Émilie du Châtelet

First published Wed May 29, 2013

Émilie le Tonnelier de Breteuil, marquise Du Châtelet-Lomont—or simply Émilie Du Châtelet—was born in Paris on 17 December 1706 to baron Louis Nicholas le Tonnelier de Breteuil and Gabrielle Anne de Froullay, Baronne de Breteuil. She married Marquis Florent-Claude de Châtelet-Lomont in 1725. Together they had three children, a daughter and two sons (the second died the year after his birth). In 1733, she met Voltaire who became her lover and life-long intellectual companion. They retired to Du Châtelet's husband's estate—Cirey—which was remodeled to include a laboratory with several instruments for their on-going scientific experiments. In 1748, she became pregnant at the age of 42 with the child of her then lover, Jean-François de Saint-Lambert. She bore her fourth child, a daughter, on 4 September 1749 and died on 10 September 1749.

In her intellectual work, Du Châtelet focused on natural philosophy, particularly that of Newton, Leibniz and Christian Wolff. She knew, corresponded with, or was tutored by Pierre Louis de Maupertuis, Alexis-Claude Clairaut, Samuel Koenig, and several members of the Bernoulli family, and her advanced abilities in physics and mathematics made her especially able to write capably about Newton's physics. She thus contributed to the shift in France away from an acceptance of Cartesian physics and toward the embrace of Newtonian physics. Nonetheless, she was more than just an expositor of others' works, and she was not interested in physics alone. Indeed, still squarely in the tradition of natural philosophy, Du Châtelet sought a metaphysical basis for the Newtonian physics she embraced upon rejecting Cartesianism.

Voltaire implicitly acknowledged her significant contribution—especially on more technical material—to his 1738 Eléments de la philosophie de Newton. Judging from the one surviving chapter on color formation of Du Châtelet's now-lost “Essai sur l'optique” (ca. 1736), this earlier essay seems to have been a more developed version of the chapter on optics in Voltaire's book, thus indicating her significant contribution to Voltaire's work. In 1737 Du Châtelet entered a competition to explain the nature of fire, conducting her experiments in secret while Voltaire also conducted experiments for his entry to the competition. Both Du Châtelet's and Voltaire's entries aimed to disprove the theory that fire is a material substance, and both were published along with the three winners (including an essay by Leonhard Euler). Du Châtelet returned to this project a number of times thereafter, making significant revisions to the original text as her ideas on the nature of fire matured and changed. In 1738, she published “Lettre sur les ‘Eléments de la philosophie de Newton’” in the Journal des savants in which she argued against those who accepted a Cartesian account of attraction. In 1740 she published her Institutions de physique (The Foundations of Physics) as a textbook in physics for her son (a second edition was published in 1742 under the slightly altered title Institutions physique). It was in this text—her magnum opus—that she supplied the metaphysical basis for the Newtonian physics she had long accepted. This metaphysics was Leibnizian and Wolffian in flavor. Her inclusion of a defense of force vive (she thus sided with Leibniz on this question) led to her subsequent dispute on the issue with Jean-Jacques Dortous de Mairan. Sometime in the early 1740s she began work on her two-volume translation of and commentary on Newton's Principia. She died shortly after she completed this work, which remained unpublished until 1759. It is still the leading French translation of Newton's book.

While Du Châtelet's primary interest was in natural philosophy, she also had interests in ethics (translating of portions of Mandeville's Fable of the Bees), theology and the Bible (writing a book titled Examens de la Bible), and the source of human happiness (writing a semi-autobiographical book, Discours sur le bonheur). Her non-scientific work occasionally touched on the subject of women's social roles and their education.

This entry focuses on Du Châtelet's natural philosophy, which occupied the bulk of her intellectual efforts. More specifically, it focuses on that aspect of her thought as found in her own clearly articulated version of natural philosophy—her masterwork of 1740, The Foundations of Physics.


1. Du Châtelet's Magnum Opus on Natural Philosophy: The Foundations of Physics: Introduction to the text

It is likely that Du Châtelet's interest in writing a text on Newtonian physics began to form around 1736 when Voltaire was working through his own ideas for a text on Newton, eventually published in 1738 (Eléments de la philosophie de Newton). Du Châtelet's distinct advantage over Voltaire on this project was her superior mathematical training, given that she sought out and benefitted from the tutelage of several of Europe's leading mathematicians. One such engagement was to have significant impact on both her own text on natural philosophy and on the fate of her reputation as an original and innovative thinker. This was her engagement with Samuel Koenig, who arrived at Cirey in 1739 to tutor Du Châtelet in mathematics shortly after Du Châtelet benefitted from similar tutelage under Maupertuis (Zinsser 2006, 162).

