Multiculturalism

First published Fri Sep 24, 2010

Multiculturalism is a body of thought in political philosophy about the proper way to respond to cultural and religious diversity. Mere toleration of group differences is said to fall short of treating members of minority groups as equal citizens; recognition and positive accommodation of group differences are required through “group-differentiated rights,” a term coined by Will Kymlicka (1995). Some group-differentiated rights are held by individual members of minority groups, as in the case of individuals who are granted exemptions from generally applicable laws in virtue of their religious beliefs or individuals who seek language accommodations in schools or in voting. Other group-differentiated rights are held by the group qua group rather by its members severally; such rights are properly called group rights, as in the case of indigenous groups and minority nations, who claim the right of self-determination. In the latter respect, multiculturalism is closely allied with nationalism.

While multiculturalism has been used as an umbrella term to characterize the moral and political claims of a wide range of disadvantaged groups, including African Americans, women, gays and lesbians, and the disabled, most theorists of multiculturalism tend to focus their arguments on immigrants who are ethnic and religious minorities (e.g. Latinos in the U.S., Muslims in Western Europe), minority nations (e.g. Catalans, Basque, Welsh, Québécois), and indigenous peoples (e.g. Native peoples in North America, Maori in New Zealand).

1. The claims of multiculturalism

Multiculturalism is closely associated with “identity politics,” “the politics of difference,” and “the politics of recognition,” all of which share a commitment to revaluing disrespected identities and changing dominant patterns of representation and communication that marginalize certain groups (Young 1990, Taylor 1992, Gutmann 2003). Multiculturalism is also a matter of economic interests and political power; it demands remedies to economic and political disadvantages that people suffer as a result of their minority status.

Multiculturalists take for granted that it is “culture” and “cultural groups” that are to be recognized and accommodated. Yet multicultural claims include a wide range of claims involving religion, language, ethnicity, nationality, and race. Culture is a notoriously overbroad concept, and all of these categories have been subsumed by or equated with the concept of culture (Song 2008). Language and religion are at the heart of many claims for cultural accommodation by immigrants. The key claim made by minority nations is for self-government rights. Race has a more limited role in multicultural discourse. Antiracism and multiculturalism are distinct but related ideas: the former highlights “victimization and resistance” whereas the latter highlights “cultural life, cultural expression, achievements, and the like” (Blum 1992, 14). Claims for recognition in the context of multicultural education are demands not just for recognition of aspects of a group's actual culture (e.g. African American art and literature) but also for the history of group subordination and its concomitant experience (Gooding-Williams 1998).

Examples of cultural accommodations or “group-differentiated rights” include exemptions from generally applicable law (e.g. religious exemptions), assistance to do things that the majority can do unassisted (e.g. multilingual ballots, funding for minority language schools and ethnic associations, affirmative action), representation of minorities in government bodies (e.g. ethnic quotas for party lists or legislative seats, minority-majority Congressional districts), recognition of traditional legal codes by the dominant legal system (e.g. granting jurisdiction over family law to religious courts), or limited self-government rights (e.g. qualified recognition of tribal sovereignty and federal arrangements recognizing the political autonomy of Quebec) (for a helpful classification of cultural rights, see Levy 1997).

Typically, a group-differentiated right is a right of a minority group (or a member of such a group) to act or not act in a certain way in accordance with their religious obligations and/or cultural commitments. In some cases, it is a right that directly restricts the freedom of non-members in order to protect the minority group's culture, as in the case of restrictions on the use of the English language in Quebec. When the right-holder is the group, the right may protect group rules that restrict the freedom of individual members, as in the case of the Pueblo membership rule that excludes the children of women who marry outside the group.

2. Justifications for multiculturalism

2.1 Communitarian

One justification for multiculturalism arises out of the communitarian critique of liberalism. Liberals are ethical individualists; they insist that individuals should be free to choose and pursue their own conceptions of the good life. They give primacy to individual rights and liberties over community life and collective goods. Some liberals are also individualists when it comes to social ontology (what some call methodological individualism or atomism). Atomists believe that you can and should account for social actions and social goods in terms of properties of the constituent individuals and individual goods. The target of the communitarian critique of liberalism is not so much liberal ethics as liberal social ontology. Communitarians reject the idea that the individual is prior to the community, and that the value of social goods can be reduced to their contribution to individual well-being. They instead embrace ontological holism, which views social goods as “irreducibly social” (Taylor 1995). This holist view of collective identities and cultures underlies Charles Taylor's normative case for a multicultural “politics of recognition” (1992). Diverse cultural identities and languages are irreducibly social goods, which should be presumed to be of equal worth. The recognition of the equal worth of diverse cultures requires replacing the traditional liberal regime of identical liberties and opportunities for all citizens with a scheme of special rights for minority cultural groups.

