.
(4b) The fence isn't strong enough to withstand the gales.
(5a) John hasn't eaten.
(5b) John hasn't eaten dinner yet.

Default interpretations are here defaults for processing of an utterance in a particular context. Automatic and unconscious enrichment produces a default interpretation of the utterance and “[o]nly when there is something wrong does the hearer suspend or inhibit the automatic transition which characterizes the normal cases of linguistic communication”. (Recanati 2002: 109). To sum up, such defaults ensue automatically, directly, without the effort of inference. They are cancellable, they can make use of contextual clues, but they are not ‘processes’ in any cognitively interesting sense of the term: they don't involve conscious inference, albeit, in Recanati's terminology, they involve inference in the broad sense: the agent is not aware of performing an inference but is aware of the consequences of this pragmatic enrichment of the interpreted sentence.

1.6 Types of Defaults in Default Semantics

One of the main questions to ask about any theory of utterance interpretation is what sources information about meaning comes from. In Default Semantics, on the second revised version of the theory (Jaszczolt, e.g., 2009, 2010), utterance meaning is the outcome of merging of information that comes from five sources: (i) word meaning and sentence structure (WS); (ii) situation of discourse (SD); (iii) properties of human inferential system (IS); (iv) stereotypes and presumptions about society and culture (SC); and world knowledge (WK). WS is the output of the syntactic processing of the sentence, or its logical form. SD stands for the widely understood context in which the discourse is immersed. IS pertains to properties of mental states which trigger certain types of interpretations. For example, the property of intentionality ensures that we normally use referring expressions with a referential intention that is the strongest for the given context. SC pertains to the background knowledge of societal norms and customs and cultural heritage. WK encompasses information about physical laws, nature, environment, etc. It is important to stress that the four sources that accompany WS do not merely enrich the output of the latter. All of the sources are equally powerful and can override each other's output. This constitutes a substantial breakaway from the established boundary between explicit and implicit content.

The identification of the sources also allows us to propose a processing model in Default Semantics in which three types of contribution to utterance interpretation are distinguished: (i) processing of the sentence (called combination of word meaning and sentence structure, WS); (ii) conscious pragmatic inference (CPI) from three of the sources distinguished above: SD, SC, and WK; and (iii) two kinds of default, automatic meanings: cognitive defaults (CD) triggered by the source IS, and social, cultural and world-knowledge defaults (SCWD).

The primary meaning is arrived at through the interaction of these processes and therefore need not bear close resemblance to the logical form of the sentence; the output of WS can vary in significance as compared with the output of other types of processes. For example, to borrow Bach's (1994) scenario, let us imagine little Johnny cutting his finger and crying, to which his mother reacts by uttering (6a).

(6a) You are not going to die.

The what is said/explicature of (6a) is something to the effect of (6b). There may also be other communicated meanings but those fall in the domain of implicatures.

(6b) You are not going to die from this cut.

In Default Semantics, the explicit content of an utterance is its most salient meaning. This is so even when this meaning does not bear any resemblance to the logical form derived from the syntactic structure of the uttered sentence. In other words, CPI can override WS and produce, say, (6c) as utterance meaning (called merger representation) for the given context. The explicit content of the utterance need not be even partially isomorphic with the meaning of the uttered sentence: it need not amount to the development of the sentence's logical form.

(6c) There is nothing to worry about.

CDs and SCWDs are default interpretations. Similar to Recanati's automatic free enrichment, these default meanings cut across Grice's GCI/PCI divide. Some of them arise due to the properties of words or constructions used and are present by default independently of the context of the utterance, while others are default meanings for the particular situation of discourse. CDs are default interpretations that are triggered by the properties of mental states. For example, when speakers use a definite description in an utterance, they normally use it referentially (about a particular, known, intersubjectively recognisable) individual rather than attributively (about whoever fits the description). This default referential use can be given a functional as well as a cognitive explanation. Firstly, it can be explained in terms of the strength of the referential intention associated with the act of utterance: ceteris paribus, humans provide the strongest information relevant and available to them. At the same time, in cognitive terms, it can be explained through the property of mental states that underlie the speaker's speech act: this is the property of intentionality or aboutness, in the sense in which the mental state is about a particular object, be it a person, thing, or situation. Like the strongest referring, so the strongest aboutness, is the norm, the default. For example, the description ‘the architect who designed St Paul's cathedral’ in (7a) is likely to be interpreted as ‘Christopher Wren’, as in (7b).

