# Logical Form

*First published Tue Oct 19, 1999; substantive revision Mon Jun 22, 2009*

Some inferences are impeccable. Examples like (1–3) illustrate reasoning that cannot lead from true premises to false conclusions.

(1) John danced if Mary sang, and Mary sang; so John danced. (2) Every politician is deceitful, and every senator is a politician; so every senator is deceitful. (3) The detective is in the garden; so someone is in the garden.

In such cases, a thinker takes no epistemic risk by endorsing the conditional claim that if the premises are true, so is the conclusion. The conclusion follows immediately from the premises, without any further assumptions that might turn out to be false. By contrast, examples like (4–6) illustrate reasoning that involves at least some risk of going wrong—from correct premises to a mistaken conclusion.

(4) John danced if Mary sang, and John danced; so Mary sang. (5) Every feathered biped is a bird, and Tweety is a feathered biped; so Tweety can fly. (6) Every human born before 1870 died; so every human will die.

Inference (4) is not secure. Suppose that John dances whenever Mary sings, and sometimes when Mary doesn't sing. Similarly, with regard to (5), Tweety might turn out to be a bird that cannot fly. Even (6) falls short of the demonstrative character exhibited by (1–3). While laws of nature may preclude immortality, the conclusion of (6) goes beyond its premise, even if it is in some sense foolish to resist the inference.

Appeals to logical form arose in the context of attempts to say more about this intuitive distinction between impeccable inferences, which invite metaphors of security and immediacy, and inferences that involve a risk of slipping from truth to falsity. The motivations for saying more are both practical and theoretical. Experience teaches us that an inference can initially seem more secure than it is; and if we knew which inferences are risk-free, we might be more alert to the points at which we risk error. Such alertness might be valuable, even if the risks are tolerable. As we shall see, claims about inference are also intimately connected with claims about the nature of thought, its relation to language, and the possibility that ordinary language “disguises” the underlying structure of thought.

Many philosophers have been especially interested in the possibility
that language disguises thought, in part because this suggests a
diagnosis for *why* human thinkers are tempted to adopt certain
problematic claims about the world we think/talk about. For example,
apparent similarities across sentences like ‘Odysseus
arrived’, ‘Nobody arrived’, and ‘The king
arrived’ might lead one to think that the corresponding thoughts
exhibit a common subject-predicate form. But even if
‘Odysseus’ indicates an entity that can be the subject a
thought T that is true if and only if the subject of T arrived, other
considerations (see sections 4 and 5) suggest that
‘Nobody’ and ‘The king’ do not indicate
subjects in this sense. There are related issues concerning
implication —e.g., why the sentence ‘Nobody arrived’
indicates a thought that *doesn't* imply any arrival. But there
are also broader issues concerning the kind(s) of structure that
thoughts and sentences exhibit. For if many thoughts do not have
subject-predicate form, perhaps thoughts and sentences exhibit
different kinds of structure; or perhaps many sentences do not have
the simple structures they initially appear to have. As we'll see,
this raises further questions about how to construe the various
proposals: are they normative claims about how we ought to think/talk,
or empirical hypotheses about certain aspects of
psycholgical/linguistic reality?

In short, we would like to know *in virtue of what* (if
anything) an inference is impeccable, in part because this a
potentially useful way of asking questions about how human language is
related to human thought. The most common suggestion has been that
certain inferences are secure by virtue of their logical form. Though
unsurprisingly, conceptions of form have evolved, along with
conceptions of logic and language.

- 1. Patterns of Reason
- 2. Propositions and Traditional Grammar
- 3. Motivations for Revision
- 4. Frege and Formal Language
- 5. Descriptions and Analysis
- 6. Regimentation and Communicative Slack

- 7. Notation and Restricted Quantification
- 8. Transformational Grammar
- 9. Semantic Structure and Events
- 10. Further Questions
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Patterns of Reason

An ancient thought is that impeccable inferences exhibit patterns that
can be characterized schematically by abstracting away from the
specific contents of particular premises and conclusions, thereby
revealing a general form common to many other impeccable inferences.
Such forms, along with the inferences that exemplify them, are said to
be *valid*. In a valid inference, the premises are strong enough
to guarantee the conclusion, which seems (somehow) to be “contained in”
the premises. With regard to (1), it seems that the conclusion is part
of the first premise, and that the second premise is another part of
the first. We can express this point by saying that (1) is an inference
of the following form: **B** if **A**, and
**A**; so **B**. Inferences like (7) share
this form.

(7) Chris swam if Pat was asleep, and Pat was asleep; so Chris swam.

The Stoics discussed such inferences, all of which are equally
secure, using ordinal numbers (instead of letters) to reflect the
abstract form: if the first then the second, and the first; so the
second. In addition to this variant of ‘**B** if
**A**, and **A**; so
**B**’, the Stoics formulated other valid
schemata.

Ifthe firstthenthe second, but notthe second; so notthe first.Either

the firstorthe second, but notthe second; sothe first.Not both

the firstandthe second, butthe first; so notthe second.

Schematic formulations require variables. And let us introduce ‘proposition’ as a term of art for whatever the variables above, represented in bold, range over. Propositions are thus potential premises/conclusions—“things” that can figure in valid inferences. Presumably, such things can be evaluated for truth or falsity; they can be endorsed or rejected. But this leaves it open what propositions are: sentences, statements, states of affairs, or whatever. For now, let's just assume that declarative sentences can be used to “indicate” propositions; for discussion, see Cartwright(1962) and the essay on structured propositions.

A significant complication is that in ordinary conversation, the context matters with regard to which proposition (if any) is indicated with a given sentence. For example, ‘Pat is asleep’ can be used at one time to indicate a true premise, and at another time to indicate a false premise. A given speaker might use ‘I am tired’ to express a false proposition, while another speaker uses the same sentence at the same time to express a true proposition. And what counts as being tired can vary across conversations. Context sensitivity, of various kinds, is ubiquitous in ordinary discourse. But for simplicity, let's idealize and assume that we can at least speak of the proposition indicated in a given context with a sentence. Eventually, we may have to modify even this assumption. (Is any one proposition indicated with ‘He is bald’ in a given context? Perhaps there is a range of candidate propositions, with no fact of the matter as to which is the proposition indicated; see the entry on vagueness.) But it seems clear that humans can at least use “idealized” sentences, like ‘Every circle is an ellipse’ or ‘Thirteen is a prime number’, to indicate premises of valid arguments. And while ordinary conversation surely differs from theoretical discourse in mathematics, the intuitive distinction between impeccable and risky inferences is not limited to special contexts in which one tries to think especially clearly about especially abstract matters. Correlatively, while context sensitivity is an important phenomenon, we can abstract away from it and still learn things about the nature of valid inference.

Another complication is that in speaking of an inference, one might
be talking about (i) a *process* in which a thinker draws a
conclusion from some premises, or (ii) the *propositions* a
thinker would accept—perhaps tentatively or
hypothetically—if she accepted the premises and conclusion, with
one proposition designated as an alleged consequence of the others. But
we can describe a risky thought process as one in which a thinker who
accepts certain propositions comes to accept, on that basis, a
proposition that does not follow from the relevant assumptions. And it
will be simpler to focus on premises/conclusions, as opposed to
episodes of reasoning.

With regard to (1),

(1) John danced if Mary sang, and Mary sang; so John danced.

the inference seems to be secure in part *because* its first
premise has the form ‘**B** if
**A**’. If the proposition in question lacked this
form, one could not explain the impeccability of (1) by saying that
‘**B** if **A**, and
**A**; so **B**’ is a form of valid
inference. It is not obvious that *all* impeccable inferences
are instances of some valid form, and thus inferences whose
impeccability is due to the forms of the relevant propositions. But
this thought has served as an ideal for the study of inference, at
least since Aristotle's treatment of examples like (2).

(2) Every politician is deceitful, and every senator is a politician; so every senator is deceitful.

The first premise—viz., the proposition that every politician
is deceitful—seems to have several parts, each of which is a part
of the second premise or the conclusion. And the inference is
presumably valid because these proposition-parts exhibit the right
pattern. Aristotle, predating the Stoics, captured this idea by
noting that conditional claims of the following form are sure to be
true: if every *P* is *D* and every *S* is a
*P*, then every *S* is *D*. Correspondingly, the
following inference schema is valid:

EveryPisD, and everySis aP; so everySisD.

Aristotle discussed a range of such inferences, called syllogisms,
involving quantificational propositions indicated by words like
‘every’ and ‘some’. (Although Aristotle
typically presented his syllogisms as conditional claims, like
‘if *D* belongs to every *P*, and *P*
belongs to every *S*, then *D* belongs to every
*S*’.) Two other syllogistic forms are expressed below as
valid schemata.

EveryPisD, and someSis aP; so someSisD.Some

Sis notD, everySis aP; so somePis notD.

The variables, represented in italics, are intended to range over
certain *parts* of propositions. Intuitively, common nouns like
‘politician’ and adjectives like ‘deceitful’
are *general* terms, since they can apply to more than one
individual. And just so, it seems, propositions contain correspondingly
general elements. For example, the proposition that every senator is
deceitful contains two such elements relevant to the validity of
inferences involving this proposition. (One violates English grammar by
saying ‘Every senator is politician’; the article
‘a’ is needed. But let's assume that this particular
feature of English, not found in all languages, does not reflect
propositional structure.)

Propositions thus seem to have structure that bears on the validity
of inferences, even ignoring premises/conclusions with propositional
parts. That is, even simple propositions have logical
form. And as Aristotle noted, pairs of such propositions can be related
in interesting ways. If every *P* is *D*, then some
*P* is *D*. (For these purposes, assume there is at least
one *P*.) If no *P* is *D*, then some *P*
is not *D*. It is certain that either every *P* is
*D* or some *P* is not *D*; and whichever of these
propositions is true, the other is false. Similarly, the following
propositions cannot both be true: every *P* is *D*; and
no *P* is *D*. But it is not certain that either every
*P* is *D*, or no *P* is *D*. Perhaps some
*P* is *D* and some *P* is not *D*. This
network of logical relations strongly suggests that the propositions in
question contain a quantificational element and two general
elements—and in some cases, an element of negation. This raises
the question of whether other propositions have a similar
structure.

## 2. Propositions and Traditional Grammar

Consider the proposition that Venus is bright, which can figure in inferences like (8).

(8) Every planet is bright, and Venus is a planet; so Venus is bright.

Aristotle's logic focussed on quantificational propositions; and as
we shall see, this was prescient. But on his view, propositions like
the conclusion of (8) still exemplify a subject-predicate structure
shared by all propositions—as well as the sentences that (can be
used to) indicate them. And one can easily formulate the schema
‘every *P* is *D*, and *n* is a *P*;
so *n* is *D*’, where the new lower-case variable
is intended to range over proposition-parts of the sort indicated by
names. (On some views, discussed below, the proposition that Venus is
bright contains a quantifier and two elements of generality; though
unsurprisingly, such views are tendentious.)

Declarative sentences intuitively divide into a subject and a
predicate, indicated with a slash as follows: ‘Every planet / is
bright’, ‘Venus / is bright’, ‘Some politician
/ swam’, ‘The brightest planet / rises early in the
evening’, etc. Until fairly recently, it was held that
propositions were like sentences in this respect. With regard to the
proposition that Venus is bright, Aristotle would have said that
bright(ness) belongs to—or in modern terms, is predicated
of—Venus; with respect to the proposition that every politician
is deceitful’, deceitful(ness) is predicated of every politician.
On this view, both ‘Venus’ and ‘every
politician’ indicate subjects, and ‘is’ introduces a
predicate. Using slightly different terminology, later theorists
treated all elements of generality as predicates, and many propositions
were said to have *categorical form*: subject-copula-predicate;
where a copula, indicated by words like ‘is’ or
‘was’, links a subject (which can consist of a quantifier
and predicate) to a predicate in a proposition.

Sentences like ‘Every politician swam’ can be paraphrased with sentences like ‘Every politician was an individual who did some swimming’. So perhaps these sentences indicate the same proposition, whose true categorical form is not reflected with ‘Every man swam’. Maybe ‘swam’ is a kind of abbreviation for ‘was one who did some swimming’, in the way that ‘bachelor’ is arguably short for ‘unmarried marriageable man’.

