Christian von Ehrenfels

First published Thu May 28, 2015

Christian von Ehrenfels (b. June 20, 1859, d. September 8, 1932) was an Austrian philosopher and psychologist from the school of Franz Brentano. He proved himself to be a highly independent and diverse thinker by formulating the notion of Gestalt qualities, elaborating on a new theory of value, and developing new ideas in sexual ethics and cosmology. He drew on what he learned not only from Brentano, but also from Alexius Meinong, the Austrian economists, and evolution theorists. Nevertheless, Ehrenfels (as he shall henceforth be designated) was also critical of his various mentors on a number of issues. Though he was very much a theorist, he was by no means aloof regarding the social and cultural problems of his time. Thus he also attempted to respond to these problems by forging new paths towards their solutions.

1. Life and Work

Christian Julius Leopold Karl, Freiherr von Ehrenfels, was born in Rodaun near Vienna. He grew up in his father’s castle in Brunn am Walde. Though he was the eldest son and accordingly the rightful heir to the family estate, he decided in 1882, when he was 23 years old, to give away his birthright to his younger brother and to devote himself entirely to philosophy, poetry, and music. At first Ehrenfels went to Vienna in 1877 to undertake agricultural studies, but in the winter semester 1879/80 he enrolled at the university where he began his studies in philosophy with Franz Brentano and Alexius Meinong. At the same time he also began to study composition with Anton Bruckner. As an enthusiastic follower of Richard Wagner he was to write librettos for Wagnerian-style music dramas.

As regards Ehrenfels’ philosophical pursuits, his interest in Brentano’s philosophy gave way to a receptivity to the ideas of Meinong, the new young lecturer who had also studied with Brentano, but who was already developing views of his own, particularly in the theory of relations, which diverged from Brentano’s orthodox teachings (see Rollinger 2008). According to Ehrenfels’ later account, Brentano’s smooth and polished delivery did not impress him nearly as much as Meinong’s cumbersome search for the truth (Ehrenfels in Fabian 1990, 426–429). Another student who also preferred Meinong over Brentano was Alois Höfler (also a Wagnerian), who became a close friend of Ehrenfels. Having started to lecture in Vienna only in 1878, Meinong was awarded a position in Graz in 1882, where Ehrenfels followed him in the winter semester of 1884/1885, after a year of military service. Ehrenfels wrote his dissertation on Relations of Magnitude and Numbers. A Psychological Study in Graz under Meinong’s guidance, but he returned to Vienna, where he did his Habilitation. This involved writing a thesis, in addition to the doctoral thesis, in order to qualify for a teaching position. Ehrenfels’ thesis for his Habilitation was “On Feeling and Willing” (Ehrenfels 1887, in Fabian 1988, 15–97), in which he opposed the Brentanian doctrine concerning emotions and also laid down the psychological foundation for his later theory of value.

Despite such opposition, it must not be overlooked that Ehrenfels’ basic orientation is unquestionably Brentanian, insofar as he never gives up thinking that consciousness is inwardly perceived and is directed at objects. This psychological basis for philosophy is indeed something he shares with other prominent students of Brentano, such as Meinong and also Carl Stumpf, Anton Marty, Edmund Husserl, Kasimir Twardowski, and Thomas Masaryk. In addition it should be pointed out that, though Ehrenfels did not accept Brentano’s own peculiar version of theism, he shared with Brentano a concern for the more “spiritual” side of things. There is, by contrast, hardly any trace of such a concern in the thought of Meinong.

Ehrenfels lectured in Vienna during the summer semesters from 1891 until he was awarded a position at the University of Prague in 1896 (Fabian 1986, 21 ff.). He kept his position there until his retirement. This of course meant that he was a colleague of Marty (in large measure an orthodox follower of Brentano), who in fact found Ehrenfels’ non-cognitivist orientation in value theory completely reprehensible. When Ehrenfels supported hiring Höfler in Prague as a professor of pedagogy, this brought him into bitter conflict with Marty, who even ascribed “naive egoism” to him (Dölling 1999, 141). Ehrenfels maintained a close relationship with Meinong and, unlike Meinong himself and Höfler, managed to stay on good terms with Brentano. However much Ehrenfels drew upon ideas of Meinong or anyone else, however, he spent his years in Prague as an independent thinker and teacher. Both Franz Kafka and Max Brod were familiar with Ehrenfels as a teacher and found him to be a rather colorful and interesting figure (see also the quotation from Emma von Ehrenfels’ biographic sketch in Fabian 1986, 26).

As pessimism began to grow in the early twentieth century, Ehrenfels became increasingly concerned with reviving European culture. It is in this context that he developed his ideas for reforming sexual ethics. In essence he advocated polygamy for the superior men, in order to increase the population of people with higher qualities. He was at the same time opposed to those who advocated racial purity and was instead all in favor of mixed races. His proposal for a new sexual ethic in this regard was not well received. As the years went on, Ehrenfels himself lost enthusiasm for it, but was instead more concerned with developing a new religion. He did not think that Christianity, with its demands for faith where reason could no longer be effective, was viable. The new religion was to be built upon a thoroughly rational dualistic principle of cosmogony, which also to a large extent drew upon the concept of Gestalt qualities that he had developed early in his career. It should also be mentioned here that Ehrenfels found the same concept to be fruitful in the domain of mathematics.

Ehrenfels died just one year before Adolf Hitler, who was of course fanatical in advancing racial purity, came to power in Germany. Ehrenfels was thus spared the agony of seeing the prospect of western civilization becoming something diametrically opposed to his own vision. Unlike many a philosopher of the twentieth century, however, it should be kept in mind that Ehrenfels indeed had a vision. In this regard he was more comparable to a Leibniz or a Hume as opposed to our present-day specialists in this or that particular domain of philosophical inquiry. Nevertheless, much of his philosophical work also exhibits detailed analysis and rigorous argumentation and may well be appreciated by contemporary philosophers who do not share his driving concerns.