The significant—and positive—impact upon her text on natural philosophy followed from the fact that Koenig brought with him to France, and to Du Châtelet, the Leibnizian-inspired ideas of Christian Wolff. This precipitated a critical change in Du Châtelet's project, for Newtonian physics alone no longer seemed to her to be the correct way of explaining various features of the natural world. Rather, she came to see the need for metaphysical foundations for the phenomena that Newton so powerfully describes in mathematical terms (e.g. Janik 1982, 93 and 102). And so, in 1738, Du Châtelet withdrew her Institutions de physique (hereafter Foundations) from imminent publication in order to massively redraft it. The final product, published in 1740, would include an Introduction followed by ten chapters on topics of metaphysics touching on issues such as the principles of knowledge (chapter 1), God (2), space and time (5 and 6) and four chapters on matter and bodies (7 through 10). Only then does the text deal with physics of an essentially Newtonian character.

The significant—and negative—impact upon her reputation as an original and innovative thinker followed from Koenig's accusation, upon the publication of Du Châtelet's Foundations, that she had plagiarized his ideas within the text. This stain upon the originality and power of her intellect remained in some form or another until the mid-twentieth century when William Barber concluded that her thought was “essentially derivative” of a number of her male contemporaries, particularly Voltaire (Barber 1967). Others have argued for the originality of her views, and (Barber aside), this interpretation has been the dominant one since Ira O. Wade presented his careful case for her intellectual independence—again, particularly from Voltaire (Wade 1947). In what follows, I contribute to this belief that Du Châtelet is not a mere parrot of her more famous male contemporaries' views.

One way of characterizing Du Châtelet's Foundations is to show that it is a reaction against Cartesian natural philosophy and in favor of Newtonian physics. In the main, this is correct. Indeed, by the time Du Châtelet turned her attention to the project of the Foundations, the popularity of Cartesian natural philosophy was on the wane in France, the popularity of Newtonain physics was on the rise, and Du Châtelet was in the thick of these movements. Still, two facts should give us pause when making the general claim just articulated. The first is that Cartesian natural philosophy and Newtonian physics have different scopes, with the former presenting a unified system of metaphysics grounding and constraining the physics that follows from the metaphysics. Indeed, Du Châtelet's commitment to developing a natural philosophy (rather than writing simply about physics) required that she find an appropriate metaphysics to ground Newtonain physics, thus presenting a unified system to replace the (in her and others' view) defunct system of Descartes.

The second fact that ought to give us pause is that Du Châtelet was remarkably even handed and open minded about her reaction to various thinkers. She seems to have been swayed neither by national prejudice nor by the authority of whatever great men were most favored in France in her time. She prescribed being guided by truth in one's philosophical decisions about what to adopt and what to reject from the various metaphysicians and physicists whose work was animating intellectual circles in her time (IP Avant-Propos VII, X and XI). She herself was remarkably in line with this principled approach. So while it is true that, in the main, she rejects Cartesian natural philosophy, she is still appreciative of Descartes' advances in, for example, geometry, dioptrics and method (IP Avant-Propos V, p. 118).[1]

One interesting element of what could be characterized as her admiration of Descartes' method is that the Foundations fairly closely tracks the structure of Descartes' project in his Principles of Philosophy. Both texts start with indubitable principles of knowledge, which, in the first instance, lead to conclusions about the metaphysics of God. These conclusions allow one to gain knowledge of the metaphysical structure of the world, which in turn grounds physical laws that allow the observer to make scientific sense of the world (Lascano 2011, 742–3; c.f. Zinsser 2006, 173). This underscores at least that the two thinkers had a shared interest in developing a unified natural philosophy with a well-worked out, and fairly robust, metaphysics detailed first. There are important divergences between the two texts, not just on the details in the metaphysics, but also on the range of topics addressed. For Descartes' forays into what we would now call “science” included not only astronomy and physics, but planned sections on living bodies and on the human being, including its soul, thus promising to touch on topics such as human health and morals (in keeping with his metaphor of the tree of philosophy offered in the preface to the Principles). In contrast, Du Châtelet's text deals exclusively with physics, leaving the broader array of natural philosophical topics and moral philosophy left untouched. Still, the overall similarity in structure between the two texts indicates her affinity, at least with respect to her overall project, with Descartes. Here, I will examine a few crucial moments in her Foundations, underscoring how she and Descartes compare and contrast on these points, with an eye to showing some central aspects of her own brand of natural philosophy, and some of the ways in which Du Châtelet fit (and did not fit) into the French Enlightenment (especially with regard to Newtonianism and scientific methodology).

