Logical Form

First published Tue Oct 19, 1999; substantive revision Mon Jun 22, 2009

Some inferences are impeccable. Examples like (1–3) illustrate reasoning that cannot lead from true premises to false conclusions.

(1) John danced if Mary sang, and Mary sang; so John danced.
(2) Every politician is deceitful, and every senator is a politician; so every senator is deceitful.
(3) The detective is in the garden; so someone is in the garden.

In such cases, a thinker takes no epistemic risk by endorsing the conditional claim that if the premises are true, so is the conclusion. The conclusion follows immediately from the premises, without any further assumptions that might turn out to be false. By contrast, examples like (4–6) illustrate reasoning that involves at least some risk of going wrong—from correct premises to a mistaken conclusion.

(4) John danced if Mary sang, and John danced; so Mary sang.
(5) Every feathered biped is a bird, and Tweety is a feathered biped; so Tweety can fly.
(6) Every human born before 1870 died; so every human will die.

Inference (4) is not secure. Suppose that John dances whenever Mary sings, and sometimes when Mary doesn't sing. Similarly, with regard to (5), Tweety might turn out to be a bird that cannot fly. Even (6) falls short of the demonstrative character exhibited by (1–3). While laws of nature may preclude immortality, the conclusion of (6) goes beyond its premise, even if it is in some sense foolish to resist the inference.

Appeals to logical form arose in the context of attempts to say more about this intuitive distinction between impeccable inferences, which invite metaphors of security and immediacy, and inferences that involve a risk of slipping from truth to falsity. The motivations for saying more are both practical and theoretical. Experience teaches us that an inference can initially seem more secure than it is; and if we knew which inferences are risk-free, we might be more alert to the points at which we risk error. Such alertness might be valuable, even if the risks are tolerable. As we shall see, claims about inference are also intimately connected with claims about the nature of thought, its relation to language, and the possibility that ordinary language “disguises” the underlying structure of thought.

Many philosophers have been especially interested in the possibility that language disguises thought, in part because this suggests a diagnosis for why human thinkers are tempted to adopt certain problematic claims about the world we think/talk about. For example, apparent similarities across sentences like ‘Odysseus arrived’, ‘Nobody arrived’, and ‘The king arrived’ might lead one to think that the corresponding thoughts exhibit a common subject-predicate form. But even if ‘Odysseus’ indicates an entity that can be the subject a thought T that is true if and only if the subject of T arrived, other considerations (see sections 4 and 5) suggest that ‘Nobody’ and ‘The king’ do not indicate subjects in this sense. There are related issues concerning implication —e.g., why the sentence ‘Nobody arrived’ indicates a thought that doesn't imply any arrival. But there are also broader issues concerning the kind(s) of structure that thoughts and sentences exhibit. For if many thoughts do not have subject-predicate form, perhaps thoughts and sentences exhibit different kinds of structure; or perhaps many sentences do not have the simple structures they initially appear to have. As we'll see, this raises further questions about how to construe the various proposals: are they normative claims about how we ought to think/talk, or empirical hypotheses about certain aspects of psycholgical/linguistic reality?

In short, we would like to know in virtue of what (if anything) an inference is impeccable, in part because this a potentially useful way of asking questions about how human language is related to human thought. The most common suggestion has been that certain inferences are secure by virtue of their logical form. Though unsurprisingly, conceptions of form have evolved, along with conceptions of logic and language.

1. Patterns of Reason

An ancient thought is that impeccable inferences exhibit patterns that can be characterized schematically by abstracting away from the specific contents of particular premises and conclusions, thereby revealing a general form common to many other impeccable inferences. Such forms, along with the inferences that exemplify them, are said to be valid. In a valid inference, the premises are strong enough to guarantee the conclusion, which seems (somehow) to be “contained in” the premises. With regard to (1), it seems that the conclusion is part of the first premise, and that the second premise is another part of the first. We can express this point by saying that (1) is an inference of the following form: B if A, and A; so B. Inferences like (7) share this form.

(7) Chris swam if Pat was asleep, and Pat was asleep; so Chris swam.

The Stoics discussed such inferences, all of which are equally secure, using ordinal numbers (instead of letters) to reflect the abstract form: if the first then the second, and the first; so the second. In addition to this variant of ‘B if A, and A; so B’, the Stoics formulated other valid schemata.

If the first then the second, but not the second; so not the first.

Either the first or the second, but not the second; so the first.

Not both the first and the second, but the first; so not the second.

Schematic formulations require variables. And let us introduce ‘proposition’ as a term of art for whatever the variables above, represented in bold, range over. Propositions are thus potential premises/conclusions—“things” that can figure in valid inferences. Presumably, such things can be evaluated for truth or falsity; they can be endorsed or rejected. But this leaves it open what propositions are: sentences, statements, states of affairs, or whatever. For now, let's just assume that declarative sentences can be used to “indicate” propositions; for discussion, see Cartwright(1962) and the essay on structured propositions.

A significant complication is that in ordinary conversation, the context matters with regard to which proposition (if any) is indicated with a given sentence. For example, ‘Pat is asleep’ can be used at one time to indicate a true premise, and at another time to indicate a false premise. A given speaker might use ‘I am tired’ to express a false proposition, while another speaker uses the same sentence at the same time to express a true proposition. And what counts as being tired can vary across conversations. Context sensitivity, of various kinds, is ubiquitous in ordinary discourse. But for simplicity, let's idealize and assume that we can at least speak of the proposition indicated in a given context with a sentence. Eventually, we may have to modify even this assumption. (Is any one proposition indicated with ‘He is bald’ in a given context? Perhaps there is a range of candidate propositions, with no fact of the matter as to which is the proposition indicated; see the entry on vagueness.) But it seems clear that humans can at least use “idealized” sentences, like ‘Every circle is an ellipse’ or ‘Thirteen is a prime number’, to indicate premises of valid arguments. And while ordinary conversation surely differs from theoretical discourse in mathematics, the intuitive distinction between impeccable and risky inferences is not limited to special contexts in which one tries to think especially clearly about especially abstract matters. Correlatively, while context sensitivity is an important phenomenon, we can abstract away from it and still learn things about the nature of valid inference.

Another complication is that in speaking of an inference, one might be talking about (i) a process in which a thinker draws a conclusion from some premises, or (ii) the propositions a thinker would accept—perhaps tentatively or hypothetically—if she accepted the premises and conclusion, with one proposition designated as an alleged consequence of the others. But we can describe a risky thought process as one in which a thinker who accepts certain propositions comes to accept, on that basis, a proposition that does not follow from the relevant assumptions. And it will be simpler to focus on premises/conclusions, as opposed to episodes of reasoning.

With regard to (1),

(1) John danced if Mary sang, and Mary sang; so John danced.

the inference seems to be secure in part because its first premise has the form ‘B if A’. If the proposition in question lacked this form, one could not explain the impeccability of (1) by saying that ‘B if A, and A; so B’ is a form of valid inference. It is not obvious that all impeccable inferences are instances of some valid form, and thus inferences whose impeccability is due to the forms of the relevant propositions. But this thought has served as an ideal for the study of inference, at least since Aristotle's treatment of examples like (2).

(2) Every politician is deceitful, and every senator is a politician; so every senator is deceitful.

The first premise—viz., the proposition that every politician is deceitful—seems to have several parts, each of which is a part of the second premise or the conclusion. And the inference is presumably valid because these proposition-parts exhibit the right pattern. Aristotle, predating the Stoics, captured this idea by noting that conditional claims of the following form are sure to be true: if every P is D and every S is a P, then every S is D. Correspondingly, the following inference schema is valid:

Every P is D, and every S is a P; so every S is D.

Aristotle discussed a range of such inferences, called syllogisms, involving quantificational propositions indicated by words like ‘every’ and ‘some’. (Although Aristotle typically presented his syllogisms as conditional claims, like ‘if D belongs to every P, and P belongs to every S, then D belongs to every S’.) Two other syllogistic forms are expressed below as valid schemata.

Every P is D, and some S is a P; so some S is D.

Some S is not D, every S is a P; so some P is not D.

The variables, represented in italics, are intended to range over certain parts of propositions. Intuitively, common nouns like ‘politician’ and adjectives like ‘deceitful’ are general terms, since they can apply to more than one individual. And just so, it seems, propositions contain correspondingly general elements. For example, the proposition that every senator is deceitful contains two such elements relevant to the validity of inferences involving this proposition. (One violates English grammar by saying ‘Every senator is politician’; the article ‘a’ is needed. But let's assume that this particular feature of English, not found in all languages, does not reflect propositional structure.)

Propositions thus seem to have structure that bears on the validity of inferences, even ignoring premises/conclusions with propositional parts. That is, even simple propositions have logical form. And as Aristotle noted, pairs of such propositions can be related in interesting ways. If every P is D, then some P is D. (For these purposes, assume there is at least one P.) If no P is D, then some P is not D. It is certain that either every P is D or some P is not D; and whichever of these propositions is true, the other is false. Similarly, the following propositions cannot both be true: every P is D; and no P is D. But it is not certain that either every P is D, or no P is D. Perhaps some P is D and some P is not D. This network of logical relations strongly suggests that the propositions in question contain a quantificational element and two general elements—and in some cases, an element of negation. This raises the question of whether other propositions have a similar structure.

2. Propositions and Traditional Grammar

Consider the proposition that Venus is bright, which can figure in inferences like (8).

(8) Every planet is bright, and Venus is a planet; so Venus is bright.

Aristotle's logic focussed on quantificational propositions; and as we shall see, this was prescient. But on his view, propositions like the conclusion of (8) still exemplify a subject-predicate structure shared by all propositions—as well as the sentences that (can be used to) indicate them. And one can easily formulate the schema ‘every P is D, and n is a P; so n is D’, where the new lower-case variable is intended to range over proposition-parts of the sort indicated by names. (On some views, discussed below, the proposition that Venus is bright contains a quantifier and two elements of generality; though unsurprisingly, such views are tendentious.)

Declarative sentences intuitively divide into a subject and a predicate, indicated with a slash as follows: ‘Every planet / is bright’, ‘Venus / is bright’, ‘Some politician / swam’, ‘The brightest planet / rises early in the evening’, etc. Until fairly recently, it was held that propositions were like sentences in this respect. With regard to the proposition that Venus is bright, Aristotle would have said that bright(ness) belongs to—or in modern terms, is predicated of—Venus; with respect to the proposition that every politician is deceitful’, deceitful(ness) is predicated of every politician. On this view, both ‘Venus’ and ‘every politician’ indicate subjects, and ‘is’ introduces a predicate. Using slightly different terminology, later theorists treated all elements of generality as predicates, and many propositions were said to have categorical form: subject-copula-predicate; where a copula, indicated by words like ‘is’ or ‘was’, links a subject (which can consist of a quantifier and predicate) to a predicate in a proposition.

Sentences like ‘Every politician swam’ can be paraphrased with sentences like ‘Every politician was an individual who did some swimming’. So perhaps these sentences indicate the same proposition, whose true categorical form is not reflected with ‘Every man swam’. Maybe ‘swam’ is a kind of abbreviation for ‘was one who did some swimming’, in the way that ‘bachelor’ is arguably short for ‘unmarried marriageable man’.