2.2 Liberal egalitarian

A second justification for multiculturalism comes from within liberalism. Will Kymlicka has developed the most influential theory of multiculturalism based on the liberal values of autonomy and equality (Kymlicka 1989, 1995, 2001). Culture is said to be instrumentally valuable to individuals, for two reasons. First, it enables individual autonomy. One important condition of autonomy is having an adequate range of options from which to choose. Cultures provide contexts of choice, which provide and make meaningful the social scripts and narratives from which people fashion their lives (cf. Appiah 2005). Second, culture is instrumentally valuable for individual self-respect. Drawing on theorists of communitarianism and nationalism, Kymlicka argues that there is a deep and general connection between a person's self-respect and the respect accorded to the cultural group of which she is a part. It is not simply membership in any culture but one's own culture that must be secured because of the great difficulty of giving it up.

Kymlicka moves from these premises about the instrumental value of cultural membership to the egalitarian claim that because members of minority groups are disadvantaged in terms of access to their own cultures (in contrast to members of the majority culture), they are entitled to special protections. It is worth noting that Kymlicka's liberal egalitarian argument for cultural accommodations reflects a central idea of a broader body of what critics of the view have identified as “luck egalitarianism” (Anderson 1999, Scheffler 2003). Luck egalitarians argue that individuals should be held responsible for inequalities resulting from their own choices, but not for inequalities deriving from unchosen circumstances. The latter inequalities are the collective responsibility of citizens to redress. Kymlicka suggests that the inequality stemming from membership in a minority culture is unchosen (just as the inequality stemming from one's native talents and social starting position in life are unchosen). Insofar as inequality in access to cultural membership stems from luck and not from one's own choices, members of minority groups can reasonably demand that members of the majority culture share in bearing the costs of accommodation. Minority group rights are justified, as Kymlicka argues, “within a liberal egalitarian theory…which emphasizes the importance of rectifying unchosen inequalities” (Kymlicka 1995, 109).

One might question whether cultural minority groups really are “disadvantaged” or suffer a serious inequality. Why not just enforce antidiscrimination laws, stopping short of any positive accommodations for minority groups? Kymlicka and other liberal theorists of multiculturalism contend that antidiscrimination laws fall short of treating members of minority groups as equals; this is because states cannot be neutral with respect to culture. In culturally diverse societies, we can easily find patterns of state support for some cultural groups over others. While states may prohibit racial discrimination and avoid official establishment of religion, they cannot avoid establishing one language for public schooling and other state services (language being a paradigmatic marker of culture) (Kymlicka 1995, 111; Carens 2000, 77–78; Patten 2001, 693). Cultural or linguistic advantage can translate into economic and political advantage since members of the dominant cultural community have a leg up in schools, the workplace, and politics. Cultural advantage also takes a symbolic form. When state action extends symbolic affirmation to some groups and not others in establishing the state language and public symbols ad holidays, it has a normalizing effect, suggesting that one group's language and customs are more valued than those of other groups.

In addition to state support of certain cultures over others, state laws may place constraints on some cultural groups over others. Consider the case of dress code regulations in public schools or the workplace. A ban on religious dress burdens religious individuals, as in the case of Simcha Goldman, a U.S. Air Force officer, who was also an ordained rabbi and wished to wear a yarmulke out of respect to an omnipresent God (Goldman v. Weinberger, 475 US 503 (1986)). The case of the French state's ban on religious dress in public schools, which burdens Muslim girls who wish to wear headscarves to school, is another example (Bowen 2007, Laborde 2008). Religion may command that believers dress in a certain way (what Peter Jones calls an “intrinsic burden”), not that believers refrain from attending school or going to work (Jones 1994). Yet, burdens on believers do not stem from the dictates of religion alone; they also arise from the intersection of the demands of religion and the demands of the state (“extrinsic burden”). While intrinsic burdens are not of collective concern (bearing the burdens of the dictates of one's faith—prayer, worship, fasting—is an obligation of faith), when it comes to extrinsic burdens, liberal multiculturalists argue that assisting cultural minorities through exemptions and accommodations is what egalitarian justice requires.