The proposition that *every planet is bright if Venus is
bright* seems to be a molecular compound of
categorical propositions. (The same complex proposition is presumably
indicated with ‘if Venus is bright then every planet is
bright’.) And the proposition that *not only* *every
planet is bright* apparently extends a categorical proposition, via
the elements indicated with ‘not’ and ‘only’.
Such reflections suggest the possibility, explored with great ingenuity
by medieval logicians, that all propositions are composed of
categorical propositions and a small number of so-called
syncategorematic elements. This is not to say that all propositions
were, or even could be, successfully analyzed in this manner. But
applications of this strategy revealed many impeccable infererences as
instances of valid forms.

Medieval logicians also discussed the relation of logic to grammar.
Many viewed their project, in part, as an attempt to uncover principles
of a mental language common to all thinkers. (Aristotle had said,
similarly, that spoken sounds symbolize ‘affections of the
soul’.) From this perspective, one expects a few differences
between the logical forms of propositions, and overt features of
sentences. If the proposition that *every man swam* has
categorical form (and thus contains a copula), then spoken languages
mask certain aspects of logical structure. For example, Ockham held
that a mental language would have no need for Latin's declensions, and
that logicians could ignore such aspects of spoken language. And the
ancient Greeks were aware of sophisms like the following: that dog is a
father, and that dog is yours; so that dog is your father. This bad
inference cannot share its form with the superficially parallel (but
impeccable) variant: that dog is a mutt, and that mutt is yours; so
that dog is your mutt. (See Plato, Euthydemus 298 d-e.) So the
superficial features of sentences are not infallible guides to the
logical forms of propositions. But the divergence was held to be
relatively minor. Spoken sentences have structure; they are composed,
in systematic ways, of words. And the assumption was that sentences
reflect the major aspects of propositional form, including
subject-predicate structure. So while there is a distinction between
the study of valid inference and the study of sentences used in spoken
language, the connection between logic and grammar was thought to run
deep. This suggested that the logical form of a proposition just is the
grammatical form of some (perhaps mental) sentence.

## 3. Motivations for Revision

Towards the end of the eighteenth century, Kant could say (without much exaggeration) that logic had followed a single path since its inception, and that ‘since Aristotle it has not had to retrace a single step’. He also said that syllogistic logic was ‘to all appearance complete and perfect’; but this was exuberance. As the medievals knew, there were problems.

Some valid schemata are reducible to others, in that any inference of the reducible form can be revealed as valid (with a little work) given other schemata. And this turns out to be important. Consider (9).

(9) If Al ran then either Al did not run or Bob did not swim, and Al ran; so Bob did not swim.

Assume that ‘Al did not run’ negates ‘Al
ran’, while ‘Bob did not swim’ negates ‘Bob
swam’. Then (9) is an instance of the following valid form: if
**A** then either not-**A** or
not-**B**, and **A**; so
not-**B**. But we can treat this as a derived form, by
showing that any instance of this form is valid given two (intuitively
more basic) Stoic inference forms: if **the first** then
**the second**, and **the first**, so
**the second**; either not **the first** or
not **the second**, and **the first**; so not
**the second**. For suppose we are given the following
premises: *A*; and if *A*, then either not-*A* or
not-*B*. We can safely infer that either not-*A* or
not-*B*; and since we were given that *A*, we can safely
infer that not-*B*. Similarly, the syllogistic schema (10) can
be treated as a derived form.

(10) Some Pis notD, and everySisD; so not everyPis anS.

We already saw that if some *P* is not *D*, then not
every *P* is *D*. So if we accept that some *P*
is not *D*, and that every *S* is *D*, we cannot
also accept that every *P* is an *S*. For if every
*P* is an *S*, and every *S* is *D*, then
every *P* is *D*; and we cannot accept this, given that
not every *P* is *D*. This fully general reasoning tells
us that each instance of (10) is itself an impeccable inference.

Presumably, further reduction is possible. One suspects that there
are relatively few *basic* inferential patterns. Some inferences
may reflect inherently compelling transitions in thought. Perhaps
‘**B** if **A**, and
**A**; so **B**’ is so obvious that
logicians are entitled to take this rule of inference as axiomatic. But
how many rules are plausibly regarded as fundamental in this sense?
Theoretical elegance and explanatory depth also favor theories with
fewer irreducible assumptions. Euclid's geometry provided a model for
how to present a body of knowledge as a network of propositions that
follow from a few basic axioms. And medieval logicians made great
strides in reducing syllogistic logic to two principles: *dictum de
omni* and *dictum de nullo*. The underyling idea is that
often, and perhaps “typically,” replacing a predicate with a less
restrictive predicate corresponds to a valid inference; but
sometimes—paradigmatically, in cases involving
negation—replacing a predicate with a more restrictive predicate
corresponds to a valid inference. For example, suppose that Rex is a
brown dog. It follows that Rex is a dog; and given that every dog is an
animal, it follows that Rex is an animal. Replacing ‘brown
dog’ with the less restrictive predicate ‘dog’ yields
a valid inference, and likewise for replacement with
‘animal’, on the assumption that ‘animal’ is
still less restrictive. Such inferences were said to be governed by
*dictum de omni*. Conversely, if Rex is not a dog, then Rex is
not a brown dog. This illustrates *dictum de nullo*: in the
scope of negation, replacing ‘dog’ with the more
restrictive predicate ‘brown dog’ yields a valid
inference.

One can account for a lot in these terms. Suppose, for example, that
no dog is clever. It follows that no brown dog is clever; it also
follows that no dog is furry and clever. In each case, the direction of
entailment is from the less restrictive to the more restrictive
predicate. Likewise, in accordance with *dictum de nullo*: if no
animal is clever, and every dog is an animal, it follows that no dog is
clever. Now suppose that some dog is clever. It follows that some dog
or cat is clever; it also follows that some dog is clever or furry.
Here, the direction of entailment is from the more restrictive to the
less restrictive predicate (from ‘dog/clever’ to ‘dog
or cat/clever or furry’). And in accordance with *dictum de
omni*: if some dog is clever, and every dog is an animal, it
follows that some animal is clever. Interestingly, ‘every’
is like ‘no’ in one respect, and like ‘some’ in
another respect. If every dog is clever, it follows that every brown
dog is clever, and that every dog is clever or furry. One can describe
this fact by saying that when the universal quantifier combines with a
predicate to form a subject, that predicate is governed by *dictum
de nullo*; but when a universally quantified subject combines with
another predicate to form a proposition, this “second” predicate is
governed by *dictum de omni*.

This makes it possible to derive many valid inference forms, including Aristotle's original examples, from just two basic forms. But despite this major achievement, traditional logic/grammar was inadequate.

Propositions involving *relations*—e.g., the
proposition that Juliet kissed Romeo—are evidently not
categorical in form. One might suggest ‘Juliet was a kisser of
Romeo’ as a subject-copula-predicate paraphrase. But the
predicate ‘kisser of Romeo’ differs, in ways that matter to
inference, from predicates like ‘politician’. If some
kisser of Romeo died, it follows that someone was kissed; whereas the
proposition that some politician died has no parallel logical
consequence to the effect that the someone was __-ed. Correspondingly,
if Juliet kissed Romeo, it follows that Juliet kissed *someone*.
And the proposition that Juliet kissed someone is of interest, even if
we express it by saying ‘Juliet was a kisser of someone’.
For such a proposition involves a quantifier as part of a complex
predicate. But traditional logic does not provide the resources needed
for capturing the validity of inferences whose validity depends on
quantifiers *within* predicates. Consider (11).

(11) Some patient respects some doctor, and every doctor is a senator; so some patient respects some senator.

If ‘respects some doctor’ and ‘respects some
senator’ indicate nonrelational proposition-parts, much like
‘is tall’ and ‘is ugly’, then the inference has
the following form: Some *P* is *T*, and every *D*
is an *S*; so some *P* is *U*. But this schema,
which fails to reflect any quantificational structure in the
*predicates*, is not valid. Its instances include bad inferences
like the following: some patient is tall, and every doctor is a
senator; so some patient is ugly. This dramatizes the point that
‘respects some doctor’ and ‘respects some
senator’ are logically related, in ways that ‘is
tall’ and ‘is ugly’ are not; see the entries on
medieval relations,
and
medieval terms.

One can adopt the view that many propositions have relational parts,
introducing a variable ‘* R*’ intended to
range over relations. Then one can formulate the following schema: some

*P*

*some*

__R__*D*, and every

*D*is an

*S*; so some

*P*

*some*

__R__*S*. But the problem remains. Quantifiers can appear in complex predicates that figure in complex impeccable inferences like (12).

(12) Every patient who met every doctor is tall, and some patient who met every doctor respects every senator; so some patient who respects every senator is tall.

But if ‘patient who met every doctor’ and ‘patient
who respects every senator’ are treated as nonrelational, then
(12) has the following form: every *P* is *T*, and some
*P* * R* every

*S*; so some

*U*is

*T*. And many inferences of this form are invalid. For example: every politician is tall, and some politician respects every senator; so some usher is tall. Again, one can abstract a valid schema that covers (12), letting parentheses indicate a relative clause.

EveryP(R_{1}everyD) isT, and someP(R_{1}everyD)R_{2}everyS; so someP(R_{2}everyS) isT.

But there can be still further quantificational structure in these predicates, and likewise for any such schema, no matter how complex. (Consider the proposition that every patient who met some doctor who saw no lawyer respects some lawyer who saw no patient who met every doctor.) Moreover, schemata like the one above are poor candidates for basic inference patterns.

As medieval logicians knew, propositions expressed with relative
clauses posed difficulties; see the entry on
medieval syllogism.
If every patient
respects some doctor, it follows that every old patient respects some
doctor. By itself, this is expected, since ‘old patient’ is
more restrictive than ‘patient’; and as we saw above, a
universally quantified subject is governed by *dictum de nullo*. But
there are also complex subjects like ‘No lawyer who saw every
patient’. And the proposition indicated with (13) follows from
the proposition indicated with (14).

(13) No lawyer who saw every patient respects some doctor (14) No lawyer who saw every old patient respects some doctor

The direction of inference is from the more restrictive ‘old
patient’ to the less restrictive ‘patient’, as if
the inference were governed by *dictum de omni*. One can say
that the default direction of implication, from more to less
restrictive predicates, has been “inverted” twice: once by
‘every’, and once by ‘No’. But one wants a
detailed and systematic account of propositional structure that
explains why and how this is the case. (For further discussion, see
Ludlow [2002], drawing on Sanchez [1991].)

All of which suggests that it really is important—if
impeccability is to be revealed as a matter of form—to find a
*general* characterization of how quantificational elements
contribute to propositions in which such elements appear. Quantifiers
are not simply devices for creating “proposition frames” like
‘Every *P* is *D*’ into which elementary
monadic predicates like ‘politician’ and
‘deceitful’ can be inserted. Predicates can themselves
have quantificational structure and relational constituents.

## 4. Frege and Formal Language

Frege showed how to resolve these difficulties for traditional logic in one fell swoop. His system of logic—published in 1879 and still in use, with notational modifications—was the single greatest contribution to the subject. So it is significant that on Frege's view, propositions do not have subject-predicate form. His account required a substantial distinction between logical form and grammatical form (as traditionally conceived). It is hard to overemphasize the impact of this point on subsequent discussions of thought and its relation to language.

Frege's leading idea was that propositions have “function-argument”
structure. And in later work, he developed in detail his intended
analogy to mathematical functions. The successor function maps every
integer onto its successor; it maps the number 1 onto the number 2, 2
onto 3, etc. We can represent this function, using a variable that
ranges over integers, as follows: *S*(*x*) = *x* +
1. The function takes integers as *arguments*; and given an
argument, the *value* of the function is the successor of that
argument. Likewise, the division function can be represented as
follows: *Q*(*x*, *y*) = *x*/*y*.
This function maps *ordered pairs* of numbers onto quotients.
For example, it maps (8, 4) onto 2, and (9, 3) onto 3. Mappings can
also be conditional. Consider the function that maps every even integer
onto itself, and every odd integer onto its successor:
*C*(*x*) = *x* if *x* is even, and
*x* + 1 otherwise; C(1) = 2, C(2) = 2, C(3) = 4, etc. By itself,
however, no function has a value.