The proposition that every planet is bright if Venus is bright seems to be a molecular compound of categorical propositions. (The same complex proposition is presumably indicated with ‘if Venus is bright then every planet is bright’.) And the proposition that not only every planet is bright apparently extends a categorical proposition, via the elements indicated with ‘not’ and ‘only’. Such reflections suggest the possibility, explored with great ingenuity by medieval logicians, that all propositions are composed of categorical propositions and a small number of so-called syncategorematic elements. This is not to say that all propositions were, or even could be, successfully analyzed in this manner. But applications of this strategy revealed many impeccable infererences as instances of valid forms.

Medieval logicians also discussed the relation of logic to grammar. Many viewed their project, in part, as an attempt to uncover principles of a mental language common to all thinkers. (Aristotle had said, similarly, that spoken sounds symbolize ‘affections of the soul’.) From this perspective, one expects a few differences between the logical forms of propositions, and overt features of sentences. If the proposition that every man swam has categorical form (and thus contains a copula), then spoken languages mask certain aspects of logical structure. For example, Ockham held that a mental language would have no need for Latin's declensions, and that logicians could ignore such aspects of spoken language. And the ancient Greeks were aware of sophisms like the following: that dog is a father, and that dog is yours; so that dog is your father. This bad inference cannot share its form with the superficially parallel (but impeccable) variant: that dog is a mutt, and that mutt is yours; so that dog is your mutt. (See Plato, Euthydemus 298 d-e.) So the superficial features of sentences are not infallible guides to the logical forms of propositions. But the divergence was held to be relatively minor. Spoken sentences have structure; they are composed, in systematic ways, of words. And the assumption was that sentences reflect the major aspects of propositional form, including subject-predicate structure. So while there is a distinction between the study of valid inference and the study of sentences used in spoken language, the connection between logic and grammar was thought to run deep. This suggested that the logical form of a proposition just is the grammatical form of some (perhaps mental) sentence.

3. Motivations for Revision

Towards the end of the eighteenth century, Kant could say (without much exaggeration) that logic had followed a single path since its inception, and that ‘since Aristotle it has not had to retrace a single step’. He also said that syllogistic logic was ‘to all appearance complete and perfect’; but this was exuberance. As the medievals knew, there were problems.

Some valid schemata are reducible to others, in that any inference of the reducible form can be revealed as valid (with a little work) given other schemata. And this turns out to be important. Consider (9).

(9) If Al ran then either Al did not run or Bob did not swim, and Al ran; so Bob did not swim.

Assume that ‘Al did not run’ negates ‘Al ran’, while ‘Bob did not swim’ negates ‘Bob swam’. Then (9) is an instance of the following valid form: if A then either not-A or not-B, and A; so not-B. But we can treat this as a derived form, by showing that any instance of this form is valid given two (intuitively more basic) Stoic inference forms: if the first then the second, and the first, so the second; either not the first or not the second, and the first; so not the second. For suppose we are given the following premises: A; and if A, then either not-A or not-B. We can safely infer that either not-A or not-B; and since we were given that A, we can safely infer that not-B. Similarly, the syllogistic schema (10) can be treated as a derived form.

(10) Some P is not D, and every S is D; so not every P is an S.

We already saw that if some P is not D, then not every P is D. So if we accept that some P is not D, and that every S is D, we cannot also accept that every P is an S. For if every P is an S, and every S is D, then every P is D; and we cannot accept this, given that not every P is D. This fully general reasoning tells us that each instance of (10) is itself an impeccable inference.

Presumably, further reduction is possible. One suspects that there are relatively few basic inferential patterns. Some inferences may reflect inherently compelling transitions in thought. Perhaps ‘B if A, and A; so B’ is so obvious that logicians are entitled to take this rule of inference as axiomatic. But how many rules are plausibly regarded as fundamental in this sense? Theoretical elegance and explanatory depth also favor theories with fewer irreducible assumptions. Euclid's geometry provided a model for how to present a body of knowledge as a network of propositions that follow from a few basic axioms. And medieval logicians made great strides in reducing syllogistic logic to two principles: dictum de omni and dictum de nullo. The underyling idea is that often, and perhaps “typically,” replacing a predicate with a less restrictive predicate corresponds to a valid inference; but sometimes—paradigmatically, in cases involving negation—replacing a predicate with a more restrictive predicate corresponds to a valid inference. For example, suppose that Rex is a brown dog. It follows that Rex is a dog; and given that every dog is an animal, it follows that Rex is an animal. Replacing ‘brown dog’ with the less restrictive predicate ‘dog’ yields a valid inference, and likewise for replacement with ‘animal’, on the assumption that ‘animal’ is still less restrictive. Such inferences were said to be governed by dictum de omni. Conversely, if Rex is not a dog, then Rex is not a brown dog. This illustrates dictum de nullo: in the scope of negation, replacing ‘dog’ with the more restrictive predicate ‘brown dog’ yields a valid inference.

One can account for a lot in these terms. Suppose, for example, that no dog is clever. It follows that no brown dog is clever; it also follows that no dog is furry and clever. In each case, the direction of entailment is from the less restrictive to the more restrictive predicate. Likewise, in accordance with dictum de nullo: if no animal is clever, and every dog is an animal, it follows that no dog is clever. Now suppose that some dog is clever. It follows that some dog or cat is clever; it also follows that some dog is clever or furry. Here, the direction of entailment is from the more restrictive to the less restrictive predicate (from ‘dog/clever’ to ‘dog or cat/clever or furry’). And in accordance with dictum de omni: if some dog is clever, and every dog is an animal, it follows that some animal is clever. Interestingly, ‘every’ is like ‘no’ in one respect, and like ‘some’ in another respect. If every dog is clever, it follows that every brown dog is clever, and that every dog is clever or furry. One can describe this fact by saying that when the universal quantifier combines with a predicate to form a subject, that predicate is governed by dictum de nullo; but when a universally quantified subject combines with another predicate to form a proposition, this “second” predicate is governed by dictum de omni.

This makes it possible to derive many valid inference forms, including Aristotle's original examples, from just two basic forms. But despite this major achievement, traditional logic/grammar was inadequate.

Propositions involving relations—e.g., the proposition that Juliet kissed Romeo—are evidently not categorical in form. One might suggest ‘Juliet was a kisser of Romeo’ as a subject-copula-predicate paraphrase. But the predicate ‘kisser of Romeo’ differs, in ways that matter to inference, from predicates like ‘politician’. If some kisser of Romeo died, it follows that someone was kissed; whereas the proposition that some politician died has no parallel logical consequence to the effect that the someone was __-ed. Correspondingly, if Juliet kissed Romeo, it follows that Juliet kissed someone. And the proposition that Juliet kissed someone is of interest, even if we express it by saying ‘Juliet was a kisser of someone’. For such a proposition involves a quantifier as part of a complex predicate. But traditional logic does not provide the resources needed for capturing the validity of inferences whose validity depends on quantifiers within predicates. Consider (11).

(11) Some patient respects some doctor, and every doctor is a senator; so some patient respects some senator.

If ‘respects some doctor’ and ‘respects some senator’ indicate nonrelational proposition-parts, much like ‘is tall’ and ‘is ugly’, then the inference has the following form: Some P is T, and every D is an S; so some P is U. But this schema, which fails to reflect any quantificational structure in the predicates, is not valid. Its instances include bad inferences like the following: some patient is tall, and every doctor is a senator; so some patient is ugly. This dramatizes the point that ‘respects some doctor’ and ‘respects some senator’ are logically related, in ways that ‘is tall’ and ‘is ugly’ are not; see the entries on medieval relations, and medieval terms.

One can adopt the view that many propositions have relational parts, introducing a variable ‘R’ intended to range over relations. Then one can formulate the following schema: some P R some D, and every D is an S; so some P R some S. But the problem remains. Quantifiers can appear in complex predicates that figure in complex impeccable inferences like (12).

(12) Every patient who met every doctor is tall, and some patient who met every doctor respects every senator; so some patient who respects every senator is tall.

But if ‘patient who met every doctor’ and ‘patient who respects every senator’ are treated as nonrelational, then (12) has the following form: every P is T, and some P R every S; so some U is T. And many inferences of this form are invalid. For example: every politician is tall, and some politician respects every senator; so some usher is tall. Again, one can abstract a valid schema that covers (12), letting parentheses indicate a relative clause.

Every P(R1 every D) is T, and some P(R1 every D) R2 every S; so some P(R2 every S) is T.

But there can be still further quantificational structure in these predicates, and likewise for any such schema, no matter how complex. (Consider the proposition that every patient who met some doctor who saw no lawyer respects some lawyer who saw no patient who met every doctor.) Moreover, schemata like the one above are poor candidates for basic inference patterns.

As medieval logicians knew, propositions expressed with relative clauses posed difficulties; see the entry on medieval syllogism. If every patient respects some doctor, it follows that every old patient respects some doctor. By itself, this is expected, since ‘old patient’ is more restrictive than ‘patient’; and as we saw above, a universally quantified subject is governed by dictum de nullo. But there are also complex subjects like ‘No lawyer who saw every patient’. And the proposition indicated with (13) follows from the proposition indicated with (14).

(13) No lawyer who saw every patient respects some doctor
(14) No lawyer who saw every old patient respects some doctor

The direction of inference is from the more restrictive ‘old patient’ to the less restrictive ‘patient’, as if the inference were governed by dictum de omni. One can say that the default direction of implication, from more to less restrictive predicates, has been “inverted” twice: once by ‘every’, and once by ‘No’. But one wants a detailed and systematic account of propositional structure that explains why and how this is the case. (For further discussion, see Ludlow [2002], drawing on Sanchez [1991].)

All of which suggests that it really is important—if impeccability is to be revealed as a matter of form—to find a general characterization of how quantificational elements contribute to propositions in which such elements appear. Quantifiers are not simply devices for creating “proposition frames” like ‘Every P is D’ into which elementary monadic predicates like ‘politician’ and ‘deceitful’ can be inserted. Predicates can themselves have quantificational structure and relational constituents.

4. Frege and Formal Language

Frege showed how to resolve these difficulties for traditional logic in one fell swoop. His system of logic—published in 1879 and still in use, with notational modifications—was the single greatest contribution to the subject. So it is significant that on Frege's view, propositions do not have subject-predicate form. His account required a substantial distinction between logical form and grammatical form (as traditionally conceived). It is hard to overemphasize the impact of this point on subsequent discussions of thought and its relation to language.

Frege's leading idea was that propositions have “function-argument” structure. And in later work, he developed in detail his intended analogy to mathematical functions. The successor function maps every integer onto its successor; it maps the number 1 onto the number 2, 2 onto 3, etc. We can represent this function, using a variable that ranges over integers, as follows: S(x) = x + 1. The function takes integers as arguments; and given an argument, the value of the function is the successor of that argument. Likewise, the division function can be represented as follows: Q(x, y) = x/y. This function maps ordered pairs of numbers onto quotients. For example, it maps (8, 4) onto 2, and (9, 3) onto 3. Mappings can also be conditional. Consider the function that maps every even integer onto itself, and every odd integer onto its successor: C(x) = x if x is even, and x + 1 otherwise; C(1) = 2, C(2) = 2, C(3) = 4, etc. By itself, however, no function has a value.