2. First Principles of Knowledge

Descartes famously writes in the preface to the Principles that “the whole of philosophy is like a tree. The roots are metaphysics, the trunk is physics, and the branches emerging from the trunk are all the other special sciences, which may be reduced to three principal ones, namely medicine, mechanics, and morals” (AT VIIIa, 14; CSM 1, 186). Metaphysics is his starting point, but what Descartes means by metaphysics, and what falls under the rubric of metaphysics for him, is crucial to understanding his project, and for understanding Du Châtelet's conceptual relation to him. One of the central innovations Descartes makes in the field of metaphysics is to include metaphysical claims about the mind of the knowing subject (Hatfield 1990, 11–17). This element of metaphysics leads Descartes very quickly into a discussion of first principles of knowledge, such as his belief that the knowing subject is capable of rationally intuiting further metaphysical principles because God has implanted innate ideas about them within human souls.

Du Châtelet's starting point—her first chapter of the Foundations—is also a consideration of first principles, but she starts immediately with first principles of knowledge, and hers are very different from Descartes'. Indeed, her first principles are distinctively Leibnizian and Wolffian, and number exactly two; they are the principle of contradiction (hereafter PC) and the principle of sufficient reason (hereafter PSR). In what follows, I first present some general ideas that are helpful to bear in mind when thinking about Du Châtelet's use of the PC and PSR. I then draw some important conclusions regarding these principles as they are found in Wolff, noting points on which Wolff departs from Leibniz with regard to first principles of knowledge. And finally, I turn to a consideration of how Du Châtelet employs these principles in her work.

There are a number of different ways of articulating the PC, including the following.[2]

  1. A is A, and cannot be ~A.
  2. For any proposition P, it is not the case that P is both true and false.
  3. For any proposition P, P is either true or false.
  4. For any proposition P, if P is false, then ~P is true.
  5. For any proposition P, if P implies a contradiction, then P is false.
  6. For any proposition P, if P is or is reducible to an identical proposition, then P is true.

(1) equates the PC with the Principle of Identity. (3) through (5) bring together the Law of Non-Contradiction (hereafter LNC) and the Law of the Excluded Middle (hereafter LEM) within the PC. These versions of the PC rely upon opposition based in contradictories. That is, P and ~P are mutually inconsistent and cannot be both true (LNC), and they are mutually exhaustive (LEM). (6) relies upon the LNC only, and not the LEM. This formulation of the PC, that is, relies upon opposition based in contraries. For example, “P is happy”, and “P is sad” are contraries and thus mutually inconsistent and cannot both be true (LNC). But they are not mutually exhaustive, because they both can be false (and thus, the LEM does not hold in these cases). The PC can be intended as a logical, ontological or psychological principle. As a logical principle, the PC is about opposite assertions. As an ontological principle, the PC is about properties in a subject. As a psychological principle, the PC is about what is possible and, especially, impossible to believe. Finally, the PC can operate in different realms. For example, it can operate in the realm of modality, perhaps serving to pick out necessary truths. Alternatively, it can operate in the realm of standard areas of human inquiry, perhaps serving as the foundation of mathematics (but perhaps not in metaphysics, natural theology, physics, and many other disciplines).

As with the PC, there are different ways of articulating the PSR, including the following.[3]

  1. There is nothing that is without a reason why it is, and is not otherwise. (Also: For any fact or event that obtains or exists, there is some reason why it obtains or exists, and is not otherwise.)
  2. There is no effect without a cause. (Also: any existing thing must have something, either within its nature or outside of itself, as its cause.)
  3. For any proposition P that is true, there is an explanation for its truth.
  4. It is impossible to fail to account for something if you have enough information (even though humans often do not have enough information).
  5. There are no brute facts.

