Ernst Mach

First published Wed May 21, 2008; substantive revision Tue Apr 28, 2009
The frequent excursions which I have made into this province have all sprung from the profound conviction that the foundations of science as a whole, and of physics in particular, await their next greatest elucidations from the side of biology, and especially, from the analysis of the sensations. [Mach in Analysis of Sensations: Preface to 1st Ed.]

Ernst Mach (February 18, 1838 – February 19, 1916) made major contributions to physics, philosophy, and physiological psychology. In physics, the speed of sound bears his name, as he was the first to systematically study super-sonic motion. He also made important contributions to understanding the Doppler effect. His critique of Newtonian ideas of absolute space and time were an inspiration to the young Einstein, who credited Mach as being the philosophical forerunner of relativity theory. His systematic skepticism of the old physics was similarly important to a generation of young German physicists.

In philosophy, he is best known for his influence upon the Vienna Circle (a predecessor of which was named the Ernst Mach Verein), for his famous anti-metaphysical attitude (which developed into the verifiability theory of meaning), for his anti-realist stance in opposition to atomism, and in general for his positivist-empiricist approach to epistemology. It is important to note that some of these influences are currently being re-examined, and are now thought to be both more tenuous and more complicated than was once assumed. He was also an important historian of science, and occupied the Chair for the Philosophy of the Inductive Sciences at the University of Vienna. Although previous philosophers had commented on science and many scientists had influenced philosophy, Mach more than anyone else bridged the divide; he is a founder of the philosophy of science.

In psychology, he studied the relationship of our sensations to external stimuli. Space, time, color, sound, once the domain of physics, were now also being studied by psychologists and conceived of as not only the stuff of the physical external world but also the elements of our inner experience. Mach was deeply inspired by Gustav Fechner's psychophysics here. Psychologists today regard him as a founder of Gestalt theory as well as the discoverer of neural inhibition. Importantly, although in the twentieth century he was better known to philosophers for his influence upon physics and the philosophy of physics, it was psychology that was the primary driving force behind his philosophy of science.

In his later years (1901), Mach was appointed to the Austrian Parliament, where he was known as a reformer. His intellectual influence amongst leftists was so great that Lenin wrote a book, Materialism and Empirico-Criticism, criticizing Machian anti-materialism.

1. Summary

A broad foundation is laid for the theory in question, and light is shed upon it from new sides, if, in conformity with the stimulus given by Darwinism, we conceive of all psychical life — including science — as biological appearance, and if we apply to the theory the Darwinian conceptions of struggle for existence, of development, and of selection. [Analysis of Sensations, 49–50]

Mach was a naturalist and a monist, as well as an anti-materialist in the sense of being an anti-mechanist. The connection between naturalism and materialism is an important one for Mach. Naturalism, in its simplest sense, is the doctrine that there is nothing beyond nature, not even the organic or mental, and evolution is thus generally a crucial component of it. The materialism of the mechanical philosophy is the further view that this nature consists of matter in motion, and in particular that psychic phenomena can be reduced to matter in motion. Although materialism can make as much use of evolution as naturalism, Mach's nineteenth century evolutionary views influenced his anti-materialism. Whereas mechanistic materialism views nature as an organized system of billiard balls, Mach's evolutionary perspective viewed nature as a dynamic process.

Mach is part of the empiricist tradition, but he also believed in something like a priori truths. But it is a biologized a priori: what is a priori to an individual organism was a posteriori to its ancestors; not only does the a priori pre-form experience, but the a priori is itself formed from experience. It was simultaneously the contradiction and confirmation of Kantian epistemology. In as much as Kant used the a priori to explain how knowledge is possible, Mach uses the knowledge of the new sciences to explain how an a priori is possible. One more patch of philosophy, it was thought, yielded to science.

Mach's empiricism is complicated. It has its roots in the belief that knowledge is a product of evolution, that our senses, minds, and cultures have an evolutionary history. It was simple experience to which early organisms responded, and it was out of simple experiences that the first images of the world were constructed. These constructions became a priori, allowing new and more complicated understandings, and so forth. This process is in a sense repeated in development; individual development begins through a process of the interaction of simple sensations with those innate capacities formed in our ancestors. Out of this, more complex understandings arise; the process continues. Science furthers this biological process by bringing our primitive conceptions into contact with new environments, thus causing mental adaptation. The one and same process unites all features of activity in nature: the adaptation of early life to primordial environments and the adaptation of modern science to new data are unified under the principle of experience forcing adaptation in memory. Though loosely an empiricist in this sense, he rejected Locke's tabula rasa, and aligned himself against the more empiricist Helmholtz and towards the nativist Ewald Hering in their famous nature-nurture debates. He is not in the least a traditional empiricist.

Mach is generally considered a ‘positivist’. However, this tells us little, as positivism is really a collection of traditions, connected often by misunderstandings as much as by actual intellectual agreement. Furthermore, the word today has come to mean something so far removed from its nineteenth century origins as to be practically harmful in understanding the how it was used in the nineteenth century. Outside of the social sciences (where it is alive and well), the word ‘positivism’ seems to be used mostly by post-modernists, deconstructionists, and the Frankfurt school as a word to represent that branch of the enlightenment tradition that failed; it has become the ‘other’ which we all know is wrong without having to know what it is. Comte was a Positivist. Mach, too, was a Positivist, but Mach probably has more in common with Husserl than Comte, and certainly more in common with James.