Variable letters, such as ‘x’ and ‘y’ in ‘Q(x, y) = x/y’, are typographically convenient for representing functions that take more than one argument. But we could also index argument places, as shown below.

Q[(  )i , (  )j] = (  )i / (  )j

Or we could replace the subscripts above with lines that connect each pair of round brackets on the left of ‘=’ to the corresponding pair of brackets on the right of ‘=’. But the idea, however we encode it, is that a proposition has at least one constituent that is saturated by the requisite number of arguments. (One can think of an unsaturated proposition-part as the result of abstracting away from the arguments in a particular proposition. Frege was here influenced by Kant's discussion of judgment, and the ancient observation that merely combining two things does not make the combination truth-evaluable; predicates evidently play a special role in “unifying” propositions.)

On Frege's view, the proposition that Mary sang has a functional component indicated by ‘sang’, and an argument indicated by ‘Mary’. So the sentence ‘Mary sang’, with ‘Mary’ as subject and ‘sang’ as predicate, indicates a proposition with the following function-argument structure: Sang(Mary). Frege thought of the relevant function as a conditional mapping from individuals to truth values: Sang(x) = T if x sang, and F otherwise; where ‘T’ and ‘F’ stand for special entities such that for each individual x, Sang(x) = T if and only if x sang, and Sang(x) = F if and only if x did not sing. Likewise, the proposition that John admired Mary has an ordered pair of arguments and a functional component indicated by the transitive verb: Admired(John, Mary); where Admired(x, y) = T if x admired y, and F otherwise. According to Frege, the proposition that Mary was admired by John has the same function-argument structure, even though ‘Mary’ is the subject of the passive sentence. And more importantly, Frege's treatment of quantified propositions departs radically from the traditional idea that the grammatical structure of sentence reflects the logical structure of the indicated proposition.

Suppose that S is the function indicated by ‘sang’. Then Mary sang iff—i.e., if and only if—S(Mary) = T. Likewise, someone sang iff: S maps some individual onto T; that is, for some individual x, S(x) = T. Or using a modern variant of Frege's notation, someone sang iff ∃x[Sang(x)]. The quantifier ‘∃x’ is said to bind the variable ‘x’, which ranges over individual things in a domain of discourse. (For now, assume that the domain contains only people.) If every individual in the domain sang, then F maps every individual onto T; or using formal notation, ∀x[Sang(x)]. A quantifier binds each occurrence of its variable, as in ‘∃x[D(x) & C(x)]’, which reflects the logical form of ‘someone is deceitful and clever’. In this last example, the quantifier combines with a complex predicate formed by conjoining two predicates.

With respect to the proposition that some politician is deceitful, traditional grammar suggests the division ‘Some politician / is deceitful’, with the noun ‘politician’ forming a constituent with the quantificational word. But on a Fregean view, the logically relevant division is between the existential quantifier and the rest: ∃x[P(x) & D(x)]; someone is both a politician and deceitful. With respect to the proposition that every politician is deceitful, Frege again says that the logically relevant division is between the quantifier and its scope: ∀x[P(x) → D(x)]; everyone is such that if he is a politician then he is deceitful. Here too, the quantifier combines with a complex predicate, albeit a conditional rather than conjunctive predicate; ‘∀x[P(x) & D(x)]’ implies that everyone is a politician. As Frege defines the relevant symbols, ‘P(x) → D(x)’ is equivalent to ‘¬P(x) ∨ D(x)’, and ‘∀x’ is equivalent to ‘¬∃x¬’. So ‘∀x[P(x) → D(x)]’ is equivalent to ‘¬∃x¬[¬P(x) ∨ D(x)]’. And given de Morgan's Laws (concering the relations between negation, disjunction, and conjunction) the following biconditional is sure to be true: ¬∃x¬[¬P(x) ∨ D(x)] iff ¬∃x[P(x) & ¬D(x)]. Hence, ∀x[P(x) → D(x)] iff ¬∃x[P(x) & ¬D(x)]. This captures the idea that every politician is deceitful iff no individual is both a politician and not deceitful.

This suggests that grammar is misleading in several respects. First, grammar leads us to think that ‘some politician’ indicates a constituent of the proposition that some politician is deceitful. Second, grammar masks a difference between existential and universally quantified propositions: the main predicates are related conjunctively in the former, and conditionally in the latter. Moreover, Frege offers an attractive account of propositions involving relations and multiple quantifiers; and with respect to such propositions, there seems to be a big difference between logical structure and grammatical structure.

On Frege's view, just as a single quantifier can bind an unsaturated position associated with a function that takes a single argument, two quantifiers can bind two unsaturated positions associated with a function that takes a pair of arguments. The proposition that everyone trusts everyone, for example, has the following very noncategorical form: ∀xy[T(x, y)]. Assuming that ‘John’ and ‘Mary’ indicate arguments, it follows that John trusts everyone, and that everyone trusts Mary—∀y[T(j, y)] and ∀x[T(x, m)]. And it follows from all three propositions that John trusts Mary: T(j, m). The rules of inference for Frege's logic capture this central feature of the universal quantifier. A variable bound by a universal quantifier can be replaced with a name for some individual in the domain. Correlatively, a name can be replaced with a variable bound by an existential quantifier. Schematically: ∀x(…x…), therefore …n…; and …n…, therefore ∃x(…x…). Given that John trusts Mary, it follows that someone trusts Mary, and that John trusts someone. Frege could capture this, formally, as follows: T(j, m); so ∃x[T(x, m)], and ∃x[T(j, x)]. And it follows from all three propositions that someone trusts someone: ∃xy[T(x, y)]. A single quantifier can bind multiple argument positions, as in ‘∃x[T(x, x)]’; but this means that someone trusts herself.

Mixed quantification introduces an interesting wrinkle. The propositions indicated by ‘∃xy[T(x,y)]’ and ‘∀yx[T(x,y)]’ differ. We can paraphrase the first as ‘there is someone who trusts everyone’ and the second as ‘everyone is trusted by someone or other’; the second follows from the first, but not vice versa. This suggests that ‘someone trusts everyone’ is ambiguous: this one string of English words can be used to indicate two different propositions. This in turn raises difficult questions about what natural language expressions are, and how they can be used to indicate propositions; see section 8. But for Frege, the important point concerned the distinction between the propositions (Gedanken). Similar remarks apply to ‘∀xy[T(x, y)]’ and ‘∃yx[T(x, y)]’.

A related phenomenon is exhibited by ‘John danced if Mary sang and Chris slept’. Is the indicated proposition of the form ‘(A if B) and C’ or ‘A if (B and C)’? Indeed, it seems that the relation between word-strings and propositions expressed is often one-to-many. Is someone who says ‘The artist drew a club’ talking about a sketch or a card game? One can use ‘is’ to express identity, as in ‘Hesperus is the planet Venus’; but in ‘Hesperus is bright’, ‘is’ indicates predication. In ‘Hesperus is a planet’, ‘a’ seems to be logically inert; yet in ‘John saw a planet’, ‘a’ seems to indicate existential quantification: ∃x[P(x) & S(j,x)]. (One can render ‘Hesperus is a planet’ as ‘∃x[P(x) & h = x]’. But this treats ‘is a planet’ as importantly different than ‘is bright’; and this raises other difficulties.)

According to Frege, such ambiguities provide further evidence that natural language is not suited to the task of representing propositions and inferential relations perspicuously. And he wanted a language that was suited for this task. (Leibniz and others had envisioned a ‘Characteristica Universalis’, but without detailed proposals for how to proceed beyond syllogistic logic in creating one.) This is not to deny that natural language is well suited for other purposes, like efficient human communication. And Frege held that we often do use natural language to indicate propositions. But he suggested that natural language is like the eye, whereas a good formal language is like a microscope that reveals structure not otherwise observable. On this view, the logical form of a proposition is made manifest by the structure of a sentence in an ideal formal language—what Frege called a Begriffsschrift (concept-script); where the sentences of such a language exhibit function-argument structures that differ in kind from the grammatical structures exhibited by the sentences we use in ordinary communication.

The real power of Frege's strategy for representing propositional structure is most evident in his discussion of the Dedekind-Peano axioms for arithemetic—and in particular, how the proposition that every number has a successor is logically related to more basic truths of arithmetic; see the entry on Frege's logic, theorem and foundations for arithmetic. But without getting into these details, one can get a sense of Frege's improvement on previous logic by considering (15–16) and Fregean analyses of the corresponding propositions

(15) Every patient respects some doctor
x{P(x) → ∃y[D(y) & R(x,y)]}
(16) Every old patient respects some doctor
x{[O(x) & P(x)] → ∃y[D(y) & R(x,y)]}

Suppose that every individualx has the following conditional property: if hex is a patient, then some individual is such that shey is both a doctor and respected by himx. Then it follows—intuitively and given the rules of Frege's logic—that every individualx has the following conditional property: if hex is both old and a patient, then some individualy is such that shey is both a doctor and respected by himx. So the proposition indicated with (16) follows from the one indicated with (15). More interestingly, we can also account for why the proposition indicated with (13) follows from the one indicated with (14).

(13) No lawyer who saw every patient respects some doctor
¬∃x{L(x) & ∀y[P(y) → S(x,y)] & ∃z[D(z) & R(x,z)]}
(14) No lawyer who saw every old patient respects some doctor
¬∃x{L(x) & ∀y{[O(y) & P(y)] → S(x,y)} & ∃z[D(z) & R(x,z)]}

For suppose it is false that some individualx has the following conjunctive property: hex is a lawyer; and hex saw every old patient (i.e., every individualy is such that if shey is both old and a patient, then shey was seen by himx); and hex respects some doctor (i.e., some individualz is such that shez is both a doctor and respected by himx). Then intuitively and given the rules of Frege's logic, it is false that some individualx has the following conjunctive property: hex is a lawyer; and hex saw every patient; and hex respects some doctor.

This explains why the direction of valid inference is from the more restrictive ‘old patient’ in (14) to the less restrictive ‘patient’ in (13), despite the fact that ‘every (old) patient’ is governed by dictum de nullo in simpler cases. The contribution of ‘no’, reflected with the wide scope negation, combines with the contribution of ‘every’ to create the appearance of an inference governed by dictum de omni. In general, Frege's logic handles a wide range of inferences that had puzzled medieval logicians. But the Fregean logical forms seem to differ dramatically from the grammatical forms of sentences like (13–16). Frege concluded that we need a Begriffsschrift, distinct from the languages we naturally speak, in order to depict (and help us discern) the structures of the propositions we express by using natural languages.

