First published Tue Feb 1, 2011; substantive revision Sun Aug 30, 2015

Discrimination is prohibited by six of the core international human rights documents. The vast majority of the world’s states have constitutional or statutory provisions outlawing discrimination. (Osin and Porat 2005) And most philosophical, political, and legal discussions of discrimination proceed on the premise that discrimination is morally wrong and, in a wide range of cases, ought to be legally prohibited. However, co-existing with this impressive global consensus are many contested questions, suggesting that there is less agreement about discrimination than initially meets the eye. What is discrimination? Is it a conceptual truth that discrimination is wrong, or is it a substantive moral judgment? What is the relation of discrimination to oppression and exploitation? What are the categories on which acts of discrimination can be based, aside from such paradigmatic classifications as race, religion, and sex? These are some of the contested issues.

1. The Concept of Discrimination

What is discrimination? More specifically, what does it mean to discriminate against some person or group of persons? It is best to approach this question in stages, beginning with an answer that is a first approximation and then introducing additions, qualifications, and refinements as further questions come into view.

1.1 A First Approximation

In his review of the international treaties that outlaw discrimination, Wouter Vandenhole finds that “[t]here is no universally accepted definition of discrimination” (2005: 33). In fact, the core human rights documents fail to define discrimination at all, simply providing non-exhaustive lists of the grounds on which discrimination is to be prohibited. Thus, the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights declares that “the law shall prohibit any discrimination and guarantee to all persons equal and effective protection against discrimination on any ground such as race, color, sex, language, religion, political or other opinion, national or social origin, property, birth or other status” (Article 26). And the European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights declares, “The enjoyment of the rights and freedoms set forth in this Convention shall be secured without discrimination on any ground such as sex, race, color, language, religion, political or other opinion, national or social origin, association with a national minority, property, birth or other status” (Article 14). Left unaddressed is the question of what discrimination itself is.

Any viable account of what discrimination is will regard it as consisting of actions, practices, or policies that are—in some appropriate sense—based on the (perceived) social group to which those discriminated against belong. Moreover, the relevant groups must be “socially salient,” as Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen puts it, i.e., they must be groups that are “important to the structure of social interactions across a wide range of social contexts” (2006: 169). Thus, groups based on race, religion and gender qualify as potential grounds of discrimination in any modern society, but groups based on the musical or culinary tastes of persons would typically not so qualify.

Discrimination against persons, then, is necessarily oriented toward them based on their membership in a certain type of social group. But it is also necessary that the discriminatory conduct impose some kind of disadvantage or harm on the persons at whom it is directed. In this connection, consider the landmark opinion of the U.S. Supreme Court in Brown v. Board of Education, holding that de jure racial segregation in public schools is unconstitutional. The court writes, “Segregation with the sanction of law … has a tendency to [retard] the educational and mental development of negro children and to deprive them of some of the benefits they would receive in a racial[ly] integrated school system” (1954: 495). Thus, the court rules that segregation amounts to illegal discrimination against black children because it imposes on them educational and psychological disadvantages.

Additionally, as Brown makes clear, the disadvantage imposed by discrimination is to be determined relative to some appropriate comparison social group. This essential reference to a comparison group explains why duties of non-discrimination are “duties to treat people in certain ways defined by reference to the way that others are treated” (Gardner 1998: 355). Typically, the relevant comparison group is part of the same society as the disadvantaged group, or at least it is governed by the same overarching political structure. In Brown, the relevant comparison group consisted of white citizens. Accordingly, it would be mistaken to think that the black citizens of Kansas who brought the lawsuit were not discriminated against because they were treated no worse than blacks in South Africa were being treated under apartheid. Blacks in South Africa were not the proper comparison class.

The appropriate comparison class is determined by normative principles. American states are obligated to provide their black citizens an education that is no worse than what they provide to their white citizens; any comparison with the citizens or subjects of other countries is beside the point. It should also be noted that, whether or not American states have an obligation to provide an education to any of their citizens, if such states provide an education to their white citizens, then it is discriminatory for the states to fail to provide an equally good education to their black citizens. And if states do have an obligation to provide an education to all their citizens, then giving an education to whites but not blacks would constitute a double-wrong against blacks: the wrong of discrimination, which depends on how blacks are treated in comparison to whites, and the wrong of denying blacks an education, which does not depend on how whites are treated.

Discrimination is inherently comparative, and the Brown case seems to suggest that what counts in the comparison is not how well or poorly a person (or group) is treated on some absolute scale, but rather how well she is treated relative to some other person. But an important element of the court’s reasoning in Brown suggests that the essence of discrimination does not lie in treating some persons more favorably than others. Thus, the court famously writes, “Separate educational facilities are inherently unequal” (1954: 495). In other words, the harm of discrimination lies in the very act itself of racially separating black and white children, quite apart from the educational or psychological impact of the separation. On this understanding, treating blacks differently from whites amounts to discrimination, even if they are treated as well as whites.

However, there is a critical problem with the view that the essence of discrimination is differential treatment rather than disadvantageous treatment. If this view were correct, then, under Jim Crow segregation, not only blacks but also whites would be victims of discrimination. Differential treatment is symmetrical: if blacks are treated differently from whites, then whites must be treated differently from blacks. But it is implausible to hold that the South’s system of racial segregation discriminated against whites. The system arguably held back economic progress for everyone in the South, but that point is quite different from the implausible claim that everyone was a victim of discrimination. Accordingly, it is better to think of discrimination in terms of disadvantageous treatment rather than simply differential treatment. Discrimination imposes a disadvantage on certain persons relative to others, and those who are treated more favorably are not to be seen as victims of discrimination.

An act can both be discriminatory and, simultaneously, confer an absolute benefit on those discriminated against, because the conferral of the benefit might be combined with conferring a greater benefit on the members of the appropriate comparison group. In such a case, the advantage of receiving an absolute benefit is, at the same time, a relative disadvantage or deprivation. For example, consider the admissions policy of Harvard University in the early twentieth century, when the university had a quota on the number of Jewish students. Harvard was guilty of discriminating against all Jewish applicants on account of their religion. Yet, the university still offered the applicants something of substantial value, viz., the opportunity to compete successfully for admission. What made the university’s offer of this opportunity discriminatory was that the quota placed (potential and actual) Jewish applicants at a disadvantage, due to their religion, relative to Christian ones.

One might think that it downplays the harm done by discrimination to say that the disadvantage it imposes only need be a relative disadvantage. However, the Brown case shows how the imposition of even a “merely” relative disadvantage can have extremely bad and unjust consequences for persons, especially when the relevant comparison class consists of one’s fellow citizens. Disadvantages relative to fellow citizens, when those disadvantages are severe and concern important goods such as education, can make persons vulnerable to domination and oppression at the hands of their fellow citizens. (Anderson 1999) The domination and oppression of American blacks by their fellow citizens under Jim Crow was made easier by the relative disadvantage imposed on blacks when it came to education. Norwegians might have had an even better education than southern whites, but Norwegians posed little threat of domination to southern whites or blacks, because they lived under an entirely separate political structure, having minimal relations to American citizens. Matters are different in today’s globalized world, where an individual’s disadvantage in access to education relative to persons who live in other countries could pose a threat of oppression. Accordingly, one must seriously consider the possibility that children from poor countries are being discriminated against when they are unable to obtain the education routinely available to children in affluent societies.

The relative nature of the disadvantage that discrimination imposes explains the close connection between discrimination and inequality. A relative disadvantage necessarily involves an inequality with respect to persons in the comparison class. Accordingly, antidiscrimination norms prohibit certain sorts of inequalities between persons in the relevant comparison classes. (Shin 2009) For example, the U.S. Civil Rights Act of 1866 requires that all citizens “shall have the same right, in every State and Territory in the United States, to make and enforce contracts, to sue, be parties, and give evidence, to inherit, purchase, lease, sell, hold, and convey real and personal property, and to full and equal benefit of all laws and proceedings for the security of person and property, as is enjoyed by white citizens” (Civil Rights Act 1866). And the international convention targeting discrimination against women condemns “any distinction, exclusion or restriction made on the basis of sex which has the effect or purpose of impairing or nullifying the recognition, enjoyment or exercise by women … on a basis of equality of men and women, of human rights and fundamental freedoms” (CEDAW, Article 1).

To review: as a reasonable first approximation, we can say that discrimination consists of acts, practices, or policies that impose a relative disadvantage on persons based on their membership in a salient social group. But notice that this account does not make discrimination morally wrong as a conceptual matter. The imposition of a relative disadvantage might, or might not, be wrongful. In the next section, we will see how the idea of moral wrongfulness can be introduced to form a moralized concept of discrimination.