(7a) The architect who designed St Paul's cathedral was a genius.
(7b) Sir Christopher Wren was a genius.

Next, SCWDs are default interpretations that arise due to the shared cultural and social background of the interlocutors. To use a well worn example, in (8a), it is the shared presumption that babies are raised by their own mothers that allows the addressee to arrive at (8b).

(8a) The baby cried and the mother picked it up.
(8b) The baby cried and the baby's mother picked it up.

In CDs and SCWDs, no conscious inference is involved. The natural concomitant of reducing the role of the logical form (WS) to one of four equally potent constituents of utterance meaning is a revised view of compositionality. The compositional nature of meaning is retained as a methodological assumption but this compositionality is now sought at the level of the merger of information from the five sources, arrived at through the interaction of the four identified processes. The output of these processes is called merger representation and is expected to be a compositional structure. Current research focuses of providing an algorithm for the interaction of the output of the identified processes.

2. Definitional Characteristics of Default Interpretations

It evident from the sample of approaches presented above that the notion of default meaning is used slightly differently in each of them. We can extract the following differences in the understanding of default interpretations:

[1a] Defaults belong to competence.
[1b] Defaults belong to performance.
[2a] Defaults are context-independent.
[2b] Defaults can make use of contextual information.
[3a] Defaults are easily defeasible.
[3b] Defaults are not normally defeasible.
[4a] Defaults are a result of subdoxastic, automatic process.
[4b] Defaults can sometimes involve conscious pragmatic inference.
[5a] Defaults are developments of the logical form of the uttered sentence.
[5b] Defaults need not enrich the logical form of the sentence but may override it.
[6a] Defaults can all be classified as one type of pragmatic process.
[6b] Defaults come from qualitatively different sources in utterance processing.

There is also disagreement concerning the following properties, to be discussed below:

[7a] Defaults are always based on a complete proposition.
[7b] Defaults can be ‘local’, ‘sub-propositional’, based on a word or a phrase.
[8a] Defaults necessarily arise quicker than non-default meanings. Hence they can be tested for experimentally by measuring the time of processing of the utterance.
[8b] Defaults do not necessarily arise quicker than non-default meanings because both types of meaning can be based on conscious, effortful inference. Hence, the existence of defaults cannot be tested experimentally by measuring the time of processing of the utterance.

Some of these properties are interrelated, some of the others just tend to occur together. Levinson's presumptive meanings, for example, are defeasible, i.e., fulfil 3a, local [7b], pertain to competence [1a], and are faster to process than inferential meanings [8a]. They are competence defaults of the type 1a because they arise independently of the situation of discourse and are triggered by the construction alone, due to the presumed default scenario that it pertains to. For example, scalar inference from ‘many’ to ‘not all’ is a case of a competence-based, context-independent, local default. Similarly, rhetorical structure rules of SDRT give rise to competence defaults. (9b) is a result of the common, shared knowledge that pushing normally results in falling.

(9a) You pushed me and I fell.
(9b) You pushed me and as a result I fell.

On Levinson's account, such defaults arise as soon as the relevant word or expression is processed and as soon as the situation is clear to the addressee. Such meanings can subsequently be cancelled if further context witnesses against them.

As regards feature 7, it is at least conceivable that presumed meanings arise as soon as the triggering word or construction has been processed by the hearer. For Levinson (1995, 2000), salient meanings have this property of arising even before the processing of the sentence is completed. In other words, they arise pre-propositionally or locally. Discourse interpretation proceeds incrementally and similarly the assignment of default meanings to the processed segments is incremental. For example, the scalar term many in (10a) triggers the presumed meaning not all as soon as it has been processed. The subscript d in (10b) stands for the default meaning and is placed immediately after the triggering construction.