Frege also made a different kind of contribution, which would prove important, to the study of propositions. Prior to 1892, he spoke as though propositional constituents were the relevant functions and (ordered n-tuples of) entities that such functions map to truth-values. But he refined this view in light of his distinction between Sinn and Bedeutung (see the entry on Gottlob Frege). The Sinn of an expression was said to be a “way of presenting” the corresponding Bedeutung, which might be an entity, a truth-value, or a function from (ordered n-tuples of) entities to truth-values. The basic idea is that two names, like ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’, can present the same Bedeutung in different ways; in which case, the Sinn of the first name differs from the Sinn of the second. Given this distinction, we can think of ‘Hesperus’ as an expression that presents the evening star (a.k.a. Venus) as such, while ‘Phosphorus’ presents the morning star (also a.k.a. Venus) in a different way. Likewise, we can think of ‘is bright’ as an expression that presents a certain function in a certain way, and ‘Hesperus is bright’ as a sentence that presents its truth-value in a certain way—i.e., as the value of the function in question given the argument in question (T if Hesperus is bright and F otherwise). From this perspective, propositions are sentential ways of presenting truth-values, and proposition-parts are subsentential ways of presenting functions and arguments. Frege could thus distinguish the proposition that Hesperus is bright from the proposition that Phosphorus is bright, even though the two propositions are alike with regard to the relevant function and argument. Likewise, he could distinguish the trivial proposition Hesperus is Hesperus from the (apparently nontrivial) proposition Hesperus is Phosphorus. This is an attractive view. For intuitively, ancient astronomers were correct not to regard the inference Hesperus is Hesperus, so Hesperus is Phosphorus as an instance of the following valid schema: A, so A. But this raised questions about what the Sinn of an expression really is, what “presentation” could amount to, and what to say about a name with no Bedeutung.

5. Descriptions and Analysis

Frege did not distinguish (or at least did not emphasize any distinction between) names like ‘John’ and descriptions like ‘the boy’ or ‘the tall boy from Canada’. Initially, both kinds of expression seem to indicate arguments, as opposed to functions. So one might think that the logical form of ‘The boy sang’ is simply ‘Sang(b)’, where ‘b’ is a an unstructured symbol that stands for the boy in question (and presents him in a certain way). But this makes the elements of a description logically irrelevant. And this seems wrong. If the tall boy from Canada sang, then some boy from Canada sang. Moreover, ‘the’ implies uniqueness in a way that ‘some’ does not. (Of course, one can say ‘The boy sang’ without denying that universe contains more than one boy. But likewise, in ordinary conversation, one can say ‘Everything is in the trunk’ without denying that the universe contains some things not in the trunk. And intuitively, a speaker who uses ‘the F’ does imply that the predicate is satisfied by exactly one contextually relevant thing.)

Russell held that these implications reflect the logical form of a proposition indicated (in a given context) with a description. On his view, ‘The boy sang’ has the following logical form: ∃x{Boy(x) & ∀y[Boy(y) → y = x] & Sang(x)}; some individualx is such that hex is a boy, and every (relevant) individualy is such that if hey is a boy, then hey is identical with himx, and hex sang. The awkward middle conjunct was just Russell's way of expressing uniqueness with Fregean tools; see section 7. But rewriting the middle conjunct would not affect Russell's technical point, which is that ‘the boy’ does not correspond to any constituent of the formalism. This reflects Russell's main claim: while a speaker may refer to a certain boy in saying ‘The boy sang’, that boy is in no sense a constituent of the proposition indicated. According to Russell, the proposition has the form of an existential quantification with a bound variable. It does not have the form of a function saturated by (an argument that is) the boy referred to. The proposition is general rather than singular. In this respect, ‘the boy’ is like ‘some boy’ and ‘every boy’; though on Russell's view, not even ‘the’ indicates a constituent of the proposition expressed. (See the entry on Betrand Russell.)

This extended Frege's idea that natural language misleads us about the structure of the propositions we assert. Russell went on to apply this hypothesis to what became a famous puzzle. Even though France is currently kingless, ‘The present king of France is bald’ can be used to indicate a proposition. The sentence is not meaningless; it has implications. So if the proposition consists of the function indicated with ‘Bald( )’ and an argument indicated with ‘The present king of France’, there must be an argument so indicated. But appeal to nonexistent kings is, to say the least, dubious. Russell concluded that ‘The present king of France is bald’ indicates a quantificational proposition: ∃x{K(x) & ∀y[K(y) → y = x] & B(x)}; where K(x) = T iff x is a present king of France, and B(x) = T iff x is bald. (For present purposes, set aside worries about the vagueness of ‘bald’.) And as Russell noted, the following contrary reasoning is spurious: every proposition is true or false; so the present king of France is bald or not; so there is a king of France, and he is either bald or not. For let P be the proposition that the king of France is bald. Russell held that P is indeed true or false. On his view, it is false. Given that ¬∃x[K(x)], it follows that ¬∃x{K(x) & ∀y[K(y) → y = x] & B(x)}. But it does not follow that there is a present king of France who is either bald or not. Given that ¬∃x[K(x)], it hardly follows that ∃x{K(x) & [B(x) v ¬B(x)]}. So we must not confuse the negation of P with the following false proposition: ∃x{K(x) & ∀y[K(y) → y = x] & ¬B(x)}. The ambiguity of natural language may foster such confusion, given examples like ‘The present king of France is bald or not’. But according to Russell, puzzles about “nonexistence” can be resolved without special metaphysical theses, given the right views about logical form and natural language.

This invited the thought that other philosophical puzzles might dissolve if we properly understood the logical forms of our claims. Wittgenstein argued, in his influential Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, that: (i) the very possibility of meaningful sentences, which can be true or false depending on how the world is, requires propositions with structures of the sort Frege and Russell were getting at; (ii) all propositions are logical compounds of—and thus analyzable into—atomic propositions that are inferentially independent of one another; though (iii) even simple natural language sentences may indicate very complex propositions; and (iv) the right analyses would, given a little reflection, reveal all philosophical puzzles as confusions about how language is related to the world. Russell never endorsed (iv). And Wittgenstein later noted that claims like ‘This is red’ and ‘This is yellow’ presented difficulties for his earlier view: if the indicated propositions are unanalyzable, and thus logically independent, each should be compatible with the other; but at least so far, no one has provided a plausible analysis that accounts for the apparent impeccabilty of ‘This is red, so this is not yellow’. (This raises questions about whether all inferential security is due to logical form.) But for reasons related to epistemological puzzles, Russell did say that: (a) we are directly acquainted with the constituents of those propositions into which every proposition (that we can grasp) can be analyzed; (b) at least typically, we are not directly acquainted with the mind-independent bearers of proper names; and so (c) the things we typically refer to with names are not constituents of basic propositions.

This led Russell to say that natural language names are disguised descriptions. On this view, ‘Hesperus’ is semantically associated with a complex predicate—say, for illustration, a predicate of the form ‘E(x) & S(x)’. In which case, ‘Hesperus is bright’ indicates a proposition of the form ‘∃x{[E(x) & S(x)] & ∀y{[E(y) & S(y)] → y = x]} & B(x)}’. It also follows that Hesperus exists iff ∃x[E(x) & S(x)]; and this would be challenged by Kripke (1980) (see the entries on rigid-designators and names). But by analyzing names as descriptions—quantificational expressions, as opposed to logical constants (like ‘b’) that indicate individuals—Russell offered an attractive account of why the proposition that Hesperus is bright differs from the proposition that Phosphorus is bright. Instead of saying that propositional constituents are Fregean senses, Russell could say that ‘Phosphorus is bright’ indicates a proposition of the form ‘∃x{[M(x) & S(x)] & ∀y{[M(y) & S(y)] → y = x]} & B(x)’; where ‘E(x)’ and ‘M(x)’ indicate different functions, specified (respectively) in terms of evenings and mornings. This leaves room for the discovery that the complex predicates ‘E(x) & S(x)’ and ‘M(x) & S(x)’ both indicate functions that map Venus and nothing else to the truth-value T. The hypothesis was that the propositions indicated with ‘Hesperus is bright’ and ‘Phosphorus is bright’ have different (fundamental) constituents, even though Hesperus is Phosphorus, but not because propositional constituents are “ways of presenting” Bedeutungen. Similarly, the idea was that the propositions indicated with ‘Hesperus is Hesperus’ and ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ differ, because only the latter has predicational/unsaturated constituents corresponding to ‘Phosphorus’. Positing unexpected logical forms seemed to have explanatory payoffs.

Questions about names and descriptions are also related to psychological reports, like ‘Mary thinks Venus is bright’, which present puzzles of their own. Such reports seem to indicate propositions that are neither atomic nor logical compounds of simpler propositions. For as Frege noted, replacing one name with another name for the same object can apprarently affect the truth of a psychological report (see the entry on propositional attitude reports). If Mary fails to know that Hesperus is Venus, she might think Venus is a planet without thinking Hesperus is a planet; though cf. Soames (1987, 1995, 2002), and see the entries on singular propositions, and structured propositions. Any function that has the value T given Venus as argument has the value T given Hesperus as argument. So Frege, Russell, and Wittgenstein all held—in varying ways—that psychological reports are also misleading with respect to the logical forms of the indicated propositions.

6. Regimentation and Communicative Slack

Within the analytic tradition inspired by these philosophers, it became a commonplace that logical form and grammatical form typically diverge, often in dramatic ways. This invited attempts to provide analyses of propositions, and accounts of natural language, with the aim of saying how relatively simple sentences (with subject-predicate structures) could be used to indicate propositions (with function-argument structures).

The logical positivists explored, with great precision and ingenuity, the idea that the meaning of a sentence is a procedure for determining the truth or falsity of that sentence. From this perspective, the studies of linguistic meaning and propositional structure still dovetail, even if natural language employs “conventions” that make it possible to indicate complex propositions with grammatically simple sentences; see the entry on analysis. But to cut short a long and interesting story, there was little success in formulating “semantic rules” that were plausible both as (i) descriptions of how ordinary speakers understand sentences of natural language, and (ii) analyses that revealed logical structure of the sort envisioned. (And until Montague [1970], discussed briefly in the next section, there was no real progress in showing how to systematically associate quantificational constructions of natural language with Fregean logical forms.)

Rudolf Carnap, one of the leading positivists, responded to difficulties facing his earlier views by developing a sophisticated position according to which philosophers could—and should—articulate alternative sets of conventions for associating sentences of a language with propositions. Within each such language, the conventions would determine what follows from what. But one would have to decide, on broadly pragmatic grounds, which interpreted language was best for certain purposes (like conducting scientific inquiry). On this view, questions about “the” logical form of an ordinary sentence are in part questions about which conventions one should adopt. The idea was that “internal” to any logically perspicuous linguistic scheme, there would be an answer to the question of how two sentences are inferentially related; but “external” questions, about which conventions we should adopt, would not be settled by descriptive facts about how we understand languages that we already use.

This was, in many ways, an attractive development of Frege's vision. But it also raised a skeptical worry: perhaps the structural mismatches between sentences of a natural language and sentences of a Begriffsschrift are so severe that one cannot formulate general rules for associating the sentences we ordinarily use with propositions. Later theorists would combine this view with the idea that propositions are sentences of a mental language that is relevantly like a Fregean Begriffsschrift, and relevantly unlike the spoken languages humans use to communicate; see Fodor (1975, 1978). But given the rise of behaviorism, both in philosophy and psychology, this variant on a medieval idea was initially ignored or ridiculed. (And it does face difficulties; see section 8.)