While offered as a general normative argument for minority cultural groups, liberal multiculturalists distinguish among different types of groups. For instance, Kymlicka's theory of liberal multiculturalism offers the strongest form of group-differentiated rights—self-government rights—to indigenous peoples and national minorities because their minority status is unchosen; they were coercively incorporated into the larger state. In contrast, immigrants are viewed as voluntary economic migrants who chose to relinquish access to their native culture by migrating. Immigrant multiculturalism (what Kymlicka calls “polyethnic rights”) is understood as a demand for fairer terms of integration through mostly temporary measures (e.g. exemptions, bilingual education) and not a rejection of integration (Kymlicka 1995, 113–115).

2.3 Postcolonial

Lastly, some philosophers have looked beyond liberalism in arguing for multiculturalism. This is especially true of theorists writing from a postcolonial perspective. The case for tribal sovereignty rests not simply on premises about the value of tribal culture and membership, but also on what is owed to Native peoples for the historical injustices perpetrated against them. Reckoning with history is crucial. Proponents of indigenous sovereignty emphasize the importance of understanding indigenous claims against the historical background of the denial of equal sovereign status of indigenous groups, the dispossession of their lands, and the destruction of their cultural practices (Ivison 2006, Ivison et al. 2000, Moore 2005, Simpson 2000). This background calls into question the legitimacy of the state's authority over aboriginal peoples and provides a prima facie case for special rights and protections for indigenous groups, including the right of self-government.

A postcolonial perspective also seeks to develop models of constitutional and political dialogue that recognize culturally distinct ways of speaking and acting. Multicultural societies consist of diverse religious and moral outlooks, and if liberal societies are to take such diversity seriously, they must recognize that liberalism is just one of many substantive outlooks based on a specific view of man and society. Liberalism is not free of culture but expresses a distinctive culture of its own. This observation applies not only across territorial boundaries between liberal and nonliberal states, but also within liberal states and its relations with nonliberal minorities. As Bhikhu Parekh argues, liberal theory cannot provide an impartial framework governing relations between different cultural communities (2000). He argues instead for a more open model of intercultural dialogue in which a liberal society's constitutional and legal values serve as the initial starting point for cross-cultural dialogue while also being open to contestation. James Tully surveys the language of historical and contemporary constitutionalism with a focus on Western state's relations with Native peoples to uncover more inclusive bases for intercultural dialogue (1995).

3. Critique of multiculturalism

3.1 Cosmopolitan view of culture

Some critics contend that the multicultural argument for the preservation of cultures is premised on a problematic view of culture and of the individual's relationship to culture. Cultures are not distinct, self-contained wholes; they have long interacted and influenced one another through war, imperialism, trade, and migration. People in many parts of the world live within cultures that are already cosmopolitan, characterized by cultural hybridity. As Jeremy Waldron (1995, 100) argues, “We live in a world formed by technology and trade; by economic, religious, and political imperialism and their offspring; by mass migration and the dispersion of cultural influences. In this context, to immerse oneself in the traditional practices of, say, an aboriginal culture might be a fascinating anthropological experiment, but it involves an artificial dislocation from what actually is going on in the world.” To aim at preserving or protecting a culture runs the risk of privileging one allegedly pure version of that culture, thereby crippling its ability to adapt to changes in circumstances (Waldron 1995, 110; see also Benhabib 2002 and Scheffler 2007). Waldron also rejects the premise that the options available to an individual must come from a particular culture; meaningful options may come from a variety of cultural sources. What people need are cultural materials, not access to a particular cultural structure.

In response, multicultural theorists agree that cultures are overlapping and interactive, but still maintain that individuals belong to distinct societal cultures and wish to preserve these cultures (Kymlicka 1995, 103). The justifications for special protections for minority cultural groups discussed above still hold, even in the face of a more cosmopolitan view of cultures, for the aim of group-differentiated rights is to empower members of minority groups to continue their distinctive practices if they wish to.

3.2 Toleration requires indifference, not accommodation

A second major criticism of multiculturalism is based on the ideas of liberal toleration and freedom of association and conscience. If we take these ideas seriously and accept both ontological and ethical individualism as discussed above, then we are led to defend the individual's right to form and leave associations and not any special protections for groups. As Chandran Kukathas (1995, 2003) argues, there are no group rights, only individual rights. By granting cultural groups special protections and rights, the state oversteps its role, which is to secure civility, and risks undermining individual rights of association. States should not pursue “cultural integration” or “cultural engineering” but rather a “politics of indifference” toward minority groups (2003, 15). The major limitation of this laissez-faire approach is that groups that do not themselves value toleration and freedom of association (including the right to dissociate or exit a group) may practice internal discrimination against group members, and the state would have little authority to interfere in such associations. This benign neglect approach would permit the abuse of vulnerable members of groups (the problem of internal minorities discussed below), tolerating “communities which bring up children unschooled and illiterate; which enforce arranged marriages; which deny conventional medical care to their members (including children); and which inflict cruel and ‘ununsual’ punishment” (Kukathas 2003, 134).