Mach is not a phenomenalist under normal uses of this term, but this certainly requires investigation. First, to whatever extent he was a phenomenalist, he was a ‘scientific’ phenomenalist: his ideas were not derived from philosophical skepticism but through application of the results of psychology and evolutionary theory. He provides clues as to how we should understand his infamous “elements”—they are related to the thought of Fechner and Ewald Hering. Secondly, he advocated that physics should describe relations of experience as much as possible; in his time this was termed ‘phenomenological physics’. This was clearly meant as a methodological suggestion, arising out of the way he thought physics could best respond to the challenges presented to it by the life sciences. Thirdly, he writes that his ideas were the same as Avenarius who had approached questions of the relationship between the psychical and the physical from a physicalistic perspective. Although Mach undoubtedly adopts a sensationalist basis, this foundation is not crucial for Mach. He recognizes the possibility of other foundations:

… many readers have found a stumbling-block in what they took, erroneously indeed, to be the general character of my conception of the universe. And, to begin with, I must say that anyone who, in spite of repeated protests from myself and from other quarters, identifies my view with that of Berkeley, is undoubtedly very far removed from a proper appreciation of my position. This misconception is no doubt partly due to the fact that my view was developed from an earlier idealistic phase, which has left on my language traces which are probably not even yet entirely obliterated. For, of all the approaches to my standpoint, the one by way of idealism seems to me the easiest and most natural…. I feel it to be a piece of particularly good fortune that Avenarius has developed the same conception of the relation between the physical and psychical on an entirely realistic, or, if the phrase be preferred, a materialistic foundation … [italics mine; AS: 361-2; see also 358]

Experimental psychology had just been founded. Mach's elements are, quite simply, the variables of a major branch of psychology, the new field of psychophysics. Mach was part of the first generation of physiological psychologists that thought they had broken through the primeval walls dividing the physical from the mental. They thought they had solved this ancient problem through a scientific, monistic unification. The physical was characterized by its ability to be quantified: it was part of science. Now, the realm of Geist was falling under the same methods used so successfully in physics. Following the pioneering work of Fechner, they had measured sensation and found that the relationship of external stimulus to inner response followed mathematical law. Fueled further by developments in evolutionary theory, their optimism soared, perhaps a bit too high. As so often happens in periods of scientific optimism, these new discoveries called for a philosophy in which they would be at home. Mach not only took up this challenge, but as a physicist also applied the results of this tradition to the categories of physics.

Modern psychologists regard Mach as the forerunner of the idea of neural nets in perception. He discovered that the eye has a mind of its own; we perceive not direct stimuli but relations of stimuli. The visual system operates through a process of continual adaptation of the present sensation to previous ones. We do not experience ‘reality’ but rather experience the after effects of our nervous system's adaptations to new stimuli. Furthermore, from an evolutionary perspective, it was necessary that this relational nature of perception be so. What were once thought of as errors of the brain, Mach showed to be adaptations. His argument is brilliant and he is cited even today in psychology textbooks for these contributions. Furthermore, his work in physiology influenced his epistemology. If we perceive not things directly but contrasts of things, then the world is a biological construction formed through the process of our nervous system adapting to new sensations. Representationalist theories of perception, which posit a direct correspondence between appearance and reality, become untenable.

Mach is also considered by Gestalt theorists to be one of their forerunners. Christian von Ehrenfels, the founder of Gestalt theory, begins his seminal 1890 paper “Über Gestaltqualitäten” by reviewing Gestalt ideas in Mach's Analysis of Sensations. These ideas arose in the context of his research on Mach bands where he realized that the mind and senses actively contribute to sensation. The Analysis of Sensations is full of examples of this sort; its central concern is to understand the dynamic relation between our cognitive structure and experience. Our cognitive structure is itself formed through previous experience, and our current experience is structured by it in turn.

2. Biography and Early Development

Mach was born in Moravia on Feb 18, 1838. In 1840 his family moved to a farm in Untersiebenbrunn, Lower Austria. He studied physics at the University of Vienna from 1855 to 1861, continuing on as a lecturer until 1864. After spending three years as Professor of Mathematics at Graz, he received a Chair at Prague where he stayed until 1895. For the next six years, Mach occupied a Chair in the History and Philosophy of the Inductive Sciences at Vienna. He suffered a stroke in 1898 and retired in 1901. He died near Munich in 1916.

He credited his philosophical awakening to reading, at age fifteen, his father's copy of Kant's Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics:

The book made at the time a powerful and ineffaceable impression upon me, the like of which I never afterwards experienced in any of my philosophical reading. Some two or three years later the superfluity of the role played by “the thing in itself” abruptly dawned upon me. On a bright summer day in the open air, the world with my ego suddenly appeared to me as one coherent mass of sensations, only more strongly coherent in the ego. Although the actual working out of this thought did not occur until a later period, yet this moment was decisive for my whole view. [AS: 30fn]

Mach attended an Austrian Gymnasium in Moravia, graduating at seventeen, entering the University of Vienna as a student of mathematics and physics in 1855, and matriculating in 1860. After graduation, he stayed in Vienna as a privat dozent, supporting himself through giving lectures paid for directly by students (which means he made very little money).

It was in these years at Vienna that Mach began his interest in physiology. Johannes Müller and his students had started a new school of physiology in the 1840's. Initially centered in Berlin, it came to Vienna following the political reforms of 1848 in the guise of Ernst Brüke and Carl Ludwig, a former a student of Müller. This new school was characterized not just by a general suspicion of vitalism (though Müller remained a vitalist of sorts), but more by an agreement on the importance of the application of physical-chemical methods to the biological sciences. Carl Ludwig, Herman von Helmholtz, and Ernst Haeckel also studied under Müller. Although his degree was in physics, Mach enrolled as a student of the Medical Faculty, taking 22 hours of classes in physiology, chemistry, and anatomy. In 1861 he taught a course in physics for medical students, out of which he developed his textbook, Compendium der Physik für Mediciner. He also published his first article on psychophysics, Über das Sehen von Lagen und Winkeln durch die Bewegung des Auges, where he studied the relationship between tension in the eye muscles and perception of form. This work also contains Mach's first reference to Fechner, whose influential Elements of Psychophysics was published in 1860. During the next years in Vienna, he also taught classes in psychophysics and a class entitled Die Principien der Mechanik und mechanischen Physik in ihrer historischen Entwicklung, which possibly marks the start of his interest in the history of science (though we do not know the actual contents of the lectures). Mach was also influenced by Helmholtz's Die Lehre von den Tonempfindungen.

Mach's first important scientific contribution was over the recently discovered ‘Doppler theory’. In 1841, Christian Doppler noticed that sound changes in frequency as a source moves toward and away from an observer. By 1845 he had generalized this to include all wave phenomena, including light. Two prominent physicists, Petzval and Ångström, challenged Doppler. Mach devised a simple apparatus that demonstrated that the Doppler effect was real, at least for sound. A six-foot tube with a whistle at one end was mounted so as to rotate in a vertical plane. When the listener stood in the plane of the axis of rotation no changes in pitch could be heard. But if the observer stood in the plane of rotation, fluctuations in pitch that corresponded to the speed of rotation could be heard. The application of this work to Doppler effects with light remained controversial, but Mach is regarded as one of the first to realize the possibility of studying a star's spectrum to understand its movements [see Blackmore 1972: 17-19; Swoboda 1974: 20-75].