Willard Van Orman Quine combined behaviorist psychology with a normative conception of logical form similar to Carnap's. The result was an influential view according to which: there is no fact of the matter about which proposition a speaker/thinker indicates with a sentence of natural language, because talk of propositions is (at best) a way of talking about how we should regiment our verbal behavior for certain purposes—and in particular, for purposes of scientific inquiry; claims about logical form are in this sense evaluative; and such claims are underdetermined by the totality of facts concerning speakers' dispositions to use language. From this perspective, mismatches between logical and grammatical form are to be expected, and we should not conclude that ordinary speakers have mental representations that are isomorphic with sentences of a Fregean Begriffsschrift.

According to Quine, speakers' behavioral dispositions constrain what can be plausibly said about how to best regiment their language. He also allowed for some general constraints on interpretability that an idealized “field linguist” might impose in coming up with a regimented interpretation scheme. (Donald Davidson developed a similar line of thought in less behavioristic terms, speaking in terms of constraints on a “radical interpreter,” who would favor “charitable” construals of alien speech.) But unsurprisingly, this left ample room for “slack” with respect to which logical forms should be associated with a given sentential utterance.

Quine also held that decisions about how to make such associations should be made holistically. As he sometimes put it, the “unit of translation” is an entire language, not a particular sentence. On this view, one can translate a sentence S of natural language NL with a structurally mismatching sentence µ of a formal language FL, even if it seems (locally) implausible that S is used to indicate the proposition associated with µ, so long as the following condition is met: the association between S and µ is part of a general account of NL and FL that figures in an overall theory—which includes an account of language, logic, and the language-independent world—that is among the best overall theories available. This holistic conception of how to evaluate proposed regimentations of natural language was part and parcel of Quine's criticism of the early positivists' analytic-synthetic distinction, and Quine's more radical suggestion that there is no such distinction.

The suggestion was that even apparently tautologous sentences, like ‘Bachelors are unmarried’ and ‘Caesar died if Brutus killed him’, have empirical content. These may be among the last sentences we would dissent from, faced with recalcitrant experience; we may prefer to say that Caesar didn't really die, or that Brutus didn't really kill him, if the next best alternative is to deny the conditional claim. But for Quine, every meaningful claim is a claim that could turn out to be false—and so a claim we must be prepared, at least in principle, to reject. Correlatively, no sentences are known to be true simply by knowing what they mean (and knowing a priori that sentences with such meanings must be true).

For present purposes, we can abstract away from the details of debates about whether Quine's overall view was plausible. Here, what matters most is that claims about logical form were said to be (at least partly) claims about the kind of regimented language we should use, not claims about the propositions actually indicated with sentences of natural language. And one aspect of Quine's thought about the kind of regimented language we should use turned out to be especially important for subsequent discussions of logical form. For even among those who rejected the behavioristic assumptions that animated Quine's conception of language, it was often held that logical forms are expressions of first-order predicate calculus.

Frege's Begriffsschrift, recall, was designed to capture the Dedekind-Peano axioms for arithmetic, including the axiom of induction; see the entry on Frege's logic, theorem and foundation for arithmetic. This required quantification into positions occupiable by predicates, as well as positions occupiable by names. Using modern notation, Frege allowed for formulae like ‘(Fa & Fb) → ∃X(Xa & Xb)’ and ‘∀xy[x = y ↔ ∀X(XxXy)]’. And he took second-order quantification to be quantification over functions. This is to say, for example, that ‘∃X(Xa & Xb)’ is true iff: there is a function, X, that maps both the individual a and the individual b onto the truth-value T. Frege also took it to be a truth of logic that for any predicate P, there is a function such that for each individual x, that function maps x to T iff x satisfies P. (In which case, for each predicate, there is the set of all and only the things that satisfy the predicate.) The axioms for Frege's logic thus generated Russell's paradox, given predicates like ‘is not a member of itself’. This invited attempts to weaken the axioms, while preserving second-order quantification. But for various reasons, Quine and others advocated a restriction to the first-order fragment of Frege's logic, disallowing quantification into positions occupied by predicates. (Godel had proved the completeness of first-order predicate calculus, thus providing a purely formal criterion for what followed from what in that language. Quine also held that second-order quantification illicitly treated predicates as names for sets, thereby spoiling Frege's conception of propositions as unified by virtue of having unsaturated predicational constituents that are satisfied by things denoted by names.) On Quine's view, we should replace ‘(Fa & Fb) → ∃X(Xa & Xb)’ with explicit first-order quantification over sets, as in ‘(Fa & Fb) → ∃s(as & bs)’; where ‘∈’ stands for ‘is an element of’, and this second conditional is not a logical truth, but rather a hypothesis (to be evaluated holistically) concerning sets.

The preference for first-order regimentations has come to seem unwarranted, or at least highly tendentious; see Boolos (1998). But it fueled the idea that logical form can diverge wildly from grammatical form. For as students quickly learn, first-order regimentations of natural sentences often turn out to be highly artificial. (And in some cases, such regimentations seem to be unavailable.) This was, however, taken to show that natural languages are far from ideal for purposes of indicating logical structure.

A different strand of thought in analytic philosophy—pressed by Wittgenstein in Philosophical Investigations and developed by others, including Strawson and Austin—also suggested that a single sentence could be used (on different occasions) to express different kinds of propositions. Strawson (1950) argued that pace Russell, a speaker could use an instance of ‘The F is G’ to express a singular proposition about a specific individual: namely, the F in the context at hand. According to Strawson, sentences themselves do not have truth conditions, since sentences (as opposed to speakers) do not indicate propositions; and speakers can use ‘The boy is tall’ to express a proposition with the contextually relevant boy as a constituent. Donnellan (1966) went on to argue that a speaker could even use an instance of ‘The F is G’ to express a singular proposition about an individual that isn't an F; see the entry on reference. Such considerations, which have received a great deal of attention in recent discussions of context dependence, suggested that relations between natural language sentences and propositions are (at best) very complex and mediated by speakers' intentions. All of which made it seem that such relations are far more tenuous than the pre-Fregean tradition suggested. This bolstered the Quine/Carnap idea that questions about the structure of premises and conclusions are really questions about how we should talk (when trying to describe the world), much as logic itself seems to be more concerned with how we should infer than with how we do infer. From this perspective, the connections between logic and grammar seemed rather shallow.

7. Notation and Restricted Quantification

On the other hand, more recent work on quantifiers suggests that the divergence had been exaggerated, in part because of how Frege's idea of variable-binding was originally implemented. Consider again the proposition that some boy sang, and the proposed logical division into the quantifier and the rest: ∃x[Boy(x) & Sang(x)]; something is both a boy and an individual that sang. This is one way to regiment the English sentence. But one can also offer a “logical paraphrase” that more closely parallels the grammatical division between ‘some boy’ and ‘sang’: for some individual x such that x is a boy, x sang. One can formalize this by using restricted quantifiers, which incorporate a restriction on the domain over which the variable in question ranges. For example, ‘∃x:Boy(x)’ is an existential quantifier that binds a variable ranging over boys in the relevant domain. So ‘∃x:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’ means that some boy sang. Since ‘∃x:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’ and ‘∃x[Boy(x) & Sang(x)]’ are logically equivalent, logic provides no reason for preferring the latter. And choosing the latter does not show that propositional structure differs from grammatical structure.

Universal quantifiers can be restricted, as in ‘∀x:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’, interpreted as follows: for every individual x such that Boy(x), x sang; that is, every boy sang. Restrictors can also be logically complex, as in ‘Some tall boy sang’ or ‘Some boy who respects Mary sang’, rendered as ‘∃x:Tall(x) & Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’ and ‘∃x:Boy(x) & Respects(x, m)[Sang(x)]’. Given these representations of logical form, it seems that the inferential difference between ‘some boy sang’ and ‘every boy sang’ lies entirely with the propositional contributions of ‘some’ and ‘every’ after all—and not in part with the contribution of connectives like ‘&’ and ‘→’.

Words like ‘someone’, and the grammatical requirement that ‘every’ be followed by a noun (or noun phrase), reflect the fact that natural language employs restricted quantifiers. Phrases like ‘every boy’ are composed of a determiner and a noun. Correspondingly, one can think of determiners as expressions that can combine with an ordered pair of predicates to form a sentence, much as one can think of transitive verbs as expressions that can combine with an ordered pair of names to form a sentence. And this grammatical analogy, between determiners and transitive verbs, has a semantic correlate.

Since ‘x’ and ‘y’ are variables ranging over individuals, one can say that the function indicated by the transitive verb ‘loves’ yields the value T given the ordered pair ⟨x,y⟩ as argument if and only if x loves y. In this notational scheme, ‘y’ corresponds to the direct object (or internal argument), which combines with the verb to form a phrase like ‘loves Chris’; ‘x’ corresponds to the grammatical subject (or external argument) of the verb. If we think about ‘every boy sang’ analogously, ‘boy’ is the internal argument of ‘every’, since ‘every boy’ is a phrase; by contrast, ‘boy’ and ‘sang’ do not form a phrase in ‘every boy sang’. So let us introduce ‘X’ and ‘Y’ as second-order variables ranging over functions, from individuals to truth values, stipulating that the extension of such a function is the set of things that the function maps onto the truth value T. Then one can say that the function indicated by ‘every’ yields the value T given the ordered pair ⟨X, Y⟩ as argument iff the extension of X includes the extension of Y. Similarly, one can say that the function indicated by ‘some’ maps the ordered pair ⟨X, Y⟩ onto T iff the extension of X intersects with the extension of Y.

Just as we can think about ‘loves’ as a predicate satisfied by ordered pairs ⟨x, y⟩ such that x loves y, so we can think about ‘every’ as a predicate satisfied by ordered pairs ⟨X, Y⟩ such that the extension of X includes the extension of Y. (This is compatible with thinking about ‘every boy’ as a restricted quantifier that combines with a predicate to form a sentence that is true iff every boy satisfies that predicate.) One virtue of this notation scheme is that it lets us represent relations between predicates that cannot be captured with ‘∀’, ‘∃’, and the sentential connectives; see Rescher (1962), Wiggins (1980). For example, most boys sang iff the boys who sang outnumber the boys who did not sing. So we can say that ‘most’ indicates a function that maps ⟨X, Y⟩ to T iff the number of things that Y and X both map to T exceeds the number of things that Y but not X maps to T.

Using restricted quantifiers, and thinking about determiners as devices for indicating relations between functions, also suggests an alternative to Russell's treatment of ‘the’. The formula ‘∃x{Boy(x) & ∀y[Boy(y) → x = y] & Sang(x)}’ can be rewritten as ‘∃x:Boy(x)[Sang(x)] & |Boy| = 1’, interpreted as follows: for some individual x such that x a boy, x sang, and exactly one (relevant) individual is a boy. On this view, ‘the boy’ still does not correspond to a constituent of the formalism; nor does ‘the’. But one can depart farther from Russell's notation, while emphasizing his idea that ‘the’ is relevantly like ‘some’ and ‘every’. For one can analyze ‘the boy sang’ as ‘!x:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’, specifying the propositional contribution of ‘!’—on a par with as ‘∃’ and ‘∀’—as follows:

!x:Y(x)[X(x)] = T iff the extensions of X and Y intersect & |Y| = 1. 