In recent years, some thinkers have rejected the view that discrimination is an essentially comparative concept that looks to how certain persons are treated relative to others. For example, Denise Réaume argues against the view by invoking the “leveling-down objection.” She points out that, if there is an inequality in the distribution of some benefit between two persons or groups, then we need to ask “whether leveling up or leveling down are, other things held constant, regarded as equally attractive solutions” (2013: 8). The comparative view seems to entail that the two solutions are equally attractive, but, Réaume points out, plaintiffs in discrimination cases who are demanding equal treatment “rarely put their claim this way” (8) and would not be satisfied with the leveling-down solution: “they ask to vote as well, not that voting be abolished, or that a pension scheme include them, not that it be repealed.” Réaume continues, “To level down would deprive everyone of something all are properly entitled to, and thus exacerbate rather than solve the problem” (11). Nonetheless, the leveling-down objection is problematic. That plaintiffs in discrimination cases do not ask that voting be abolished only shows that they know that they would be better off with everyone having the right to vote than with no one having it. Moreover, although leveling down would, in typical cases, deprive everyone of something to which all are entitled, it does not follow that leveling down would constitute discrimination. The universal denial of the franchise would be a wrong, but not the wrong of discrimination. Denial of the franchise amounts to discrimination only when it is selectively directed at some salient group within the adult population. Accordingly, Lippert-Rasmussen seems to be right when he explains, “Unlike other prima facie morally wrong acts, such as lying, hurting, or manipulating, one cannot discriminate against some unless there are others who receive (or who would receive) better treatment at one’s hands …. I can rebut an accusation of having discriminated against someone by saying that I would have treated anyone else at least as badly in that situation” (2014: 16).

1.2 The Moralized Concept

The concept of discrimination is inherently normative to the extent that the idea of disadvantage is a normative one. But it does not follow from this point that discrimination is, by definition, morally wrong. At the same time, many—or even most—uses of the term ‘discrimination’ in contemporary political and legal discussions do employ the term in a moralized sense. David Wasserman is using this moralized sense, when he writes that “[t]o claim that someone discriminates is … to challenge her for justification; to call discrimination ‘wrongful’ is merely to add emphasis to a morally-laden term” (1998: 805). We can, in fact, distinguish a moralized from a non-moralized concept of discrimination. The moralized concept picks out acts, practices or policies insofar as they wrongfully impose a relative disadvantage on persons based on their membership in a salient social group of a suitable sort. The non-moralized concept simply dispenses with the adverb ‘wrongfully’.

Accordingly, the sentence ‘Discrimination is wrong’ can be either a tautology (if ‘discrimination’ is used in its moralized sense) or a substantive moral judgment (if ‘discrimination’ is used in its non- moralized sense). And if one wanted to condemn as wrong a certain act or practice, then one could call it ‘discrimination’ (in the moralized sense) and leave it at that, or one could call it ‘discrimination’ (in the non-moralized sense) and then add that it was wrongful. In contexts where the justifiability of an act or practice is under discussion and disagreement, the moralized concept of discrimination is typically the key one used, and the disagreement is over whether the concept applies to the act. Because of its role in such discussion and disagreement, the remainder of this article will be concerned with the moralized concept of discrimination, unless it is explicitly indicated otherwise.

There is an additional point that needs to be made in connection with the wrongfulness of discrimination in its moralized sense. It is not simply that such discrimination is wrongful as a conceptual matter. The wrongfulness of the discrimination is tied to the fact that the discriminatory act is based on the victim’s membership in a salient social group. An act that imposes a relative disadvantage or deprivation might be wrong for a variety of reasons; for example, the act might violate a promise that the agent has made. The act counts as discrimination, though, only insofar as its wrongfulness derives from a connection of the act to the membership in a certain group(s) of the person detrimentally affected by the act. Accordingly, we can refine the first-approximation account of discrimination and say that the moralized concept of discrimination is properly applied to acts, practices or policies that meet two conditions: a) they wrongfully impose a relative disadvantage or deprivation on persons based on their membership in some salient social group, and b) the wrongfulness rests (in part) on the fact that the imposition of the disadvantage is on account of the group membership of the victims.

2. Types of Discrimination (in its Moralized Sense)

Legal thinkers and legal systems have distinguished among a bewildering array of types of discrimination: direct and indirect, disparate treatment and disparate impact, intentional and institutional, individual and structural. It is not easy to make sense of the morass of categories and distinctions. The best place to start is with direct discrimination.

2.1 Direct Discrimination

Consider the following, clear instance of direct discrimination. In 2002, several men of Roma (“gypsy”) descent entered a bar in a Romanian town and were refused service. The bar employee explained his conduct by pointing out to them a sign saying, “We do not serve Roma.” The Romanian tribunal deciding the case ruled that the Roma men had been the victims of unlawful direct discrimination. (Schiek, Waddington, and Bell 2007: 185) The bar’s policy, as formulated in its sign, explicitly and intentionally picked out the Roma qua Roma for disadvantageous treatment. It was those two features—explicitness and intention—that made the Roma case a paradigmatic example of direct discrimination. Such examples of discrimination are ones which the agent performs with the aim of imposing a disadvantage on persons for being members of some salient social group. In the Roma case, the bartender and bar owner aimed to exclude Roma for being Roma, and so both the owner’s policy and the bartender’s maxim of action explicitly referred to the exclusion of Roma. It is clear that the policy of the bar was wrong, but the question of what makes the policy and other instances direct discrimination wrongful will be put on hold until section 4.1 below.

In some cases, a discriminator will adopt a policy that, on its face, makes no explicit reference to the group that he or she aims to disadvantage. Instead, the policy employs some facially-neutral surrogate that, when applied, accomplishes the discriminator’s hidden aim. For example, during the Jim Crow era, southern states used literacy tests for the purpose of excluding African-Americans from the franchise. Because African-Americans were denied adequate educational opportunities and because the tests were applied in a racially-biased manner, virtually all of the persons disqualified by the tests were African-Americans, and, in any given jurisdiction, the vast majority of African-American adults seeking to vote were disqualified. The point of the literacy tests was precisely such racial exclusion, even though the testing policy made no explicit reference to race.

Notwithstanding the absence of an explicit reference to race in the literacy tests themselves, their use was a case of direct discrimination. The reason is that the persons who formulated, voted for, and implemented the tests acted on maxims that did make explicit reference to race. Their maxim was something along the lines of: ‘In order to exclude African-Americans from the franchise and do so in a way that appears consistent with the U.S. Constitution, I will favor a legal policy that is racially-neutral on its face but in practice excludes most African-Americans and leaves whites unaffected.’ As with the Roma case, there were agents whose aim was to disadvantage persons for belonging to a certain social group.

However, it is too simple to say that direct discrimination simply is intentional discrimination. Lippert-Rasmussen rightly points out that there can be cases of direct discrimination not involving the intention to disadvantage anyone on account of her group membership (2014: 59–60). A disadvantage might, instead, be imposed as a result of a general indifference toward the interests and rights of the members of a certain group. Thus, an employer might use hiring criteria that unfairly disadvantages women, not because the employer intends to disadvantage women, but because the criteria are easy to use and he simply does not care that women are unfairly disadvantaged as a result. Such instances of discrimination might not have the paradigmatic status that an example like the Roma case has, but they should be counted as forms of direct discrimination, because the disadvantageous treatment derives from an objectionable mental state of the agent. The same goes for disadvantageous treatment that is the product of bias against a certain group, even when the bias does not involve an intention to treat the group disadvantageously. A paternalistic employer might intend to help women by hiring them only for certain jobs in his company, but, if the employer is motivated by unwarranted views about the capabilities of women, he is guilty of direct discrimination.

Acts of direct discrimination can be unconscious in that the agent is unaware of the discriminatory motive behind them. It is plausible to think that in many societies, unconscious prejudice is a factor in a significant range of discriminatory behavior, and a viable understanding of the concept of discrimination must be able to accommodate the possibility. In fact, there is growing evidence that unconscious discrimination exists. (Jost et al. 2009 and Payne and Cameron 2010) And as Amy Wax has noted, even the intention to disadvantage persons on account of their group affiliation can be unconscious (2008: 983).

2.2 Indirect Discrimination

Under many legal systems, an act that imposes a disproportionate disadvantage on the members of a certain group can count as discriminatory, even though the agent has no intention to disadvantage the members of the group and no other objectionable mental state, such as indifference or bias, motivating the act. This form of discriminatory conduct is called “indirect discrimination” or, in the language of American doctrine, “disparate impact” discrimination. Thus, the European Court of Human Rights (ECHR) has held that “[w]hen a general policy or measure has disproportionately prejudicial effects on a particular group, it is not excluded that this may be considered as discriminatory notwithstanding that it is not specifically aimed or directed at that group.” (Shanaghan v. U.K. 2001: para. 129) Indirect discrimination is different from the direct form in that the relevant agents do not aim to disadvantage persons for being members of a certain group.

It is important to note that the ECHR says that policies with disproportionate effects may be discriminatory even if that is not the aim of the policies. So what criterion determines when a policy with disproportionately worse effects on a certain group actually counts as indirect discrimination? There is no agreed upon answer.