Mach was highly influenced by Johann Herbart during this period, not only through Herbart's writings, but also through Franz Lott, Vienna's Herbartian spokesperson and Mach's good friend. In Herbart, Mach found a mechanical approach to psychology and physiology that coincided with Mach's early acceptance of atomism. As his interests shifted to physiology and psychology, the mechanical models remained, but the atomism became less important. Eventually, the mechanical approach to physiology gave way to an evolutionary approach, and as the mechanical approach lost ground here atomism did as well. This trend increased the deeper Mach went into psychophysics, and eventually turned into an anti-mechanistic philosophy in Mach's mature thought. Mach makes little mention of Herbart in his later writings; for instance, only two brief references are made to Herbart in Analysis of Sensations, both in the context of reflections on his intellectual development.

In 1864 Mach received an appointment in mathematics at Graz. For the first time he had the money and freedom to carry out his own experiments. In 1866 he exchanged his math chair for one in physics. While at Graz he had personal contact with Fechner and carried out his important work on Mach Bands. It was in this work that Mach first made use of evolutionary theory. Mach started work on what later became Analysis of Sensations, but apparently was discouraged by Fechner's criticism. He returned to this work twenty years later, after further developing his own ideas. It was also in Graz that Mach first encountered Ewald Hering's thought, both in physiology and evolution. In Mach's first article on Mach Bands [Mach 1865] he refers to Hering, and in 1866 Hering gave his famous address on Unconscious Memory to the Vienna Academy. In 1867 Mach went to Prague as a professor of physics. He stayed in Prague for twenty-eight years, until 1895, whereupon he returned to Vienna. It was in Prague that his mature thought developed.

Mach's name is, of course, associated with the speed of sound, where Mach 1 means the speed of sound in a given medium. Since the speed of sound varies with the density of the medium it is traveling through, Mach numbers are not absolute quantities but relational ones. In the late 1860's developments in gun and artillery technology produced projectiles that traveled faster than sound vibrations. This was realized over a period of time as two effects were investigated—a second loud ‘boom’, distinct from the usual one of the explosion, as well as a different type of wound. It was the latter that began Mach's interest. In 1868 warring European powers had signed The St. Petersburg Declaration that banned a new type of bullet that exploded on impact, thus causing ‘crater’ type wounds. Soon thereafter, however, similar types of ‘crater’ wounds appeared again. Various theories over their cause were put forward, leading Mach to investigate. By 1885 Mach had worked out the details of supersonic motion, along the way developing high-speed photographic techniques. Most importantly for engineers, Mach Number is the ratio of the speed of sound in the given medium to the speed of the projectile; his work is essential to modern aerodynamics, and through it the word ‘Mach’ has bizarrely entered into popular culture as an icon for razors, sound systems, fighter pilots, and high speed fuels.

Mach's early intellectual development was very much a product of the outstanding developments in the sciences of his time. Whereas a generation before, there existed only one truly mature science, physics, by the early 1860's both psychology and biology had entered the scientific scene. Previously, scientifically based views on reality were essentially Newtonian-mechanistic. After Darwin and Fechner, the new sciences of psychology and evolutionary theory opened up new areas of philosophic-scientific interaction. The possibility of a new scientific view opened up, one based upon these new sciences, and sought to displace the Newtonian paradigm with one based upon developmental orientations.

3. Psychology and the Life Sciences

3.1 Gustav Fechner

My natural bent for the study of these questions received its strongest stimulus twenty-five years ago from Fechner's Elemente der Psychophysik … [AS: xxxvi]

The single greatest influence upon Mach was Fechner; this cannot be overstated. Fechner's The Elements of Psychophysics was published in 1860, but Mach was aware of the ideas in it before. The definitive account of Fechner is Michael Heidelberger's book Nature from Within [2004].

Fechner founded experimental psychology by developing a method of ‘measuring’ the psychical. Our senses have thresholds of perception; that is, given any amount of stimulation of a sense, there is an amount more of that stimulation which is required for us to notice it. Furthermore, that amount increases logarithmically as the base-line sensation increases. This holds true, with complications and variations, for all of our sensations. The import was that there is a mathematical relationship between the external world and the inner, between the physical and the psychological. It was then possible to talk about these dual aspects of reality in a neutral manner (see Neutral Monism). Fechner uses the word ‘elements’ for this purpose, and Mach's elements are directly related to them. With some loss, embed Fechnerian methodology within nineteenth century evolutionary theory, and apply it to the categories of physics, and we get Machian epistemology.

3.2 Mach Bands

In 1865 Mach published, “On the effect of the spatial distribution of the light stimulus on the retina,” the first of a series of remarkable articles on what are now known today as Mach Bands.

mach bands
Mach Bands © Alan Stubbs, from Perceptual Stuff.
Reproduced with permission.

The thin dark bands along the outer edges of the gradients and the thin light bands along the inner edges of the gradients are optical illusions. The cause of this effect is due to contrast perception; we over process at boundaries and under process where there is constancy. In fact sensory response can even stop with unchanging stimulation. Mach is credited for discovering lateral inhibition in our sense organs, the idea that our senses pre-process information before sending it to the brain.

Before this period, optical illusions were understood as just that, errors in judgment, quirks of the brain. The sense organs were seen as simple media with a direct link to the brain. Their only role was to transmit a sensation to the brain, where it was then interpreted. Mach argued that the processing does not all occur in the brain. The quirks of judgment are not due to processing errors in the brain, but innate features of the senses themselves.

The immediate significance of this was that it provided a strong argument against direct representationalist theories of perception. There simply is no isomorphism between reality and appearance. But Mach took this even further, embedding it within his evolutionary Fechnerian framework.

Mach argued that perception works through perceiving the relations between stimuli. And this process is at the root of all life. The same process that drives evolution, drives perception, and even (as we shall see shortly) drives science.