This way of encoding Russell's theory preserves his central claim. While there may be a boy one refers to in saying ‘the boy sang’, that boy is not a constituent of the quantificational proposition indicated with ‘!x:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’; see Neale (1990) for discussion. But far from showing that the logical form of ‘the boy sang’ diverges dramatically from its grammatical form, the restricted quantifier notation suggests that the logical form closely parallels the grammatical form—‘the boy’ and ‘the’ do correspond to constituents of '‘!x:Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’' —at least if (pace Quine) we allow for logical forms that represent quantificational propositions as claims to the effect that a certain relation holds between a pair of (perhaps complex) predicates.

It is worth noting, briefly, an implication of this point for the inference ‘the boy sang, so some boy sang’. If the logical form of ‘the boy sang’ is ‘∃x:Boy(x)[Sang(x)] & |Boy|=1’, then the inference is an instance of the schema ‘A & B, so A’. But if the logical form of ‘the boy sang’ is simply ‘!(x):Boy(x)[Sang(x)]’, the premise and conclusion have the same form, differing only by substitution of ‘!’ for ‘∃’. In which case, the impeccability of the inference depends on the specific contributions of ‘the/!’ and ‘some/∃’. Only when these contributions are “spelled out,” perhaps in terms of set-intersection, would the validity of the inference be manifest. So even if grammar and logic do not diverge in this case, one still might want to say that grammatical structure does not reveal all the logical relations. From this perspective, analysis of ‘the’ is still required. Hence, those skeptical of an analytic/synthetic distinction will say that it remains more a decision than a discovery to say that ‘Some boy sang’ follows from ‘The boy sang’. In general, and especially with regard to aspects of propositional form indicated with individual words, issues about logical form are connected with issues about the analytic-synthetic distinction.

8. Transformational Grammar

Still, even given restricted quantifiers (and acceptance of second-order logical forms), the subject/predicate structure of ‘Mary / trusts every doctor’ diverges from the corresponding formula


We can rewrite ‘Trusts(Mary,y)’ as ‘[Trusts(y)](Mary)’, to reflect the fact that ‘trusts’ combines with a direct object to form a phrase, which in turn combines with a subject. But this does not affect the main point: ‘every’ seems to be a grammatical constituent of the verb phrase ‘trusts every doctor’, but the main quantifier of the indicated proposition. In natural language, ‘trusts’ and ‘every doctor’ form a phrase; but with respect to logical form, ‘trusts’ evidently combines with ‘Mary’ and a variable to form a complex predicate that is in turn an external argument of the higher-order predicate ‘every’. Similar remarks apply to ‘Some boy trusts every doctor’ and ‘[∃x:Boy(x)][∀y:Doctor(y)]{Trusts(x, y)]’. So it seems that mismatches remain, in the very places that troubled medieval logicians—quantificational direct objects and other examples of complex predicates with quantificational constituents.

Montague (1970, 1974) showed that these mismatches do not preclude systematic association of natural language sentences with the corresponding propositional structures. Abstracting from the technical details, one can specify an algorithm that pairs each natural language sentence with one or more quantificational expressions like ‘every doctor’ with one or more Fregean logical forms. This was a significant advance. Together with subsequent developments, Montague's work showed that Frege's logic was compatible with the idea that quantificational constructions in natural language have a systematic semantics. Indeed, one could use Frege's formal apparatus to study such constructions. Montague still held that the syntax of natural language was misleading for purposes of (what he took to be) real semantics. On this view, the study of valid inference still suggests that natural language grammar disguises the structure of human thought. But this was becoming less clear.

In thinking about the relation of logic to grammar, one must not assume a naive conception of the latter. For example, the grammatical form of a sentence need not be determined by the linear order of its words. Using brackets to disambiguate, we can distinguish the sentence ‘Mary [saw [the [boy [with binoculars]]]]’—whose direct object is ‘the boy with binoculars’—from the homophonous sentence ‘Mary [[saw [the boy]] [with binoculars]]’, in which ‘saw the boy’ is modified by an adverbial phrase. The first implies that the boy had binoculars, while the second implies that Mary used binoculars to see the boy. This distinction may not be audibly marked. Nonetheless, there is a difference between modifying a noun (like ‘boy’) with a prepositional phrase and modifying a verb phrase (‘saw the boy’).

More generally, grammatical structure need not be obvious. Just as it may take work to discover the kind(s) of structure that propositions exhibit, so it may take work to discover the kind(s) of structure that sentences exhibit. And it turns out that the study of natural language suggests a rich conception of grammatical form that diverges from traditional views; see especially Chomsky (1957, 1965, 1981, 1986, 1995). So we need to ask how logical forms are related to actual grammatical forms, which linguists try to discover, since these may differ importantly from any apparent grammatical forms suggested by casual reflection on spoken language. It may be that appearances are misleading with respect to both grammatical and logical form, leaving room for the possibility that these notions of structure are no so different after all.

A leading idea of modern linguistics is that at least some grammatical structures are transformations of others. This is related to the idea that words (and phrases) often appear to be displaced from the positions canonically associated with certain grammatical relations. For example, the word ‘who’ in (17) seems to be somehow associated with the internal (direct object) argument position of the verb ‘saw’:

(17) Mary wondered who John saw

Correspondingly, (17) can be glossed as ‘Mary wondered which person is such that John saw that person’. This invites the hypothesis that (17) reflects a transformation of the “Deep Structure” (17D) into the “Surface Structure” (17S),

(17D) {Mary [wondered {John [saw who]}]}
(17S) {Mary [wondered [whoi {John [saw ( _ )i ]}]]}

with indices indicating a grammatical relation between the indexed positions. In (17D), the embedded clause has the same form as ‘John saw Bill’. But in (17S), ‘who’ has been displaced from the indexed argument position. Similar remarks apply to the question ‘Who did John see’ and other question-words like ‘why’, ‘what’, ‘when’, and ‘how’.

One might also explain the synonymy of (18) and (19) by positing a common deep structure, (18D):

(18) John seems to like Mary
(19) It seems John likes Mary 
(18D) [Seems{John [likes Mary]}]
(18S) {Johni [seems { ( _ )i [to like Mary]}]}

If every English sentence needs a grammatical subject, (18D) must be modified: either by displacing ‘John’, as in (18S); or by inserting a pleonastic subject, as in (19). Note that in (19), ‘It’ does not indicate an argument; compare ‘There’ in ‘There is something in the garden’. Appeal to displacement also lets one distinguish the superficially parallel sentences (20) and (21).

(20) John is easy to please
(21) John is eager to please

If (20) is true, John is easily pleased; or using a pleonastic subject, it is easy (for someone) to please John. But if (21) is true, John is eager that he please someone or other. This asymmetry is effaced by representations like ‘Easy-to-please(John)’ and ‘Eager-to-please(John)’. The contrast is made manifest, however, with (20S) and (21S);

(20S) {Johni [is easy { e [to please ( _ )i ]}]}
(21S) {Johni [is eager { ( _ )i [to please e ]}]}

where ‘e’ indicates an unpronounced argument position. It may be that in (21S), which does not mean that it is eager for John to please someone, ‘John’ is grammatically linked but not actually displaced from the coindexed position. But on any such conception of grammar, the “surface subject” of a sentence may be the object of a verb embedded within the main predicate, as in (20S). Of course, such hypotheses about grammatical structure require defense. But Chomsky and others have long argued that such hypotheses are needed to account for various facts concerning human linguistic capacities.

As an illustration of the kind of data that is relevant, note that (22–24) are perfectly fine expressions of English, while (25) is not.

(22) The boy who sang was happy
(23) Was the boy who sang happy
(24) The boy who was happy sang
(25) *Was the boy who happy sang

This suggests that the auxiliary verb ‘was’ can be displaced from some positions but not others. That is, while (22S) is a permissible transformation of (22D), (24S) is not a permissible transformation of (24D):

(22D) {[The [boy [who sang]]] [was happy]}
(22S) Wasi {[the [boy [who sang]]] [ ( _ )i happy]}
(24D) {[The [boy [who [was happy]]]] sang}
(24S) *Wasi {[the [boy [who [ ( _ )i happy]]]] sang}

The ill-formedness of (25) is striking, since one can sensibly ask whether or not the boy who was happy sang. One can also ask whether or not (26) is true. But (27) is not the yes/no question corresponding to (26).

(26) The boy who was lost kept crying
(27) Was the boy who lost kept crying

Rather, (27) is the yes/no question corresponding to ‘The boy who lost was kept crying’, which has an unexpected meaning. So we want some account of why (27) cannot have the interpretation corresponding to (26). But the “negative fact” concerning (27) is precisely what one would expect if ‘was’ cannot be displaced from its position in (26).

*Wasi {[the [boy [who [( _ )i lost]]]] [kept crying]}

By contrast, if we merely specify an algorithm that associates (27) with its actual meaning—or if we merely hypothesize that (27) is the English translation of a certain mental sentence—we have not yet explained why (27) cannot also be used to ask whether or not (26) is true.

Explanations of such facts appeal to nonobvious grammatical structure, and constraints on natural language transformations. (For example, no “fronting” an auxiliary verb from a relative clause; though of course, one then tries to find deeper explanations for such constraints.) More specifically, the idea was that a sentence has a deep structure (DS), which reflects semantically relevant relations between verbs and their arguments, and a surface structure (SS) that may include displaced (or pleonastic) elements; and in some cases, pronunciation might depend on still further transformations of SS, resulting in a distinct “phonological form” (PF). Linguists posited various constraints on these levels of grammatical structure, and the transformations that relate them. Though as the theory was elaborated and refined under empirical pressure, various facts that apparently called for explanation in these terms still went unexplained. This suggested another level of grammatical structure, perhaps obtained by a different kind of transformation on SS. The hypothesized level was called ‘LF’ (intimating ‘logical form’); and the hypothesized transformation—called quantifier raising because it targeted the kinds of expressions that indicate (restricted) quantifiers—mapped structures like (28S) onto structures like (28L).