The ECHR has laid down the following criterion: a policy with disproportionate effects counts as indirect discrimination “if it does not pursue a legitimate aim or if there is not a reasonable relation of proportionality between means and aim” (Abdulaziz et al. v. U.K., 1985: para. 721). Swedish law contains a different criterion: a policy with disproportionate effects is not discriminatory if and only if it “can be motivated by a legitimate aim and the means are appropriate and necessary to achieve the aim” (Osin and Porat 2005: 864). The Human Rights Committee of the United Nations has judged that a policy with disproportionate effects is discriminatory “if it is not based on objective and reasonable criteria” (Moucheboeuf 2006: 100). Under the British Race Relations Act, such a policy is discriminatory if the policymaker “cannot show [the policy] to be justifiable irrespective of the … race … of the person to whom it is applied” (Osin and Porat 2005: 900). And in its interpretation of the Civil Rights Act of 1964, the U.S. Supreme Court has held that, in judging whether the employment policies of private businesses are (indirectly) discriminatory, “[i]f an employment practice which operates to exclude Negroes cannot be shown to be related to job performance, the practice is prohibited” (Griggs v. Duke Power 1971: 431). Despite the differences, these criteria have a common thought behind them: a disproportionately disadvantageous impact on the members of certain salient social groups must not be written off as morally or legally irrelevant or dismissed as mere accident, but rather stands in need of justification. In other words, the impact must not be treated as wholly inconsequential, as if it were equivalent, for example, to a disproportionate impact on persons with long toe nails. Toe-nail group impact would require no justification, because it would simply be an accidental and morally inconsequential feature of the act, at least in all actual societies. In contrast, the thought behind the idea of indirect discrimination is that, if an act has a disproportionately disadvantageous impact on persons belonging to certain types of salient social groups, then the act is morally wrong and legally prohibited if it cannot meet some suitable standard of justification.

To illustrate the idea of indirect discrimination, we can turn to the U.S. Supreme Court case, Griggs v. Duke Power (1971). A company in North Carolina used a written test to determine promotions. The use of the test had the result that almost all black employees failed to qualify for the promotions. The company was not accused of intentional (direct) discrimination, i.e., there was no claim that race was a consideration that the company took into account in deciding to use the written test. But the court found that the test did not measure skills essential for the jobs in question and that the state of North Carolina had a long history of deliberately discriminating against blacks by, among other things, providing grossly inferior education to them. The state had only very recently begun to rectify that situation. In ruling for the black plaintiffs, the court reasoned that the policy of using the test was racially discriminatory, because of the test’s disproportionate racial impact combined with the fact that it was not necessary to use the test to determine who was best qualified for promotion.

2.3 Organizational, Institutional, and Structural Discrimination

In many cases, acts of discrimination are attributed to collective agents, rather than to natural persons acting in their individual capacities. Accordingly, corporations, universities, government agencies, religious bodies, and other collective agents can act in discriminatory ways. This kind of discrimination can be called “organizational,” and it cuts across the direct-indirect distinction. Confusion sometimes arises when it is mistakenly believed that organizations cannot have intentions and that only indirect discrimination is possible for them. As collective agents, organizations do have intentions, and those intentions are a function of who the officially authorized agents of the institution are and what they are trying to do when they act as their official powers enable them. Suppose that the Board of Trustees of a university votes to adopt an admissions policy that (implicitly or explicitly) excludes Jews, and the trustees vote that way precisely because they believe that Jews are inherently more dishonest and greedy than other people. In such a cases, the university is deliberately excluding Jews and is guilty of direct discrimination. Individual trustees acting in their private capacity might engage in other forms of discriminatory conduct; for example, they might refuse to join clubs that have Jewish members. Such a refusal would not count as organizational discrimination. But any discriminatory acts attributable to individual board members in virtue of some official power that they hold would count as organizational discrimination.

Structural discrimination—sometimes called “institutional” (Ture and Hamilton 1992/1967: 4)—should be distinguished from organizational: the structural form concerns the rules that constitute and regulate the major sectors of life such as family relations, property ownership and exchange, political powers and responsibilities, and so on. (Pogge 2008: 37) It is true that when such rules are discriminatory, they are often—though not always—the deliberate product of some collective or individual agent, such as a legislative body or executive official. In such cases, the agents are guilty of direct discrimination. But the idea of structural discrimination is an effort to capture a wrong distinct from direct discrimination. Thus, Fred Pincus writes that “[t]he key element in structural discrimination is not the intent but the effect of keeping minority groups in a subordinate position” (1994: 84). What Pincus and others have in mind can be explained in the following way.

When the rules of a society’s major institutions consistently produce disproportionately disadvantageous outcomes for the members of certain salient social groups and the production of such outcomes is unjust, then there is structural discrimination against the members of the groups in question, apart from any direct discrimination in which the collective or individual agents of the society might engage. This account does not mean that, empirically speaking, structural discrimination stands free of direct discrimination. It is highly unlikely that the consistent production of unjust and disproportionately disadvantageous effects would be a chance occurrence. Rather, it is (almost) always the case that, at some point(s) in the history of a society in which there is structural discrimination, important collective agents, such as governmental ones, intentionally created rules with the aim of disadvantaging the members of the groups in question. It is also likely that some collective and individual agents continue to engage in direct discrimination in such a society. But by invoking the idea of structural discrimination and attributing the discrimination to the rules of a society’s major institutions, we are pointing to a form of discrimination that is conceptually distinct from the direct discrimination engaged in by collective or individual agents. Thus understood, structural discrimination is, as a conceptual matter, necessarily indirect, although, as empirical matter, direct discrimination is (almost) always part of the story of how structural discrimination came to be and continues to exist.

Also note that the idea of structural discrimination does not presuppose that, whenever the rules of society’s major institutions consistently produce disproportionately disadvantageous results for a salient group such as women or racial minorities, structural discrimination thereby exists. Because our concern is with the moralized concept of discrimination, one might think that disproportionate outcomes, by themselves, entail that an injustice has been done to the members of the salient group in question and that structural discrimination thereby exists against the group. However, on a moralized concept of structural discrimination, the injustice condition is distinct from the disproportionate outcome condition. Whether a disproportionate outcome is sufficient for concluding that there is an injustice against the members of the group is a substantive moral question. Some thinkers might claim that the answer is affirmative, and such a claim is consistent with the moralized concept of structural discrimination. However, the claim is not presupposed by the moralized concept, which incorporates only the conceptual thesis that a pattern of disproportionate disadvantage falling on the members of certain salient groups does not count as structural discrimination unless the pattern violates sound principles of distributive justice.

3. Challenging the Concept of Indirect Discrimination

The distinction between direct and indirect discrimination plays a central role in contemporary thinking about discrimination. However, some thinkers hold that talking about indirect discrimination is confused and misguided. For these thinkers, direct discrimination is the only genuine form of discrimination. Examining their challenge to the very concept of indirect discrimination is crucial in developing a philosophical account of what discrimination is.

3.1 Is Indirect Discrimination Really Discrimination?

Iris Young argues that the concept of discrimination should be limited to “intentional and explicitly formulated policies of exclusion or preference.” She holds that conceiving of discrimination in terms of the consequences or impact of an act, rather than in terms of its intent, “confuses issues” by conflating discrimination with oppression. Discrimination is a matter of the intentional conduct of particular agents. Oppression is a matter of the outcomes routinely generated by “the structural and institutional framework” of society. (1990: 196)

Matt Cavanagh holds a position similar to Young’s, writing that persons “who are concerned primarily with how things like race and sex show up in the overall distributions [of jobs] have no business saying that their position has anything to do with discrimination. It is not discrimination they object to, but its effects; and these effects can equally be brought about by other causes” (2002: 199). For example, the disproportionate exclusion of certain ethnic groups from the ranks of professional violinist could be the result of discrimination against those groups, but it also might be an effect of the fact that there is a lower proportion of persons from those groups who have perfect pitch than the proportion found in other ethnic groups.

The arguments of Cavanagh and Young raise a question that is not easy to answer, viz,, why can indirect and direct discrimination be legitimately considered as two subcategories of one and the same concept? In other words, what do the two supposed forms of discrimination really have in common that make them forms of the same type of moral wrong? Direct discrimination is essentially a matter of the reasons or motives that guide the act or policy of a particular agent, while indirect discrimination is not about such reasons or motives. Even conceding that acts or policies of each type can be wrong, it is unclear that the two types are each species of one and the same kind of moral wrong, i.e., the wrong of discrimination. And if cases of direct discrimination are paradigmatic examples of discrimination, then a serious question arises as to whether the concept of discrimination properly applies to the policies, rules, and acts that are characterized as “indirect” discrimination.