Since every retinal point perceives itself, so to speak, as above or below the average of its neighbors, there results a characteristic type of perception. Whatever is near the mean of the surroundings becomes effaced, whatever is above or below is disproportionately brought into prominence. One could say that the retina schematizes and caricatures. The teleological significance of this process is clear in itself. It is an analog of abstraction and of the formation of concepts. [Mach 1868, in Ratliff 1965: 306]

That which is constant receives less attention, that which varies must be brought into equilibrium. It is this process of bringing contrasts into equilibrium which is at the basis of all organic processes, evolutionary, developmental, and perceptual. The organism is a dynamic system that has innate tendencies to self-regulation and equilibrium. When equilibrium is disturbed, which can happen on a variety of levels, the organism works to form a new equilibrium. The senses are not things that got passively written on, but rather things that interact with environments. Life is not mechanistic but teleological.

And this is not an accident, for can we imagine life otherwise? Mach asks us to consider the following:

Let us first ask how we would find our way in the visual world if we would perceive, not relations of, but only differences in, illumination. One and the same thing in the same surroundings would become immediately unrecognizable with the slightest alteration of light intensity, such as when a cloud covers the sun. Should we still want to find our way, we would then have to habituate ourselves to maintain equal levels of light intensity, for instance by closing and opening our eyes. In fact, if this god of the psychophysical law were non-existent, the organism itself would have to devise it and, if the Darwinian theory is correct, it has devised it. The seeing of light intensity relations, within certain limits, is necessary for the existence of organisms. [Mach 1868 in Ratliff 1965: 300]

We do not perceive the world in itself, Mach claims. If we did we would perceive chaos. Thus we have evolved senses that perceive contrasts of perception, relations of perception. Sensations by themselves can have no organic meaning; only the relations of sensations to one another can have meaning. Perception, Mach believed, is never perception of direct stimuli.

3.3 Gestalt Theory

This central Machian insight that perception is always relational and constructed lies at the origins of Gestalt Theory. The seminal article of Gestalt Theory, Christian von Ehrenfels’ 1890 “Über Gestaltqualitäten,” begins with a review of these ideas, found in Mach's 1886 Analysis of Sensations. Sensations are not simply raw experiences, but the interaction of experience with a pre-formed cognitive structure. For instance, when we hear a known melody, we recognize it no matter what key it is played in. It can be hummed, buzzed, or strummed on a guitar. Furthermore, even if one or more notes are incorrect, we still recognize it. Mach asks, “what constitutes a melody?” It seems incorrect to say that the actual sound vibrations constitute the melody as we have just seen that numerous different sounds can make the same melody. But on the other hand, it seems empirically odd to say that a melody is not constituted out of its sounds. The actual melody, then, exists in our ability to recognize it. It is formed by experience of one or more examples of the melody, but it is an idealization of that experience. Significantly, the idealization captures not the actual sounds, but the relationships of the sounds to one another. Thus a melody can be sung in a high or low pitch, etc., but as long as the relationships remain the same we recognize it as the same melody. For Mach, this process is at the basis of all perception. Experience requires an ‘a priori’, but that a priori is itself formed by experience. This process is also at the root of evolutionary processes.

3.4 Haeckel, Hering and Evolutionary Theory

Nineteenth century evolutionary theory is complicated in that in the cultures which most obviously experienced a widespread acceptance of evolution, inspired apparently by Darwin's 1859 publication of Origin of the Species, evolutionary ideas had already been present and Darwin's mechanism for evolutionary change, natural selection, was not necessarily accepted. Rather, more deeply teleological accounts of nature were often put forward within an evolutionary framework. Mach came of intellectual age in 1860, right when this explosion of evolutionary ideas was starting. Unlike the disciplines of psychology and physics, he makes no contributions to evolutionary theory; however, his entire system is located within an evolutionary framework. This framework is not one that he argues for; rather, it was the metaphysics (yes, metaphysics) he adapted from his nineteenth century German intellectual culture. The two immediate influences on Mach in this regard were Herring and Haeckel, or at least we can turn to their writings to understand the evolutionary tradition Mach was part of.

The greatest popularizer of evolutionary theory in the nineteenth century was of course Ernst Haeckel. Although he is now best known for his infamous maxim, “ontogeny recapitulates phylogeny”, his larger project was to put forward an evolutionary metaphysics; in particular to offer a monistic unified account of our reality. His project, overlapping significantly with that of Mach and Herring, sought to embed the developments of psychology within a theory of evolutionary development; evolution was the evolution of not just the species but also of the psyche.

In late nineteenth century continental Europe a different notion of ‘direction’ existed than the one that Darwin directly attacked. Whereas the theory of natural selection maintains that evolution is a directionless process having no guiding factor or end point, relying rather on selection within particular environments on random variations thrown up by the chaos of nature, Hering, Haeckel, and Mach were part of a German tradition which held that there is an inner telos in nature. Hering and Mach were atheists, and disbelieved in a soul, but still accepted the idea that nature had internal direction. As will be shown later, this idea of internal direction extends for Mach all the way up to his ideas on the purpose of science.

Hering was Mach's close friend, political ally, academic partner, and second only to Fechner in terms of total influence. Hering was also a fellow Fechnerian (he studied under Fechner), and he shared both Mach's bio-psychological orientation and nativist theories of spatial intuition. Hering is known for his work in binocular vision and for his debates with Helmholtz over color vision, and also for his address to the Imperial Academy of Sciences in Vienna, “On Memory as a Universal Function of Organized Matter”.