Variable letters, such as ‘*x*’ and
‘*y*’ in ‘*Q*(*x*, *y*) =
*x*/*y*’, are typographically convenient for
representing functions that take more than one argument. But we could
also index argument places, as shown below.

Q[( )_{i}, ( )_{j}] = ( )_{i}/ ( )_{j}

Or we could replace the subscripts above with lines that connect each pair of round brackets on the left of ‘=’ to the corresponding pair of brackets on the right of ‘=’. But the idea, however we encode it, is that a proposition has at least one constituent that is saturated by the requisite number of arguments. (One can think of an unsaturated proposition-part as the result of abstracting away from the arguments in a particular proposition. Frege was here influenced by Kant's discussion of judgment, and the ancient observation that merely combining two things does not make the combination truth-evaluable; predicates evidently play a special role in “unifying” propositions.)

On Frege's view, the proposition that Mary sang has a functional
component indicated by ‘sang’, and an argument indicated by
‘Mary’. So the sentence ‘Mary sang’, with
‘Mary’ as subject and ‘sang’ as predicate,
indicates a proposition with the following function-argument structure:
Sang(Mary). Frege thought of the relevant function as a conditional
mapping from individuals to truth values: Sang(*x*) = T if
*x* sang, and F otherwise; where ‘T’ and
‘F’ stand for special entities such that for each
individual *x*, Sang(*x*) = T if and only if *x*
sang, and Sang(*x*) = F if and only if *x* did not sing.
Likewise, the proposition that John admired Mary has an ordered pair of
arguments and a functional component indicated by the transitive verb:
Admired(John, Mary); where Admired(*x*, *y*) = T if
*x* admired *y*, and F otherwise. According to Frege, the
proposition that Mary was admired by John has the same
function-argument structure, even though ‘Mary’ is the
subject of the passive sentence. And more importantly, Frege's
treatment of quantified propositions departs radically from the
traditional idea that the grammatical structure of sentence reflects
the logical structure of the indicated proposition.

Suppose that *S* is the function indicated by
‘sang’. Then Mary sang iff—i.e., if and only
if—*S*(Mary) = T. Likewise, someone sang iff: *S*
maps some individual onto T; that is, for some individual *x*,
*S*(*x*) = T. Or using a modern variant of Frege's
notation, someone sang iff ∃*x*[Sang(*x*)]. The
quantifier ‘∃*x*’ is said to bind the variable
‘*x*’, which ranges over individual things in a
domain of discourse. (For now, assume that the domain contains only
people.) If every individual in the domain sang, then *F* maps
every individual onto T; or using formal notation,
∀*x*[Sang(*x*)]. A quantifier binds each
occurrence of its variable, as in
‘∃*x*[*D*(*x*) &
*C*(*x*)]’, which reflects the logical form of
‘someone is deceitful and clever’. In this last example,
the quantifier combines with a complex predicate formed by conjoining
two predicates.

With respect to the proposition that some politician is deceitful,
traditional grammar suggests the division ‘Some politician / is
deceitful’, with the noun ‘politician’ forming a
constituent with the quantificational word. But on a Fregean view,
the logically relevant division is between the existential quantifier
and the rest: ∃*x*[*P*(*x*) &
*D*(*x*)]; someone is both a politician and deceitful.
With respect to the proposition that every politician is deceitful,
Frege again says that the logically relevant division is between the
quantifier and its scope: ∀*x*[*P*(*x*)
→ *D*(*x*)]; everyone is such that if he is a
politician then he is deceitful. Here too, the quantifier combines with
a complex predicate, albeit a conditional rather than conjunctive
predicate; ‘∀*x*[*P*(*x*) &
*D*(*x*)]’ implies that everyone is a politician.
As Frege defines the relevant symbols, ‘*P*(*x*)
→ *D*(*x*)’ is equivalent to
‘¬*P*(*x*) ∨ *D*(*x*)’, and
‘∀*x*’ is equivalent to
‘¬∃*x*¬’. So
‘∀*x*[*P*(*x*) →
*D*(*x*)]’ is equivalent to
‘¬∃*x*¬[¬*P*(*x*) ∨
*D*(*x*)]’. And given de Morgan's Laws (concering
the relations between negation, disjunction, and conjunction) the
following biconditional is sure to be true:
¬∃*x*¬[¬*P*(*x*) ∨
*D*(*x*)] iff
¬∃*x*[*P*(*x*) &
¬*D*(*x*)]. Hence,
∀*x*[*P*(*x*) →
*D*(*x*)] iff
¬∃*x*[*P*(*x*) &
¬*D*(*x*)]. This captures the idea that every
politician is deceitful iff no individual is both a politician and not
deceitful.

This suggests that grammar is misleading in several respects. First,
grammar leads us to think that ‘some politician’ indicates
a *constituent* of the proposition that some politician is
deceitful. Second, grammar masks a difference between existential and
universally quantified propositions: the main predicates are related
conjunctively in the former, and conditionally in the latter. Moreover,
Frege offers an attractive account of propositions involving relations
and multiple quantifiers; and with respect to such propositions, there
seems to be a big difference between logical structure and grammatical
structure.

On Frege's view, just as a single quantifier can bind an unsaturated
position associated with a function that takes a single argument, two
quantifiers can bind two unsaturated positions associated with a
function that takes a pair of arguments. The proposition that everyone
trusts everyone, for example, has the following very noncategorical
form: ∀*x*∀*y*[*T*(*x*,
*y*)]. Assuming that ‘John’ and ‘Mary’
indicate arguments, it follows that John trusts everyone, and that
everyone trusts Mary—∀*y*[*T*(*j*,
*y*)] and ∀*x*[*T*(*x*,
*m*)]. And it follows from all three propositions that John
trusts Mary: *T*(*j*, *m*). The rules of inference
for Frege's logic capture this central feature of the universal
quantifier. A variable bound by a universal quantifier can be replaced
with a name for some individual in the domain. Correlatively, a name
can be replaced with a variable bound by an existential quantifier.
Schematically: ∀*x*(…*x*…),
therefore …*n*…; and …*n*…,
therefore ∃*x*(…*x*…). Given that
John trusts Mary, it follows that someone trusts Mary, and that John
trusts someone. Frege could capture this, formally, as follows:
*T*(*j*, *m*); so
∃*x*[*T*(*x*, *m*)], and
∃*x*[*T*(*j*, *x*)]. And it follows
from all three propositions that someone trusts someone:
∃*x*∃*y*[*T*(*x*,
*y*)]. A single quantifier can bind multiple argument positions, as in
‘∃*x*[*T*(*x*, *x*)]’;
but this means that someone trusts herself.

Mixed quantification introduces an interesting wrinkle. The
propositions indicated by
‘∃*x*∀*y*[*T*(*x*,*y*)]’
and
‘∀*y*∃*x*[*T*(*x*,*y*)]’
differ. We can paraphrase the first as ‘there
is someone who trusts everyone’ and the second as ‘everyone
is trusted by someone or other’; the second follows from the
first, but not *vice versa*. This suggests that ‘someone
trusts everyone’ is *ambiguous*: this one string of
English words can be used to indicate two different propositions. This
in turn raises difficult questions about what natural language
expressions *are*, and how they can be used to indicate
propositions; see section 8. But for Frege, the important point
concerned the distinction between the propositions (Gedanken). Similar
remarks apply to
‘∀*x*∃*y*[*T*(*x*,
*y*)]’ and
‘∃*y*∀*x*[*T*(*x*,
*y*)]’.

A related phenomenon is exhibited by ‘John danced if Mary sang
and Chris slept’. Is the indicated proposition of the form
‘(**A** if **B**) and
**C**’ or ‘**A** if
(**B** and **C**)’? Indeed, it seems
that the relation between word-strings and propositions expressed is
often one-to-many. Is someone who says ‘The artist drew a
club’ talking about a sketch or a card game? One can use
‘is’ to express identity, as in ‘Hesperus is the
planet Venus’; but in ‘Hesperus is bright’,
‘is’ indicates predication. In ‘Hesperus is a
planet’, ‘a’ seems to be logically inert; yet in
‘John saw a planet’, ‘a’ seems to indicate
existential quantification: ∃*x*[*P*(*x*)
& *S*(*j*,*x*)]. (One can render
‘Hesperus is a planet’ as
‘∃*x*[*P*(*x*) & *h* =
*x*]’. But this treats ‘is a planet’ as
importantly different than ‘is bright’; and this raises
other difficulties.)

According to Frege, such ambiguities provide further evidence that
natural language is not suited to the task of representing propositions
and inferential relations *perspicuously*. And he wanted a
language that was suited for this task. (Leibniz and others had
envisioned a ‘Characteristica Universalis’, but without
detailed proposals for how to proceed beyond syllogistic logic in
creating one.) This is not to deny that natural language is well suited
for other purposes, like efficient human communication. And Frege held
that we often do use natural language to indicate propositions. But he
suggested that natural language is like the eye, whereas a good formal
language is like a microscope that reveals structure not otherwise
observable. On this view, the logical form of a proposition is made
manifest by the structure of a sentence in an ideal formal
language—what Frege called a *Begriffsschrift*
(concept-script); where the sentences of such a language exhibit
function-argument structures that differ in kind from the grammatical
structures exhibited by the sentences we use in ordinary
communication.

The real power of Frege's strategy for representing propositional structure is most evident in his discussion of the Dedekind-Peano axioms for arithemetic—and in particular, how the proposition that every number has a successor is logically related to more basic truths of arithmetic; see the entry on Frege's logic, theorem and foundations for arithmetic. But without getting into these details, one can get a sense of Frege's improvement on previous logic by considering (15–16) and Fregean analyses of the corresponding propositions

(15) Every patient respects some doctor ∀ x{P(x) → ∃y[D(y) &R(x,y)]}(16) Every old patient respects some doctor ∀ x{[O(x) &P(x)] → ∃y[D(y) &R(x,y)]}

Suppose that every individual_{x} has the following
conditional property: if he_{x} is a patient, then
some individual is such that she_{y} is both a doctor
and respected by him_{x}. Then it
follows—intuitively and given the rules of Frege's
logic—that every individual_{x} has the
following conditional property: if he_{x} is both old
and a patient, then some individual_{y} is such that
she_{y} is both a doctor and respected by
him_{x}. So the proposition indicated with (16)
follows from the one indicated with (15). More interestingly, we can
also account for why the proposition indicated with (13) follows from
the one indicated with (14).

(13) No lawyer who saw every patient respects some doctor ¬∃ x{L(x) & ∀y[P(y) →S(x,y)] & ∃z[D(z) &R(x,z)]}(14) No lawyer who saw every old patient respects some doctor ¬∃ x{L(x) & ∀y{[O(y) &P(y)] →S(x,y)} & ∃z[D(z) &R(x,z)]}

For suppose it is false that some individual_{x}
has the following conjunctive property: he_{x} is a
lawyer; and he_{x} saw every old patient (i.e., every
individual_{y} is such that if
she_{y} is both old and a patient, then
she_{y} was seen by him_{x}); and
he_{x} respects some doctor (i.e., some
individual_{z} is such that she_{z}
is both a doctor and respected by him_{x}). Then
intuitively and given the rules of Frege's logic, it is false that some
individual_{x} has the following conjunctive property:
he_{x} is a lawyer; and he_{x} saw
every patient; and he_{x} respects some doctor.

This explains why the direction of valid inference is from the more
restrictive ‘old patient’ in (14) to the less restrictive
‘patient’ in (13), despite the fact that ‘every
(old) patient’ is governed by *dictum de nullo* in
simpler cases. The contribution of ‘no’, reflected with
the wide scope negation, combines with the contribution of
‘every’ to create the appearance of an inference governed
by *dictum de omni*. In general, Frege's logic handles a wide
range of inferences that had puzzled medieval logicians. But the
Fregean logical forms seem to differ dramatically from the grammatical
forms of sentences like (13–16). Frege concluded that we need a
*Begriffsschrift*, distinct from the languages we naturally
speak, in order to depict (and help us discern) the structures of the
propositions we express by using natural languages.