The PSR embodies the position that everything is explainable and thus intelligible. The PSR can also be used to explain a number of different things, including the coherence of a thing's essence, that essences have a cause, and the existence of things. These points can also be captured by the depiction of the PSR as the principle which accounts both for the possibility of things (i.e. due to the coherence of their essences), and for the actualization of essences (i.e. there is a cause of their actualization which thus brings them into existence). Sometimes the PSR is taken to have a very wide domain (e.g. all truths and all events), while sometimes the PSR is taken to have a narrower domain. For example, the domain of the PSR is sometimes only events, but not truths, even while some truths (but not mathematical truths) can be translated into events. Or, as another example, sometimes the domain of the PSR is taken to be only the domain of contingent truths but not necessary truths. Sometimes the domain of the PSR is taken to be all truths, with the sufficient reason for the truth of necessary truths being that their negation violates the PC. There are different ways of thinking of the relation between the PC and the PSR, the two most prominent being, first, that the PC and the PSR are equally fundamental, and, second, that only the PC is fundamental, with the PSR either playing a role of secondary importance or being derived from or proven by the PC. Finally, as with the PC, the PSR can operate in different realms. For example, it can operate in the realm of modality, perhaps serving to explain contingent truths. Alternatively, it can operate in the realm of standard areas of human inquiry, perhaps serving as the foundation of metaphysics, natural theology, physics, and many other disciplines (but not mathematics).

As should be clear from the above, there is no single and settled version of either the PC or the PSR, different thinkers employ them differently, and sometimes a single thinker employs them differently in different periods of their thought or in different texts and contexts. In what follows, I sketch one respectable interpretation of Wolff's use of these principles—together with notes on where he departs from Leibniz's (admittedly multi-faceted) use of the principles—at least in part because Wolff's approach does seem to be fairly close to Du Châtelet's own.

For Wolff,[4] the PC is fundamental, and it is an innate first principle. Methodologically, Wolff starts with the psychological impossibility of believing or judging that something both is and is not. Wolff thus accepts version number 2 above of the PC, and he starts with the first person awareness of one's psychological inability to not accept the PC so presented. This psychological awareness further reveals the logical impossibility of any proposition that asserts that something is both true and false at the same time, and the logical impossibility of a proposition that asserts contraries further reveals the ontological fact that something cannot have contrary properties. The PC first and primary job, then, for Wolff is to divide impossible concepts and things—concepts and things that embody a contradiction—from possible concepts and things—concepts and things that do not embody a contradiction. Possible concepts for Wolff include both necessary truths and contingent truths. Thus, the fundamental and first job of the PC for Wolff includes the work of dividing both necessary and contingent truths from impossible truths. As result, in the realm of modality, the PC serves to identify not only necessary truths, but also contingent truths, pace Leibniz for whom, in the realm of modality, the PC serves to identify necessary truths. Once impossible concepts and things are isolated from the rest, the PSR enters to further explain aspects of possible things. It does so in two ways. First, the PSR acts as a “principle of being” in the sense that there is a sufficient reason to explain the essence of any possible being; there is a sufficient reason why a being's essence is as it is. This role for the PSR is relevant in the case of both necessary beings and contingent beings, and on this point, Wolff once again divergences from Leibniz in that the latter often (though not always) restricts the role of the PSR to that of providing an explanation for why contingent beings, though not necessary beings, are as they are. For Leibniz (usually), the PC explains why necessary beings (and truths) are as they are. Still, the divide between Wolff and Leibniz on this point may be narrower than it seems, because for Wolff, the sufficient reason why a necessary being is as it is just is that the PC establishes this. The second way in which the PSR enters the picture to further explain aspects of possible things for Wolff is that it acts as a “principle of becoming”. In this role, the PSR gives the causes or grounds for why a possible being becomes actual as opposed to remaining possible but non-actual.

With this general background on our two great principles in place, together with how these principles operate in Wolff (sometimes in contrast with how they operate in Leibniz), I now turn to a consideration of how these principles operate in Du Châtelet's opening chapter of the Foundations. While I cannot here do full justice to Du Châtelet's account of the first principles of knowledge, I provide some essential background to these principles in order to set the stage for an evaluation of other central aspects of her natural philosophy as presented in the Foundations.