3.5 Monism

All three were also leaders in the Monist movement. It is no accident that one of the oldest philosophy journals is The Monist (started in 1888). A look through its early volumes reveals a mixture of scientific applications to the various categories of human existence. Mach was a frequent contributor, and indeed a good friend of the editor, Paul Carus, who also arranged the English translation and publication of many of Mach's works. In 1906, Monistenbund, a monistic society, was formed with the intention of including everyone who believed that there was only one reality. Haeckel and Ostwald were active members and tried without success to bring in Mach with an offer of the presidency in 1912. Mach wrote back:

There are as many different monisms as there are people in it. Monism is provisionally a goal, after which we all strive, but is scarcely anything fixed or sufficient … It seems to me … ludicrous to found a kind of religious sect, while refusing to consider philosophical questions [as to its nature]. But this is not so terribly important in so far as the movement is limited to a small circle of intellectuals. But if it expands more widely, then it will probably let loose a kind of counterreformation for which I definitely have no sympathy. [Blackmore 1972: 193-4]

4. Philosophy of Science

4.1 Historical Critique

Mach wrote a number of widely read science history texts; in a sense they are archaeologies of science, digging at the past to critically elucidate the present. Machian history can also be seen in the context of German nineteenth century thought; Hegel, David Strauss, Nietzsche, and Marx all offered historical frameworks for their various social-philosophical positions. They also saw their own critiques as playing a crucial role in the new order that was to follow. That is, each of their works placed itself at the juncture of history, where their writing self-consciously was to influence the next stage that it had predicted. Certainly d'Alembert, Herschel, Whewell, and Mill had written histories of science before Mach, but it was Mach who wrote critical history in the above sense. The interesting aspect of Mach's critique was that it actually had an effect upon science. Science of Mechanics deserves mention in the history of physics.

4.2 Biological Origins of Science

Mach puts science on a continuum with earlier human activity, in fact with earlier animal activity. What began as simple adaptations that allowed instinctive responses to immediate conditions, gradually evolved into ever more complex capacities for response. Gradually life acquired memory and thus an awareness of a wider field of spatial-temporal relations than is present immediately to the senses. Memory then grew beyond individual memory and became communicated culturally. Science is a direct outgrowth of this deep natural process:

Lower animals living under simple, constant and favorable conditions adapt themselves to immediate circumstances through their innate reflexes. This usually suffices to maintain individuals and species for a suitable period. An animal can withstand more intricate and less stable conditions only if it can adapt to a wider range of spatial and temporal surroundings. This requires a farsightedness in space and time which is met first by more perfect sense organs, and with mounting demands by a development in the life of the imagination. Indeed an organism that possesses memory has wider spatial and temporal surroundings in its mental field of vision than it could reach through its senses. It perceives, as it were, even those regions that adjoin the directly visible, seeing the approach of prey or foe before any sense organ announces them. What guarantees to primitive man a measure of advantage over his animal fellows is doubtless only the strength of his individual memory, which is gradually reinforced by the communicated memory of forebears and tribe. Likewise, what essentially marks progress in civilization is that noticeably wider regions of space and time are drawn within the scope of human attention. With the partial relief that a rising civilization affords, to begin with through division of labor, development of trades and so on, the individual's life is focused on a smaller range of facts and gains in strength, while that of society as a whole does not lose in scope. Gradually the activity of thinking thus invigorated may itself become a calling. Scientific thought arises out of popular thought, and so completes the continuous series of biological development that begins with the first simple manifestations of life.…. Indeed, the formation of scientific hypotheses is merely a further degree of development of instinctive and primitive thought, and all the transitions between them can be demonstrated. [KE: 171]

In an article to which Mach often refers, he writes: “Here I wish simply to consider the growth of natural knowledge in the light of the theory of evolution. For knowledge, too, is a product of organic nature. And although ideas, as such, do not comport themselves in all respects like independent organic individuals, and although violent comparisons should be avoided, still if Darwin reasoned rightly, the general imprint of evolution and transformation must be noticeable in ideas also.” [PL: 218] And later, “We are prepared, thus, to regard ourselves and every one of our ideas as a product and a subject of universal evolution; and in this way we shall advance sturdily and unimpeded along the paths which the future will throw open to us.” [PL: 233]

4.3 Biological Purpose of Science

Once science is placed within an evolutionary context, Mach’s teleological views of evolution (see section 3.4) become significant for his philosophy of science. The developmental processes of evolution have given rise to this complex human activity we call science, which now itself is participating in the processes of evolution. Just as the eye, for instance, has evolved to better aid us in adapting to a greater variety of landscapes, so science has evolved to better aid us in adapting to the world:

Science apparently grew out of biological and cultural development as its most superfluous offshoot. However, today we can hardly doubt that it has developed into the factor that is biologically and culturally the most beneficial. Science has taken over the task of replacing tentative and unconscious adaptation by a faster variety that is fully conscious and methodical. [KE: 361]

Science is both an outcome of this process (it has biological roots), and also now is part of this process (it has a biological function continuous with other evolutionary processes). Leaves, hearts, brains, eyes, and science are on a continuum in as much as they arose out of adaptive processes and now serve the biological function of survival and further adaptation.

Man is governed by the struggle for self preservation: his whole activity is in its service, and only achieves with richer resources, what the reflexes accomplish in the lower organisms under simpler conditions of life. Every recollection, every idea, every piece of knowledge has a value originally only in so far as it directly furthers man in the direction indicated. [PH: 336]

It should be noted that Mach does not argue or provide evidence for this evolutionary view of science; he seems rather to adopt it from ideas that were being circulated in the later half of the nineteenth century. Nonetheless, references to a deep evolutionary perspective permeate his writings. For instance:

The biological task of science is to provide the fully developed human with as perfect a means of orientating himself as possible. No other scientific ideal can be realized, and any other must be meaningless. [AS: 37]

And also:

The adaptation of thoughts to facts, accordingly, is the aim of all scientific research. In this, science only deliberately and consciously pursues what in daily life goes on unnoticed and of its own accord.” [AS: 316]

This evolutionary perspective even plays a critical role in his understanding of physics. For instance, in his famous exchange with Planck (see 5.3), Mach repeatedly refers to his biologico-economical theory of knowledge as an important part of view of the physical world.

4.4 Economy and Unity of Science

One and the same view underlies both my epistemological-physical writings and my present attempt to deal with the physiology of the senses — the view, namely, that all metaphysical elements are to be eliminated as superfluous and as destructive of the economy of science. [AS: xxxviii]

The idea of an economy of nature dates back at least to Linnaeus, is present throughout nineteenth century evolutionary ideas, and finds another home in Mach. Nature is an organized and frugal system. Excess exists only in a vestigial sense; everything has its place. For Darwin, the economy of nature had a ready explanation in natural selection, and the non-economical aspects of nature, such as vestigial organs, took on great significance. A logic of biology took hold: where once economy was an observed feature of nature, it now became a necessary feature. Even the apparent non-economical aspects were ultimately economical. Where once economy required explanation, it now became the explanation. A phenomenon of nature turned into a force of nature. As is typical for Mach, widely accepted biological principles become uncritically held cornerstones of his epistemology.