Frege also made a different kind of contribution, which would prove
important, to the study of propositions. Prior to 1892, he spoke as
though propositional constituents were the relevant functions and
(ordered n-tuples of) entities that such functions map to truth-values.
But he refined this view in light of his distinction between
*Sinn* and *Bedeutung* (see the entry on
Gottlob Frege).
The *Sinn* of an expression was said to be a “way of
presenting” the corresponding *Bedeutung*, which might be an
entity, a truth-value, or a function from (ordered n-tuples of)
entities to truth-values. The basic idea is that two names, like
‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’, can present the
same *Bedeutung* in different ways; in which case, the
*Sinn* of the first name differs from the *Sinn* of the
second. Given this distinction, we can think of ‘Hesperus’
as an expression that presents the evening star (a.k.a. Venus) as
such, while ‘Phosphorus’ presents the morning star (also
a.k.a. Venus) in a different way. Likewise, we can think of ‘is
bright’ as an expression that presents a certain function in a
certain way, and ‘Hesperus is bright’ as a sentence that
presents its truth-value in a certain way—i.e., as the value of
the function in question given the argument in question (T if Hesperus
is bright and F otherwise). From this perspective, propositions are
sentential ways of presenting truth-values, and proposition-parts are
subsentential ways of presenting functions and arguments. Frege could
thus distinguish the proposition that Hesperus is bright from the
proposition that Phosphorus is bright, even though the two
propositions are alike with regard to the relevant function and
argument. Likewise, he could distinguish the trivial proposition
Hesperus is Hesperus from the (apparently nontrivial) proposition
Hesperus is Phosphorus. This is an attractive view. For intuitively,
ancient astronomers were correct not to regard the inference Hesperus
is Hesperus, so Hesperus is Phosphorus as an instance of the following
valid schema: **A**, so **A**. But this
raised questions about what the *Sinn* of an expression really
is, what “presentation” could amount to, and what to say
about a name with no *Bedeutung*.

## 5. Descriptions and Analysis

Frege did not distinguish (or at least did not emphasize any
distinction between) names like ‘John’ and descriptions
like ‘the boy’ or ‘the tall boy from Canada’.
Initially, both kinds of expression seem to indicate arguments, as
opposed to functions. So one might think that the logical form of
‘The boy sang’ is simply ‘Sang(*b*)’,
where ‘*b*’ is a an unstructured symbol that stands
for the boy in question (and presents him in a certain way). But this
makes the elements of a description logically irrelevant. And this
seems wrong. If the tall boy from Canada sang, then some boy from
Canada sang. Moreover, ‘the’ implies *uniqueness* in
a way that ‘some’ does not. (Of course, one can say
‘The boy sang’ without denying that universe contains more
than one boy. But likewise, in ordinary conversation, one can say
‘Everything is in the trunk’ without denying that the
universe contains some things not in the trunk. And intuitively, a
speaker who uses ‘the *F*’ does imply that the
predicate is satisfied by exactly one contextually relevant thing.)

Russell held that these implications reflect the logical form of a
proposition indicated (in a given context) with a description. On his
view, ‘The boy sang’ has the following logical form:
∃*x*{Boy(*x*) &
∀*y*[Boy(*y*) → *y* = *x*]
& Sang(*x*)}; some individual_{x} is such
that he_{x} is a boy, and every (relevant)
individual_{y} is such that if he_{y}
is a boy, then he_{y} is identical with
him_{x}, and he_{x} sang. The awkward
middle conjunct was just Russell's way of expressing uniqueness with
Fregean tools; see section 7. But rewriting the middle conjunct
would not affect Russell's technical point, which is that ‘the
boy’ does not correspond to any constituent of the formalism.
This reflects Russell's main claim: while a speaker may refer to a
certain boy in saying ‘The boy sang’, that boy is in no
sense a constituent of the proposition indicated. According to Russell,
the proposition has the form of an existential quantification with a
bound variable. It does *not* have the form of a function
saturated by (an argument that is) the boy referred to. The proposition
is general rather than singular. In this respect, ‘the boy’
is like ‘some boy’ and ‘every boy’; though on
Russell's view, not even ‘the’ indicates a constituent of
the proposition expressed. (See the entry on
Betrand Russell.)

This extended Frege's idea that natural language misleads us about
the structure of the propositions we assert. Russell went on to apply
this hypothesis to what became a famous puzzle. Even though France is
currently kingless, ‘The present king of France is bald’
can be used to indicate a proposition. The sentence is not meaningless;
it has implications. So if the proposition consists of the function
indicated with ‘Bald( )’ and an argument indicated
with ‘The present king of France’, there must be an
argument so indicated. But appeal to nonexistent kings is, to say the
least, dubious. Russell concluded that ‘The present king of
France is bald’ indicates a quantificational proposition:
∃*x*{*K*(*x*) &
∀*y*[*K*(*y*) → *y* =
*x*] & *B*(*x*)}; where *K*(*x*)
= T iff *x* is a present king of France, and
*B*(*x*) = T iff *x* is bald. (For present
purposes, set aside worries about the vagueness of ‘bald’.)
And as Russell noted, the following contrary reasoning is spurious:
every proposition is true or false; so the present king of France is
bald or not; so there is a king of France, and he is either bald or
not. For let **P** be the proposition that the king of France is
bald. Russell held that **P** is indeed true or false. On his
view, it is false. Given that
¬∃*x*[*K*(*x*)], it follows that
¬∃*x*{*K*(*x*) &
∀*y*[*K*(*y*) → *y* =
*x*] & *B*(*x*)}. But it does not follow that
there is a present king of France who is either bald or not. Given that
¬∃*x*[*K*(*x*)], it hardly follows that
∃*x*{*K*(*x*) & [*B*(*x*)
v ¬*B*(*x*)]}. So we must not confuse the negation of
**P** with the following false proposition:
∃*x*{*K*(*x*) &
∀*y*[*K*(*y*) → *y* =
*x*] & ¬*B*(*x*)}. The ambiguity of
natural language may foster such confusion, given examples like
‘The present king of France is bald or not’. But according
to Russell, puzzles about “nonexistence” can be resolved without
special metaphysical theses, given the right views about logical form
and natural language.

This invited the thought that other philosophical puzzles might
*dissolve* if we properly understood the logical forms of our
claims. Wittgenstein argued, in his influential *Tractatus
Logico-Philosophicus*, that: (i) the very possibility of meaningful
sentences, which can be true or false depending on how the world is,
requires propositions with structures of the sort Frege and Russell
were getting at; (ii) all propositions are logical compounds
of—and thus analyzable into—atomic propositions that are
inferentially independent of one another; though (iii) even simple
natural language sentences may indicate very complex propositions; and
(iv) the right analyses would, given a little reflection, reveal all
philosophical puzzles as confusions about how language is related to
the world. Russell never endorsed (iv). And Wittgenstein later noted
that claims like ‘This is red’ and ‘This is
yellow’ presented difficulties for his earlier view: if the
indicated propositions are unanalyzable, and thus logically
independent, each should be compatible with the other; but at least so
far, no one has provided a plausible analysis that accounts for the
apparent impeccabilty of ‘This is red, so this is not
yellow’. (This raises questions about whether *all*
inferential security is due to logical form.) But for reasons related
to epistemological puzzles, Russell did say that: (a) we are
*directly* *acquainted* with the constituents of those
propositions into which every proposition (that we can grasp) can be
analyzed; (b) at least typically, we are not directly acquainted with
the mind-independent bearers of proper names; and so (c) the things we
typically refer to with names are not constituents of basic
propositions.

This led Russell to say that natural language names are disguised
descriptions. On this view, ‘Hesperus’ is semantically
associated with a complex predicate—say, for illustration, a
predicate of the form ‘*E*(*x*) &
*S*(*x*)’. In which case, ‘Hesperus is
bright’ indicates a proposition of the form
‘∃*x*{[*E*(*x*) &
*S*(*x*)] &
∀*y*{[*E*(*y*) &
*S*(*y*)] → *y* = *x*]} &
*B*(*x*)}’. It also follows that Hesperus exists
iff ∃*x*[*E*(*x*) &
*S*(*x*)]; and this would be challenged by Kripke (1980)
(see the entries on
rigid-designators
and
names).
But by analyzing names as
descriptions—quantificational expressions, as opposed to logical
constants (like ‘*b*’) that indicate
individuals—Russell offered an attractive account of why the
proposition that Hesperus is bright differs from the proposition that
Phosphorus is bright. Instead of saying that propositional constituents
are Fregean senses, Russell could say that ‘Phosphorus is
bright’ indicates a proposition of the form
‘∃*x*{[*M*(*x*) &
*S*(*x*)] &
∀*y*{[*M*(*y*) &
*S*(*y*)] → *y* = *x*]} &
*B*(*x*)’; where
‘*E*(*x*)’ and ‘M(*x*)’
indicate different functions, specified (respectively) in terms of
evenings and mornings. This leaves room for the discovery that the
complex predicates ‘*E*(*x*) &
S(*x*)’ and ‘*M*(*x*) &
S(*x*)’ both indicate functions that map Venus and nothing
else to the truth-value T. The hypothesis was that the propositions
indicated with ‘Hesperus is bright’ and ‘Phosphorus
is bright’ have different (fundamental) constituents, even though
Hesperus is Phosphorus, but not because propositional constituents are
“ways of presenting” *Bedeutungen*. Similarly, the idea was that
the propositions indicated with ‘Hesperus is Hesperus’ and
‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ differ, because only the latter
has predicational/unsaturated constituents corresponding to
‘Phosphorus’. Positing unexpected logical forms seemed to
have explanatory payoffs.

Questions about names and descriptions are also related to psychological reports, like ‘Mary thinks Venus is bright’, which present puzzles of their own. Such reports seem to indicate propositions that are neither atomic nor logical compounds of simpler propositions. For as Frege noted, replacing one name with another name for the same object can apprarently affect the truth of a psychological report (see the entry on propositional attitude reports). If Mary fails to know that Hesperus is Venus, she might think Venus is a planet without thinking Hesperus is a planet; though cf. Soames (1987, 1995, 2002), and see the entries on singular propositions, and structured propositions. Any function that has the value T given Venus as argument has the value T given Hesperus as argument. So Frege, Russell, and Wittgenstein all held—in varying ways—that psychological reports are also misleading with respect to the logical forms of the indicated propositions.

## 6. Regimentation and Communicative Slack

Within the analytic tradition inspired by these philosophers, it became a commonplace that logical form and grammatical form typically diverge, often in dramatic ways. This invited attempts to provide analyses of propositions, and accounts of natural language, with the aim of saying how relatively simple sentences (with subject-predicate structures) could be used to indicate propositions (with function-argument structures).

The logical positivists explored, with great precision and ingenuity, the idea that the meaning of a sentence is a procedure for determining the truth or falsity of that sentence. From this perspective, the studies of linguistic meaning and propositional structure still dovetail, even if natural language employs “conventions” that make it possible to indicate complex propositions with grammatically simple sentences; see the entry on analysis. But to cut short a long and interesting story, there was little success in formulating “semantic rules” that were plausible both as (i) descriptions of how ordinary speakers understand sentences of natural language, and (ii) analyses that revealed logical structure of the sort envisioned. (And until Montague [1970], discussed briefly in the next section, there was no real progress in showing how to systematically associate quantificational constructions of natural language with Fregean logical forms.)

Rudolf Carnap, one of the leading positivists, responded to difficulties facing his earlier views by developing a sophisticated position according to which philosophers could—and should—articulate alternative sets of conventions for associating sentences of a language with propositions. Within each such language, the conventions would determine what follows from what. But one would have to decide, on broadly pragmatic grounds, which interpreted language was best for certain purposes (like conducting scientific inquiry). On this view, questions about “the” logical form of an ordinary sentence are in part questions about which conventions one should adopt. The idea was that “internal” to any logically perspicuous linguistic scheme, there would be an answer to the question of how two sentences are inferentially related; but “external” questions, about which conventions we should adopt, would not be settled by descriptive facts about how we understand languages that we already use.