2. Gestalt Qualities

Gestalt” is probably the best known contribution of Ehrenfels to philosophy and psychology. As Ehrenfels himself points out in his 1890 article “Über ‘Gestaltqualitäten’” (“On ‘Gestalt Qualities’”), he was inspired by a series of remarks in Ernst Mach’s 1886 book Beiträge zur Analyse der Empfindungen (Contributions to the Analysis of Sensations), in particular Mach’s claim that we would be able to sense spatial shapes and melodies (“tone shapes”) directly. Mach begins by discussing the comparison of geometrical shapes: “In examining two figures which are alike [gleiche Gestalten] but differently colored (for example, two letters of the same size and shape, but of different colors), we recognize their sameness of form [gleiche Form] at the first glance, in spite of the difference of color-sensation.” (Mach 1886, 43, translation from Mach 1914, 105, the same example can be found already in Stumpf 1883, 115.) However, Mach then also proceeds to apply the term Gestalt in a metaphorical sense to the qualitative moments of melodies. Gestalten, for Mach, appear thanks to an equality (Gleichheit) in the sensations, which can be noticed “at a glance”, i.e., they are given directly, not deduced or abstracted. Mach argues that the geometrical similarity of two whole figures would be given by the lower level equality of their elements (lengths, angles, etc.) (Mach 1886, 47; Mach 1914, 109). In analogy to his considerations about space, Mach also applies this analysis to time, finding the same “immediate” perception of Gestalt in rhythm and melody (Mach 1886, 128; Mach 1914, 285). In this way, Mach used the term Gestalt to indicate the characteristics of a whole that depend on the specific configuration of its parts. This formed one of the starting points for Ehrenfels’ much more focused discussions of Gestalten in 1890. The other starting point is of course the discussion in the School of Brentano about parts and wholes, “relations of relations” and higher order objects in general (in various terminologies). In particular, Ehrenfels’ teacher Alexius Meinong had dedicated a work specifically to the theory of relations (Meinong 1882), which is also repeatedly referred to by Ehrenfels, underscoring that relations are crucially important to his discussion and explicitly pointing out that relations themselves are nothing but Gestalt qualities (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 101). At the same time, and due to more or less the same set of influences, Husserl also had used the term Gestalt and Gestaltmoment to indicate higher-order quasi-qualities and the unitary framework of the whole intuition (in a lecture from January 1890, see Husserl 2005, and in the 1891 Philosophy of Arithmetic, where he switches his terminology to “figural moment”). Despite such anticipations and parallels (see also the critical remarks by Zimmer in Albertazzi et al. 2001, 135 ff.), it was Ehrenfels’ work that thematized this whole topic and brought such diverse approaches into focus, thereby turning the psychology of Gestalten into a topic in its own right and fixating the terminology, problems, and scope of the debate about higher order objects and relations for the years to come.

The fundamental question with which Ehrenfels begins is the following: “Is a melody (i) a mere sum [Zusammenfassung] of elements, or (ii) something novel in relation to this sum, something that certainly goes hand in hand with but is distinguishable from the sum of elements?” (Ehrenfels 1890, tr. Smith 1988, 83) According to Ehrenfels, insofar as Mach spoke of Gestalten as objects of sensation, he could not have considered them as “mere sum of elements”, but rather as something new. Indeed, Stumpf had formulated a similar conclusion, claiming that with fusion the simple elements in sensation appear as parts of one greater whole: “the qualities are not in the least changed [… ] but a new relation is introduced between them, which establishes a closer unity than that between members of a mere sum” (Stumpf 1890, 64). According to Ehrenfels, as soon as one is committed to the idea that something other than the sum of the tones makes up the melody, “one has in effect accepted what we call the tonal Gestalt” (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 91). More precisely:

Let us suppose, on the one hand, that the series of tones t1, t2, t3, … tn’ on being sounded, is apprehended by a conscious subject S as a tonal Gestalt (so that the memory-images of all the tones are simultaneously present to him); and let us suppose also that the sum of these n tones, each with its particular temporal determination, is brought to presentation by n unities of consciousness in such a way that each of these n individuals has in his consciousness only one single tone-presentation. Then the question arises whether the consciousness S, in apprehending the melody, brings more to his presentation than the n distinct individuals taken together. (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 85)

Ehrenfels argues that a Gestalt is more (or at least other) than the sum of its parts, which helps to explain how people can remember melodies without having absolute pitch and in different keys, which would be incompatible with the view of melodies as mere sums of tones (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 90 ff.). Based on these preliminary observations and the rejection of simplistic objections, Ehrenfels introduces his definition of a Gestalt:

By a Gestalt quality we understand a positive content of presentation bound up in consciousness with the presence of complexes of mutually separable (i.e., independently presentable) elements. That complex of presentations which is necessary for the existence of a given Gestalt quality we call the foundation [Grundlage] of that quality. (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 93)

Furthermore, he introduces an important distinction here: “We can however exhaustively partition all possible Gestalt qualities into the two non-overlapping categories of temporal and non-temporal.” Specifically, in the case of temporal Gestalt qualities “at most one element can be given in perceptual presentation”, the rest being available only in memory or anticipation, while non-temporal Gestalt qualities “are qualities whose foundation can be given completely in perceptual presentation” (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 94).

Harmony and timbre would be examples of non-temporal Gestalt qualities and with respect to chords, among others, Ehrenfels points out that “the Gestalt quality may sometimes force itself into the foreground, i.e., may make demands on our attention to such an extent that it is difficult to resolve its foundation into elements” (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 95). This shows the need for abstraction to identify the various layers of tonal complexes, as we find in Stumpf’s (1883, 101) characterization of fusion of consonant tones as “less easily and completely recognized as a multiplicity”. Indeed, Ehrenfels also speaks of fusion, and like Stumpf (1890, 65 ff., 193), even of fusion (and hence Gestalten) among different senses:

The intimate fusion of touch, temperature and sometimes also taste and smell sensations into a single unified total impression raises the question of whether we do not have here Gestalt qualities which are built up upon a foundation belonging to several sensory regions. […] we must also accept the possibility of Gestalt qualities comprehending complexes of elements of different categories. (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 97)

Temporal Gestalt qualities, on the other hand, are generated by “every change of any kind in a presentational complex, providing it proceeds in some definite direction”, specifically, if such change “reveals a unified character, so that we have (or could have) a name to designate it” (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 97 ff.), it identifies a Gestalt quality. However, not only change, but also persistence, such as the sustaining of a note, can give rise to a peculiar Gestalt quality (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 101).

Similarly to Husserl, who points to collective nouns as identifying the figural moments that characterize Inbegriffe (swarm, flock, herd, etc.), Ehrenfels also tries to find helpful indicators in ordinary language, but cannot but lament the poverty of the available terminology:

We have to make do with a few words for isolated examples from the whole range of possible colour changes (e.g. blushing, blanching, darkening, glowing, etc.). […] Beside the musical temporal qualities already considered we have to recognize also such noise or resonance Gestalten as, say, thundering, exploding, rustling, splashing, etc. (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 98, 100)

Ehrenfels proceeds to highlight Gestalt qualities in almost every domain. First of all, relations also fall “under the concept of Gestalt quality” (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 101), since they consist in a presentational complex of separable elements (as in the case of the similarity relation between red and orange), though the two categories cannot be straightforwardly be equated (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 102). Also in the case where elements cannot be combined, i.e., logical incompatibility (as in the case of a round square), there is nevertheless an unintuitive unity to the whole, which is again a Gestalt quality: “If I am to deny the existence of a round square, then I must be in a position to think this round square. i.e., to combine the two determinations roundness and squareness in some way or other.” (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 103). Moreover, since one can form unintuitive presentations also when the elements are compatible, Ehrenfels argues that the movement of going from an unintuitive to the corresponding intuitive presentation gives rise to a Gestalt quality.

Thus anyone confronted with, say, a complicated description of a work of architecture will first of all form a merely indirect presentation of it, which will then be rounded out by gradual execution or fulfilment of the various merely intended components, to yield an intuitive total picture. But this process of formation of the intuitive presentation directly from the indirect presentation is something that happens, a process of change, which serves as the foundation for a specific temporal Gestalt quality. (Ehrenfels 1890, tr. Smith 1988, 104)

Given the Gestalt nature of relations, including in particular relations of comparison, Ehrenfels argues that Gestalten can themselves also be compared to one another and hence give rise to increasingly higher order Gestalt qualities. Ehrenfels suggest among other things, that temporal Gestalten can be compared with respect to their rhythm or that we can recognize the composer due to similarities in the melodies (Ehrenfels 1890, tr. Smith 1988, 105 ff.).