(28S) {Pat [trusts [every doctor]]}
(28L) {[every doctor]i {Pat [ trusts ( _ )i ]}}

Clearly, (28L) does not reflect the pronounced word order in English. But the idea was that (PF) determines pronunciation, while LF was said to be the level at which the scope of a natural language quantifier is determined; see May (1985). If we think about ‘every’ as a kind of second-order transitive predicate, which can combine with two predictes like ‘doctor’ and ‘Pat trusts’ to form a complete sentence, we should expect that at some level of analysis, the sentence ‘Pat trusts every doctor’ has the structure indicated in (28L). And mapping (28L) to the logical form ‘[∀x:Doctor(x)]{Trusts(Pat, x)}’ is trivial. Likewise, one can hypothesize that (29S) may be mapped onto (29L) or (29L'),

(29S) {[some boy] [trusts [every doctor]]}
(29L) {[some boy]i {[every doctor]j {( _ )i [ trusts ( _ )j ]}}
(29L') {[every doctor]j {[some boy]i { ( _ )i [ trusts ( _ )j ]}}}

which are easily mapped onto ‘[∃x:Boy(x)][∀y:Doctor(y)]{Trusts(x, y)}’ and ‘[∀y:Doctor(y)][∃x:Boy(x)]{Trusts(x, y)}’. This assimilates quantifier scope ambiguity to the structural ambiguity of examples like ‘Mary saw the boy with binoculars’. More generally, many apparent examples of grammar/logic mismatches were rediagnosed as mismatches between different aspects of grammatical structure—between those aspects that determine pronunication, and those that determine interpretation. In one sense, this is fully in keeping with the idea that in natural language, “surface appearances” are often misleading with regard to propositional structure. But it also makes room for the idea that grammatical structure and logical structure converge, in ways that can be discovered through investigation, once we move beyond traditional subject-predicate conceptions of structure with regard to both logic and grammar.

There is independent evidence for “covert” transformations—displacement of expressions from their audible positions, as in (28L); see Huang (1995), Hornstein (1995). Consider, for example, the French translation of ‘Who did John see’: Jean a vu qui. If we assume that qui (‘who’) is displaced at  LF, then we can explain why the question-word is understood in both French and English like a quantifier binding a variable: which person x is such that John saw x? Similarly, example (30) from Chinese is transliterated as in (31).

(30) Zhangsan zhidao Lisi mai-te sheme
(31) Zhangsan know Lisi bought what

But (30) is ambiguous, between the interrogative (31a) and the complex declarative (31b).

(31a) Which thing is such that Zhangsan knows Lisi bought it
(31b) Zhangsan knows which thing (is such that) Lisi bought (it)

This suggests covert displacement of the quantificational question-word in Chinese; see Huang (1982, 1995). Chomsky (1981) also argued that the constraints on such displacement can help explain contrasts like the one illustrated with (32) and (33).

(32) Who said he has the best smile 
(33) Who did he say has the best smile

In (32), the pronoun ‘he’ can have a bound-variable reading: which person x is such that x said that x has the best smile. This suggests that the following grammatical structure is possible: Whoi {[(  )i said [hei has the best smile]]}. But (33) cannot be used to ask this question, suggesting that some linguistic constraint rules out the following structure:

*Whoi [did {[hei say [(  )i has the best smile]]].

And there cannot be constraints on transformations without transformations. So if English overtly displaces question-words that are covertly displaced in other languages, we should not be surprised if English covertly displaces other quantificational expressions like ‘every doctor’.

Likewise, (34) has the reading indicated in (34a) but not the reading indicated in (34b).

(34) It is false that Pat saw every lawyer
(34a) ¬∀x:Lawyer(x)[Saw(Pat, x)]
(34b) x:Lawyer(x)¬[Saw(Pat, x)]

This suggests that ‘every doctor’ gets displaced, but only so far. Similarly, (13) cannot mean that every patient is such that no lawyer who saw that patient respects some doctor.

(13) No lawyer who saw every patient respects some doctor

As we have already seen, English seems to abhor “fronting” certain elements from within an embedded relative clause. This invites the hypothesis that quantifier raising is subject to a similar constraint, and hence, that there is quantifier-raising in English. Indeed, many linguists (following Chomsky [1995, 2000]) would now posit only two “levels” of grammatical structure, corresponding to PF and LF—the thought being that constraints on DS and SS can be eschewed in favor of a simpler theory that only posits constraints on how expressions can be combined in the course of constructing complex expressions that can be pronounced and interpreted. If this development of earlier theories proves correct, the only semantically relevant level of grammatical structure often reflects covert displacement of audible expressions. But in any case, there is a large body of work suggesting that many logical properties of quantifiers, names, and pronouns are reflected in properties of LF.

For example, if (35) is true, it follows that some doctor treated some doctor; whereas (36) does not have this consequence:

(35) Every boy saw the doctor who treated himself
(36) Every boy saw the doctor who treated him

The truth conditions of (35–36) seem to be as indicated in (35a) and (36a).

(35a) [∀x:Boy(x)][!y:Doctor(y) & Treated(y,y)]{Saw(x, y)]}
(36a) [∀x:boy(x)][!y:Doctor(y) & Treated(y,x)]{Saw(x, y)}

This suggests that ‘himself’ is behaving like a variable bound by ‘the doctor’, while ‘every boy’ can bind ‘him’. And there are independent grammatical reasons for saying that ‘himself’ must be linked to ‘the doctor’, while ‘him’ must not be so linked. Note that in ‘Pat thinks Chris treated himself/him’, the antecedent of ‘himself’ must be the subject of ‘treated’, while the antecedent of ‘him’ must not be.

Linguists have also discovered grammatical correlates of dictum de nullo environments. For example, the word ‘ever’ can be used in sentences like (37–39). But there is something wrong with (40–42).

(37) No senator ever lied
(38) No senator who ever lied got away with it
(39) Every senator who ever lied got away with it
(40) *Every senator ever lied
(41) *Some senator ever lied
(42) *Some senator who ever lied got away with it

To a first approximation, certain expressions like ‘ever’ can appear only in phrases that licence inferences from more restrictive to less restrictive predicates. (Idiomatic alternatives to ‘any’—like ‘pay a plug nickel for’, roughly synonymous with ‘pay any money for’—exhibit this pattern: Nobody/*Somebody would pay a plug nickel for that horse.) Such discoveries, of which there have been many, confirm the Aristotelian and medieval suspicion that logical properties and grammatical properties are deeply related after all.

There is, to be sure, an important conceptual distinction between LF and the traditional notion of logical form: there is no guarantee that structural features of natural language sentences will mirror the logical features of propositions; cp. Stanley (2000), King (2007). But this leaves room for the empirical hypothesis that LF reflects at least a great deal of propositional structure; see Harman (1972), Higginbotham (1986), Segal (1989), Larson and Ludlow (1993), and the essay on structured propositions. And even if the LF of a sentence S underdetermines the logical form of the proposition a speaker expresses with S (on a given occasion of use), perhaps the LF provides a “scaffolding” that is somehow elaborated in particular contexts, with little or no mismatch between grammatical and propositional architecture. If some such view is correct, it might avoid certain (unpleasant) questions prompted by earlier Fregean views: how can a sentence indicate a proposition with a different structure; and if grammar is deeply misleading, why think that our intuitions concerning impeccability provide reliable evidence about which propositions follow from which? These are, however, issues that remain very much unsettled.

9. Semantic Structure and Events

If propositions are the “things” that really have logical form, and sentences of English are not themselves propositions, then sentences of English “have” logical forms only by association with propositions. But if the meaning of a sentence is an indicated proposition (or perhaps a function from contexts to propositions), then one might say that the logical form “of” a sentence is its semantic structure—i.e., the structure of that sentence's meaning. Alternatively, one might suspect that in the end, talk of propositions is just convenient shorthand for talking about the semantic properties of sentences: perhaps sentences of a Begriffsschrift, or sentences of mentalese, or sentences of natural languages (abstracting away from their logically/semantically irrelevant properties). And in any case, the notion of logical form has played a significant role in recent work on theories of meaning. So an introductory discussion of the topic would not be complete without at least a hint of why that work is relevant.

Prima facie, ‘every tall sailor respects some doctor’ and ‘some short boy likes every politician’ exhibit common modes of linguistic combination. And a natural hypothesis is that the meaning of each sentence is fixed by these modes of combination, given the relevant word meanings. It may be hard to see how this hypothesis could be true if there are widespread mismatches between logical and grammatical form. But it is also hard to see how the hypothesis could be false, given that children (with finite cognitive resources) typically acquire the capacity to understand the endlessly many expressions of the languages spoken around them. A great deal of recent work has focussed on these issues, concering the connections between logical form and the senses in which natural languages are (and are not) semantically compositional.

It was implicit in Frege that each of the endlessly many sentences of an ideal language would have a compositionally determined truth-condition. But Frege did not specify an algorithm that would associate each sentence of his Begriffsschrift with its truth-condition. Tarski (1933) showed how to do this for the first-order predicate calculus, focussing on the interesting cases of multiple quantification like ‘∀xy(NxSyx)’, ‘∀xy{Nx → [Syx & ∀z(PzxPzy)]}’, etc. This made it possible to capture, with precision, the idea that an inference is valid in the predicate calculus iff: every interpretation that makes the premises true also makes the conclusion true, holding fixed the interpretations of logical elements like ‘if’ and ‘every’. Davidson (1967a) conjectured that one could do for English what Tarski did for the predicate calculus; and Montague, similarly inspired by Tarski, showed how one could start dealing with predicates that have quantificational constituents. Still, many apparent objections to the conjecture remained. As noted in section four, sentences like ‘Pat thinks that Hesperus is Phosphorus’ present difficulties; though Davidson (1968) offered an influential suggestion. Davidson's (1967b) proposal concerning examples like (43–46) also proved enormously fruitful.

(43) Juliet kissed Romeo quickly at midnight.
(44) Juliet kissed Romeo quickly.
(45) Juliet kissed Romeo at midnight.
(46) Juliet kissed Romeo.

If (43) is true, so are (44–46); and if (44) or (45) is true, so is (46). The inferences seem impeccable. But the function-argument structures are not obvious. If we represent ‘kissed quickly at midnight’ as a unstructured predicate that takes two arguments, like ‘kissed’ or ‘kicked’, we will represent the inference from (43) to (46) as having the form: K*(x, y); so K(x, y). But this form is exemplified by the bad inference ‘Juliet kicked Romeo; so Juliet kissed Romeo’. Put another way, if ‘kissed quickly at midnight’ is a logically unstructured binary predicate, then the following claim is a nonlogical assumption: if Juliet kissed Romeo in a certain manner at a certain time, then Juliet kissed Romeo. But this seems like a tautology, not an assumption that introduces any epistemic risk. Davidson concluded that the surface appearances of sentences like (43–46) mask semantic structure. In particular, he proposed that such sentences are understood in terms of quantification over events.

According to Davdison, the meaning of (46) is manifested in the paraphrase ‘There was a kissing of Romeo by Juliet’. One can formalize this proposal in various ways: ∃e[Kissing(e) & Of(e, Romeo) & By(e, Juliet)]; or ∃e[Kiss(e, Juliet, Romeo)], with the verb ‘kiss’ indicating a function that takes three arguments; or as in (46a),

(46a) e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo)]

with Juliet and Romeo being explicitly represented as players of certain roles in an event. But whatever the notation, adverbs like ‘quickly’ and ‘at midnight’ are said to indicate further features of the event described, as shown in (43a-45a).