Of course, the metaphor of economy is also used in economics. According to Mach's own recollections of his intellectual development in a 1910 essay, “The Guiding Principles of My Scientific Theory,” he first understood science as ‘okonomisch’ in 1864, through discussions with his friend E. Hermann, a political economist. In the same passage, Mach proceeds to note that he was well prepared for this idea through his biological background, and in fact the two combined to form what became his ‘biological-economical theory of knowledge’. [Mach 1910: 30-31]

The purpose of science is to give the most economical description of nature as possible, because science is to provide conceptions which can help us better orient ourselves to our world, and if science is uneconomical then it is useless in this regard. Put another way, Mach's reason for insisting that economy must be a guiding principle in accepting or rejecting a theory is that uneconomical theories cannot fulfill their biological function, which, as we have seen previously, he insists is (in a descriptive sense) the function of science. The biological purpose of science is the improvement or the better adaptation of memory in service of the organism's development:

The aim of scientific economy is to provide us with a picture of the world as complete as possible — connected, unitary, calm and not materially disturbed by new occurrences: in short a world picture of the greatest possible stability. The nearer science approaches this aim, the more capable will it be of controlling the disturbances of practical life, and thus serving the purpose out of which its first germs were developed. [PH: 336, italics added]

Disturbances in environments cause maladaptations; progressive adaptation only has meaning in reference to that which is stable. Science must be economical so that a stable basis for our orientation can be built up, and this leads to a crucial point: as science encompasses more and more of the world, and as these theories work themselves into our unconscious memory, more and more of the world becomes part of our pre-existing cognitive structure. That is, the role of science is to improve our orientation to the world.

Let us look in depth at a discussion of these issues occurring in Science and Mechanics in a chapter entitled “The Economy of Science.” The section occurs toward the end of the book, and begins: “It is the object of science to replace, or save experiences, by the reproduction and anticipation of facts in thought. Memory is handier than experience, and often answers the same purpose.” [SM: 577] The economical role of science is to allow us to understand and react to nature prior to experience; just as a newborn chicken knows what to do as soon as it is hatched due to its accumulated memory (it doesn't need to learn on its own as the learning has already been done by its ancestors), so we now learn from science how to anticipate the world. Our memory encompasses more and more of the world, thus allowing better and better orientation.

The drive for economy is itself a biological instinct, which science must thus also fulfill. In a larger sense, economy is tied to the innate tendency toward survival or search for better orientation discussed earlier. Evolution is guided by these principles; life as a product of evolution has a tendency toward these principles, and we as humans have these tendencies hard-wired into us—even to the point that our very conception of self-existence arises out of it; in Analysis of Sensations, the ego is described as arising from an “ideal mental economical unity.” [AS: 22]

An important application of this idea of economy occurs when two theories, formerly separate, come in contact. For Mach this is a central concern: he is driven to unify psychology and physics. At issue here is the economical requirement of needing a single orientating perspective: “But anyone who has in mind the gathering up of the sciences into a single whole, has to look for a conception to which he can hold in every department of science.” [AS: 312] When theories come in contact with each other, adaptation of one to the other must take place: “Epistemological criticism [is not a problem for the physicist]. But when it is a question of bringing into connection two adjacent departments, each of which has been developed in its special way, the connection cannot be effected by means of the limited conceptions of a narrow special department. By means of more general considerations, conceptions have to be created which shall be adequate for the wider domain.” [AS: 313] It is uneconomical to have one theory for physics and another for psychology; the mind demands that the two be brought together. Attempts at such mutual adaptation have so far been failures and Mach hopes that his ideas can facilitate this:

To the physicist, qua physicist, the idea of “body” … [assists in] a real facilitation of view, and is not the cause of disturbance…. When, however, physics and psychology meet, the ideas held in the one domain prove to be untenable in the other. From the attempt at mutual adaptation arise the various atomic and monadistic theories — which, however, never attain their end. If we regard sensations, in the sense above defined (p. 13), as the elements of the world, the problems referred to appear to be disposed of in all essentials, and the first and most important adaptation to be consequently effected. This fundamental view (without any pretension to being a philosophy for all eternity) can at present be adhered to in all fields of experience … [AS: 32]

The inherent non-metaphysical unity of the physical and psychical is not concocted, rather the disunity is what is artificial. Mach's ideas on the unity of science, then, arise out of his bio-economical model of science.

4.5 Nature of Scientific Change and Progress

Finally, Mach can be seen as the precursor of what is today one of the major epistemological metaphors of scientific change. Mach offers a selectionist account of group-level change consisting of selection upon naturally produced variation, passed on through processes of heredity. As with Darwinian evolution, scientific variation itself is not directed. Emphasizing the importance of natural variation, Mach had a Feyerabendian tolerance of nonscientific beliefs—the familiar point being that it is better to tolerate some error than risk losing variation which might yield fruit later. As an indication of variation's importance, several chapters in his various books are directed almost entirely to this subject. Variation is not something which we consciously produce, but rather something which happens by accident.

The mind is not able to come up with new ideas on its own, that is, it is unable to direct creativity. Thus, variation is not directed, but science relies on fantasy, chance, luck, etc., for production of its ideas. Once produced, scientists choose those ideas which best fit the facts. Mach also comments on the debates over whether reasoning, inductive or deductive, can produce knowledge, arguing that reasoning cannot by itself produce knowledge, but rather can only operate on existing variation: “Thus syllogism and induction do not create new knowledge, but merely make sure that there is no contradiction between our various insights and show clearly how these are connected, and lead our attention to different sides of some particular insight, teaching us to recognize it in different forms. Obviously, then, the genuine source from which the enquirer gains knowledge must lie elsewhere.” [KE: 231]

Although the mind cannot direct the creation of ideas, it can direct the selection of them. Selection occurs when the scientists choose the theories, out of the pool of available variation, which best fit the data and other pre-existing ideas. It is also worth noting that Mach talks of the tendency for resistance to change as being both necessary and problematic for science. Mach was not only one of the founders of Gestalt Theory, but also applied its core concepts to the process of science. Packaged together with his use of history to elucidate science, he anticipates Kuhn's ideas on scientific change and progressive rationality.