Importantly, Ehrenfels also argues that temporal Gestalt qualities are not limited to outer perception, but also occur in inner perception, where the growing or diminishing of desires, fears, expectations, etc. are compared to a crescendo or diminuendo in music (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 101). With respect to the possibility of higher-order Gestalten, Ehrenfels adds to this the “intimate unity with which we combine presentational contents of physical and psychical occurrences” as in all cases of deliberate actions “expressed by means of common nouns (kindness, service, rivalry, marriage, theft, war, etc.) or verbs (entreat, complain, help, rob, avenge, etc.)” (Ehrenfels 1890;. Smith 1988, 107).

If we accept any such “union of the physical and the psychical” as the basis for a Gestalt quality, then of course Gestalten are to be found everywhere: “all designations of human individuals or groups of whatever kind (Hans and Paul, priests, manual workers, Scotsmen, rogues, etc.), as well as most designations for human corporations and institutions (state, authority, the insurance market, etc.), all names of places and territories, and equally all names of animal species” (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 107). This leads straight to Ehrenfels’ remarkable claim that “the larger part of both our everyday and our scientific vocabulary designates Gestalt qualities”. Not only does every verb (with the partial exception of being and having and few others) designate a (temporal) Gestalt, but also “every noun and adjective having reference to more than a single presentational element” (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 108).

Yet a problem remains, namely whether Gestalt qualities arise as a result of some activity on our part when confronted with the relevant complex of elements or without any contribution of the intellect. Mach held the latter view, that “Gestalten are objects of ‘sensation’ just as soon as their respective foundations are given to consciousness” (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 111). Ehrenfels points out first of all that Gestalten are not always noticed (e.g. proverbially seeing the trees but not the forest) and some effort seems to be required in grasping a shape by filling out and complementing the Gestalt suggested by the foundations, e.g. when “seeing” the third dimension suggested by the cues of a perspectival drawing (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 111 ff.). While we do not actually generate the Gestalt in a separate act, specifically meant to add it to the foundation, we do expend effort in completing the required set of presentational elements needed for the Gestalt, which then arises spontaneously. This, however, does not exclude that different Gestalten may supervene on the same foundations and that we can switch between them by changing the focus of our attention. By bringing a different complex of presentational elements into the foreground, i.e., by varying the foundations, we can also (indirectly) vary the Gestalt (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 112 ff.).

Having now found Gestalt qualities nearly everywhere, Ehrenfels suggests “that the theory of Gestalt qualities would perhaps be qualified to bridge the gulf between the various sensory regions, and indeed between the various categories of the presentable in general” (Ehrenfels 1890, Smith 1988, 114), which ultimately “would yield the possibility of comprehending the whole of the known world under a single mathematical formula” (Ehrenfels 1890; Smith 1988, 116). Indeed, Ehrenfels will go on to apply the concept of Gestalt in very disparate fields, ranging from mathematics to cosmology, thereby also bestowing a peculiar unity to his entire oeuvre.

3. Theory of Values

Soon after publishing his article on Gestalt qualities, Ehrenfels produced a series of articles under the title “Werttheorie und Ethik” (1893–1894) which were followed by his two-volume System der Werttheorie (1897–1898). The first volume in particular, entitled Allgemeine Werttheorie, Psychologie des Begehrens, concerns us in this section.

It is most appropriate, according to Ehrenfels, to begin a philosophical investigation by taking into account what is indicated by ordinary language. However, by no means is it obligatory to leave the matter there. Sometimes a revision of the concept in question is needed. Such a revision he finds to be necessary regarding the concept of value. While ordinary language seems to indicate that the value of something is among its objective properties, such a value-property is not to be found in reality. Rather, as long as we adhere to such a conception of value, it seems to be mystical. Though we ordinarily think that we desire objects because they are “valuable” (i.e., because they supposedly have this “mystical, incomprehensible essence”), the fact of the matter, says Ehrenfels, is that we ascribe value to objects because we desire them (Ehrenfels 1897, 2, also see Fabian in Albertazzi et al. 1996, 166).

Besides the view that value is some sort of mystical property of objects, other ones are identified by Ehrenfels in opposition to his. Among these views is the one put forward by the so-called “first school” of Austrian value theory, as put forward by certain outstanding economists (specifically C. Menger, E. Böhm von Bawerk, and F. von Wieser, as mentioned in Ehrenfels 1897, 3 n.). On this view the value of objects “is neither a property nor an essence of them, considered as such, but rather merely their indispensability in the satisfaction of our desires” (Ehrenfels 1897, 3). While Ehrenfels fully appreciates this school’s contribution to the understanding of value (Smith 1994, 282), he nonetheless thinks that it does not provide a satisfactory theory of value in general due to its narrow focus on economic value. There are for him other types of value besides this, as exhibited by counter-examples (as when the lock of hair belonging to one’s mother is kept as a thing of value). A general theory of value on his view is to illuminate economic value and not vice versa.

Yet another attempt to characterize value without assigning it the status of a mystical property of certain objects is the one that had been put forward by Brentano, which Ehrenfels formulates as follows:

Not all desired things are valuable, but rather only those which are worthy of being desired. Whether this worthiness belongs to a thing, however, is not in the particular case yielded from the investigation of the objective nature of the thing, but rather from the subjective consideration of the desire directed at the thing. From the examination of our own mental activity in the act of desire we discern whether this is directed at something valuable or not. (Ehrenfels 1897, 3–4)

In contemporary terms, Brentano is a cognitivist, for he maintains that loving and hating (the acts of valuing on his view) can be characterized as correct (Brentano 1889). The “second school” of Austrian value theory, to which the early Meinong (1894) as well as Ehrenfels belong, distanced itself from Brentano’s cognitivism, while building on his method of descriptive psychology (Grassl in Fabian 1982, 5). Here we should note, however, that Ehrenfels came to develop views in aesthetics that can be contrasted with the non-cognitivism found in his early work. This later development will be discussed further at the end of the present section.

An important aspect of Ehrenfels’ value theory is his view regarding the relation of desire to feeling. He characterizes feeling as anything that occurs on the scale that ranges from pleasure to pain (Ehrenfels 1897, 5 ff.). Indifference is the central point in this scale. Desire also encompasses a range of phenomena, consisting of wishing, striving, and willing (Ehrenfels 1897, 6 ff.). There is, according to Ehrenfels, clearly a difference between feeling and desire, though they are also connected in a psychologically interesting way. While Brentano seems to think that his inclusion of feeling and desire in a single class of psychical phenomena is supported by inner perception, Ehrenfels points out how ineffective an appeal to inner perception is in such matters of dispute (this, however, does not prevent Ehrenfels from making similar appeals at crucial junctures of his value theory). Moreover, Brentano argues for his classification of desire together with feeling by presenting us with a range of phenomena which seem to shade off into each other, beginning with a feeling and ending with not only a desire, but with a full-fledged instance of willing (Brentano 1874, 308 ff.; Brentano 1995, 183 ff.). Nevertheless, Ehrenfels maintains that instances in which there occurs feeling without desire and desire without feeling serve to demonstrate that they do not belong together in the same class of psychical phenomena (Ehrenfels 1897, 10 ff.). It is, in addition, on his view desire rather than feeling that determines what is valuable. It was Meinong who first insisted on the distinction between feeling and desire, although he regarded feelings rather than desires to be determinative of values (Meinong 1894, §§ 5–6). Ehrenfels’ general theory of value thus stands in contrast with those that were advocated by both of his mentors.