Moreover, there is a crucial ambiguity in how discrimination is understood that lends itself to conflating direct discrimination with the phenomena picked out by ‘indirect discrimination’. Direct discrimination involves the imposition of disadvantages “based on” or “on account of” or “because of” membership in some salient social group. Yet, these phrases can refer either to a) the reasons that guide the acts of agents or to b) factors that do not guide agents but do help explain why the disadvantageous outcomes of certain acts and policies fall disproportionately on certain salient groups. (Cf. Shin, 2010.) In the Roma case, the disadvantage was “because of” ethnicity in the former sense: the ethnicity of the Roma was a consideration that guided the acts of the bar owner and bartender. In the Griggs case, the disadvantage was “because of race” in the latter sense: race did not guide the acts of the company but neither was it an accident that the disadvantages of the written test fell disproportionately on blacks. Rather, race, in conjunction with the historical facts about North Carolina’s educational policies, explained why the disadvantage fell disproportionately on black employees.

The thought that the policy of the company in Griggs is a kind of discrimination, viz., indirect discrimination, seems to trade on the ambiguity in the meanings of the locutions ‘based on’, ‘because of’, ‘on account of’, and so on. The state of North Carolina’s policy of racial segregation in education imposed disadvantages based on/because of/on account of race, in one sense of those terms. The company’s policy of using a written test imposed disadvantages based on/because of/on account of race, in a different sense. Even conceding that both the state and the company wronged blacks on the basis of their race, it appears that the two cases present two different kinds of wrong.

However, one can reasonably argue, to the contrary, that the two wrongs are not different in kind, because they are both instances of wrongs done to persons in which membership in some salient social group explains why the wrongful disadvantages fell on the individuals in question. In order to understand why the persons in the Roma case were thrown out of the bar, it is necessary to understand that their identity as Roma was the key practical reason guiding the actions of the bartender. In order to understand why the employees in the Griggs case were unable to get promotions, it is necessary to understand that their identity as blacks was a key factor explaining why they failed to achieve high enough scores on the company’s written test. The types of explanation operate at different levels. In the Roma case, the explanation works at the retail level of particular agents, explaining why individual Roma were harmed by appealing to the practical reasons of the bartender. By contrast, in the Griggs case, the explanation involves considerations at the wholesale level of general social facts, explaining racially disproportionate exam outcomes by appealing to factors about a population’s access to educational opportunities, factors that did not play a role in the practical reasoning of the company. But in each case, the appropriate explanation for why certain individuals were disadvantaged concerned their group membership. Additionally, for both forms of discrimination, the wrongfulness of the discriminatory act or policy derived from the connection between the disadvantages and the salient-group membership of the persons who were disadvantaged.

Still, one might argue that the concept of indirect discrimination is problematic because its use mistakenly presupposes that the wrongfulness of discrimination can lie ultimately in its effects on social groups. Certainly, bad effects can be brought about by discriminatory processes, but, the argument claims, the wrongfulness lies in what brings about the effects, i.e., in the unfairness or injustice of those acts or policies that generate the effects, and does not lie in the effects themselves. Cavanagh seems to have this argument in mind when he writes that people who characterize an act or policy as discriminatory on the basis of its effects are really objecting to the effects and that “these effects can equally be brought about by other causes” (2002: 199). Addressing this argument requires a closer examination of why discrimination is wrong, the topic of section 4. Before turning to that section, it would helpful to address a suspicion that might arise in the course of pondering whether indirect discrimination is really is a form of discrimination.

3.2 Is the Dispute Merely Terminological?

One might suspect that any disagreement over whether indirect discrimination is really a form of discrimination is only a terminological one, devoid of any philosophical substance and capable of being adequately settled simply by the speaker stipulating how she is using term ‘discrimination’. (Cavanagh 2002: 199) One side in the disagreement could, then, stipulate that, as it is using the term, ‘discrimination’ applies only to direct discrimination, and the other side could stipulate that ‘discrimination’, as it is using the term, applies to direct and indirect discrimination alike. However, the choice of terminology is not always philosophically innocent or unproblematic. A poor choice of terminology can lead to conceptual confusions and fallacious inferences. Cavanagh argues that precisely these sorts of infelicities are fostered when ‘discrimination’ is used to refer to a wrong that essentially depends on certain effects being visited upon the members of a social group. (2002: 199) Moreover, the critics and the defenders of the term ‘indirect discrimination’ presumably agree with one another that the concept of discrimination possesses a determinate meaning that either admits, or does not admit, of an indirect form of discrimination. So it seems that the disagreement over indirect discrimination has philosophical significance.

The possibility should be acknowledged that the concept of discrimination is insufficiently determinate to dictate an answer to the question of whether there can be an indirect form of discrimination. In that case, there would be no answer, and any disagreement over the possibility of such discrimination would be devoid of philosophical substance and should be settled by speaker stipulation. However, it would be hasty to arrive at the conclusion that there is no answer before a thorough examination of the concept of discrimination is completed and some judgment is made about what the best account is of the concept. And a thorough examination must take up the question of why discrimination is wrong.

4. Why Is Discrimination Wrong?

As we have seen, discrimination, in its moralized sense, is necessarily wrongful, and the wrong is connected in some way to its group-based character. But these points do not yet tell us why discrimination is wrongful. Let us begin with direct discrimination and then turn to the indirect form, in order to shed some light on whether the wrongs involved in the two forms are sufficiently analogous to consider them as two types of one and the same kind of wrong, viz., the wrong of discrimination in general.

4.1 The Wrongs of Direct Discrimination

Specifying why direct discrimination is wrongful has proved to be a surprisingly controversial and difficult task. There is general agreement that the wrong concerns the kind of reason or motive that guides the action of the agent of discrimination: the agent is acting on a reason or motive that is in some way illegitimate or morally tainted. But there are more than a half-dozen distinct views about what the best principle is for drawing the distinction between acts of direct discrimination (in the moralized sense) and those acts that are not wrongful even though the agent takes account of another’s social group membership.

One popular view is that direct discrimination is wrong because the discriminator treats persons on the basis of traits that are immutable and not under the control of the individual possessing them. Thus, Richard Kahlenberg asserts that racial discrimination is unjust because race is such an immutable trait. (1996: 54–55). And discrimination based on many forms of disability would seem to fit this view. But Bernard Boxill rejects the view, arguing that there are instances in which it is justifiable to treat persons based on features that are beyond their control. (1992: 12–17) Denying blind people a driver’s license or persons with little athletic ability a place on the basketball team is not an injustice to such individuals. Moreover, Boxill notes that, if scientists developed a drug that could change a person’s skin color, it would still be unjust to discriminate against people because of their color. (1992: 16) Additionally, a paradigmatic ground of discrimination, a person’s religion, is not an immutable trait, nor are some forms of disability. Thus, there are serious problems with the popular view that direct discrimination is wrong due to the immutable nature of the traits on the basis of which the discriminator treats the persons whom he wrongs.

A second view holds that direct discrimination is wrong because it treats persons on the basis of inaccurate stereotypes. When the state of Virginia defended the male-only admissions policy of the Virginia Military Institute (VMI), it introduced expert testimony that there was a strong correlation between sex and the capacity to benefit from the highly disciplined and competitive educational atmosphere of the school: those who benefited from such an atmosphere were, for the most part, men, while women had a strong tendency to thrive in a quite different, cooperative educational environment. This defense involved the premise that the school’s admissions policy was not discriminatory because the policy relied on accurate generalizations about men and women. And in its ruling against VMI, the Supreme Court held that a public policy “must not rely on overbroad generalizations about the different talents, capacities, or preferences of males and females” (U.S. v. Virginia 1996: 533). But the court went on to argue that “generalizations about ‘the way women are’, estimates of what is appropriate for most women, no longer justify denying opportunity to women whose talent and capacity place them outside the average description” (U.S. v. Virginia 1996: 550).(ital. in original) This reasoning implies that, even if gender was a very good a predictor of the qualities needed to benefit from and be successful at the school, VMI’s admissions policy would still be discriminatory. (Schauer 2003: 137–141) The Court’s reasoning here seems sound, because it is possible that there was something discriminatory about the way in which the school had defined success. For example, the school might have focused on those forms of discipline and competition that generally favored men and might have ignored those forms that favored women. In such a case, the discrimination would not rest on an inaccurate stereotype, but, perhaps, on the undue devaluation of qualities accurately associated with women. Whether or not VMI’s policy involved such a consideration, an account of why direct discrimination is wrong should be consistent with the possibility of discrimination that is based on accurate gender generalizations.

A third view is that direct discrimination is wrong because it is an arbitrary or irrational way to treat persons. In other words, direct discrimination imposes a disadvantage on a person for a reason that is not a good one, viz., that the person is a member of a certain salient social group. Accordingly, Anne-Marie Cotter argues that such discrimination treats people unequally “without rational justification” (2006: 10). John Kekes expresses a similar view in condemning race-based affirmative action as “arbitrary” (1995: 200), and, in the same vein, Anthony Flew argues that racism is unjust because it treats persons on the basis of traits that “are strictly superficial and properly irrelevant to all, or almost all, questions of social status and employability” (1990: 63–64).