(10a) Many people liked Peter Carey's new novel.
(10b) Many (d many but not all) people liked Peter Carey's new novel.

Similarly, ‘paper cup’ and ‘tea cup’ give rise to presumed meanings locally, as in (11b) and (12b) respectively.

(11a) Those paper cups are not suitable for hot drinks.
(11b) Those paper cups (d cups made of paper) are not suitable for hot drinks.
(12a) I want three tea cups, three saucers and three spoons please.
(12b) I want three tea cups (d cups used for drinking tea), three saucers and three spoons please.

Inferences such as those in (11b) and (12b) are very common. They are, however, substantially different from the inference in (10b) in that the resulting meaning is the lexical meaning of the collocation, similar to that of a compound. Other examples include ‘pocket knife’ vs. e.g., ‘bread knife’, and ‘coffee spoon’ vs. e.g., ‘silver spoon’. It is worth remembering that on Levinson's account, presumed, salient interpretations can be explained through the principles of rational communicative behaviour summed up as his Q, I and M heuristics (see Section 1.2 and Levinson 1995, 2000). (10b) arises through the Q-heuristic, ‘What isn't said isn't’, while (11b) and (12b) arise through the I-heuristic, ‘What is expressed simply is stereotypically exemplified’. Most generally, the defaults that arise through the Q-heuristic exploit a comparison with what was not, but might have been, said. For example, ‘most’ triggers an inference to a denial of a stronger item ‘all’; ‘believe’ triggers an inference to ‘not know’. At the same time, they are all easily cancellable, as (10c) illustrates.

(10c) Many, and possibly all, people liked Peter Carey's new novel.

I-heuristic exploits only what there is in the sentence: it is an inference to a stereotype and as such is not so easily cancellable. For example, (13) and (14) seem rather bizarre.

(13) Those paper cups, I mean cups used for storing paper, are full.
(14) I want three tea cups, I mean cups used for storing tea leaves.

Perhaps the fact that these defaults are not so easily cancellable comes from their property of resembling lexical compounds and, like in the case of compounds, the link between the juxtaposed lexemes is very strong in their case. If indeed it is plausible to treat them on a par with compounds, then they are not very useful as a supporting argument for local defaults: instead of defaults, we have lexical meaning of compounds.

Local defaults allow us to dispose of the level of an underspecified propositional representation in semantic theory. Since the inferences proceed incrementally, then as soon as the triggering expression is encountered, there is no level of a minimal proposition that would constitute a foundation for further inferences. If there is one, it is just accidental, in that the triggering item may just happen to be placed at the end of the sentence, for example ‘tea cups’ in the first clause of (14) above. But it is also important to note that a lot more work has to be done to make the status of such defaults clear. For example, Levinson's defaults are local, but at the same time “cancellable” to the extent that the context may prevent them from arising. This leads to a difficulty in examples such as (15)–(16).

(15) You are allowed five attempts to get the prize.
(16) You are allowed to do five minutes of piano practice today because it is late.

It is clear that in (15) ‘five’ is to be understood as ‘at most five’. How are we to model the process of utterance interpretation for this case? Are we to propose that the inference from ‘at least five’ to ‘exactly five’ takes place and is then cancelled? Or are we to propose that ‘five’ is by default ‘at least five’ (or underdetermined five, or ‘exactly five’, depending on the orientation (see Horn 1992, Koenig 1993, Bultinck 2005) and becomes altered in the process of pragmatic inference to ‘at most five’ in the context of ‘allow’? But then, ‘allow’ is also present in (16) and the inference to ‘at most’ is not at all salient: doing a longer piano practice is generally preferred but may not be what the addressee likes doing and ‘five’ may end up, in this context, to mean ‘as little as five’ or ‘five or more’, stressing that more than five is not expected but allowed. In (17), the problem is even more salient. If ‘five’ triggers locally the ‘exactly’ meaning, then the default has to be cancelled immediately afterwards when ‘are needed’ has been processed and the ‘at least’ interpretation becomes obvious.