Ehrenfels also criticizes the traditional view (especially prominent in Kantian ethics) that reason (Vernunft) can direct our desires (Ehrenfels 1897, 8 ff.). On his view reason may be used to construct complexes of presentations, which are then set as goals by our desires, though reason itself is unable to set these as goals. Ehrenfels also thinks that reason can determine the means whereby a goal is to be achieved, but this is again not the same as setting goals. Aside from its involvement in shaping the presentations of ends and the determination of the means to them, Ehrenfels rejects any suggestion that reason plays any additional role in valuation.

While the view that desire and not reason determines value will suggest to many that Ehrenfels wants to assert that nothing is valuable for each individual aside from its own pleasure, the underlying assumption that one desires only one’s own feeling of pleasure. Our experience, however, shows us that this assumption is false. “In the most common circumstances of our everyday life our desiring aims directly at certain routine external tasks such as eating, drinking, waiting, sitting, sleeping, etc., without there being presented thereby the state of feeling which corresponds to these” (Ehrenfels 1897, 27; Smith 1994, 283 ff.). Nevertheless, obtaining what we desire does result in an increase of pleasure relative to the state that would be experienced without the desire being satisfied (Ehrenfels 1897, 31 ff.).

Far from desire being aimed at such concrete things as feelings, it is rather described by Ehrenfels in the following way:

Desiring a thing means either desiring the existence of a thing, or possession of it, in which case the desire is directed at an existence, though not of the thing itself, but rather of its availability, and at the same time at a non-existence, the absence of all disturbances which obstruct that availability. (Ehrenfels 1897, 53)

We can of course have “negative” desires that are as such directed at the non-existence of something. Though Ehrenfels does not use any technical term in application to the correlate of desire, it is understandable to suggest that he has “states of affairs” (Sachverhalte) in mind here (Smith 1994, 286).

It has been said that the theory of value that Ehrenfels developed in his early work was non-cognitivist in his general theory of values. In his aesthetics, however, we find a very different view regarding values of works of art. This view is expressed in a posthumously published dialogue, “Was ist Schönheit?”, where he says “that absolute beauty is given and comes about wherever we grasp with feeling or sensation a certain lawfulness [Gesetztmäßigkeit] that we cannot yet comprehend with the understanding” (Fabian 1986, 164). There are, according to Ehrenfels, no differences in taste in art. As regards music, for instance, the apparent difference in taste among people is characterized as follows:

Most fundamentally much rather difference in the capacity for musical perception, that is to say, the faculty of apprehension, of imagination and memory for tonal forms [Tongestalten] – furthermore difference in inner rhythm and inner gestures with which we unconsciously accompany our speech, thoughts, and feelings – difference in our instinctual life [Triebleben], even in the formation of our senses. (Fabian 1986, 164–165.)

In short, absolute beauty is the same for all of us, though our differences in the apprehension of works of art misleads us into thinking that beauty is merely relative, just “a matter of taste”. While this development in Ehrenfels aesthetics away from his earlier non-cognitivism has not gone unnoticed (Reicher 2006, 2009) it is a domain that he himself left open for further investigation. It apparently calls for revision of his earlier non-cognitivism as well as explorations of connections between the theory of Gestalt qualities and aesthetics.

While Ehrenfels’ early work on value theory and ethics remained for the most part within the domain now called “metaethics”, he did make an effort in his later work to develop a theory of normative ethics. His most passionate attempt to do so will be considered in the following section.

4. Sexual Ethics

While Ehrenfels’ treatise on sexual ethics of 1907 might understandably be considered extremely controversial and inappropriate by today’s standards, it was much less so at the time it was written. Most of the seemingly radical ideas and proposals were relatively popular and widespread in educated society at the time, and the controversial nature of his article is rather due to the original way in which Ehrenfels combines and connects them, taking them to considerably farther reaching conclusions (compare Dickinson 2002, 265–268). The general tenor of this treatise was already anticipated in literary form by Ehrenfels’ choral drama Siegmar und Heliea from 1898/1899 (see Fabian 1986, 28 ff.).

Ehrenfels aimed at a recuperation of a “natural sexual morality”, which would preserve and advance the healthy constitution of a species, as opposed to the cultural sexual morality of his time, which would instead corrupt it (Ehrenfels 1907, 8). This could be effected by recognizing that the main biological function of the sexual drive, namely reproduction, is not the only one. Sexuality also serves selection, not in the sense of natural selection as survival of the fittest, but selection aimed at ensuring reproduction by the best, leading to the progressive improvement of the species (Ehrenfels 1907, 9 ff.). This selection is the first and foremost function of male sex drive, which is why Ehrenfels speaks of “virile selection” (Ehrenfels 1907, 79, compare Dickinson 2002, 258). Since according to Ehrenfels males represent the active sex, not just among humans, but “in the entire bisexual animal kingdom”, and the females’ sex drive is only operative as a response to the males’, the male sex drive is the biologically more important one, and hence the basis for re-establishing the natural sexual morality.

As the males’ sex drive exceeds the females’, the males will and should compete with one another for the possibility of reproducing with as many females as possible (Ehrenfels 1907, 46). For a sexually well-endowed man (“einen sexual vollkräftigen Mann”), it is advisable to have regular, pleasurable intercourse with healthy women or girls (Ehrenfels 1907, 62), leading to polygyny, which is the only “healthy natural sexual life” (Ehrenfels 1907, 13). For Ehrenfels, this would actually present a “solution to virtually all the major problems confronting European societies” (Dickinson 2002, 257) in his time. Thanks to competition and polygyny, only the best males will reproduce and will do so in greater numbers than in a monogamous culture, in which virile selection is absent (Ehrenfels 1907, 11, 30) and where knights and knaves alike rule as lords in their families. Conversely, since monandric women have more children than polyandric ones (Ehrenfels 1907, 14), and men will only want to care for children that they can be sure to have fathered, females should remain monandric and even avoid serial polyandry (Ehrenfels 1907, 12). Besides the biological reasons, another concern for Ehrenfels is the well-being of the children in successive marriages, i.e., serial polyandry, which would destroy the trust among parents and children, as a stepfather and alimony would never be a satisfactory replacement (Ehrenfels 1907, 68).

According to Ehrenfels, women would remain so impressed and overwhelmed by their first sexual experience, that not even the hottest fires of passion will ever consume that memory, and hence they should avoid pre-marital sex to ensure future happiness in married life (Ehrenfels 1907, 65). On the other hand, abstinence is not suitable for men, who should certainly have some previous experience so as to be fully aware of their sexual duties and to avoid becoming hypersensitive to intimate physical contact (Ehrenfels 1907, 69). Nevertheless, the youth should abstain from sex, not just actual but also fantasized, for moral and hygienical reasons until reaching full sexual maturity (Ehrenfels 1907, 61). What Ehrenfels considered “unnatural” sexual activities, such as masturbation and homosexuality, should be avoided and condemned, although they can be tolerated as long as they do not damage anyone’s health (Ehrenfels 1907, 56). Indeed, autoeroticism, when practiced in moderation, does not cause any noticeable harm (Ehrenfels 1907, 61), and both autoeroticism and homosexual relationships among females, being the passive sex, would not be as harmful as among men, and can hence be considered as lighter transgressions (Ehrenfels 1907, 16).