However, many thinkers reject this third view of the wrongness of direct discrimination. John Gardner argues that there is no “across-the-board-duty to be rational, so our irrationality as such wrongs no one.” Additionally, Gardner contends that “there patently can be reasons, under some conditions, to discriminate on grounds of race or sex,” even though the conduct in question is wrongful. (1998: 168) For example, a restaurant owner might rationally refuse to serve blacks if most of his customers are white racists who would stop patronizing the establishment if blacks were served. (1998: 168 and 182) The owner’s actions would be wrong and would amount to a rational form of discrimination. Additionally, Richard Wasserstrom argues that the principle that persons ought not to be treated on the basis of morally arbitrary features cannot grasp the fundamental wrong of direct racial discrimination, because the principle is “too contextually isolated” from the actual features of a society in which many people have racist attitudes. (1995: 161) For Wasserstrom, the wrong of racial discrimination cannot be separated from the fact that such discrimination manifests an attitude that the members of certain races are intellectually and morally inferior to the rests of the population.

A fourth view is that direct discrimination is wrong because it fails to treat individuals based on their merits. Thus, Sidney Hook argues that hiring decisions based on race, sex, religion and other social categories are wrong because such decisions should be based on who “is best qualified for the post” (1995: 146). In a similar vein, Alan Goldman argues that discriminatory practices are wrong because “the most competent individuals have prima facie rights to positions” (1979: 34).

Opponents of this merit-based view note that it is often highly contestable who the “best qualified” really is, because the criteria determining qualifications are typically vague and do not come with weights attached to them. (Wasserman, 1998: 807) Another line of criticism claims that merit does not entitle a person to a position. For example, the most meritorious worker might be an obnoxious person whose fellow workers would dislike working with him. It would seem that an employer has the right to hire a less meritorious but more likable person. Even if the company profits fell a bit as a result, no wrong is done to the meritorious but obnoxious applicant. Thus, Cavanagh suggests that “hiring on merit has more to do with efficiency than fairness” (2002: 20). Cavanagh also notes that a merit principle cannot explain what is distinctively wrong about an employer who discriminates against blacks because the employer thinks that they are morally or intellectually inferior. The merit approach “makes [the employer’s] behavior look the same as any other way of treating people … non-meritocratically” (2002: 24–25).

A fifth view, defended by Richard Arneson and Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen, explains the wrongfulness of discrimination in terms of a certain consequentialist moral view. The view rests on the principle that every action ought to maximize overall moral value and incorporates the idea that benefits accruing to persons who are at a lower level of well-being count more toward overall moral value than benefits to those at a higher level. Additionally, the view holds that benefits to persons who are more deserving of them count more than benefits to those who are less deserving (Arneson 1999: 239–40 and Lippert-Rasmussen 2014: 165–83). This approach holds that discrimination is wrong because it violates a rule that would be part of the social morality that maximizes overall moral value. Thus, Arneson writes that his view “can possibly defend nondiscrimination and equal opportunity norms as part of the best consequentialist public morality” (2013: 99). However, for many thinkers, the view will fail to adequately capture a key aspect of discrimination, viz., that discrimination is not simply wrong but that it is a wrong to the persons who are discriminated against. One might argue in defense of Arneson that those who are victimized by discrimination can claim that they deserve the opportunity that is denied them, but philosophers like Cavanagh, who object to the merit approach, will have the same objections to such a defense (Cavanagh 2002: 20 and 24–25).

A sixth view, developed by Sophia Moreau, regards direct discrimination as wrong because it violates the equal entitlement each person has to freedom. In particular, she contends that “the interest that is injured by discrimination is our interest in … deliberative freedoms: that is, freedoms to have our decisions about how to live insulated from the effects of normatively extraneous features of us, such as our skin color or gender” (2010: 147). Normatively extraneous features are “traits that we believe persons should not have to factor into their deliberations …as costs.” For example, “people should not be constrained by the social costs of being one race rather than another when they deliberate about such questions as what job to take or where to live” (2010: 149).

Yet, it is unclear that Moreau’s account gets to the bottom of what is wrong with discrimination. One might object, following the criticisms leveled by Wasserstrom and Cavanagh at the arbitrariness and merit accounts, respectively, that the idea of a normatively extraneous feature is too abstract to capture what makes racial discrimination a paradigmatic form of direct discrimination. There are reasons that justify our belief “that persons should not have to factor [race] into their deliberations …as costs,” and those reasons seem to be connected to the idea that racial discrimination treats persons of a certain race as having a diminished or degraded moral status as compared to individuals belonging to other races. The wrong of racial and other forms of discrimination seems better illuminated by understanding it in terms of such degraded status than in terms of the idea of normatively extraneous features.

A seventh view, developed by Deborah Hellman, holds that direct discrimination is wrong because it demeans and denigrates those against whom it is directed, thereby treating such persons as morally inferior. Thus, she contends that “the act of demeaning is the wrong of wrongful discrimination” (2008: 172). For example, it is demeaning, she argues, for an employer to require female employees to wear cosmetics because such a requirement “conveys the idea that a woman’s body is for adornment and the enjoyment by others” (2008: 42). Patrick Shin proposes a similar account in his discussion of equal protection, arguing that “to characterize an action as unequal treatment is to register a certain objection as to what, in view of its rationale, the action expresses” (2009: 170). Offending actions are ones that treat an individual “as though that individual belonged to some class of individuals that was less entitled to right treatment than anyone else” (2009:169). And this seventh view of what makes discrimination wrongful is reflected in the legal case Obergefell v. Hodges, decided by the U.S. Supreme Court and declaring unconstitutional laws prohibiting same-sex marriage. In his opinion for the Court, Justice Kennedy wrote that “the necessary consequence [of such laws] is to put the imprimatur of the State itself on an exclusion that soon demeans or stigmatizes those whose own liberty is then denied. Under the Constitution, same-sex couples seek in marriage the same legal treatment as opposite-sex couples, and it would disparage their choices and diminish their personhood to deny them this right” (2015: Slip Opinion at 19).

Closely related to Hellman’s account is an eighth view, holding that direct discrimination is wrong on account of its connection to prejudice, where prejudice is understood as an attitude that regards the members of a salient group, qua members, as not entitled to as much respect or concern as the members of other salient groups. Prejudice can involve feelings of hostility, antipathy, or indifference, as well as belief in the inferior morals, intellect, or skills of the targeted group. Returning to the case of the Roma who were excluded by the policy of a bar, we could say that the policy was discriminatory because it was the expression of prejudice against the Roma, whereas a bar’s policy of excluding men from the women’s restroom would fail to be discriminatory because it would not be an expression of prejudice.

John Hart Ely defends a version of this eighth view, holding that discriminatory acts are those that are motivated by prejudice. (1980: 153–159) Ronald Dworkin has formulated an alternative version, arguing that discriminatory acts are those that could be justified only if some prejudiced belief were correct. The absence of a “prejudice-free justification” thus makes a law or policy discriminatory. (1985: 66)

The eighth view, along with the accounts of Hellman and Shin, rest on the intuitively attractive idea that the wrongfulness of direct discrimination is tied to its denial of the equal moral status of persons. This idea is also at the heart of Wasserstrom’s complaint that understanding discrimination in terms of arbitrariness is too abstract to capture the wrongfulness of racial discrimination as it has actually been practiced and Cavanagh’s related objection to the merit view that what is wrong with the discriminatory acts of a racist cannot be adequately grasped strictly in terms of the denial of merit. However the details are to be worked out, the essential wrong of paradigmatic acts of direct discrimination seems to be that they violate the equal moral status of persons by treating the victims in ways that would be appropriate only for individuals having a diminished or degraded moral status.

4.2 The Wrongs of Indirect Discrimination

The most egregious forms of indirect discrimination are typically structural, due to the pervasive impact of a society’s basic institutions on the life-prospects of its members. (Rawls 1971: 7) Indirect discrimination is structural when the rules and norms of society consistently produce disproportionately disadvantageous outcomes for the members of a certain group, relative to the other groups in society, the outcomes are unjust to the members of the disadvantaged group, and the production of the outcomes is to be explained by the group membership of those individuals. Cass Sunstein nicely captures the wrong of this form of indirect discrimination in the course of explaining his antidiscrimination principle, which he calls the “anticaste principle.” He writes, “The motivating idea [for the anticaste principle] is that without good reason, social and legal structures should not turn differences that are both highly visible and irrelevant from the moral point of view into systematic social disadvantages. A systematic disadvantage is one that operates along standard and predictable lines in multiple and important spheres of life” (1994: 2429). In a similar vein, Catharine MacKinnon finds structural discrimination against women to be intolerable because it consists of “the systematic relegation of an entire group of people to a condition of inferiority” (1987: 41).