5. Physics

Just as the early Mach was influenced by the revolutions in psychology and biology, the mature Mach was deeply involved in the revolutions in physics, though remaining a critic of the new physics just as much as he had been of the old. Both Planck and Einstein paid their homage to the person who created a culture of critique within which they developed their ideas. They also came to criticize what they saw as his stubborn refusal to accept their new ideas.

To twentieth philosophy, Mach is best known as a positivist who influenced Logical Positivism, a philosopher of physics who influenced Einstein, and an empiricist who denied the reality of atoms. None of this is incorrect, but to understand Mach as limited to physics is a huge mistake. Mach's influence upon physics and its philosophy was enormous; the mistake has been to not understand the roots of Mach's ideas, a mistake which took place early in the twentieth century as a new brand of positivism/empiricism entered the scene (one which turned away from the life sciences as the scientific driving force of positivist epistemology and focused on the new developments in the foundations of physics and logic). This encyclopedia has several entries on the history and philosophy of physics (see links below) which detail Mach's ideas, contributions, and influences (in particular, his famous critique of Newtonian Absolute Space and Time, as well as his relationship to Einstein). What follows is a placement of his ideas within the context of his larger thought.

5.1 Space

Mach perhaps writes more about space than any single other topic; the Analysis of Sensations is dominated by discussions about it (Chapters 6 to 10 are devoted, more or less, exclusively to it) as is Space and Geometry. His Science of Mechanics contains his famous analysis of absolute space. The starting point of Mach's thought is that physiological space is different from geometrical space. The idea of physiological space was not new with Mach; apparently initiated by Müller, it was discussed by both Helmholtz and Hering. Physiological space is the space constructed by our cognitive structure. It is not something we intentionally create, but rather it is a product of unconscious adaptation, and as such, may be a source of a priori truths. Geometrical space, on the other hand, is an intellectual construction, “reached for the most part by purposeful experience.” [SG: 5] While physiological space is completely psychological, geometrical space is an abstraction on physiological space. Neither is an ‘objective’ or ‘absolute’ space.

Whereas geometrical space is unbounded, infinite, and homogeneous (at least in its Euclidean form), physiological space is highly bounded, finite, and non-uniform. Geometrical space is detached from our emotional psyche, but physiological space is intertwined with basic emotions: a tiger nearby in physiological space brings about different emotions than a tiger far away in physiological space. Similarly, upness and downness, rightness and leftness are not just abstract directions but have physiological, and thus psychological meaning. When objects in physiological space are moved, their (apparent)size changes (similarly, when we move, the size of objects in physiological space also changes). And, importantly, physiological space does not, at least in its origins, have a metric. The origins of physiological space are in unconscious biological need, whereas the origins of geometrical space are in physiological space and intellectual development.

5.2 Measurement

This brings us to the problem of measurement. Normally when we measure an interval we believe we are indeed measuring space or time. However, measurement relies upon comparison. This was important for Mach: we do not measure ‘space’, but rather we compare our spatial sensations. All measurement requires the use of a standard, and since any standard we pick is of the same nature as the thing we are measuring, we do not truly measure anything (if by this we mean an absolute measurement):

But we do not measure mere space; we require a material standard of measurement, and with this the whole system of manifold sensations is brought back again. It is only intuitional sense-presentations that can lead to the formulation of the equations of physics, and it is precisely in such presentations that the interpretation of these equations consists. Thus, though the equations only contain spatial numerical measurements, these measurements, also, are merely the ordering principle which tells us out of what members of the series of sensational elements we have to construct our picture of the world. [AS: 343]

When we measure the spatial dimensions of an object, we are comparing it to an agreed upon standard. Ultimately all standards must have their root in physiological comparison. In this way Mach tries to bring physics back into psychology. Physics is based upon measurements, but measurements are ultimately physiological comparisons. According to Mach, physics can never escape its biological origins. Planck and Einstein accepted Mach's critique of the old physics, that it was under the spell of concepts which were derivative of unreflective development, but rejected Mach's claim that physics was stuck, so to speak, in psychology.

5.3 Anti-Atomism

… the biological-economical interpretation of the cognitive process can perfectly well co-exist on peaceable, and indeed on friendly, terms with that of present-day physics. The only real point of difference which has so far come to light concerns the belief in the reality of atoms. Here again, Planck can hardly find words degrading enough for such wrong headedness …. After exhorting the reader, with Christian charity, to respect his opponent, P. brands me, in the well-known biblical words, as a “false prophet.” It appears that the physicists are on the way to founding a church; they are already using a church's traditional weapons. To this I answer simply: “If belief in the reality of atoms is so important to you, I cut myself off from the physicist's mode of thinking, I do not wish to be a true physicist, I renounce all scientific respect—in short: I decline with thanks the communion of the faithful. I prefer freedom of thought.” [“The Guiding Principles of My Scientific Theory of Knowledge and Its Reception by My Contemporaries.” 37-38]

Mach's opposition to atomism has become one of his best known legacies, with Mach seen as an anti-realist about unobservable entities. While anti-realist arguments can indeed be found in Mach, their origins lie not in philosophical skepticism but in his bio-psychological view of science. Furthermore, his concerns about atoms were often specific to the various competing theories of the time. It should be noted that the issue of atomism was a central scientific controversy of this period; there were a variety of theories of atoms being put forward as well as varieties of alternatives. In his Principles of the Theory of Heat, Mach aligned himself with a phenomenological approach to thermodynamics—a temporarily fruitful research program that avoided the problems of positing theoretical causal entities. Mach's experimental research was not in this area, but at stake was not just the reality of atoms but an understanding of science. Mach's attitude toward atoms was an outgrowth of a view of science.