Monogamy, however, is a serious danger to the well-being of society, according to Ehrenfels. Not only does a monogamous society morally and legally sanction (Ehrenfels 1907, 78), even “sanctify” (Ehrenfels 1907, 81), female possessiveness and jealousy, by establishing an unnatural and merely culturally justified exclusive right on the father of her children (Ehrenfels 1907, 79), but also thereby engenders all kinds of sexual corruption and general degenerations. By enforcing an unnatural sexual morality, it leads to double standards (Dickinson 2002, 259), where men are driven by their sexuality to prostitutes, pornophilia and hyperaesthesia. Due to the demand their appetites generate, men who buy sexual satisfaction are complicit in the human trade and the corruption of young women who enter into prostitution, though it would go too far to forbid prostitution altogether (Ehrenfels 1907, 62). The natural sex drive of men, which cannot be satisfied through monogamy, drifts into extremes, both toward pornophilia (“die Freude am Schweinischen”), i.e., pure sensualistic, even animalistic stimulation, disregarding the function of reproduction, through masturbation or in brothels (with all the risks of STDs), and in the other direction toward incessant search for variety and exotic eroticisms (Ehrenfels 1907, 49).

The one positive side effect of monogamy is that it has led to the “sublimation of sexual affects”, as modern psychology has it, among sexually frustrated males. Since males cannot find full satisfaction for their sex drive in monogamous marriage, they divert their superfluous energy into other pursuits, such as cultural achievements of various sorts: “accumulation of ownership and possessions, economical and social organization, artistic and scientific achievements, indeed in works of charity and neighborly love” (Ehrenfels 1907, 31).

Ehrenfels connects these themes of gender and sexuality to larger issues of economy, sociology and politics. For instance, while historically the institution of monogamy enabled women (and their children) to join the workforce as partners in the family business (Ehrenfels 1907, 37), the changing economical situation, which favors larger enterprises, puts monogamy at a distinct disadvantage by limiting the opportunities for married women to work. This also negatively affects the overall composition and growth of the workforce, since the advanced techniques available for family planning (Ehrenfels 1907, 42 ff.) and the rising age (especially among the higher educated) at which couples marry and have children, leads to lower birthrates (Ehrenfels 1907, 35 ff.). Monogamy, Ehrenfels argues, leads to a decrease both in quality as well as the quantity of the population (compare Dickinson 2002, 259), and hence a deficit in the workforce that can be compensated for only through immigration (Ehrenfels 1907, 43). This has repercussions on a global scale, because Ehrenfels feared, as many did at the time, the competition of other races, specifically the “Mongolian” or yellow race. In particular the Chinese would be an indomitable competitor economically, as they could sink wages by offering lower cost labor thanks to their greater number and fertility (Ehrenfels 1907, 86 ff.). The “Mongol tsunami” (“Mongolenflut”) would interrupt cultural development for centuries and for Ehrenfels the only remedy was to adopt his newly developed sexual ethics as soon as possible in order to increase quantity and quality of the population. Ehrenfels regarded his reform as absolutely crucial for humanity at large in the long term, noting that in the end also the Mongol hordes would have to adopt it, when they would eventually face the same problems down the road (Ehrenfels 1907, 94).

Ehrenfels had the opportunity to present his proposal in the Vienna Psychoanalytic Society on December 23, 1908, where Isidor Sadger observed not only that “all of this seems like an adolescent sexual fantasy”, but more significantly that behind Ehrenfels’ views there would seem to be a personal history, regarding the author’s own sexuality (cf. Dickinson 2002, 268–270). In reply to this, Ehrenfels pointed out that his proposal had grown out of the realization that it was not necessarily he who needed to curb his sex drive, but that the dominant morality was a distortion of the natural one.

The sexual and social reforms he proposed in numerous articles, opinion pieces, and lectures spanning more than a decade (Fabian 1986, 30, n. 29), were for the most part met with deafening silence (Fabian 1986, 35, 40).

5. Philosophy of Mathematics

Like most of Brentano’s students, Ehrenfels also wrote various works on the philosophy of mathematics: first of all his 1885 dissertation on “Größenrelationen und Zahlen: eine psychologische Studie” (“Relations of Magnitude and Numbers: a Psychological Study”), then his article “Zur Philosophie der Mathematik” (“On the Philosophy of Mathematics”) in 1891, the same year as Husserl’s Philosophy of Arithmetic, and finally in 1922 his booklet on Das Primzahlengesetz (The Law of Prime Numbers). As Simons (1988, 10) observes, his early mathematical works are representative of the Brentanian approach as it can also be found in Husserl’s and Stumpf’s habilitation works.

Indeed, in his (as of yet, unpublished) dissertation Ehrenfels presents an account of the concept of number and the philosophy of mathematics that is for the most part the traditional Brentanian one, though unsurprisingly including many Meinongian elements. Ehrenfels claims that by abstracting from all particularities of two objects and considering them merely as the foundations of a relation of difference, we obtain the concept of two. If we then add another object, we need to compare and distinguish not only the first-order relations among the foundations, but also the second-order relation of difference among the first-order relations of difference, and so on for every additional element. This leads to a rapid increase in complication, as illustrated in Husserl’s critique of such an approach in the second chapter of the Philosophy of Arithmetic. Ehrenfels likewise concludes that this process of distinction soon leads beyond our limited presentational capacities and requires more convenient, though indirect, ways of presenting numbers. Hence, he argues that higher numbers can only be reached by successive presentations of partial numbers, e.g. nine by three times three.

Ehrenfels presents an interesting account of the golden ratio (1:1.618) as the point where the relations of similarity and difference are in balance, i.e., two magnitudes that stand to each other in the golden ratio are as similar as they are different. Towards the end of the work Ehrenfels’ discussion of higher-order relations and of comparisons of relations independently of their foundations leads him into formulations that could be seen as anticipating his later concept of Gestalt qualities.

In his article on the philosophy of mathematics Ehrenfels starts with an analysis of the presentation of number and the concepts of unity and multiplicity. He denies an empirical basis to number presentations: “The presentation of number is not extracted from external perception, but is actually inserted into it” (Ehrenfels 1891, 287). Ehrenfels takes relations of difference as the foundation for the concept of multiplicity and goes on to describe the construction of numbers through counting, by successive addition of unities (Ehrenfels 1891, 289 ff.). Like other Brentanists, he comments on the limits of our cognitive capacities and points out that we can have a presentation of higher numbers only indirectly, i.e., symbolically (Ehrenfels 1891, 292, also see 289 where he refers to Husserl 1887). Ehrenfels here chooses the Meinongian terminology, speaking of indirect or founded contents (see his notes on 292 ff.), but also follows Brentano’s approach when remarking on the power of signs to function as surrogates for presentations (Ehrenfels 1891, 296). He gives an extensive critique of Kant’s famous doctrine that “7+5=12” would be an example of a synthetic proposition a priori, with a quite idiosyncratic argumentation, stating that the a priori or a posteriori character of the sum would depend on the possibility of a direct intuition of its elements, i.e., a proper presentation. If we have to externalize the process by use of signs when the numbers exceed our cognitive capacities, then how can we claim to be able to perform such calculations a priori? Ehrenfels lists several examples that involve external aids, such as the use of logarithmic tables: looking up a number on a list is hardly an “a priori” cognitive act (Ehrenfels 1891, 329). The interesting aspect of his approach is that he takes mathematics in this way as an essentially computational science, relying on external artifacts (“physical aides”) and hence as a science which necessarily has a large a posteriori component (Ehrenfels 1891, 331). In the second half of the article, however, Ehrenfels provides a critique of J.S. Mill and empiricism in mathematics, along the same lines as Stumpf had done in his habilitation work. Like Husserl and fellow Meinong-student Konrad Zindler, he points out that in the progress of calculation with signs one often hits on “unpresentable” combinations, i.e., combinations of signs that cannot be combined into a proper presentation (Ehrenfels 1891, 342). Yet, these “impossible” combinations do then lead to correct results. (This paragraph is based in part on Ierna 2011).