As with Leibniz and Wolff, Du Châtelet's two primary first principles of knowledge are the PC—‘the basic axiom upon which all truths are founded’, which is consequently the foundation of all certainty (§4)—and the PSR (§8). These two principles operate not by opening up a category of metaphysical truths that are innate to our minds. Rather, they operate by giving universal (perhaps one would want to call these innate)[5] procedures for delineating what is possible from what is impossible, and then for determining what is necessary and what is actual (as opposed to non-actual) from among the range of possibilities. So right away, we see that Du Châtelet's starting point is that of Wolff.

The PC is foundational in all our thinking. At its most basic, this principle seems to be, for Du Châtelet, the principle that: for any proposition P, if P implies a contradiction, then P is false (5 above): ‘For, if one once granted that something may exist and not exist at the same time, there would no longer be any truth…’ (IP §4). According to Du Châtelet once this principle as stated is acknowledged, one can divide claims into the impossible and the possible: ‘It follows from this [principle] that the impossible is that which implies contradiction, and the possible does not imply it at all’ (IP §5). The possibles include the possibilities from among which God created the world.

But the PC does more work for Du Châtelet than just separating out the possible from the impossible, and on this point, she leans more toward Leibniz's use of this principle than toward Wolff's use of it, for the PC secondarily divides the category of the possible into truths that are necessary from those that are contingent. At this second stage, she seems to be employing a new conception of the PC. To show this, I examine her way of distinguishing between necessary and contingent truths. Necessary truths are ‘truths which can only be determined in a single way, for this is what is meant by the term necessary’ (IP §7). Immediately after this (admittedly odd) definition she contrasts necessary truths with contingent truths, ‘that is to say, when a thing can exist in various ways’ (IP §7), indicating that necessary truths are claims about things that can exist in only one way. To use her own examples to further clarify (IP §8), geometrical truths are necessary because, for example, a triangle (generally conceived) can exist in only one way, i.e., it is a figure whose three angles added together are equal to the sum of two right angles. We cannot conceive of it in any other way. Conversely, truths about the posture Du Châtelet finds herself in are contingent because she can exist in many ways, i.e., standing, sitting, lying down and so forth. Implicit here is a version of the PC which states that for any proposition P if P is or is reducible to an identical proposition, then P is necessarily true (6 above, with the modality of necessity added). For ‘triangle’ and ‘a figure whose three angles added together are equal to the sum of two right angles’ can be reduced to an identity statement (triangles can exist only in that one way) while ‘Du Châtelet’ and ‘sitting down’ cannot be reduced to an identity statement (Du Châtelet can exist in many other ways).[6] A crucial lesson to be drawn from her approach just outlined is that she takes the human's everyday experience—including our psychological inability to imagine, for example, necessary geometrical truths differently than how they are—as telling us something metaphysically true about the world itself. That is, like Wolff, she starts with a psychological rendition of the PC, but draws ontological conclusions from this starting point.

According to Du Châtelet, the PSR is ‘[t]he principle on which all contingent truths depend…’ (IP §8). Given what follows, the most consistent way to interpret Du Châtelet's claim here is not to assume that the PSR picks out all contingent truths, for this is clearly the work of the PC (when that latter principle separates out necessary from contingent truths). Rather, Du Châtelet seems quite clearly to mean that the PSR explains why the contingent truths that actually obtain in the world do obtain. Thus, she seems to accept the second of Wolff's ways in which the PSR further explains aspects of possible things: the PSR acts as a “principle of becoming”. It also acts as a “principle of being” in so far as it explains essences, but it explains the essences of contingent things, while the essences of necessary things are explained by the PC for her (pace Wolff, but in keeping with Leibniz's usual approach). So, immediately after her definition of the PSR given above, she writes that:

When asking someone to account for his actions, we persist with our own question until we obtain a reason that satisfies us, and in all cases we feel that we cannot force our mind to accept something without a sufficient reason, that is to say, without a reason that makes us understand why the thing is what it is, rather than something completely different. (IP§8, emphasis added)

According to this interpretation of the PSR, it is the principle that explains why some contingent truths actually obtain while others do not (there is no sufficient reason for these others to obtain). The PSR is also the reason that led God to actualize this world from among the various possibilities (IP §9); that is, to reiterate the interpretation offered here, it is the principle that explains why our contingent universe exists rather than any number of other such possible, but not necessary, universes. The PSR serves as (a) the principle of becoming (b) of contingent beings only.