This was, in many ways, an attractive development of Frege's vision.
But it also raised a skeptical worry: perhaps the structural mismatches
between sentences of a natural language and sentences of a
*Begriffsschrift* are so severe that one cannot formulate
general rules for associating the sentences we ordinarily use with
propositions. Later theorists would combine this view with the idea
that propositions are sentences of a mental language that is relevantly
like a Fregean *Begriffsschrift*, and relevantly unlike the
spoken languages humans use to communicate; see Fodor (1975, 1978). But
given the rise of
behaviorism,
both in
philosophy and psychology, this variant on a medieval idea was
initially ignored or ridiculed. (And it does face difficulties; see
section 8.)

Willard Van Orman Quine
combined behaviorist psychology with a normative conception of logical
form similar to Carnap's. The result was an influential view according
to which: there is no fact of the matter about which proposition a
speaker/thinker indicates with a sentence of natural language, because
talk of propositions is (at best) a way of talking about how we should
regiment our verbal behavior for certain purposes—and in
particular, for purposes of scientific inquiry; claims about logical
form are in this sense evaluative; and such claims are underdetermined
by the totality of facts concerning speakers' dispositions to use
language. From this perspective, mismatches between logical and
grammatical form are to be expected, and we should not conclude that
ordinary speakers have mental representations that are isomorphic with
sentences of a Fregean *Begriffsschrift*.

According to Quine, speakers' behavioral dispositions constrain what can be plausibly said about how to best regiment their language. He also allowed for some general constraints on interpretability that an idealized “field linguist” might impose in coming up with a regimented interpretation scheme. (Donald Davidson developed a similar line of thought in less behavioristic terms, speaking in terms of constraints on a “radical interpreter,” who would favor “charitable” construals of alien speech.) But unsurprisingly, this left ample room for “slack” with respect to which logical forms should be associated with a given sentential utterance.

Quine also held that decisions about how to make such associations
should be made *holistically*. As he sometimes put it, the
“unit of translation” is an entire language, not a particular
sentence. On this view, one can translate a sentence *S* of
natural language NL with a structurally mismatching sentence µ
of a formal language FL, even if it seems (locally) implausible
that *S* is used to indicate the proposition associated with
µ, so long as the following condition is met: the association
between *S* and µ is part of a general account of NL and
FL that figures in an overall theory—which includes an account
of language, logic, and the language-independent world—that is
among the best overall theories available. This holistic conception of
how to evaluate proposed regimentations of natural language was part
and parcel of Quine's criticism of the early positivists'
analytic-synthetic distinction,
and Quine's more radical suggestion that there is no
such distinction.

The suggestion was that even apparently tautologous sentences, like
‘Bachelors are unmarried’ and ‘Caesar died if Brutus
killed him’, have empirical content. These may be among the last
sentences we would dissent from, faced with recalcitrant experience; we
may prefer to say that Caesar didn't really die, or that Brutus
didn't really kill him, if the next best alternative is to deny
the conditional claim. But for Quine, every meaningful claim is a claim
that could turn out to be false—and so a claim we must be
prepared, at least in principle, to reject. Correlatively, no sentences
are known to be true simply by knowing what they mean (and knowing
*a priori* that sentences with such meanings must be true).

For present purposes, we can abstract away from the details of
debates about whether Quine's overall view was plausible. Here, what
matters most is that claims about logical form were said to be (at
least partly) claims about the kind of regimented language we
*should* use, not claims about the propositions actually
indicated with sentences of natural language. And one aspect of Quine's
thought about the kind of regimented language we should use turned out
to be especially important for subsequent discussions of logical form.
For even among those who rejected the behavioristic assumptions that
animated Quine's conception of language, it was often held that logical
forms are expressions of first-order predicate calculus.

Frege's *Begriffsschrift*, recall, was designed to capture
the Dedekind-Peano axioms for arithmetic, including the axiom of
induction; see the entry on
Frege's logic, theorem and foundation for arithmetic.
This required quantification
into positions occupiable by predicates, as well as positions
occupiable by names. Using modern notation, Frege allowed for formulae
like ‘(*Fa* & *Fb*) →
∃*X*(*Xa* & *Xb*)’ and
‘∀*x*∀*y*[*x = y* ↔
∀*X*(*Xx* ↔ *Xy*)]’. And he took
second-order quantification to be quantification over functions. This
is to say, for example, that ‘∃*X*(*Xa* &
*Xb*)’ is true iff: there is a function, *X*, that
maps both the individual *a* and the individual *b* onto
the truth-value T. Frege also took it to be a truth of *logic*
that for any predicate *P*, there is a function such that for
each individual *x*, that function maps *x* to T iff
*x* satisfies *P*. (In which case, for each predicate,
there is the set of all and only the things that satisfy the
predicate.) The axioms for Frege's logic thus generated
Russell's paradox,
given predicates like ‘is not a member of itself’. This
invited attempts to *weaken* the axioms, while preserving
second-order quantification. But for various reasons, Quine and others
advocated a restriction to the first-order fragment of Frege's logic,
disallowing quantification into positions occupied by
predicates. (Godel had proved the completeness of first-order
predicate calculus, thus providing a purely formal criterion for what
followed from what in that language. Quine also held that second-order
quantification illicitly treated predicates as names for sets, thereby
spoiling Frege's conception of propositions as unified by virtue of
having unsaturated predicational constituents that are satisfied by
things denoted by names.) On Quine's view, we should replace
‘(*Fa* & *Fb*) →
∃*X*(*Xa* & *Xb*)’ with explicit
first-order quantification over sets, as in ‘(*Fa* &
*Fb*) → ∃*s*(*a*∈*s* &
*b*∈*s*)’; where ‘∈’ stands
for ‘is an element of’, and this second conditional is not
a logical truth, but rather a hypothesis (to be evaluated
holistically) concerning sets.

The preference for first-order regimentations has come to seem unwarranted, or at least highly tendentious; see Boolos (1998). But it fueled the idea that logical form can diverge wildly from grammatical form. For as students quickly learn, first-order regimentations of natural sentences often turn out to be highly artificial. (And in some cases, such regimentations seem to be unavailable.) This was, however, taken to show that natural languages are far from ideal for purposes of indicating logical structure.

A different strand of thought in analytic philosophy—pressed
by Wittgenstein in *Philosophical Investigations* and developed
by others, including Strawson and Austin—also suggested that a
single sentence could be used (on different occasions) to express
different kinds of propositions. Strawson (1950) argued that
*pace* Russell, a speaker could use an instance of ‘The
*F* is *G*’ to express a singular proposition about
a specific individual: namely, the *F* in the context at hand.
According to Strawson, sentences themselves do not have truth
conditions, since sentences (as opposed to speakers) do not
indicate propositions; and speakers can use ‘The boy is
tall’ to express a proposition with the contextually relevant boy
as a constituent. Donnellan (1966) went on to argue that a speaker
could even use an instance of ‘The *F* is
*G*’ to express a singular proposition about an individual
that isn't an *F*; see the entry on
reference.
Such considerations, which have
received a great deal of attention in recent discussions of context
dependence, suggested that relations between natural language sentences
and propositions are (at best) very complex and mediated by
speakers' intentions. All of which made it seem that such
relations are far more tenuous than the pre-Fregean tradition
suggested. This bolstered the Quine/Carnap idea that questions about
the structure of premises and conclusions are really questions about
how we *should* talk (when trying to describe the world), much
as logic itself seems to be more concerned with how we should infer
than with how we do infer. From this perspective, the connections
between logic and grammar seemed rather shallow.

## 7. Notation and Restricted Quantification

On the other hand, more recent work on quantifiers suggests that the
divergence had been exaggerated, in part because of how Frege's idea of
variable-binding was originally implemented. Consider again the
proposition that some boy sang, and the proposed logical division into
the quantifier and the rest: ∃*x*[Boy(*x*) &
Sang(*x*)]; something is both a boy and an individual that sang.
This is one way to regiment the English sentence. But one can also
offer a “logical paraphrase” that more closely parallels the
grammatical division between ‘some boy’ and
‘sang’: for some individual *x* such that *x*
is a boy, *x* sang. One can formalize this by using
*restricted* quantifiers, which incorporate a restriction on the
domain over which the variable in question ranges. For example,
‘∃*x*:Boy(*x*)’ is an existential
quantifier that binds a variable ranging over boys in the relevant
domain. So
‘∃*x*:Boy(*x*)[Sang(*x*)]’ means
that some boy sang. Since
‘∃*x*:Boy(*x*)[Sang(*x*)]’ and
‘∃*x*[Boy(*x*) & Sang(*x*)]’
are logically equivalent, logic provides no reason for preferring the
latter. And choosing the latter does not show that propositional
structure differs from grammatical structure.

Universal quantifiers can be restricted, as in
‘∀*x*:Boy(*x*)[Sang(*x*)]’,
interpreted as follows: for every individual *x* such that
Boy(*x*), *x* sang; that is, every boy sang. Restrictors
can also be logically complex, as in ‘Some tall boy sang’
or ‘Some boy who respects Mary sang’, rendered as
‘∃*x*:Tall(*x*) &
Boy(*x*)[Sang(*x*)]’ and
‘∃*x*:Boy(*x*) & Respects(*x*,
*m*)[Sang(*x*)]’. Given these representations of
logical form, it seems that the inferential difference between
‘some boy sang’ and ‘every boy sang’ lies
entirely with the propositional contributions of ‘some’
and ‘every’ after all—and not in part with the
contribution of connectives like ‘&’ and
‘→’.

Words like ‘someone’, and the grammatical requirement
that ‘every’ be followed by a noun (or noun phrase),
reflect the fact that natural language employs restricted quantifiers.
Phrases like ‘every boy’ are composed of a
*determiner* and a noun. Correspondingly, one can think of
determiners as expressions that can combine with an ordered pair of
predicates to form a sentence, much as one can think of transitive
verbs as expressions that can combine with an ordered pair of names to
form a sentence. And this grammatical analogy, between determiners and
transitive verbs, has a semantic correlate.

Since ‘*x*’ and ‘*y*’ are
variables ranging over individuals, one can say that the function
indicated by the transitive verb ‘loves’ yields the value T
given the ordered pair ⟨*x*,*y*⟩ as argument if and
only if *x* loves *y*. In this notational scheme,
‘*y*’ corresponds to the direct object (or
*internal* argument), which combines with the verb to form a
phrase like ‘loves Chris’; ‘*x*’
corresponds to the grammatical subject (or *external* argument)
of the verb. If we think about ‘every boy sang’
analogously, ‘boy’ is the internal argument of
‘every’, since ‘every boy’ is a phrase; by
contrast, ‘boy’ and ‘sang’ do not form a phrase
in ‘every boy sang’. So let us introduce
‘*X*’ and ‘*Y*’ as second-order
variables ranging over functions, from individuals to truth values,
stipulating that the *extension* of such a function is the set
of things that the function maps onto the truth value T. Then one can
say that the function indicated by ‘every’ yields the value
T given the ordered pair ⟨*X*, *Y*⟩ as argument iff
the extension of *X* includes the extension of *Y*.
Similarly, one can say that the function indicated by
‘some’ maps the ordered pair ⟨*X*, *Y*⟩
onto T iff the extension of *X* intersects with the extension of
*Y*.

Just as we can think about ‘loves’ as a predicate
satisfied by ordered pairs ⟨*x*, *y*⟩ such that
*x* loves *y*, so we can think about ‘every’
as a predicate satisfied by ordered pairs ⟨*X*,
*Y*⟩ such that the extension of *X* includes the
extension of *Y*. (This is compatible with thinking about
‘every boy’ as a restricted quantifier that combines with
a predicate to form a sentence that is true iff every boy satisfies
that predicate.) One virtue of this notation scheme is that it lets
us represent relations between predicates that cannot be captured with
‘∀’, ‘∃’, and the sentential
connectives; see Rescher (1962), Wiggins (1980). For example, most
boys sang iff the boys who sang outnumber the boys who did not
sing. So we can say that ‘most’ indicates a function that
maps ⟨*X*, *Y*⟩ to T iff the number of things that
*Y* and *X* both map to T exceeds the number of things
that *Y* but not *X* maps to T.