Ehrenfels himself assigns an important biographical role to his last major work in the philosophy of mathematics, while its actual philosophical and mathematical significance is much more modest, as we will see. Ehrenfels states in the preface to Das Primzahlengesetz that, after a long depression following WWI, the contemplation of the “field of numbers and their eternal, necessary connections” soothed his agonized spirit (“Weltangst”) (Ehrenfels 1922, III). In the preface to the work he retraces the development of the core idea of the book, describing very poetically how in April 1919 the idea “blossomed” in his mind about the distribution of prime numbers (Ehrenfels 1922, IV: “An einem warmen Aprilvormittag 1919 ist mir – in der Sonne gelagert neben der Gruft meines Vaters – „der Knopf aufgegangen” für das Wesentliche der Lösung.”) Ehrenfels himself at first took it only as a rediscovery of already well-established mathematical insights, but having been informed by his friend and colleague the mathematician Gerhard Kowalewski that the matter of the distribution of primes was far from settled, Ehrenfels tried to work out his idea in a more systematic fashion, convinced to have hit on something new and worthwhile.

Ehrenfels’ core idea in Das Primzahlengesetz is to apply the notion of Gestalt to number series to find the law-like regularities in the distribution of prime numbers. Therefore Ehrenfels decided to include the entire text of his 1890 article “Über Gestaltqualitäten” in the work, unchanged, though split into two parts. In the course of his discussion, Ehrenfels once again goes down the familiar road of Brentanist mathematics: a discussion of proper and symbolic presentations of number, the limits of our presentational capacity, proper number conceptions as based on (higher order) relations of distinction, etc. (Ehrenfels 1922, 30 ff.) He explicitly considers the proper number presentations as Gestalt qualities, and to be precise, as presentations of “second order”. Collections of numbers, which he calls Zahlenfiguren, would be of third order. These number figures play a central role in, literally, “figuring out” the prime numbers: by generating series of number figures corresponding to all multiples of a base number, which can then be combined in such a way as to filter out the primes.

However, in the end the result of this procedure turns out to be quite trivial from a mathematical perspective: “It actually merely leads to a simplification of the method known as the “Sieve of Eratosthenes” already being practiced for more than 2000 years” (Ehrenfels 1922, 48). The method of the sieve consists in identifying and then eliminating all divisible numbers by generating them from multiplications of primes. If one wants to find all the prime numbers between 0 and 100, one would proceed by striking all multiples of two, then all multiples of three, etc. until only the primes remain. Ehrenfels’ approach shortens the process by avoiding repeated strikings, as would happen e.g. with 6 as multiple of both 2 and 3 (Ehrenfels 1922, 49). As Simons (1986, 112) argues, this is merely computationally faster than the traditional method of the sieve of Eratosthenes (but slower than other methods, as experimentally verified by Simons 1988, 12), but not a substantially new algorithm.

6. Cosmology

In his 1916 Kosmogonie, Ehrenfels aims at laying out the fundamental Gestalt of the world as a whole. Ehrenfels wants to elucidate the origin, development, and ultimate destiny of the universe. On the one hand, he considers it as a Kosmos in the classical sense of an ordered, harmonious whole, governed by an ordering principle that establishes the wholeness and unity of the world. However, Ehrenfels also acknowledges a principle of disunity and entropy: chaos and chance. For Ehrenfels, the world as we know it is generated through the complementary activity of these two cosmic principles (compare Fabian 1986, 44 ff.).

This results in a religious dualism. The contraposition of chaos and cosmos explains the presence of both good and evil, reason and chance, etc. in the world, allowing Ehrenfels to provide a theodicy. Nevertheless, the cosmic principles themselves cannot be straightforwardly regarded as absolutely good or evil. Moreover, although Ehrenfels calls the ordering principle “God”, it cannot be understood as the omnipotent creator of western monotheism (also dubbed “solotheism” by Ehrenfels), since neither cosmic principle is absolute in itself. Creation can only be achieved by both principles working in tandem and consists in God ordering and “shaping” or “forming” (“Gestalten” in its verbal form) the world in perpetual contrast with chaos. Hence, the Kosmogonie does not carry the tone of a typically Christian religious work, nor is it simply a transposition of ancient or eastern mythologies into modern Europe. Rather, Ehrenfels had the ambition to formulate a general framework for a (utopian) future world-spanning religion, based on a firm scientific foundation (Ehrenfels 1916, 150, also see Fabian 1986, 52). Indeed, Ehrenfels presents his dualism explicitly as a scientific hypothesis to be investigated and proven, and concludes that it can in fact explain the world as it is and can be confirmed by experience (Ehrenfels 1916, 23, 35).

In the fourth paragraph of the sixth chapter, Ehrenfels formulates six dogmas for his new religion: 1) The world is the combined product of the active principle of order and form (“Gestaltung”) and the passive principle of chaos. 2) The world has a beginning but no end. Order and form are eternally progressing and increasing. 3) The principle of unity is bodiless and rather “soul-like”. 4) The eternal progress of the world proceeds from an eternal internal development in the principle of unity. 5) The world is not a result of a purposeful will, but of a blind forming (“Gestalten”). 6) We human beings are part of the divine and hence collaborators in the divine works.

These last two points are particularly relevant, because Ehrenfels will conclude the Kosmogonie with the admittedly unsubstantiated claim that the principle of unity and order is coming to self-awareness through the human mind and that it is in and through human beings that its blind creative impulse can acquire a purpose (Ehrenfels 1916, 86, 207).

The mere formulation of the six dogmas, as Ehrenfels clearly states at the end of the fourth paragraph of the sixth chapter, cannot have the pretension to constitute without further ado a fully formed religion. In his 1922 Gedanken über die Religion der Zukunft, Ehrenfels then sketches in more detail what is still missing in the Kosmogonie. Here, as well as in the Kosmogonie, he provides a description or morphology of religion rather than a definition (in the Kosmogonie he spoke of a physiognomy as Weltbeschreibung). Religions in general consist of four aspects:

  1. a Weltanschauuung, an encompassing vision of the world based on metaphysical assumptions, that address the “big questions” of why, whence, and whereto;
  2. a Morallehre or moral standard that tells us which actions are good or evil, allowed or reprehensible;
  3. a Kultus, or a system of traditional practices that allow the faithful to relate to whichever powers of the cosmos they acknowledge;
  4. exemplary Idealgestalten, imaginary or historical figures to emulate, i.e., heroes and saints.