Two related wrongs belonging to structural discrimination can be distinguished. First is the wrong that consists of society’s major institutions imposing, without adequate justification, relative disadvantages on persons belonging to certain salient social groups. Accordingly, it is wrong for society’s basic rules to deny to women or to racial or religious minorities opportunities for personal freedom, development, and flourishing equal to those that men or racial and religious majorities enjoy. Second is the wrong of placing the members of a salient social group in a position of vulnerability to exploitation and domination as a result of the denial of equal opportunities and the imposition of other kinds of relative disadvantage. Accordingly, it is wrong for a society to make women vulnerable to sexual exploitation and domination at the hands of men by the imposition of various economic and social disadvantages relative to men.

In contrast, the wrongs of non-structural forms of indirect discrimination seem to be dependent on structural (or direct) discrimination. Consider the Griggs case. The company’s promotion policy was not part of the wrong involved in society’s basic institutions imposing relative disadvantages on blacks. But the policy did have some connection to structural racial discrimination and to the widespread direct discrimination against blacks that existed prior to and contemporaneous with the policy. The policy helped to perpetuate the unjust disadvantages that were due to such structural and direct discrimination, even though the policy was not needed to serve any legitimate business purpose and that was why the policy was wrong. Or at least that is what the proponents of the idea of indirect discrimination appear to have in mind when they talk about non-structural forms of indirect discrimination.

Are the wrongs of indirect discrimination sufficiently similar to the wrongs of direct discrimination that it is reasonable to say that they are, in fact, two different types of one and the same wrong? We have seen that the accounts of the wrong of direct discrimination are many and various. But abstracting from those differences, critics of talk of “indirect discrimination” might argue that discrimination is essentially a process-based wrong, rather than an outcome-based one, and that only direct discrimination is process-based. In other words, only with direct discrimination is there a defect in how some outcome is brought about, rather than in what the outcome itself is. On this view, discriminating against people is similar to having an incompetent person judge an ice-skating competition: just as the incompetent judging taints the process by which places are awarded in the competition, discrimination taints the process by which opportunities and other social goods get distributed among the members of society.

However, one can understand indirect discrimination as involving process-based wrongs, although the wrongs do not necessarily occur at the retail level of the practical reasoning of specific agents. Consider the structural form of indirect discrimination. Disproportionately disadvantageous outcomes do not, by themselves, amount to structural discrimination, even when those outcomes fall on the shoulders of the members of a salient social group such as women or racial or religious minorities. There must also be a linkage between membership in the group and the disadvantageous outcomes: group membership must help explain why the disproportionately disadvantageous outcomes fall where they do. This explanation will proceed at the wholesale level of macro-social facts about the population and the various groups that constitute it. But the requirement of a linkage shows that how the disproportionate outcomes are brought about is essential to the existence of structural discrimination. There must be social processes at work that, as Sunstein puts its, “turn differences that are both highly visible and irrelevant from the moral point of view into systematic social disadvantages” (1994: 2429). It is true that the differences do not need to be literally visible; they need only be socially salient. But the main point is that there is something morally wrong with social processes that consistently but avoidably turn such differences into relative disadvantages for the members of salient groups, such as women or racial or religious groups. A parallel is thereby established with direct discrimination, in which there is something morally wrong with a practical-reasoning process that treats sex, race, or religion as grounds for treating persons as having a degraded or diminished moral status.

With the non-structural form of indirect discrimination, the parallel to the wrong of direct discrimination is even stronger, because the morally flawed process does occur at the retail level. Consider the Griggs case. The company’s decision to use certain exams to determine promotions contributed to the unjust disadvantages suffered by blacks from structural and direct discrimination. Yet, the use of the exams was apparently not necessary to determine who could best perform the jobs in question or to meet any other legitimate purpose of the business. It is plausible to say, then, that the company’s decision process wrongly counted for nothing the promotion policy’s contribution to the perpetuation and even exacerbation of unjust disadvantages from which blacks already suffered. This process-based wrong is at the level of a specific agent, albeit a collective agent. The difference with direct discrimination is that it is a moral failure of omission, i.e., failing to count for something the impact of the promotion policy on blacks, rather than a failure of commission, such as deliberately excluding blacks from better-paying positions. In either case, though, an agent has engaged in a morally flawed process of practical reasoning in which the flaw concerns the role that considerations of salient group membership play.

There is a case to be made, then, that the wrongs of indirect discrimination, structural and non-structural, are importantly parallel to those of direct discrimination. For that reason, it can be argued that direct and indirect discrimination are usefully conceived as different versions of the same moral wrong, viz., discrimination in general, and that the term ‘indirect discrimination’ is a valuable part of our moral vocabulary.

5. Which Groups Count?

Discrimination wrongfully imposes relative disadvantages or deprivations on persons based on their membership in some salient social group. But which salient groups count for the purpose of determining whether an act is an act of discrimination? This question is at the heart of many heated political and legal disputes, such as the controversy over gay marriage. The question is also central to a question that is less politically prominent than such disputes but which has important political and philosophical implications. The question is whether the members of socially dominant groups can, in principle, be victims of discrimination. It is sometimes said that, in the United States and other Western countries, whites cannot really be discriminated against on account of their race, because whites are the socially dominant racial group whose members are systematically advantaged by their being white. Thus, in his account of racial discrimination, Thomas Scanlon acknowledges that his view entails that, in the U.S., at least, whites can discriminate against blacks but not vice-versa. He holds that discrimination is “unidirectional, [applying] only to actions that disadvantage members of a group that has been subject to widespread denigrations and exclusion.” This implication derives from his claim that it is “crucial to racial discrimination … that the prejudicial judgments it involves are not just the idiosyncratic attitudes of a particular agent but are widely shared in the society in question and commonly expressed and acted on in ways that have serious consequences” (2008: 73–74). The idea that discrimination is unidirectional is also implied by Owen Fiss’s understanding of discrimination in terms of “the perpetual subordination” of “specially disadvantaged groups …[whose] political power is severely circumscribed” (1976: 154–155).

Although is it undeniable that the members of socially dominant groups typically enjoy a host of unfair advantages, it seems mistaken to conclude from this fact that such persons cannot be victims of discrimination. Even if any disadvantages that might be imposed on them based on their group membership are too small to outweigh the sum total of the unfair advantages that they enjoy, it still does not follow that the members of socially dominant groups cannot be discriminated against by others in society. And even though the members of dominant groups enjoy many unfair advantages, it is possible, for example, for them to be wronged by some agent deliberately imposing on them disadvantages because of their race, religion, or some similar consideration. Thus, direct discrimination against whites because they are white is possible in a white-dominated society: non-whites can wrongfully deny them opportunities such as a job or a place of residence, based on their being white, even when almost all of the direct racial discrimination in the society is perpetrated by whites against non-whites. The same is true with respect to indirect discrimination: even if whites in a certain society constitute a dominant group, individual whites might confront indirect discrimination in the form of policies that unjustly, though unintentionally, disadvantage them on account of their race.

The concept of discrimination itself places no substantive restrictions on which salient social groups could, in principle, count for purposes of determining whether an act is an act of discrimination. Thus, suppose there were some society and historical context such that a) the length of one’s thumb determined membership in some salient social group, b) it was wrong to impose a disadvantage on a person based on membership in a certain thumb-length group, and c) the wrongness was due to the fact that the imposition was based on membership in the thumb-length group. In such a scenario, thumb-length groups would count in determining which acts were acts of discrimination. Put another way, the fact that, in our society and its historical context, thumb length does not count, but race and religion do count, is not because the concept of discrimination includes race and religion, while excluding thumb length. Rather, it is because the formal elements of the concept of discrimination are properly specified—or made more concrete—in terms of race and religion (among other categories), given our social and historical context, while those elements are not properly specified in terms of thumb length, given that same context.

Perhaps the most heated of contemporary debates over the question of which social groups count for purposes of determining whether an act is an act of discrimination are the debates concerning sexual orientation. Many persons hold the view that it is discrimination whenever gays and lesbians are denied the same set of legal rights and powers that heterosexual persons have, but others reject such a view. Philosophers and political theorists can be found on both sides of this divide, although the predominant view among such thinkers is that it is discriminatory to deny gays and lesbians the same legal rights and powers as heterosexuals. (Macedo, 1996; Corvino, 2005; and, dissenting, Finnis, 1997) The debate is ultimately one of moral principle, resting on the question of whether government wrongs gays and lesbians if it denies them any such rights or powers. The concept of discrimination cannot, by itself, settle the question, because the concept only tells us that it is properly applied to the imposition of wrongful disadvantages on account of salient group membership. The concept does not specify whether it is wrongful to impose disadvantages on persons on account of their sexual orientation. Substantive moral reasoning is needed to address the question concerning wrongfulness.