Using restricted quantifiers, and thinking about determiners as
devices for indicating relations between functions, also suggests an
alternative to Russell's treatment of ‘the’. The formula
‘∃*x*{Boy(*x*) &
∀*y*[Boy(*y*) → *x* = *y*]
& Sang(*x*)}’ can be rewritten as
‘∃*x*:Boy(*x*)[Sang(*x*)] & |Boy|
= 1’, interpreted as follows: for some individual *x* such
that *x* a boy, *x* sang, and exactly one (relevant)
individual is a boy. On this view, ‘the boy’ still does not
correspond to a constituent of the formalism; nor does
‘the’. But one can depart farther from Russell's notation,
while emphasizing his idea that ‘the’ is relevantly like
‘some’ and ‘every’. For one can analyze
‘the boy sang’ as
‘!*x*:Boy(*x*)[Sang(*x*)]’, specifying the
propositional contribution of ‘!’—on a par with as
‘∃’ and ‘∀’—as follows:

!x:Y(x)[X(x)] = T iff the extensions ofXandYintersect & |Y| = 1.

This way of encoding Russell's theory preserves his central
claim. While there may be a boy one refers to in saying ‘the boy
sang’, that boy is not a constituent of the quantificational
proposition indicated with
‘!*x*:Boy(*x*)[Sang(*x*)]’; see Neale (1990)
for discussion. But far from showing that the logical form of
‘the boy sang’ diverges dramatically from its grammatical
form, the restricted quantifier notation suggests that the logical
form closely *parallels* the grammatical form—‘the
boy’ and ‘the’ do correspond to constituents of
'‘!*x*:Boy(*x*)[Sang(*x*)]’' —at least
if (pace Quine) we allow for logical forms that represent
quantificational propositions as claims to the effect that a certain
relation holds between a pair of (perhaps complex) predicates.

It is worth noting, briefly, an implication of this point for the
inference ‘the boy sang, so some boy sang’. If the logical
form of ‘the boy sang’ is
‘∃*x*:Boy(*x*)[Sang(*x*)] &
|Boy|=1’, then the inference is an instance of the schema
‘**A** & **B**,
so **A**’. But if the logical form of ‘the
boy sang’ is simply
‘!(*x*):Boy(*x*)[Sang(*x*)]’, the
premise and conclusion have the same form, differing only by
substitution of ‘!’ for ‘∃’. In which
case, the impeccability of the inference depends on the specific
contributions of ‘the/!’ and
‘some/∃’. Only when these contributions are
“spelled out,” perhaps in terms of set-intersection, would
the validity of the inference be manifest. So even if grammar and
logic do not diverge in this case, one still might want to say that
grammatical structure does not reveal all the logical relations. From
this perspective, analysis of ‘the’ is still required.
Hence, those skeptical of an analytic/synthetic distinction will say
that it remains more a decision than a discovery to say that
‘Some boy sang’ follows from ‘The boy
sang’. In general, and especially with regard to aspects of
propositional form indicated with individual words, issues about
logical form are connected with issues about the
analytic-synthetic distinction.

## 8. Transformational Grammar

Still, even given restricted quantifiers (and acceptance of second-order logical forms), the subject/predicate structure of ‘Mary / trusts every doctor’ diverges from the corresponding formula

∀y:Doctor(y)[Trusts(Mary,y)}.

We can rewrite ‘Trusts(Mary,*y*)’ as
‘[Trusts(*y*)](Mary)’, to reflect the fact that
‘trusts’ combines with a direct object to form a phrase,
which in turn combines with a subject. But this does not affect the
main point: ‘every’ seems to be a grammatical constituent
of the verb phrase ‘trusts every doctor’, but the main
quantifier of the indicated proposition. In natural language,
‘trusts’ and ‘every doctor’ form a phrase; but
with respect to logical form, ‘trusts’ evidently combines
with ‘Mary’ and a variable to form a complex predicate
that is in turn an external argument of the higher-order predicate
‘every’. Similar remarks apply to ‘Some boy trusts
every doctor’ and
‘[∃*x*:Boy(*x*)][∀*y*:Doctor(*y*)]{Trusts(*x*,
*y*)]’. So
it seems that mismatches remain, in the very places that troubled
medieval logicians—quantificational direct objects and other
examples of complex predicates with quantificational constituents.

Montague (1970, 1974) showed that these mismatches do not preclude
systematic association of natural language sentences with the
corresponding propositional structures. Abstracting from the technical
details, one can specify an algorithm that pairs each natural language
sentence with one or more quantificational expressions like
‘every doctor’ with one or more Fregean logical
forms. This was a significant advance. Together with subsequent
developments, Montague's work showed that Frege's logic was compatible
with the idea that quantificational constructions in natural language
have a systematic semantics. Indeed, one could use Frege's formal
apparatus to study such constructions. Montague still held that the
syntax of natural language was misleading for purposes of (what he
took to be) real semantics. On this view, the study of valid inference
still suggests that natural language *grammar* disguises the
structure of human thought. But this was becoming less clear.

In thinking about the relation of logic to grammar, one must not assume a naive conception of the latter. For example, the grammatical form of a sentence need not be determined by the linear order of its words. Using brackets to disambiguate, we can distinguish the sentence ‘Mary [saw [the [boy [with binoculars]]]]’—whose direct object is ‘the boy with binoculars’—from the homophonous sentence ‘Mary [[saw [the boy]] [with binoculars]]’, in which ‘saw the boy’ is modified by an adverbial phrase. The first implies that the boy had binoculars, while the second implies that Mary used binoculars to see the boy. This distinction may not be audibly marked. Nonetheless, there is a difference between modifying a noun (like ‘boy’) with a prepositional phrase and modifying a verb phrase (‘saw the boy’).

More generally, grammatical structure need not be obvious. Just as it
may take work to discover the kind(s) of structure that propositions
exhibit, so it may take work to discover the kind(s) of structure that
sentences exhibit. And it turns out that the study of natural language
suggests a rich conception of grammatical form that diverges from
traditional views; see especially Chomsky (1957, 1965, 1981, 1986,
1995). So we need to ask how logical forms are related to actual
grammatical forms, which linguists try to discover, since these may
differ importantly from any apparent grammatical forms suggested by
casual reflection on spoken language. It may be that appearances are
misleading with respect to *both* grammatical *and*
logical form, leaving room for the possibility that these notions of
structure are no so different after all.

A leading idea of modern linguistics is that at least some grammatical
structures are *transformations* of others. This is related to
the idea that words (and phrases) often appear to
be *displaced* from the positions canonically associated with
certain grammatical relations. For example, the word ‘who’
in (17) seems to be somehow associated with the internal (direct
object) argument position of the verb ‘saw’:

(17) Mary wondered who John saw

Correspondingly, (17) can be glossed as ‘Mary wondered which person is such that John saw that person’. This invites the hypothesis that (17) reflects a transformation of the “Deep Structure” (17D) into the “Surface Structure” (17S),

(17D) {Mary [wondered {John [saw who]}]} (17S) {Mary [wondered [who _{i}{John [saw ( _ )_{i}]}]]}

with indices indicating a grammatical relation between the indexed positions. In (17D), the embedded clause has the same form as ‘John saw Bill’. But in (17S), ‘who’ has been displaced from the indexed argument position. Similar remarks apply to the question ‘Who did John see’ and other question-words like ‘why’, ‘what’, ‘when’, and ‘how’.

One might also explain the synonymy of (18) and (19) by positing a common deep structure, (18D):

(18) John seems to like Mary (19) It seems John likes Mary (18D) [Seems{John [likes Mary]}] (18S) {John _{i}[seems { ( _ )_{i}[to like Mary]}]}

If every English sentence needs a grammatical subject, (18D) must be modified: either by displacing ‘John’, as in (18S); or by inserting a pleonastic subject, as in (19). Note that in (19), ‘It’ does not indicate an argument; compare ‘There’ in ‘There is something in the garden’. Appeal to displacement also lets one distinguish the superficially parallel sentences (20) and (21).

(20) John is easy to please (21) John is eager to please

If (20) is true, John is easily pleased; or using a pleonastic subject, it is easy (for someone) to please John. But if (21) is true, John is eager that he please someone or other. This asymmetry is effaced by representations like ‘Easy-to-please(John)’ and ‘Eager-to-please(John)’. The contrast is made manifest, however, with (20S) and (21S);

(20S) {John _{i}[is easy {e[to please ( _ )_{i}]}]}(21S) {John _{i}[is eager { ( _ )_{i}[to pleasee]}]}

where ‘*e*’ indicates an unpronounced argument
position. It may be that in (21S), which does not mean that it is eager
for John to please someone, ‘John’ is grammatically linked
but not actually displaced from the coindexed position. But on any such
conception of grammar, the “surface subject” of a sentence may be the
*object* of a verb embedded within the main predicate, as in
(20S). Of course, such hypotheses about grammatical structure require
defense. But Chomsky and others have long argued that such hypotheses
are needed to account for various facts concerning human linguistic
capacities.

As an illustration of the *kind* of data that is relevant,
note that (22–24) are perfectly fine expressions of English, while (25)
is not.

(22) The boy who sang was happy (23) Was the boy who sang happy (24) The boy who was happy sang (25) *Was the boy who happy sang

This suggests that the auxiliary verb ‘was’ can be displaced from some positions but not others. That is, while (22S) is a permissible transformation of (22D), (24S) is not a permissible transformation of (24D):

(22D) {[The [boy [who sang]]] [was happy]} (22S) Was _{i}{[the [boy [who sang]]] [ ( _ )_{i}happy]}(24D) {[The [boy [who [was happy]]]] sang} (24S) *Was _{i}{[the [boy [who [ ( _ )_{i}happy]]]] sang}

The ill-formedness of (25) is striking, since one can sensibly ask whether or not the boy who was happy sang. One can also ask whether or not (26) is true. But (27) is not the yes/no question corresponding to (26).

(26) The boy who was lost kept crying (27) Was the boy who lost kept crying

Rather, (27) is the yes/no question corresponding to ‘The boy who lost was kept crying’, which has an unexpected meaning. So we want some account of why (27) cannot have the interpretation corresponding to (26). But the “negative fact” concerning (27) is precisely what one would expect if ‘was’ cannot be displaced from its position in (26).

*Was_{i}{[the [boy [who [( _ )_{i}lost]]]] [kept crying]}

By contrast, if we merely specify an algorithm that associates (27) with its actual meaning—or if we merely hypothesize that (27) is the English translation of a certain mental sentence—we have not yet explained why (27) cannot also be used to ask whether or not (26) is true.

Explanations of such facts appeal to nonobvious grammatical structure,
and constraints on natural language transformations. (For example, no
“fronting” an auxiliary verb from a relative clause;
though of course, one then tries to find deeper explanations for such
constraints.) More specifically, the idea was that a sentence has a
deep structure (DS), which reflects semantically relevant relations
between verbs and their arguments, and a surface structure (SS) that
may include displaced (or pleonastic) elements; and in some cases,
pronunciation might depend on still further transformations of SS,
resulting in a distinct “phonological form”
(PF). Linguists posited various constraints on these levels of
grammatical structure, and the transformations that relate
them. Though as the theory was elaborated and refined under empirical
pressure, various facts that apparently called for explanation in
these terms still went unexplained. This suggested another level of
grammatical structure, perhaps obtained by a different kind of
transformation on SS. The hypothesized level was called
‘LF’ (intimating ‘logical form’); and the
hypothesized transformation—called *quantifier raising*
because it targeted the kinds of expressions that indicate
(restricted) quantifiers—mapped structures like (28S) onto
structures like (28L).