However, Ehrenfels in this writing renounces the soul-like nature of the divine and formulates a new theory of the “superposition of units of consciousness”. Ehrenfels claims that wherever there is a living cell, there we can speak of some form of “consciousness”. This would hold not only for unicellular organisms, but also for plants, animals and humans. If every living cell of my body is somehow conscious, then also the individual cells in my brain must be. Yet while each and every individual neuron is conscious in itself, collectively they also constitute my unitary consciousness as a human being. This leads Ehrenfels through analogy to formulate the idea of “personalities of higher order”, indeed a Volksseele would be more than a mere poetic fiction. As support for this thesis Ehrenfels points to organic metaphors for social processes (such as competition for limited resources) as well as the purposeful unity displayed by bee swarms that collectively act like a single organism. Similarly, a few years later in Die Religion der Zukunft, he also states explicitly that all intellects participate in the divine intellect (Ehrenfels 1929, in Fabian 1990, 286).

Ehrenfels’ thoughts and writings about cosmology and religion didn’t remain at the level of mere academic “armchair” speculations. Besides his engagement for sexual reform and the racial question in opinion pieces and speeches, he also actively sought to concretely establish the new religion sketched above. Indeed, Ehrenfels went so far as to publicly appeal in an open letter to the president of Czechoslovakia, his former fellow Brentano-pupil Thomas Masaryk, to act as the founder of the new religion (Ehrenfels 1929, in Fabian 1990, 289 ff.). Although sympathetic to his concerns, Masaryk politely rebuffed him, clearly distinguishing between his personal religious thoughts and his public political role (see Masaryk’s letter to Ehrenfels in Fabian 1990, 294 ff.).

7. Legacy

Inevitably, what comes to mind first and foremost when speaking of Ehrenfels’ legacy, is the idea of Gestalt. Whatever the inspiration by Mach or parallel developments in Husserl, it was Ehrenfels’ seminal paper “Über Gestaltqualitäten” that gave rise to the ensuing debates in the school of Brentano and beyond. As Smith (1988, 12) observes: “The importance of Ehrenfels’ paper rests on the fact that it contains the first concentrated reflections on the question ‘what complex perceived formations such as spatial figures or melodies might be’.” Ehrenfels’ original proposal of “Gestaltqualitäten” still left many issues open or unclear, which were soon taken up in various ways by his fellow Brentanians. Despite opposition against his terminological choice and the development of alternative terminologies, such as Meinong’s “founded contents” (1891, 253) and Husserl’s “figural moments” (1891, 236 n. 1) or “moments of unity” (1901, 230), Ehrenfels’ article fixed the terminology and many of the conceptual categories. At variance with Brentano’s other pupils, Ehrenfels did not manage to establish a school or movement of his own, although he was the first teacher of Max Wertheimer in Prague. While Ehrenfels’ work sketched the larger picture and provided a general framework to approach Gestalt phenomena, many of the details were worked out subsequently by the Graz and Berlin schools of Gestalt psychology, formed by the students of Stumpf (Max Wertheimer, Kurt Koffka and Wolfgang Köhler) and Meinong (Stephan Witasek and Vittorio Benussi). Systematically, the schools differ mainly in their views on how Gestalt qualities originate. Contra Ehrenfels, the Graz school argued that Gestalten are actively produced by our intellect on the basis of the Gestalt switch phenomenon (see, among others, Smith 1994, 259 ff.).

However, the results that may be regarded as Ehrenfels’ most original and influential contributions, both the original article on Gestalt as well as his engagement with value theory, were mostly products of his early career (compare Fabian 1986, 21 ff.). The endeavors Ehrenfels passionately pursued later on, even though partially related to and building on his earlier work, ended for the most part in failure. His proposals for sexual and social reforms fell flat, the idea of establishing a new religion went nowhere, and the discovery of the one and only law of primes turned out to be a very minor accomplishment (cf. Fabian 1986, 53).

The notion of Gestalt, to the contrary, obtained great influence also beyond the school of Brentano and its offspring (compare Zimmer in Albertazzi et al. 2001, 141 ff.). In particular, the idea of Gestalt switch and a holistic interpretation of higher-order phenomena in various contexts, has served as a metaphor and inspiration for (among others) the idea of incommensurability of scientific theories in Thomas Kuhn and the logical positivism of the Vienna Circle, particularly Rudolf Carnap’s holism, which in turn influenced W. V. O. Quine’s. While increasingly removed from its original formulation, the historical starting point for it all is Ehrenfels’ article on Gestalt qualities.


Primary Literature

Works by Ehrenfels

  • von Ehrenfels, Christian, 1885, Größenrelationen und Zahlen: eine psychologische Studie (unpublished dissertation)
  • –––, 1887, Über Fühlen und Wollen. Eine psychologische Studie. Vienna: Kaiserliche Akademie der Wissenschaften. (Reprint in Fabian 1988: 15–97.) [available online]
  • –––, 1890, “Über ‘Gestaltqualitäten’”, Vierteljahrsschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie, 14: 249–292. (Reprint in Fabian 1988: 128–155.) [available online]
  • –––, 1891, “Zur Philosophie der Mathematik”, Vierteljahrsschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie, 15: 285–347. (Reprint in Fabian 1988: 415–451.) [available online]
  • –––, 1893, “Werttheorie und Ethik”, Vierteljahrsschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie, 17: 76–110, 200–266, 321–363, 413–475. (Reprint in Fabian 1982: 23–151.) [available online]
  • –––, 1894, “Werttheorie und Ethik”, Vierteljahrsschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie, 18: 77–97. (Reprint in Fabian 1982: 151–166.) [available online]
  • –––, 1897, System der Werttheorie, I: Allgemeine Werttheorie, Psychologie des Begehrens. Leipzig: O. R. Reisland. (Reprint in Fabian 1982: 201–406.) [available online]
  • –––, 1898, System der Werttheorie, II: Grundzüge einer Ethik, Psychologie des Begehrens. Leipzig: O. R. Reisland. (Reprint in Fabian 1982: 407–593.) [available online]
  • –––, 1907, Sexualethik. Wiesbaden: Bergman. [available online]
  • –––, 1916, Kosmogonie. Jena: Dietrichs. (Reprint in Fabian 1990: 69–230.)
  • –––, 1922, Das Primzahlengesetz, entwickelt und dargestellt auf Grund der Gestalttheorie. Leipzig: Reisland. (Reprint in Fabian 1988: 455–505.)
  • –––, 1922, “Gedanken über die Religion der Zukunft” (in 8 articles), Prager Presse, 23 April, 7/14 May, 28 May, 4 June, 18 June, 2 July, 16 July, 27 August 1922. (Reprinted in Fabian 1990: 231–280.)
  • –––, 1932 (dictated), “Über ‘Gestaltqualitäten’”, Philosophia (Belgrade), 2 (1937): 139–141. (Reprint in F. Weinhandl (ed.) 1960: 61–63.)
  • –––, 1982, Philosophische Schriften, I. Werttheorie , Munich and Vienna: Philosophia. (Reprints include Ehrenfels 1897,Ehrenfels 1898.) Edited by Reinhard Fabian.
  • –––, 1986, Philosophische Schriften, II. Ästhetik, Munich and Vienna: Philosophia. Edited by Reinhard Fabian.
  • –––, 1988, Philosophische Schriften, III. Psychologie, Ethik, Erkenntnistheorie, Munich and Vienna: Philosophia. (Reprints include Ehrenfels 1887, Ehrenfels 1890.) Edited by Reinhard Fabian.
  • –––, 1990, Philosophische Schriften, IV. Metaphysik, Reinhard Fabian (ed.), Munich and Vienna: Philosophia.