6. What Good is the Concept of Discrimination?

The concept of discrimination picks out a kind of moral wrong that is a function of the salient social group membership of the person wronged: persons are treated as though they had diminished or degraded moral status on account of their group membership, or they are, because of their group membership and the relative disadvantages that they suffer due to that membership, made vulnerable to domination and oppression. But why have such a concept? Why not simply have the concepts of domination, oppression, and degrading treatment, abstracting from whether or not the reasons for such wrongs involve group membership?

Until the middle of the 19th century, critical moral reflection and discussion proceeded largely without the concept of discrimination. But over the course of the first half of the 20th century, moral reflection became increasingly sensitive to the fact that many, even most, of the large-scale injustices in history had a group-based structure: certain members of society were identified by others as belonging to a particular salient group; the group members were consistently denigrated and demeaned by the rest of society and by its official organs; and many serious relative disadvantages connected to this denigration and demeaning, such as material deprivation and extreme restrictions on liberty, were imposed on the members of the denigrated group. It is this historical reality, apparently deeply rooted in human social life, that gives the concept of discrimination its point and its usefulness. The concept highlights the group-structure, and the relative deprivations built around this structure, that are exhibited by many of the worst systematic wrongs that humans inflict on one another.

At the same time, the group structure of these injustices does not mean that the group as such is the party that is wronged; rather, the wrongs are ultimately wrongs to the individual persons making up the group. Accordingly, the concept of discrimination has become a useful tool for representing many serious wrongs, while avoiding the implication that these wrongs are ultimately done to the groups as such.

However, this understanding of the significance of the concept of discrimination is challenged by Young, who claims that the concept is inadequate for capturing group-based wrongs. She argues that the concept “tends to present the injustices groups suffer as aberrant, the exception rather than the rule.” Accordingly, she contends that “[i]f one focuses on discrimination as the primary wrong that groups suffer, then the more profound wrongs of exploitation, marginalization, powerlessness, cultural imperialism, and violence that we still suffer go undiscussed and unaddressed.” (1990: 196–97)

Nonetheless, Young’s understanding of discrimination seems to rest on some misconceptions. First, the concept of discrimination does not, strictly speaking, present injustices as ones that groups suffer. The injustices are suffered by the members of the group and not by the group as such. This point might seem to play into Young’s hand, as one might infer from it that the idea of discrimination cannot capture injustices that are systemic rather than aberrant, the rule rather than the exception. But such an inference would be mistaken, and that mistake leads to a second misconception in Young’s account. Discrimination against the members of a group can be, and often is, systemic. The reason is that wrongs against individuals on account of their group membership typically are not aberrant but form broad social patterns. Accordingly, the idea of discrimination can capture the profound systemic wrongs to which Young refers, while preserving the key moral thought that the wrongs are done to individuals. At the same time, Young is right insofar as she is claiming that exploitation, powerlessness, and her other profound wrongs do not necessarily have a component involving direct discrimination. The claim is important, because the failure to appreciate it would incline one to think mistakenly that, to the extent that direct discrimination recedes, so must exploitation, powerlessness and so on. Accordingly, if direct discrimination recedes, the profound injustices referred to by Young could persist with their present force or even grow worse.

7. Intersectionality

Kimberlé Crenshaw (1998) introduced the idea of intersectionality in her account of the distinctive form of discrimination faced by black women. Intersectionality refers to the fact that one and the same person can belong to several distinct groups, each of whose members are victimized by widespread discrimination. This overlapping membership can generate experiences of discrimination that are very different from those of persons who belong to just one, or the other, of the groups. Thus, Crenshaw argues that “any analysis that does not take intersectionality into account cannot sufficiently address the particular manner in which Black women are subordinated” (1998: 315).

Crenshaw’s idea of intersectionality applies beyond race and gender to cover any social groups against which discrimination is directed: discrimination is inflected in different ways depending on the particular combination of social groups to which those persons discriminated against belong. And one implication of intersectionality is that the disadvantages suffered by some persons who are discriminated against on account of belonging to a certain group might be offset, partially or fully, by advantages those same persons gain by being discriminated in favor of due to their belonging to other groups. As Crenshaw notes, women who are wealthy and white are “race- and class-privileged,” even as they are disadvantaged by their gender. (1998: 314)

The idea of intersectionality threatens to destabilize the concept of discrimination. The idea highlights what is problematic about any account of discrimination that abstracts from how different salient identities converge to shape the experiences of persons. But, taken to the hilt, the idea of intersectionality might appear to undermine any feasible account of discrimination. Reflection on Crenshaw’s own intersectional account illustrates the point: she examines the intersection of race and gender but abstracts from other salient social identities, such as disability status, sexual orientation, and religion. Any of those additional identities can and do converge with race and gender to form distinctive experiences of discrimination, and so abstracting from those identities seems problematic from the perspective that the idea of intersectionality opens to us. Yet, no feasible treatment can take into account all of those identities and the many more socially salient identities that persons have in contemporary societies.

Nonetheless, judgments about discrimination can and do reveal genuine wrongs that persons suffer due to their salient group membership and expose actual patterns of disadvantage and deprivation that amount to systemic injustices against the members of certain salient groups. It is not necessary to take account of everything relevant to a phenomenon in order to understand and represent important aspects of it. Thus, notwithstanding the complications introduced by intersectionality, judgments about direct and indirect discrimination can tell us something important about who is wrongfully disfavored, and who wrongfully favored, by the actions of individual and collective agents and by the rules of society’s major institutions.

8. Religious Liberty and Antidiscrimination Laws

Like the right against discrimination, the right of religious liberty is enshrined in many domestic and international legal documents. Yet, the two rights often seem to be in conflict with each other. For claims of religious liberty are frequently made by persons who wish to engage in activities that appear to amount to discrimination. Of particular importance are cases in which religious institutions and religiously-motivated individuals claim to be exempt from the requirements of antidiscrimination laws.

Claims of religious exemption to antidiscrimination laws have recently become the center of political and legal controversy in the U.S. as a result of the Obergefell case, in which the Supreme Court found a constitutional right to same-sex marriage. However, questions regarding the legal and moral validity of religious exemptions to such laws extend well beyond the issue of same-sex marriage. Moreover, many liberal thinkers who support antidiscrimination laws balk at the idea that the laws ought to be applied willy-nilly to all religious institutions and religiously-motivated persons (Barry 2001: 174–76; Eisgruber and Sager 2007: 65; Greenawalt 1998: 118; Nussbaum 1999: 114; and Galston 2002: 111).

Among the strongest claims for a religious exemption from such laws are those involving the so-called “ministerial exception.” In these cases, ministers, priests, and others who work for a religious institution are hired (or fired) in a way that discriminates against persons on the basis sex, sexual orientation, disability, race, or some other category standardly found in laws prohibiting discrimination. An organization’s hiring of persons to perform spiritual functions on the basis of their religion is a clearly valid exception to laws that prohibit discrimination on account of religion: religious liberty would be a sham if religious groups were barred from using religion as a ground for choosing persons to lead worship services, perform sacraments, and the like. But what about the use of race, disability, sex, and sexual orientation as a basis for the choice?

In the Hosanna-Tabor case (2012), the U.S. Supreme Court unanimously held that there was a ministerial exception under the Constitution, immunizing religious organizations from claims of employment discrimination when it came to certain jobs. Although the Court left it unclear who counted as a “minister,” priests, rabbis, and imams would clearly count as such, and so the Catholic Church, orthodox Jewish synagogues, and Islamic mosques are immune to sex-discrimination lawsuits for not permitting women to serve in those roles. Additionally, the employee in Hosanna-Tabor was a teacher, a role that the Court counted as “ministerial,” and various lower U.S. courts have held that the ministerial exception applies to a wide-range of employees of religious institutions, including school principals, music directors, and organists. Importantly, under the exception, religious organizations cannot be legally required to show that its employment decisions with respect to ministerial positions conform to the values and doctrines of the organization. Such decisions are thereby immunized from judicial scrutiny.

The ministerial exception has its critics. Leslie Griffin contends that the exception “supposedly protects religious freedom” but that, in fact it “stands for the proposition that religious institutions are not required to obey the law, even at the expense of the civil rights of their religious employees” (2013: 992). Griffin argues that the exception has been applied in an unduly broad range of employees by U.S. courts and that it is not needed to protect religious institutions from being legally compelled to ordain certain persons when it is against their doctrines to do so. Key to her argument is the legal category known in the U.S. as “Bonafide Occupational Qualification (BFOQ).“ Under the category, employers are permitted to discriminate (in the nonmoral sense) on the basis of an otherwise prohibited category if such discrimination is reasonably necessary to normal operation of their] business. (A similar legal category exists in other liberal democracies). For example, a mandatory retirement age is ordinarily illegal under U.S. laws prohibiting age discrimination but is permitted for airline pilots, because being under a certain age is regarded as a BFOQ for that job. Griffin claims that the Catholic Church “could easily prove” (1017) that being a man is a BFOQ for the priesthood.