3.3 Diversion from a “politics of redistribution”

A third line of critique contends that multiculturalism is a “politics of recognition” that diverts attention from a “politics of redistribution” (Barry 2001, Fraser and Honneth 2003). We can distinguish analytically between these modes of politics: a politics of recognition challenges status inequality and the remedy it seeks is cultural and symbolic change, whereas a politics of redistribution challenges economic inequality and exploitation and the remedy it seeks is economic restructuring. Working class mobilization tilts toward the redistribution end of the spectrum, and the LGBT movement toward the recognition end. Critics worry that multiculturalism's focus on culture and identity diverts attention from or even actively undermines the struggle for economic justice, partly because identity-based politics may undermine potential multiracial, multiethnic class solidarity and partly because some multiculturalists tend to focus on cultural injustice without much attention to economic injustice.

In response, multiculturalists emphasize that both redistribution and recognition are important dimensions in the pursuit of equality for minority groups. In practice, both modes of politics—addressing material disadvantages and marginalized identities and statuses—are required to achieve greater equality across lines of race, ethnicity, nationality, religion, sexuality, and class, not least because many individuals stand at the intersection of these different categories and suffer multiple forms of marginalization. Most egalitarians are focused on redistribution, but recognition is also important not only on account of its effects on socioeconomic status and political participation but also for fostering the symbolic inclusion of marginalized groups.

3.4 Egalitarian objection

A fourth objection takes issue with liberal multiculturalist's understanding of what equality requires. Brian Barry argues that religious and cultural minorities should be held responsible for bearing the consequences of their own beliefs and practices. He contrasts religious and cultural affiliations with physical disabilities and argues that the former do not constrain people in the way that physical disabilities do. A physical disability supports a strong prima facie claim to compensation because it limits a person's opportunities to engage in activities that others are able to engage in. In contrast, religion and culture may shape one's willingness to seize an opportunity, but they do not affect whether one has an opportunity. Barry argues that justice is only concerned with ensuring a reasonable range of equal opportunities and not with ensuring equal access to any particular choices or outcomes (2001, 37). When it comes to cultural and religious affiliations, they do not limit the range of opportunities one enjoys but rather the choices one can make within the set of opportunities available to all.

In reply, one might argue that opportunities are not objective in the strong physicalist sense suggested by Barry. The opportunity to do X is not just having the possibility to do X without facing physical encumbrances; it is also the possibility of doing X without incurring excessive costs or the risk of such costs (Miller 2002, 51). State law and cultural commitments can conflict in ways such that the costs for cultural minorities of taking advantage of the opportunity are prohibitively high. In contrast to Barry, liberal multiculturalists argue that many cases where a law or policy disparately impacts a religious or cultural practice constitute injustice. For instance, Kymlicka points to the Goldman case discussed above and other religion cases, as well as to claims for language rights, as examples in which group-differentiated rights are required in light of the differential impact of state action (1995, 108–115). The argument here is that since the state cannot achieve complete disestablishment of culture or be neutral with respect to culture, it must somehow make it up to citizens who are bearers of minority religious beliefs and native speakers of other languages. Where complete state disestablishment is not possible, one way to ensure fair background conditions is to provide roughly comparable forms of assistance or recognition to each of the various languages and religions of citizens. To do nothing would be to permit injustice.

3.5 Problem of vulnerable “internal minorities”

A final objection (and one that has received the most attention in recent scholarly debates about multiculturalism) argues that extending protections to minority groups may come at the price of reinforcing oppression of vulnerable members of those groups—what some have called the problem of “internal minorities” or “minorities within minorities” (Green 1994, Eisenberg and Spinner-Halev 2005). Multicultural theorists have focused on inequalities between groups in arguing for special protections for minority groups, but group-based protections can exacerbate inequalities within minority groups. This is because some ways of protecting minority groups from oppression by the majority may make it more likely that more powerful members of those groups are able to undermine the basic liberties and opportunities of vulnerable members. Vulnerable subgroups within minority groups include religious dissenters, sexual minorities, women, and children. A group's leaders may exaggerate the degree of consensus and solidarity within their group to present a united front to the wider society and strengthen their case for accommodation.