He became embroiled in a long-standing dispute with Boltzmann, propounder of the kinetic theory of gasses. Boltzmann and Mach ended up agreeing in essence: if atomic theory was fruitful it should be used, but adopted what today might be considered an anti-metaphysical stance toward a theory that was still largely unsubstantiated. It is generally agreed that it was not until 1905 with Einstein's study of Brownian motion that the kinetic theory of molecules found full verification.

Mach's views on atomism are most clearly presented in an exchange with Planck. In 1909 Planck wrote an essay “The Unity of the Physical World-Picture”, which contained a severe criticism of Mach's philosophy. Mach replied in 1910, with “The Guiding Principles of My Scientific Theory of Knowledge and Its Reception by My Contemporaries.” Planck responded in 1910 with “On Mach's Theory of Physical Knowledge: A Reply.”

At issue were differences on how to make science free of human subjectivity, and how to achieve a unified science. Planck [1909] argues that while we once defined heat according to sensations, the study of heat has gone beyond this, now being under the purview of electrodynamics and kinetic theory; similarly, tones and color are now understood as frequencies or wavelengths. Although physics had its beginnings in the analysis of sense impressions, its current success is due to removing these anthropomorphic elements. Planck formulates a vision of a human-independent science in reaction to Mach's claim that science is human-dependent.

Planck thought that physics can go beyond psychological dependency by basing itself on psychologically independent universal constants: “the constants appearing in the laws of heat radiation in free ether, like the constants of gravity, have a universal character and involve no reference to any special substance or any special body” [1909]. They are human-independent in a way that a unit like a centimeter is not. These constants can be used to “establish units of length, time, volume and temperature, which must of necessity retain their meaning for all time and for all cultures, even extra-terrestrial and extra-human ones” [1909].

Mach's response is one of his last statements of position:

I have no doubt that if, somewhere in the universe a creature organized like ourselves could make observations … it would perceive a universe working similarly to that we ourselves describe …. As for the reality of atoms: I have no doubt that if atomic theory corresponds to the reality given by the senses, the conclusions drawn from it will also bear some relation to the facts — though what relation remains unclear. The distance from the glass of the first dark ring in reflected light corresponds to one-half of the period of Newton's ‘fits’, but to one quarter of Young and Fresnel's ‘wavelength’. The findings of atomic theory, likewise, can undergo a variety of convenient reinterpretations, even if we are in no great hurry to take them for realities. [Mach 1910: 36-37]

Bibliography

Thiele (1963) and Blackmore (1972) contain exhaustive bibliographies of the German editions of Mach's books, articles, newspaper writings, and correspondence. Mach's archive is located in the Deutches Museum in Munich.

Floyd Ratliff's Mach Bands, in addition to explicating the importance of Mach's work in psychology to modern psychology, also contains translations of five critical articles written by Mach in 1865–68.

Primary Literature

Books in English Translation

[SG] Space and Geometry in the Light of Physiological, Psychological and Physical Inquiry. Trans. by T. J. McCormack, La Salle: Open Court, 1960.
[SM] The Science of Mechanics: A critical and Historical Account of its Development. Trans. by T. J. McCormack, La Salle: Open Court, 1960.
[PL] Popular Scientific Lectures. Trans. T. J. McCormack, La Salle: Open Court, 1986.
[KE] Knowledge and Error—Sketches on the Psychology of Enquiry. Trans. By T. J. McCormack & P. Fouldes, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1976.
[AS] The Analysis of Sensations and the Relation of the Physical to the Psychical. Trans. by C. M. Williams, La Salle: Open Court, 1984.
[PE] Principles of the Theory of Heat—Historically and Critically Elucidated. Trans. T. J. McCormack, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1986.

Critical Articles and Essays

[1890] “The Analysis of Sensations—Antimetaphysical.” Monist, 1: 48.
[1891] “Some Questions of Psycho-Physics.” Monist, 1: 394–400.
[1892] “Facts and Mental Symbols.” Monist, 2: 198.
[1906] “On Physiological, as Distinguished from Geometrical Space.” Monist, 11: 321.
[1908] “Über den Relativen Bildungswert der Philologischen und der Mathematisch-Naturwissenschaften Unterrichtsfächer.” Vienna.
[1910] “The Guiding Principles of My Scientific Theory of Knowledge and Its Reception by My Contemporaries.” In S. Toulmin [1970].
[1910a] “Die Organisierung der Intelligenz.” Neue Freie Presse, July 24, Morgenblatt.
[1913] “Psychic and Organic Life.” Monist, 23: 1.
[1913a] “Selbstbiographie.” In Blackmore [1992].

Articles on Mach Bands, in Mach Bands, Ed. Floyd Ratliff.

[1865] “On the effect of the spatial distribution of the light stimulus on the retina.” 253–271.
[1866] “On the physiological effect of spatially distributed light stimuli.” 271–284.
[1866b] “On the physiological effect of spatially distributed light stimuli.” 285–298.
[1868] “On the physiological effect of spatially distributed light stimuli.” 299–306.
[1868b] “On the dependence of retinal points on one another.” 307–320.
[1906b] “On the influence of spatially and temporally varying light stimuli on visual perception.” 321–332.

Lectures in Popular Scientific Lectures, Open Court, 1986. These were lectures dating from 1863 to 1898. They were first published collectively in English in 1898.

  • The Forms of Liquids. 1–16.
  • The Fibres of Corti. 17–31.
  • On the Causes of Harmony. 32–47.
  • The Velocity of Light. 48–65.
  • Why Man has Two Eyes. 66–106
  • On Symmetry. 89–106.
  • On the Fundamental Concepts of Electrostatics. 107–136.
  • On the Principle of the Conservation of Energy. 137–185.
  • On the Economical Nature of Physical Inquiry. 186–214.
  • On Transformation and Adaptation in Scientific Thought. 214–235.
  • On the Principle of Comparison on Physics. 236–258.
  • On the Part Played by Accident in Invention and Discovery. 259–281.
  • On Sensations of Orientation. 282–309.
  • On Some Phenomena Attending the Flight of Projectiles. 309–337.
  • On Instruction in the Classics and the Mathematico-Physical Sciences. 238–274.

Secondary Literature

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  • –––. 2003. Ernst Mach's World Elements: A Study in Natural Philosophy (Western Ontario Studies in the Philosophy of Science), Berlin: Springer.
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Paul Pojman

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