Translations of Works by Ehrenfels

  • Cosmogony, translation of Ehrenfels 1916, Mildred Focht (trans.), New York: Comet Press, 1948.
  • “On ‘Gestalt Qualities’”, translation of Ehrenfels 1890, Barry Smith (trans.), in B. Smith (ed.) 1988: 82–117.
  • “Gestalt Level and Purity”, translation of pp. 93–96 in Ehrenfels 1916, Barry Smith (trans.), in Smith (ed.) 1988: 118–120, available online.
  • “On ‘Gestalt Qualities’, translation of Ehrenfels 1932, Mildred Focht (trans.), revised and corrected by Barry Smith, in Smith (ed.) 1988: 121–123, available online.

Primary Works by Other Philosophers

  • Brentano, Franz, 1874, Psychologie vom empirischen Standpunkte I. Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot. [available online]
  • –––, 1889, Vom Ursprung sittlicher Erkenntnis. Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot. [available online]
  • –––, Franz,, 1995, Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint. London: Routledge. (Translated by Antos. C. Rancurello et al.)
  • Husserl, Edmund, 1887, Über den Begriff der Zahl. Psychologische Analysen. Halle: Heynemann’sche Buchdruckerei (F. Beyer). [available online]
  • –––, 1891, Philosophie der Arithmetik. Psychologische und Logische Untersuchungen, Halle-Saale: C.E.M. Pfeffer (Robert Stricker). [available online]
  • –––, 1901, Logische Untersuchungen. Zweiter Theil, Untersuchungen zur Phänomenologie und Theorie der Erkenntnis. Halle: Niemeyer. [available online]
  • –––, 1889/1890, “Lecture on the Concept of Number (WS 1889/1890)”, in Ierna, Carlo (ed.), The New Yearbook for Phenomenology and Phenomenological Philosophy, 5 (2005): 278–309. (Translated by Ierna Carlo.) [available online]
  • Kindinger, Rudolf (ed.), 1965, Philosophenbriefe aus der wissenschaftlichen Korrespondenz von Alexius Meinong. Graz: Akademische Druck- und Verlagsanstalt.
  • Mach, Ernst, 1886, Beiträge zur Analyse der Empfindungen. Jena: Gustav Fischer. [available online]
  • –––, 1914, The Analysis of Sensations. Chicago: Open Court. (Translation by C. M. Williams of Mach 1886.) [available online]
  • Meinong, Alexius, 1882, “Hume Studien II. Zur Relationstheorie” in Sitzungsberichte der philosophisch-historischen Klasse der Kaiserlichen Akademie der Wissenschaften in Wien, Band 101, Vienna, 573–752. [available online]
  • –––, 1891, “Zur Psychologie der Komplexionen und Relationen” in Zeitschrift für Psychologie und Physiologie der Sinnesorgane II: 245–265. [available online]
  • –––, 1894, Psychologisch-ethische Untersuchungen zur Werth-Theorie. Graz: Leuschner & Lubensky. [available online]
  • Menger, Carl, 1871, Grundsätze der Volkswirtschaftslehre, Vienna: Wilhelm Braumüller. [available online]
  • Stumpf, Carl, 1883, Tonpsychologie. Vol. 1. Leipzig: Hirzel. [available online]
  • –––, 1890, Tonpsychologie. Vol. 2. Leipzig: Hirzel. [available online]
  • Urban, Wilbur Marshall, 1909, Valuation: Its Nature and its Laws. London: Swan Sonnenschein & Co. [available online]
  • Wieser, Friedrich von, 1889, Der natürliche Werth. Vienna: Alfred Hölder. [available online]

Secondary Literature

  • Albertazzi, Liliana, Massimo Libardi, and Roberto Poli (eds.), 1996, The School of Franz Brentano. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Albertazzi, Liliana, Dale Jacquette, and Roberto Poli (eds.), 2001, The School of Alexius Meinong. Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Ash, Mitchell G., 1995, Gestalt Psychology in German Culture 1890–1967: Holism and the Quest for Objectivity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dickinson, Edward, 2002, “Sex and the ‘Yellow Peril’: Christian von Ehrenfels’ Program for the Revision of the European Sexual Order, 1902–1910” in German Studies Review, 25(2): 255–284. [available online]
  • Dölling, Evelyn, 1999, “Wahrheit suchen und Wahrheit bekennen.” Alexius Meinong: Skizze seines Lebens. Amsterdam and Atlanta: Rodopi.
  • Eaton, Howard O., 1930, The Austrian Philosophy of Values. Norman: Oklahoma University Press.
  • Fabian, Reinhard (ed.), 1986, Christian von Ehrenfels: Leben und Werk. Amsterdam and Atlanta: Rodopi.
  • –––, 1996, “Christian von Ehrenfels 1859–1932”, in Albertazzi et al., 161–174.
  • Grassl, Wolfgang, and Smith, Barry (eds.), 1986, Austrian Economics: Historical and Philosophical Background. London and Sydney: Croom Helm.
  • Ierna, Carlo, 2009, “Husserl et Stumpf sur la Gestalt et la fusion”, in Philosophiques, 36(2): 489–510. [available online]
  • –––, 2011, “Brentano and Mathematics”, in Revue Roumaine de Philosophie, 55(1): 149–167.
  • Reicher, Maria E., 2006, “Austrian Aesthetics”, in Mark Textor (ed.), Austrian Philosophy and Analytic Philosophy. London: Routledge, 293–323.
  • –––, 2009, “Value Facts and Value Experiences in Early Phenomenology”, in Beatrice Centi and Wolfgang Huemer (eds.), Values and Ontology: Problems and Perspectives. Frankfurt: Ontos, 105–135.
  • Rollinger, Robin D., 2008, Austrian Phenomenology: Brentano, Husserl, Meinong, and Others on Mind and Object. Frankfurt: Ontos.
  • Simons, Peter, 1986, “Mathematik als Wissenschaft der Gestalten”, in in Fabian 1986, 112–135.
  • –––, 1988, “Einleitung”, in R. Fabian (ed.) 1988, 1–12.
  • Smith, Barry (ed.), 1988, Foundations of Gestalt Theory. Munich and Vienna: Philosophia.
  • –––, 1994, Austrian Philosophy: The Legacy of Franz Brentano. Chicago and Lasalle, IL: Open Court.
  • Weinhandl, Ferdinand (ed.), 1960, Gestalthaftes Sehen. Ergebnisse und Aufgaben der Morphologie. Zum hundertjährigen Geburtstag von Christian von Ehrenfels. Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
  • Zimmer, Alfred, 2001, “Christian von Ehrenfels”, in Albertazzi et al. 2001, 135–143.

Other Internet Resources

  • Ehrenfels’ page, at the Franz Brentano Archiv Graz, in German.
  • Ehrenfels, entry in Rudolf Eisler, Philosophen–Lexikon, Berlin: Mittler, 1912.


The editors would like to thank Maria Reicher-Marek for providing useful comments on early drafts of this entry.

Copyright © 2015 by
Robin Rollinger <>
Carlo Ierna <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free