(17) Five votes are needed to pass the proposal.

Alternatively, we can stipulate that the first inference takes place after the word ‘needed’. It is clear that a lot needs to be done to clarify the notion of local defaults: most importantly, (i) what counts as the triggering unit, (ii) to what extent context is consulted, and (iii) how common cancellation is. But it seems that if defaults prove to be so local as to arise out of words or even morphemes, then they are part of the computational power of grammar and they belong to grammar and lexicon rather than to semantics and pragmatics. Chierchia (2004) and Landman (2000) represent this view. Chierchia argues that since scalar implicatures do not arise in downward-entailing contexts (contexts that license inference from a set to its subset), there is a clear syntactic constraint on their behaviour. Much more theorizing and substantial empirical support are needed to establish the exact size of the local domains before this issue can be taken any further.

As far as feature [8] is concerned, some experimental work has been performed to help decide between [8a] and [8b], measuring the recovery time for the default meaning as opposed to the non-default one. The development of the ability to use scalar inferences has also been tested (Noveck 2001; Papafragou and Musolino 2003; Musolino 2004; Noveck and Sperber 2004). It has been argued on the basis of some evidence that default interpretations are not faster to produce and can be absent altogether from processing in the case of five-year old subjects. Noveck (2004) provides the following evidence against Levinson's automatic and fast defaults. Children were presented with some descriptions of situations in which the order of the events was inverted in narration. They had to assess whether the description was true or false. The outcome was that the children who agreed with the inverted description reacted faster than the ones who disagreed. It was then concluded that enriching ‘and’ to ‘and then’ is not automatic: it takes time. And, if pragmatically enriched responses take longer, then they cannot be the default ones (see Noveck 2004: 314). Similarly, with scalar terms, if one could demonstrate that the enriched readings, such as ‘some but not all’ for ‘some’, arise faster than ‘some but not necessarily not all’, one would have strong evidence in support of the defaults view.

The problem is that all these experiments assume Levinson's notion of a fast and inference-free default while this is, as we have seen, by no means the only understanding of default interpretations. The experimenters talk of arguments for and against ‘the Default View’, ‘the Default Model’ (see also Bezuidenhout and Morris 2004, Breheny et al 2006), while, in fact there is no such unique model to be falsified. The list of possible defining characteristics of default interpretations in [1]–[8] shows that it is difficult to talk about the default meaning. It is much harder to provide experimental evidence for or against salient meaning that are so construed that they draw on some contextual information, arise late in utterance processing, and are not normally cancellable. The latter also seem much more intuitively plausible in that they are nothing less but shortcuts through costly pragmatic inference. They are just normal, unmarked meanings for the context and it is not improbable that such default, salient interpretations will prove to constitute just the polar end of a scale of degrees of inference rather than have qualitatively different properties from non-default, clearly inference-based interpretations. They will occupy the area towards the ‘zero’ end of the scale of inference but will not trigger the dichotomy ‘default vs. inferential interpretation’. It is also difficult to pinpoint the boundary between default and non-default interpretations when we allow context and inference to play a role in default meanings, that is when we allow [2b] and [8b]. This does not mean, however, that we should pour them out with the bath water and resort to proposing nonce-inference in the case of every single utterance produced in discourse. When context-dependence of defaults is allowed, then the main criterion for such meanings is their subdoxastic arrival. When conscious inference is allowed, then the main criterion is the fact that only minimal contextual input is allowed, such as, say, the co-text in (18). In (18), the definite description ‘the first daughter’ has the attributive rather than referential reading.

(18) The first daughter to be born to Mr and Mrs Brown will be called Scarlett.