However, even though the Catholic Church could make such a case, we still can ask: why should the law allow the Church to restrict ordination to men? Why would it be wrong to change the law, so that the Church would not be permitted to invoke a BFOQ defense of its restriction of the priesthood to men? Griffin (2013: 1019) and other legal thinkers (Eisgruber and Sager 2007: 65) have suggested that the answer involves a principle that protects the liberty of persons to form associations that express their common values and beliefs. However, this principle of expressive association cannot explain why, among all expressive associations, only religious ones should have their employment decisions immunized from judicial scrutiny (Laborde 2014: 71).

Under U.S. constitutional doctrine, religious organizations and religiously-motivated conduct have a special status denied to groups and conduct of a secular character. However, this special status has been challenged on grounds of fairness, and it is unclear what considerations of moral principle could justify the status. Leiter (2013) has argued, for example, that the moral principle of religious liberty is best understood as an instance of a deeper and more general principle that requires the toleration of another’s conscientious convictions, whether those convictions are religious or secular.

Yet, once the more general principle is accepted, it is reasonable to worry about whether antidiscrimination (and other) laws would be undermined, and equality under law subverted, by a flood of exceptions. One way to respond to this potential problem is to argue that there is no violation of the principle requiring toleration for a person’s conscience when government fails to exempt a person who wishes to act on her conscience in a way that violates an otherwise valid law. This response effectively denies any conscience-based exceptions. Leiter comes close to taking this position: “The No Exemptions approach to claims of conscience (or at least to claims of conscience that are burden-shifting), religious or otherwise, is the one most consistent with fairness” (130). The parenthetical clause registers Leiter’s recognition that “exemptions from generally applicable laws often impose burdens [or risks] on those who have no claim of exemption” (99). His view disqualifies all claims of exemption that create such burdens.

Exceptions to antidiscrimination laws seem to be cases where burdens are imposed on third-parties and so would be disqualified by Leiter’s approach. For example, establishing the equal status of women in society is made more difficult by the fact that certain religious groups exclude women from positions of spiritual leadership. The logical consequence of Leiter’s view, then, is that those groups have no valid claim to an exemption from laws against sex discrimination. Notice that an appeal to the BFOQ doctrine to justify an exemption here would be unavailing, as Leiter’s argument aims to capture the morality of exemptions and not to simply reflect existing legal doctrine. The Catholic Church and orthodox Jewish congregations have defined their positions of leadership in a way that excludes women, but the No Exemption view is that those organizations have no morally valid claim to be exempt from antidiscrimination laws for that reason.

Leiter’s position stands in sharp contrast, not only with existing legal doctrine in the U.S. and many other countries, but with the dominant view of legal philosophers who have taken up the issue. Yet, the arguments for the dominant view remain rather undeveloped, as is illustrated by William Galston’s remarks: “While we may regret the exclusion of women from the Catholic priesthood and from the rabbinate of Orthodox Judaism, I take it that we would agree that otherwise binding antidiscrimination laws should not be invoked to end these practices…. [R]eligious associations (and perhaps others as well) enjoy considerable authority within their own sphere to determine their own affairs” (2002: 11). Most of “us” would likely agree that exemptions should be given in such cases, but some of us would not do so. (Aside from Leiter, see, for example, Rutherford 1996: 1123–24). An argument against the No Exemption view is needed.

In rejecting the view, Martha Nussbaum argues that “it seems illiberal to hold that practices internal to the conduct of the religious body itself—the choice of priests, the regulations concerning articles of clothing—must always be brought into line with a secular liberal understanding of the ultimate good” (1999: 113–14). However, Leiter’s account distinguishes between choosing only men for the priesthood and regulating clothing: the former imposes burdens on third-parties and so should not be exempted, while the latter typically does not involve burden-shifting. On the No Exemption view, regulating clothing is illiberal in that it unjustifiably restricts liberty, but applying antidiscrimination laws across the board is required by liberal principles. And if one objects to the No Exemption view that it is simply not feasible to force Churches or synagogues to appoint women as spiritual leaders, then Rutherford replies that religious institutions can and should be subject to private lawsuits for financial damages in cases where a person is denied a position in violation of antidiscrimination laws (Rutherford 1996: 1125–26).

At this stage, the philosophical literature on valid religious (or other conscientious) exemptions remains sparse. Much work remains to be done. At the same time, there is a rich discussion, proceeding at a more concrete level than what is characteristic of philosophical thought, to be found among judicial opinions and legal analyses examining particular systems of law. (But for a philosophical discussion that does engage with concrete legal details, see Nussbaum 2008). And although the literature dealing with U.S. law is the most extensive, an important line of analysis has emerged from cases involving European law.

Under European legal systems, religious institutions have less robust immunity from antidiscrimination lawsuits than they do under American law. Although the autonomy rights of religious institutions are recognized and the Catholic Church would certainly not be required to ordain women, there is no distinct legal doctrine in Europe creating an American-style ministerial exception. Svensson asserts that E.U. law “leaves no space for blanket exceptions” (2015: 241) of the sort found in the U.S., but the assertion is a bit of an overstatement, because there is a “blanket exception” for the hiring of priests and other positions of spiritual leadership. For example, in a leading British case, the court held that a pastor’s relation to his Church was “not contractual or enforceable“ (quoted in Ahdar and Lee 2005: 296).

Still, valid exceptions to the law for religious organizations are construed narrowly in Europe. While U.S. doctrine has extended the ministerial exception to cover many lay positions, such an extension goes farther than what is found in European law. Thus, in the U.K, “a lay person may be employed by a religious body to perform wholly or mainly spiritual functions but will undoubtedly be treated as an employee with full legal protection, despite the effect on religious autonomy” (Ahdar and Leigh 2005: 297; emphasis in original).

Moreover, in contrast to U.S. law, European human-right law places a substantial burden of argument on religious institutions claiming that their autonomy would be violated by applying to them laws regulating employment decisions. The opinion of the European Court of Human Rights in Fernández Martínez v. Spain(2014), a case involving the termination of priest hired to teach Roman Catholicism in a state-run school, illustrates the difference between U.S. and European law (even though the case was decided under privacy rather than antidiscrimination norms).

Under Spanish law, the local diocese plays a key role in the hiring teachers of Catholicism in state-run schools, and the diocese in Fernández Martínez had decided to terminate the plaintiff’s employment. The Court held that “the principle of religious autonomy prevents the State from obliging a religious community to admit or exclude an individual or to entrust someone with a particular religious duty … [and] as a consequence of their autonomy, religious communities can demand a certain degree of loyalty from those working for them or representing them” (paras.129 and 131). But the Court also ruled that a religious community bore a burden of argument when a terminated employee brought suit against it: the community “must … show, in the light of the circumstances of the individual case, that the risk alleged [to its autonomy] is probable and substantial and that the impugned interference with the right [of the employee] … does not go beyond what is necessary to eliminate that risk and does not serve any other purpose unrelated to the exercise of the religious community’s autonomy” (para. 132). Under U.S. law, a religious institution would not need to make such a showing: if an employee’s job fits into one of the “ministerial” categories, then there is no legal inquiry into the facts of the case, because the institution is immune to any lawsuit charging discrimination in connection with that job.

9. Conclusion

The concept of discrimination provides an explicit way of thinking about a certain kind of wrong that can be found in virtually every society and era. The wrong involves a group-based structure that works in combination with relative deprivations built around the structure. The deprivations are wrongful because they treat persons as having a degraded moral status, but also because the deprivations tend to make members of the group in question vulnerable to domination and oppression at the hands of those who occupy positions of relative advantage. It is true that there has been confusion attending the concept of discrimination, and there will long be debates about the best way to understand and apply it. However, the concept of discrimination has proved to be a useful one, at the national and international levels, for representing in thought and combating in action a kind of wrong that is deeply entrenched in human social relations.


Legal Cases and Documents

  • Abdulaziz et al. v. U.K. European Court of Human Rights, App. No. 9214/80; decided 28 May 1985. [Available online]
  • Brown v. Board of Education 347 U.S. 483 (1954). [Available online]
  • Civil Rights Act of 1866. [Available online]
  • Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination Against Women (CEDAW). [Available online]
  • Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Racial Discrimination. (CERD) [Available online]
  • European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights. [Available online]
  • Fernández Martínez v. Spain. European Court of Human Rights, App. No. 56030/07; decided 12 June 2014. [Available online]
  • Griggs v. Duke Power 401 U.S. 424 (1974). [Available online]
  • Hosanna-Tabor v. EEOC 565 U.S. 1. (2012). [Available online]
  • Obergefell v. Hodges 576 U.S. ___ (2015). [Available online]
  • Shanaghan v. U.K. European Court of Human Rights, App. No. 37715/97; decided 4 May 2001. [Available online]
  • United States v. Virginia 518 U.S. 515 (1996), [Available online]


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