Some of the most oppressive group norms and practices revolve around issues of gender and sexuality, and many feminist critics have highlighted the tensions between multiculturalism and feminism (Okin 1999, Shachar 2000). This is a genuine dilemma if one accepts both that group-differentiated rights for minority cultural groups are justifiable, as multicultural theorists do, and that gender equality is an important value, as feminists have emphasized. Extending special protections and accommodations to patriarchal cultural communities may help reinforce gender inequality within these communities. Examples include conflicts over polygamy, arranged marriage, the ban on headscarves in France, “cultural defenses” in criminal law, accommodating religious law or customary law within the dominant legal system, and self-government rights for indigenous communities that deny equality to women in certain respects (Deveaux 2006, Phillips 2007, Shachar 2001, Song 2007).

The “internal minorities” objection is especially troublesome for liberal egalitarian defenders of multiculturalism who aim to promote inter-group equality while also challenging intra-group inequality, including gender inequality. In response, Kymlicka (1999) emphasizes that multiculturalism, like feminism, aims at a more inclusive conception of justice; both challenge the traditional liberal assumption that equality requires identical treatment. To address the concern about internal minorities, Kymlicka distinguishes between two kinds of group rights: “external protections” are rights that a minority group claims against non-members in order to reduce its vulnerability to the economic and political power of the larger society, whereas “internal restrictions” are rights that a minority group claims against its own members. He argues that a liberal theory of minority group rights cannot accept the latter (1995, 35–44; 1999, 31).

But granting “external protections” to minority groups may sometimes come at the price of “internal restrictions,” as is the case when the right of self-government is accorded to a group that violates the rights of its members by limiting freedom of conscience or upholding sexually discriminatory membership rules. Whether multiculturalism and feminism can be reconciled within liberal theory depends in part on the empirical premise that cultural groups that seek group-differentiated rights do not support patriarchal norms and practices. If they do, liberal multiculturalists would in principle have to argue against extending the group right or extending it with certain qualifications, such as conditioning the extension of self-government rights to indigenous groups on the acceptance of a constitutional bill of rights.

An alternative response to the problem of internal minorities is a democratic rather than a liberal one. Liberal theorists tend to start from the question of whether and how minority cultural practices should be tolerated or accommodated in accordance with liberal principles, whereas democratic theorists foreground the role of democratic deliberation and ask how affected parties understand the contested practice. By drawing on the voices of affected parties and giving special weight to the voice of women at the center of gendered cultural conflicts, deliberation can clarify the interests at stake and enhance the legitimacy of responses to cultural conflicts (Benhabib 2002, Deveaux 2006). Deliberation also provides opportunities for minority group members to expose instances of cross-cultural hypocrisy and consider whether and how the norms and institutions of the larger society, whose own struggles for gender equality are incomplete and ongoing, may reinforce rather than challenge sexist practices within minority groups (Song 2007). What constitutes gender subordination and how best to address it is not straightforwardly clear, and intervention into minority cultural groups without drawing on the voices of minority women themselves may not best serve their interests.

4. Political backlash against multiculturalism

The greatest challenge to multiculturalism may not be philosophical but political. At the start of the twenty-first century, there is talk of a retreat from multiculturalism as a normative ideal and as a set of policies in the West. There is little retreat from recognizing the rights of minority nations and indigenous peoples; the retreat is restricted to immigrant multiculturalism. Part of the backlash against immigrant multiculturalism is based on fear and anxiety about foreign “others” and nostalgia for an imagined past when everyone shared thick bonds of identity and solidarity. Nativism is as old as migration itself, but societies are especially vulnerable to it when economic conditions are especially bad or security is seen to be threatened. In the U.S. the cultural “others” are Latino immigrants, especially unauthorized migrants. Since September 11, Muslim minorities have also come under new scrutiny in the U.S., and concerns over security and terrorism have been invoked to justify tougher border control. The number of Muslim immigrants in North America remains relatively small in comparison to Western Europe, where Muslims have become central to scholarly and popular debates about multiculturalism. The concern is not only over security but also the failures of multiculturalism policies to integrate and offer real economic opportunities to foreigners and their descendants.

The political backlash against multiculturalism raises new challenges for defenders of multiculturalism. What is the relationship between multiculturalism and the integration of immigrants? Is liberal multiculturalism the most desirable framework for the integration of immigrants? Is integration governed by an ideal of multicultural citizenship the proper goal of liberal democratic states? Why not a common citizenship based on the same set of rights and opportunities for all individuals? Why not transnationalism, which acknowledges people's multiple attachments, or a genuinely global moral cosmopolitanism, which aims to transcend group attachments?

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