On a traditional Gricean view of post-propositional, sentence-based pragmatic inference, we have here the default attributive reading: the expression ‘to be born’ and the future auxiliary ‘will’ signal that no particular, extant, known individual is referred to. This is also the view followed in Default Semantics (Section 1.6) where both inference and defaults are ‘global’, computed after the whole sentence has been processed. In other words, information arrived at through WS merges with that from CPI, CD and SCWD when all of the WS is ready. But in Default Semantics there is no default involved in (18): we have WS merging with CPI to produce the attributive reading. On Levinson's presumptive meanings account (Section 1.2), it can be stipulated that (18) would fall in-between GCIs and PCIs: the only context that is required is the sentence itself, so the example is not different from any other cases of GCIs. But the locality of the GCI is the problem: depending on how we construct the length of the triggering expression, we obtain a GCI or a PCI. When we construe it as ‘the first daughter’, the sub-part of the definite noun phrase, then we obtain the referential reading as the default, to be cancelled by ‘to be born’. In short, we don't know yet, at the current state of theorizing and experimenting, what is going on here and which of the potential defining characteristics of defaults to employ. Neither are we ready to propose the demarcation line between default and non-default interpretations. We can conceive of the first as shortcuts through inference but such a definition will not suffice for delimiting a category. We can, however, concede that default interpretations are governed by some principles of rational behaviour in communication, be it Gricean maxims, neo-Gricean principles or heuristics, the logic of information structuring of SDRT, or a version of defeasible logic. We can also safely propose that defaults are salient meanings over and above the meanings that come from words and the structure of the sentences.

Last but not least, it is questionable whether all cases of preferred readings should indeed be thrown into the same basket. Some presumed meanings are context-free, some are not. Some are automatic, some appear to use some minimal inference. Next, some are local, some are global (albeit on some accounts only accidentally global, when the relevant expression falls at the end of the sentence). Some come from the lexicon or grammar, others come from the way humans think or the way they construct their social and cultural reality. There seems to be no compelling argument for their unitary analysis. It appears that it is this diversity of salient meanings that the research has to turn to first. The diversity of default interpretations pertains not only to their features listed in [1]–[8] but also to their provenance. We are still far from having a reliable typology of default meanings but the categories just listed are likely to be crucial.

3. Concluding Remarks and Loose Ends

This comparison of various selected approaches to default interpretations in semantics and pragmatics allows for some generalizations. Firstly, it is evident from the surveyed literature that, contrary to the assumptions of some experimental pragmaticists, there is no one, unique ‘default model’ of utterance interpretation. Instead, default, salient meanings are recognised in many approaches to utterance interpretation but they are defined by slightly different sets of characteristic features. Next, in the present state of theorizing and experimenting, while the rationale for default interpretations is strong, some of the properties of such interpretations are still in need of further investigation. For example, the discussions of locality of defaults and their subdoxastic arrival are in need of empirical support before they can be taken any further. Moreover, defaults give rise to the problem of the granularity of enrichment in that the boundary between default enrichment and further implicated meanings is not clear. The existence of a shortcut through costly inference is an appealing and hardly controversial thesis but the exact properties of such salient meanings are still subject to cutting edge disputes.

Finally, the automatic arrival at context-dependent meanings has to be discussed as part of the debate between the direct access view and the modular view of language processing. Direct access predicts that context is responsible for activating relevant senses to the extent that the salience of the particular sense of a lexical item does not play a part. According to the modular view, lexical meanings that are not appropriate for the context are also activated, only to be suppressed at the next stage of processing. With the rise of theories that sit between these polar views (see e.g. Giora 2003), the question of the compatibility of the salience in the lexicon and the default status of utterance interpretations requires more attention. What can be attributed to the lexicon (or, in terms of Default Semantics, what exactly is the scope of WS) and what to the context of utterance, remains an unresolved question.


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discourse representation theory | Grice, Paul | implicature | logic: non-monotonic | logical form | meaning, theories of | pragmatics | reasoning: defeasible | speech acts


This entry draws on some sections of my ‘Default Interpretations’, forthcoming in Handbook of Pragmatics Online, vol. 10, 2006, ed. by J.-O. Ostman and J. Verschueren. I owe thanks to John Benjamins Publishing Co., Amsterdam, for permission to use the material.

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