(43a) e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo) & Quick(e) & At-midnight(e)]
(44a) e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo) & Quick(e)]
(45a) e[Agent(e, Juliet) & Kissing(e) & Patient(e, Romeo) & At-midnight(e)]

If this is correct, then the inference from (43) to (46) is an instance of the following valid form: ∃e[A(e, x) & K(e) & P(e, y) & Q(e) & M(e)]; hence, ∃e[A(e, x) & K(e) & P(e, y)]. The other impeccable inferences involving (43–46) can likewise be viewed as instances of conjunction reduction. If the grammatical form of (46) is simply ‘{Juliet [kissed Romeo]}’, then the mapping from grammatical to logical form is not transparent; and natural language is misleading, in that no word corresponds to the event quantifier. But this does not posit a significant structural mismatch between grammatical and logical form. On the contrary, each word in (46) corresponds to a conjunct in (46a). This suggests a strategy for thinking about how the meaning of a sentence like (46) might be composed from the meanings of the constituent words. A growing body of literature, in philosophy and linguistics, suggests that Davidson's proposal captures an important feature of natural language semantics, and that “event analyses” provide a useful framework for future discussions of logical form. At a minimum, Davidson showed how we need not be limited by a particular view about the kinds of propositions indicated with sentences. One can treat (46) as a kind of quantificational claim, whether or not one follows Russell in treating names as disguised descriptions.

Let's return now to the idea that each complex expression of natural language has semantic properties—leaving it open just what these are—determined by (i) the semantic properties of its constituents, and (ii) the ways in which these constituents are grammatically arranged. If this is correct, then following Davidson, one might say that the logical form of a complex expressions (in a natural language) just is the structure that must be imposed on the relevant words to determine the relevant meaning in a systematic way that also applies to other complex expressions of the language; see Lepore and Ludwig (2002). Perhaps the phenomenon of valid inference is, at least largely, a “by product” of semantic compositionality. If the principles governing the meanings of (43–46) have the consequence that (46) is true if (43) is true, one might try to argue that this is illustrative of the general case.

10. Further Questions

At this point, many issues become relevant to further discussions of logical form. Most obviously, there are specific questions concerning specific examples. Given just about any sentence of natural language, one can ask interesting questions (that remain unsettled) about its logical form. There are also very abstract questions about the relation of semantics to logic. Should we follow Davidson and Montague, among others, in characterizing theories of meaning for natural languages as theories of truth (that perhaps satisfy certain conditions on learnability)? Is an algorithm that correctly associates sentences with truth-conditions (relative to contexts) necessary and/or sufficient for being an adequate theory of meaning? What should we say about the paradoxes apparently engendered by sentences like ‘This sentence is false’? If we allow for second-order logical forms, how should we understand second-order quantification, given Russell's Paradox? Are claims about the “semantic structure” of a sentence fundamentally descriptive claims about speakers (or their communities, or their languages)? Or is there an important sense in which claims about semantic structure are normative claims about how we should use language? Are facts about the acquisition of language germane to hypotheses about logical form? And of course, the history of the subject reveals that the answers to the central questions are by no means obvious: what is logical structure, what is grammatical structure, and how are they related? Or put another way, what kinds of structures do propositions and sentences exhibit, and how do thinkers/speakers relate them?


Cited Works

  • Boolos, G., 1998, Logic, Logic, and Logic. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Carnap, R., 1950, “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology”, reprinted in Meaning and Necessity, second edition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1956.
  • Cartwright, R., 1962, “Propositions”, in R. J. Butler, Analytical Philosophy, 1st series, Oxford: Basil Blackwell 1962; reprinted with addenda in Richard Cartwright, Philosophical Essays, Cambridge: MIT Press 1987.
  • Chomsky, N., 1957, Syntactic Structures. The Hague: Mouton.
  • –––, 1965, Aspects of the Theory of Syntax. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • –––, 1981, Lectures on Government and Binding. Dordrecht: Foris.
  • –––, 1986, Knowledge of Language. New York: Praeger.
  • –––, 1995, The Minimalist Program. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Davidson, D., 1967a, “Truth and Meaning”, Synthese, 17: 304–23.
  • –––, 1967b, “The Logical Form of Action Sentences”, in N. Rescher (ed.) The Logic of Decision and Action. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press.
  • –––, 1968, “On Saying That”, Synthese, 19: 130–46.
  • –––, 1980, Essays on Actions and Events. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1984, Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Donnellan, K., 1966, “Reference and Definite Descriptions”, Philosophical Review, 75: 281–304.
  • Fodor, J., 1975, The Language of Thought. New York: Crowell.
  • Fodor, J., 1978, “Propositional Attitudes”, The Monist, 61: 501–23.
  • Harman, G., 1972, “Logical Form,” Foundations of Language 9: 38–65.
  • Higginbotham, J., 1986, “Linguistic Theory and Davidson's Program in Semantics”, in E. Lepore, ed., Truth and Interpretation, Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 29–48.
  • Hornstein, N., 1995, Logical Form: From GB to Minimalism. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Huang, J., 1995, “Logical Form”, in Webelhuth, G. (ed.), Government and Binding Theory and the Minimalist Program: Principles and Parameters in Syntactic Theory. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • King, J., 2009, The Nature and Structure of Content. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Larson, R. and Ludlow, P., 1993, “Interpreted Logical Forms,” Synthese, 95: 305–55.
  • Lepore, E. and Ludwig, K., 2002, “What is Logical Form?”, in Preyer and Peter 2002, pp. 54–90.
  • Ludlow, P., 2002, “LF and Natural Logic”, in Preyer and Peter 2002.
  • May, R., 1985, Logical Form: Its Structure and Derivation. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Montague, R., 1970, “English as a Formal Language”, reprinted in his collected esssays, Formal Philosophy. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1974.
  • Preyer, G. and G. Peter, G. (eds.), 2002, Logical Form and Language. Oxford: OUP.
  • Quine, W.V.O., 1950, Methods of Logic. New York: Henry Holt.
  • –––, 1951, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”, Philosophical Review, 60: 20–43.
  • –––, 1960, Word and Object. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.
  • –––, 1970, Philosophy of Logic. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall.
  • Sànchez, V., 1991, Studies on Natural Logic and Categorial Grammar. Doctoral dissertation, University of Amsterdam.
  • Segal, G., 1989, “A preference for sense and reference,” The Journal of Philosophy 86: 73–89.
  • Soames, S., 1987, “Direct Reference, Propositional Attititudes, and Semantic Content”, Philosophical Topics, 15: 47–87.
  • –––, 1995, “Beyond Singular Propositions”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 25: 515–50.
  • –––, 2002, Beyond Rigidity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stanley, J., 2000, “Context and Logical Form”, Linguistics and Philosophy, 23: 391–434.
  • Strawson, P., 1950, “On Referring”, Mind, 59: 320–44.
  • Tarski, A., 1933, “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages”, reprinted in Tarski 1983.
  • –––, 1944, “The Semantic Conception of Truth”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 4: 341–75.
  • –––, 1983, Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics. Trans. J.H. Woodger; 2nd edition, ed. J. Corcoran. Indianapolis: Hackett.

Other Useful Works

The following books provide a useful overview of the history and basic subject matter of logic:

  • Kneale, W. & Kneale, M., 1962, The Development of Logic. Oxford: OUP, reprinted 1984.
  • Sainsbury, M., 1991, Logical Forms. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Broadie, A., 1987, Introduction to Medieval Logic. Oxford: OUP.

Frege's Begriffsschrift can be found in:

  • From Frege to Gödel, J. van Heijenoort (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1967.

His later work on functions (‘Function and Concept’) and belief ascriptions (‘Sense and Reference’) can be found in:

  • Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, P. Geach & M. Black (trans.), Oxford: Blackwell, 1952.

For these purposes, Russell's most important books are:

  • Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy, London: George Allen and Unwin, 1919.
  • Our Knowledge of the External World, New York: Norton, 1929.
  • The Philosophy of Logical Atomism, La Salle, Ill: Open Court, 1985.

See also the introduction to the latter, by David Pears; and Russell, by Mark Sainsbury (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1979). Stephen Neale's Descriptions (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1990) is a recent development of Russell's theory. Wittgenstein's Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1961) is importantly related to Russell's logical atomism.

Two key articles on restricted quantifiers, and a third reviewing recent work, are:

  • Barwise, J. & Cooper, R., 1981, “Generalized Quantifiers and Natural Language”, Linguistics and Philosophy, 4: 159–219.
  • Higginbotham, J. & May, R., 1981, “Questions, Quantifiers, and Crossing”, Linguistic Review, 1: 47–79.
  • Keenan, E., 1996, “The Semantics of Determiners”, in S. Lappin, ed., The Handbook of Contemporary Semantic Theory, Oxford: Blackwell

For introductions to Transformational Grammar and Chomsky's conception of natural language, see:

  • Radford, A., 1988, Transformational Grammar. Cambridge: CUP.
  • Haegeman, L., 1994, Introduction to Government & Binding Theory. Cambridge: Blackwell.
  • Lasnik, H. (with M. Depiante and A. Stepanov), 2000, Syntactic Structures Revisited. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

And for discussions of work in linguistics bearing directly on issues of logical form:

  • Higginbotham, J., 1985, “On Semantics”, Linguistic Inquiry, 16: 547–93.
  • Hornstein, N., 1995, Logical Form: From GB to Minimalism. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Larson, R. and Segal, G., 1995, Knowledge of Meaning. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • May, R., 1985, Logical Form: Its Structure and Derivation. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Neale, S., 1993, Grammatical Form, Logical Form, and Incomplete Symbols. In A. Irvine & G. Wedeking, eds., Russell and Analytic Philosophy, Toronto: University of Toronto.

For discussions of the Davidsonian program (briefly described in section 9) and appeal to events:

  • Davidson, D., 1984, Essays on Truth and Interpretation. Oxford: OUP.
  • Davidson, D., 1985, “Adverbs of Action”, in B. Vermazen and M. Hintikka, eds., Essays on Davidson: Actions and Events, Oxford: Clarendon Press
  • Evans, G. & McDowell, J. (eds.), 1976, Truth and Meaning. Oxford: OUP.
  • Higginbotham, J., Pianesi, F. and Varzi, A. (eds.), 2000, Speaking of Events, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ludwig, K. (ed.), 2003, Contemporary Philosophers in Focus: Donald Davidson, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lycan, W., 1984, Logical Form in Natural Language. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Parsons, T., 1990, Events in the Semantics of English Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Pietroski, P., 2004, Events and Semantic Architecture. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schein, B., 1993, Plurals. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Taylor, B., 1985, Modes of Occurrence. Oxford: Blackwell.

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
sep man icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
sep man icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

analysis | analytic/synthetic distinction | Aristotle, General Topics: logic | behaviorism | Carnap, Rudolf | Davidson, Donald | descriptions | Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: theorem and foundations for arithmetic | logic: classical | logic: modal | logical consequence | model theory | names | propositional attitude reports | propositions | propositions: singular | propositions: structured | Quine, Willard van Orman | reference | relations: medieval theories of | rigid designators | Russell, Bertrand | Russell's paradox | syllogism: medieval theories of | terms, properties of: medieval theories of | vagueness


The author would like to thank: Christopher Menzel for spotting an error in an earlier characterization of the generalized quantifier ‘every’, prompting revision of the surrounding discussion; Karen Carter and Max Heiber, for catching unfortunate typos earlier versions of sections three and six; and for comments on earlier drafts, Susan Dwyer, James Lesher, and the editors.

Copyright © 2009 by
Paul Pietroski <pietro@umd.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free