(28S) {Pat [trusts [every doctor]]} (28L) {[every doctor] _{i}{Pat [ trusts ( _ )_{i}]}}

Clearly, (28L) does not reflect the pronounced word order in
English. But the idea was that (PF) determines pronunciation, while LF
was said to be the level at which the *scope* of a natural
language quantifier is determined; see May (1985). If we think about
‘every’ as a kind of second-order transitive predicate,
which can combine with two predictes like ‘doctor’ and
‘Pat trusts’ to form a complete sentence, we should
expect that at some level of analysis, the sentence ‘Pat trusts
every doctor’ has the structure indicated in (28L). And mapping
(28L) to the logical form
‘[∀*x*:Doctor(*x*)]{Trusts(Pat,
*x*)}’ is trivial. Likewise, one can hypothesize that
(29S) may be mapped onto (29L) or (29L'),

(29S) {[some boy] [trusts [every doctor]]} (29L) {[some boy] _{i}{[every doctor]_{j}{( _ )_{i}[ trusts ( _ )_{j}]}}(29L') {[every doctor] _{j}{[some boy]_{i}{ ( _ )_{i}[ trusts ( _ )_{j}]}}}

which are easily mapped onto
‘[∃*x*:Boy(*x*)][∀*y*:Doctor(*y*)]{Trusts(*x*,
*y*)}’ and
‘[∀*y*:Doctor(*y*)][∃*x*:Boy(*x*)]{Trusts(*x*,
*y*)}’. This assimilates quantifier scope ambiguity to the
structural ambiguity of examples like ‘Mary saw the boy with
binoculars’. More generally, many apparent examples of
grammar/logic mismatches were rediagnosed as mismatches between
different aspects of grammatical structure—between those aspects
that determine pronunication, and those that determine interpretation.
In one sense, this is fully in keeping with the idea that in natural
language, “surface appearances” are often misleading with regard to
propositional structure. But it also makes room for the idea that
grammatical structure and logical structure converge, in ways that can
be discovered through investigation, once we move beyond traditional
subject-predicate conceptions of structure with regard to both logic
and grammar.

There is independent evidence for “covert”
transformations—displacement of expressions from their audible
positions, as in (28L); see Huang (1995), Hornstein (1995). Consider,
for example, the French translation of ‘Who did John see’:
*Jean a vu qui*. If we assume that *qui*
(‘who’) is displaced at LF, then we can explain why
the question-word is understood in both French and English like a
quantifier binding a variable: which person *x* is such that
John saw *x*? Similarly, example (30) from Chinese is
transliterated as in (31).

(30) Zhangsan zhidao Lisi mai-te sheme (31) Zhangsan know Lisi bought what

But (30) is ambiguous, between the interrogative (31a) and the complex declarative (31b).

(31a) Which thing is such that Zhangsan knows Lisi bought it (31b) Zhangsan knows which thing (is such that) Lisi bought (it)

This suggests covert displacement of the quantificational question-word in Chinese; see Huang (1982, 1995). Chomsky (1981) also argued that the constraints on such displacement can help explain contrasts like the one illustrated with (32) and (33).

(32) Who said he has the best smile (33) Who did he say has the best smile

In (32), the pronoun ‘he’ can have a bound-variable
reading: which person *x* is such that *x* said that
*x* has the best smile. This suggests that the following
grammatical structure is possible: Who_{i} {[(
)_{i} said [he_{i} has the best smile]]}. But (33)
cannot be used to ask this question, suggesting that some linguistic
constraint rules out the following structure:

*Who_{i}[did {[he_{i}say [( )_{i}has the best smile]]].

And there cannot be constraints on transformations without transformations. So if English overtly displaces question-words that are covertly displaced in other languages, we should not be surprised if English covertly displaces other quantificational expressions like ‘every doctor’.

Likewise, (34) has the reading indicated in (34a) but not the reading indicated in (34b).

(34) It is false that Pat saw every lawyer (34a) ¬∀ x:Lawyer(x)[Saw(Pat,x)](34b) ∀ x:Lawyer(x)¬[Saw(Pat,x)]

This suggests that ‘every doctor’ gets displaced, but only so far. Similarly, (13) cannot mean that every patient is such that no lawyer who saw that patient respects some doctor.

(13) No lawyer who saw every patient respects some doctor

As we have already seen, English seems to abhor “fronting” certain
elements from within an embedded relative clause. This invites the
hypothesis that quantifier raising is subject to a similar constraint,
and hence, that there is quantifier-raising in English. Indeed, many
linguists (following Chomsky [1995, 2000]) would now posit only two
“levels” of grammatical structure, corresponding to PF and
LF—the thought being that constraints on DS and SS can be
eschewed in favor of a simpler theory that only posits constraints on
how expressions can be combined in the course of constructing complex
expressions that can be pronounced and interpreted. If this
development of earlier theories proves correct, the *only*
semantically relevant level of grammatical structure often reflects
covert displacement of audible expressions. But in any case, there is
a large body of work suggesting that many logical properties of
quantifiers, names, and pronouns are reflected in properties of
LF.

For example, if (35) is true, it follows that some doctor treated some doctor; whereas (36) does not have this consequence:

(35) Every boy saw the doctor who treated himself (36) Every boy saw the doctor who treated him

The truth conditions of (35–36) seem to be as indicated in (35a) and (36a).

(35a) [∀ x:Boy(x)][!y:Doctor(y) & Treated(y,y)]{Saw(x,y)]}(36a) [∀ x:boy(x)][!y:Doctor(y) & Treated(y,x)]{Saw(x,y)}

This suggests that ‘himself’ is behaving like a variable bound by ‘the doctor’, while ‘every boy’ can bind ‘him’. And there are independent grammatical reasons for saying that ‘himself’ must be linked to ‘the doctor’, while ‘him’ must not be so linked. Note that in ‘Pat thinks Chris treated himself/him’, the antecedent of ‘himself’ must be the subject of ‘treated’, while the antecedent of ‘him’ must not be.

Linguists have also discovered grammatical correlates of *dictum de
nullo* environments. For example, the word ‘ever’ can be
used in sentences like (37–39). But there is something wrong with
(40–42).

(37) No senator ever lied (38) No senator who ever lied got away with it (39) Every senator who ever lied got away with it (40) *Every senator ever lied (41) *Some senator ever lied (42) *Some senator who ever lied got away with it

To a first approximation, certain expressions like ‘ever’ can appear only in phrases that licence inferences from more restrictive to less restrictive predicates. (Idiomatic alternatives to ‘any’—like ‘pay a plug nickel for’, roughly synonymous with ‘pay any money for’—exhibit this pattern: Nobody/*Somebody would pay a plug nickel for that horse.) Such discoveries, of which there have been many, confirm the Aristotelian and medieval suspicion that logical properties and grammatical properties are deeply related after all.

There is, to be sure, an important conceptual distinction between LF
and the traditional notion of logical form: there is no guarantee that
structural features of natural language sentences will mirror the
logical features of propositions; cp. Stanley (2000), King (2007). But
this leaves room for the empirical hypothesis that LF reflects at
least a great deal of propositional structure; see Harman (1972),
Higginbotham (1986), Segal (1989), Larson and Ludlow (1993), and the
essay on
structured propositions.
And even if the LF of a sentence *S*
underdetermines the logical form of the proposition a speaker
expresses with *S* (on a given occasion of use), perhaps the LF provides
a “scaffolding” that is somehow elaborated in particular contexts,
with little or no mismatch between grammatical and propositional
architecture. If some such view is correct, it might avoid certain
(unpleasant) questions prompted by earlier Fregean views: how can a
sentence indicate a proposition with a
*different* structure; and if grammar is deeply misleading, why
think that our intuitions concerning impeccability provide
*reliable* evidence about which propositions follow from which?
These are, however, issues that remain very much unsettled.

## 9. Semantic Structure and Events

If propositions are the “things” that really have logical form, and sentences of English are not themselves propositions, then sentences of English “have” logical forms only by association with propositions. But if the meaning of a sentence is an indicated proposition (or perhaps a function from contexts to propositions), then one might say that the logical form “of” a sentence is its semantic structure—i.e., the structure of that sentence's meaning. Alternatively, one might suspect that in the end, talk of propositions is just convenient shorthand for talking about the semantic properties of sentences: perhaps sentences of a Begriffsschrift, or sentences of mentalese, or sentences of natural languages (abstracting away from their logically/semantically irrelevant properties). And in any case, the notion of logical form has played a significant role in recent work on theories of meaning. So an introductory discussion of the topic would not be complete without at least a hint of why that work is relevant.

Prima facie, ‘every tall sailor respects some doctor’ and ‘some short boy likes every politician’ exhibit common modes of linguistic combination. And a natural hypothesis is that the meaning of each sentence is fixed by these modes of combination, given the relevant word meanings. It may be hard to see how this hypothesis could be true if there are widespread mismatches between logical and grammatical form. But it is also hard to see how the hypothesis could be false, given that children (with finite cognitive resources) typically acquire the capacity to understand the endlessly many expressions of the languages spoken around them. A great deal of recent work has focussed on these issues, concering the connections between logical form and the senses in which natural languages are (and are not) semantically compositional.

It was implicit in Frege that each of the endlessly many sentences of
an ideal language would have a compositionally determined
truth-condition. But Frege did not specify an algorithm that would
associate each sentence of his Begriffsschrift with its
truth-condition. Tarski (1933) showed how to do this for the
first-order predicate calculus, focussing on the interesting cases of
multiple quantification like
‘∀*x*∃*y*(*Nx* →
*Syx*)’,
‘∀*x*∃*y*{*Nx* →
[*Syx* & ∀*z*(*Pzx* →
*Pzy*)]}’, etc. This made it possible to capture, with
precision, the idea that an inference is valid in the predicate
calculus iff: every interpretation that makes the premises true also
makes the conclusion true, holding fixed the interpretations of
logical elements like ‘if’ and
‘every’. Davidson (1967a) conjectured that one could do
for English what Tarski did for the predicate calculus; and Montague,
similarly inspired by Tarski, showed how one could start dealing with
predicates that have quantificational constituents. Still, many
apparent objections to the conjecture remained. As noted in section
four, sentences like ‘Pat thinks that Hesperus is
Phosphorus’ present difficulties; though Davidson (1968) offered
an influential suggestion. Davidson's (1967b) proposal concerning
examples like (43–46) also proved enormously fruitful.

(43) Juliet kissed Romeo quickly at midnight. (44) Juliet kissed Romeo quickly. (45) Juliet kissed Romeo at midnight. (46) Juliet kissed Romeo.

If (43) is true, so are (44–46); and if (44) or (45) is true, so is
(46). The inferences seem impeccable. But the function-argument
structures are not obvious. If we represent ‘kissed quickly at
midnight’ as a unstructured predicate that takes two arguments,
like ‘kissed’ or ‘kicked’, we will
represent the inference from (43) to (46) as having the form:
*K**(*x*, *y*); so *K*(*x*,
*y*). But this form is exemplified by the bad inference
‘Juliet kicked Romeo; so Juliet kissed Romeo’. Put another
way, if ‘kissed quickly at midnight’ is a logically
unstructured binary predicate, then the following claim is a nonlogical
assumption: if Juliet kissed Romeo in a certain manner at a certain
time, then Juliet kissed Romeo. But this seems like a tautology, not an
assumption that introduces any epistemic risk. Davidson concluded
that the surface appearances of sentences like (43–46) mask semantic
structure. In particular, he proposed that such sentences are
understood in terms of quantification over *events*.

According to Davdison, the meaning of (46) is manifested in the
paraphrase ‘There was a kissing of Romeo by Juliet’. One
can formalize this proposal in various ways:
∃*e*[Kissing(*e*) & Of(*e*, Romeo) &
By(*e*, Juliet)]; or ∃*e*[Kiss(*e*, Juliet,
Romeo)], with the verb ‘kiss’ indicating a function that
takes three arguments; or as in (46a),

(46a) ∃ e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo)]

with Juliet and Romeo being explicitly represented as players of
certain *roles* in an event. But whatever the notation, adverbs
like ‘quickly’ and ‘at midnight’ are said to
indicate further features of the event described, as shown in
(43a-45a).

(43a) ∃ e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo) & Quick(e) & At-midnight(e)](44a) ∃ e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo) & Quick(e)](45a) ∃ e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo) & At-midnight(e)]

If this is correct, then the inference from (43) to (46) is an
instance of the following valid form:
∃*e*[* A*(

*e*,

*x*) &

*K*(

*e*) &

*(*

__P__*e*,

*y*) &

*Q*(

*e*) &

*M*(

*e*)]; hence, ∃

*e*[

*(*

__A__*e*,

*x*) &

*K*(

*e*) &

*(*

__P__*e*,

*y*)]. The other impeccable inferences involving (43–46) can likewise be viewed as instances of conjunction reduction. If the grammatical form of (46) is simply ‘{Juliet [kissed Romeo]}’, then the mapping from grammatical to logical form is not transparent; and natural language is misleading, in that no

*word*corresponds to the event quantifier. But this does not posit a significant structural mismatch between grammatical and logical form. On the contrary, each word in (46) corresponds to a conjunct in (46a). This suggests a strategy for thinking about how the meaning of a sentence like (46) might be composed from the meanings of the constituent words. A growing body of literature, in philosophy and linguistics, suggests that Davidson's proposal captures an important feature of natural language semantics, and that “event analyses” provide a useful framework for future discussions of logical form. At a minimum, Davidson showed how we need not be limited by a particular view about the kinds of propositions indicated with sentences. One can treat (46) as a kind of quantificational claim, whether or not one follows Russell in treating names as disguised descriptions.

Let's return now to the idea that each complex expression of natural language has semantic properties—leaving it open just what these are—determined by (i) the semantic properties of its constituents, and (ii) the ways in which these constituents are grammatically arranged. If this is correct, then following Davidson, one might say that the logical form of a complex expressions (in a natural language) just is the structure that must be imposed on the relevant words to determine the relevant meaning in a systematic way that also applies to other complex expressions of the language; see Lepore and Ludwig (2002). Perhaps the phenomenon of valid inference is, at least largely, a “by product” of semantic compositionality. If the principles governing the meanings of (43–46) have the consequence that (46) is true if (43) is true, one might try to argue that this is illustrative of the general case.

## 10. Further Questions

At this point, many issues become relevant to further discussions of logical form. Most obviously, there are specific questions concerning specific examples. Given just about any sentence of natural language, one can ask interesting questions (that remain unsettled) about its logical form. There are also very abstract questions about the relation of semantics to logic. Should we follow Davidson and Montague, among others, in characterizing theories of meaning for natural languages as theories of truth (that perhaps satisfy certain conditions on learnability)? Is an algorithm that correctly associates sentences with truth-conditions (relative to contexts) necessary and/or sufficient for being an adequate theory of meaning? What should we say about the paradoxes apparently engendered by sentences like ‘This sentence is false’? If we allow for second-order logical forms, how should we understand second-order quantification, given Russell's Paradox? Are claims about the “semantic structure” of a sentence fundamentally descriptive claims about speakers (or their communities, or their languages)? Or is there an important sense in which claims about semantic structure are normative claims about how we should use language? Are facts about the acquisition of language germane to hypotheses about logical form? And of course, the history of the subject reveals that the answers to the central questions are by no means obvious: what is logical structure, what is grammatical structure, and how are they related? Or put another way, what kinds of structures do propositions and sentences exhibit, and how do thinkers/speakers relate them?

## Bibliography

### Cited Works

- Boolos, G., 1998,
*Logic, Logic, and Logic*. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Carnap, R., 1950, “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology”, reprinted
in
*Meaning and Necessity*, second edition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1956. - Cartwright, R., 1962, “Propositions”, in R. J. Butler,
*Analytical Philosophy*, 1st series, Oxford: Basil Blackwell 1962; reprinted with addenda in Richard Cartwright,*Philosophical Essays*, Cambridge: MIT Press 1987. - Chomsky, N., 1957,
*Syntactic Structures*. The Hague: Mouton. - –––, 1965,
*Aspects of the Theory of Syntax*. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - –––, 1981,
*Lectures on Government and Binding*. Dordrecht: Foris. - –––, 1986,
*Knowledge of Language*. New York: Praeger. - –––, 1995,
*The Minimalist Program*. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - Davidson, D., 1967a, “Truth and Meaning”,
*Synthese*, 17: 304–23. - –––, 1967b, “The Logical Form of Action
Sentences”, in N. Rescher (ed.)
*The Logic of Decision and Action*. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press. - –––, 1968, “On Saying That”,
*Synthese*, 19: 130–46. - –––, 1980,
*Essays on Actions and Events*. Oxford: Oxford University Press. - –––, 1984,
*Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation*. Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Donnellan, K., 1966, “Reference and Definite Descriptions”,
*Philosophical Review*, 75: 281–304. - Fodor, J., 1975,
*The Language of Thought*. New York: Crowell. - Fodor, J., 1978, “Propositional Attitudes”,
*The Monist*, 61: 501–23. - Harman, G., 1972, “Logical Form,”
*Foundations of Language*9: 38–65. - Higginbotham, J., 1986, “Linguistic Theory and Davidson's Program
in Semantics”, in E. Lepore, ed.,
*Truth and Interpretation*, Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 29–48. - Hornstein, N., 1995,
*Logical Form: From GB to Minimalism*. Oxford: Blackwell. - Huang, J., 1995, “Logical Form”, in Webelhuth, G. (ed.),
*Government and Binding Theory and the Minimalist Program: Principles and Parameters in Syntactic Theory*. Oxford: Blackwell. - King, J., 2009,
*The Nature and Structure of Content*. Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Larson, R. and Ludlow, P., 1993, “Interpreted Logical
Forms,”
*Synthese*, 95: 305–55. - Lepore, E. and Ludwig, K., 2002, “What is Logical Form?”, in Preyer and Peter 2002, pp. 54–90.
- Ludlow, P., 2002, “LF and Natural Logic”, in Preyer and Peter 2002.
- May, R., 1985,
*Logical Form: Its Structure and Derivation*. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - Montague, R., 1970, “English as a Formal Language”, reprinted in his
collected esssays,
*Formal Philosophy*. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1974. - Preyer, G. and G. Peter, G. (eds.), 2002,
*Logical Form and Language*. Oxford: OUP. - Quine, W.V.O., 1950,
*Methods of Logic*. New York: Henry Holt. - –––, 1951, “Two Dogmas of
Empiricism”,
*Philosophical Review*, 60: 20–43. - –––, 1960,
*Word and Object*. Cambridge MA: MIT Press. - –––, 1970,
*Philosophy of Logic*. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall. - Sànchez, V., 1991,
*Studies on Natural Logic and Categorial Grammar*. Doctoral dissertation, University of Amsterdam. - Segal, G., 1989, “A preference for sense and
reference,”
*The Journal of Philosophy*86: 73–89. - Soames, S., 1987, “Direct Reference, Propositional Attititudes, and
Semantic Content”,
*Philosophical Topics*, 15: 47–87. - –––, 1995, “Beyond Singular
Propositions”,
*Canadian Journal of Philosophy*, 25: 515–50. - –––, 2002,
*Beyond Rigidity*. Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Stanley, J., 2000, “Context and Logical
Form”,
*Linguistics and Philosophy*, 23: 391–434. - Strawson, P., 1950, “On Referring”,
*Mind*, 59: 320–44. - Tarski, A., 1933, “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages”, reprinted in Tarski 1983.
- –––, 1944, “The Semantic Conception of
Truth”,
*Philosophy and Phenomenological Research*, 4: 341–75. - –––, 1983,
*Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics*. Trans. J.H. Woodger; 2nd edition, ed. J. Corcoran. Indianapolis: Hackett.

### Other Useful Works

The following books provide a useful overview of the history and basic subject matter of logic:

- Kneale, W. & Kneale, M., 1962,
*The Development of Logic*. Oxford: OUP, reprinted 1984. - Sainsbury, M., 1991,
*Logical Forms*. Oxford: Blackwell. - Broadie, A., 1987,
*Introduction to Medieval Logic*. Oxford: OUP.

Frege's *Begriffsschrift* can be found in:

*From Frege to Gödel*, J. van Heijenoort (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1967.

His later work on functions (‘Function and Concept’) and belief ascriptions (‘Sense and Reference’) can be found in:

*Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege*, P. Geach & M. Black (trans.), Oxford: Blackwell, 1952.

For these purposes, Russell's most important books are:

*Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy*, London: George Allen and Unwin, 1919.*Our Knowledge of the External World*, New York: Norton, 1929.*The Philosophy of Logical Atomism*, La Salle, Ill: Open Court, 1985.

See also the introduction to the latter, by David Pears; and
*Russell*, by Mark Sainsbury (London: Routledge & Kegan
Paul, 1979). Stephen Neale's *Descriptions* (Cambridge, MA: MIT
Press, 1990) is a recent development of Russell's theory.
Wittgenstein's *Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus* (London:
Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1961) is importantly related to Russell's
logical atomism.

Two key articles on restricted quantifiers, and a third reviewing recent work, are:

- Barwise, J. & Cooper, R., 1981, “Generalized Quantifiers and
Natural Language”,
*Linguistics and Philosophy*, 4: 159–219. - Higginbotham, J. & May, R., 1981, “Questions, Quantifiers, and
Crossing”,
*Linguistic Review*, 1: 47–79. - Keenan, E., 1996, “The Semantics of Determiners”, in S. Lappin, ed.,
*The Handbook of Contemporary Semantic Theory*, Oxford: Blackwell

For introductions to Transformational Grammar and Chomsky's conception of natural language, see:

- Radford, A., 1988,
*Transformational Grammar*. Cambridge: CUP. - Haegeman, L., 1994,
*Introduction to Government & Binding Theory*. Cambridge: Blackwell. - Lasnik, H. (with M. Depiante and A. Stepanov), 2000,
*Syntactic Structures Revisited*. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

And for discussions of work in linguistics bearing directly on issues of logical form:

- Higginbotham, J., 1985, “On Semantics”,
*Linguistic Inquiry*, 16: 547–93. - Hornstein, N., 1995,
*Logical Form: From GB to Minimalism*. Oxford: Blackwell. - Larson, R. and Segal, G., 1995,
*Knowledge of Meaning*. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - May, R., 1985,
*Logical Form: Its Structure and Derivation*. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - Neale, S., 1993,
*Grammatical Form, Logical Form, and Incomplete Symbols*. In A. Irvine & G. Wedeking, eds.,*Russell and Analytic Philosophy*, Toronto: University of Toronto.

For discussions of the Davidsonian program (briefly described in section 9) and appeal to events:

- Davidson, D., 1984,
*Essays on Truth and Interpretation*. Oxford: OUP. - Davidson, D., 1985, “Adverbs of Action”, in B. Vermazen and M.
Hintikka, eds.,
*Essays on Davidson: Actions and Events*, Oxford: Clarendon Press - Evans, G. & McDowell, J. (eds.), 1976,
*Truth and Meaning*. Oxford: OUP. - Higginbotham, J., Pianesi, F. and Varzi, A. (eds.), 2000,
*Speaking of Events*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Ludwig, K. (ed.), 2003,
*Contemporary Philosophers in Focus: Donald Davidson*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Lycan, W., 1984,
*Logical Form in Natural Language*. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - Parsons, T., 1990,
*Events in the Semantics of English*Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - Pietroski, P., 2004,
*Events and Semantic Architecture*. Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Schein, B., 1993,
*Plurals*. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - Taylor, B., 1985,
*Modes of Occurrence*. Oxford: Blackwell.

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## Related Entries

analysis | analytic/synthetic distinction | Aristotle, General Topics: logic | behaviorism | Carnap, Rudolf | Davidson, Donald | descriptions | Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: theorem and foundations for arithmetic | logic: classical | logic: modal | logical consequence | model theory | names | propositional attitude reports | propositions | propositions: singular | propositions: structured | Quine, Willard van Orman | reference | relations: medieval theories of | rigid designators | Russell, Bertrand | Russell's paradox | syllogism: medieval theories of | terms, properties of: medieval theories of | vagueness

### Acknowledgments

The author would like to thank: Christopher Menzel for spotting an error in an earlier characterization of the generalized quantifier ‘every’, prompting revision of the surrounding discussion; Karen Carter and Max Heiber, for catching unfortunate typos earlier versions of sections three and six; and for comments on earlier drafts, Susan Dwyer, James Lesher, and the editors.