Du Châtelet indicates what the PSR requires of us as investigators of nature. In the closing sections of her chapter on the nature of body (§162–4), she makes clear that since full knowledge of contingent truths is too complex for humans to grasp through rational intuition (IP §9), we need to turn to some other way of learning them. But because God is bound by the PSR, we cannot appeal directly to his will as the ‘explanation’ of these truths, and so we must turn to proximate causes rather than the ultimate cause for explanation. We must investigate nature in order to try to discern causes of effects—that is, in order to discern the sufficient reason why effects obtain. Empirical observations that we have of how bodies actually do operate in the actual world will lead the investigator to beliefs about features of bodies. These features, however, are not taken to be certainly true as a result of their being supposedly known by introspection into our innate ideas (as they are for Descartes). It may be, therefore, that we are unable to know the sufficient reason for why actuals exist as they do exist, though we surely know that there is a reason, for our experience tells us that actual beings were chosen to exist rather than not to exist. But God knows the sufficient reason, and it is the reason why he actualized the beings that he did: “Without the principle of sufficient reason, one would no longer be able to say that this universe, whose parts are so interconnected, could only be produced by a supreme wisdom, for if there can be effects without sufficient reason, all might have been produced by accident, that is to say, by nothing” (IP §8, p. 129).

Two important aspects of Du Châtelet's broader philosophy are captured by this passage just quoted. The first is that she takes the natural world to be a whole whose parts are systematically interconnected. This natural systematicity is crucial to her scientific method, it sets her apart from many of her French Enlightenment peers, but there are nonetheless important limits to her willingness to call upon systematicity in her approach to investigations of the natural world. I address these points in §5 and §6 below. The second important point implicit in the above-cited passage is that she clearly sides with what we would now call the intellectualist side of the voluntarist-intellectualist debate. Crudely, the debate centers around whether God's will or God's intellect takes precedence in his actions with respect to his creation, include creation itself. A voluntarist would say that God's will takes precedence, and God could will anything to be the case. Whatever he wills just would be true and good because he willed it. Thus, God could have willed 2+2=5 to be true, and it would thereby be true. Conversely, an intellectualist would say that God's intellect takes precedence in his actions with respect to creation, including creation itself. He first understands what is true and good, and then he wills that certain things should attain because his intellect understands the truth and goodness of them (and his benevolence guides his choice). Earlier, Du Châtelet wavered on how to interpret the relation between God's will and intellect, but by the time she wrote the Foundations, she had clearly settled for the intellectualist side, and the PSR guides God in his choices no less than it guides humans. On this point, she is squarely in opposition to Voltaire who suggests that we should not search for, in his words, “sufficient causes” in nature for natural phenomena; rather we should bear in mind that the first cause of nature's activities is to be referred to God's will and power.[7] It is enough to appeal to this as the source of phenomena, and then leave it at that. Du Châtelet dissents from this approach, and not just because it mistakes, in her view, God's nature. Rather, it is an appeal we ought not to make as scientists (IP §162), for it is an utterly unscientific approach to a natural problem, putting the cause of the phenomena wholly beyond our ability to investigate it.[8] I return to this point in §5 below.

Two further points are of particular importance in Du Châtelet's discussion of first principle of knowledge. The first is her noting that the term “principle” “has been much abused”, especially by “the Scholastics, who could demonstrate nothing [and who] chose unintelligible words for their principles” (IP §1, p. 125). The PSR, she later tells us, banishes these unintelligible principles such as “plastic natures, vegetative souls” (IP §10, p. 131). Without detailing how the PSR might banish such other principles, I focus on Du Châtelet's own conception of the sort of intelligible metaphysical principle identified by the PSR, for she favors the mechanical philosophy over, for example, plastic natures and vegetative souls. According to Du Châtelet, one must explain how a mechanism can produce a plant relying, for example, upon an explanation of how each particle of matter is able to produce the effect that it does (IP §10 and §12, p. 131–2) through simple motion. Accounting for natural change by appeal to bits of matter interacting through lawful motion and contact—but not by appeal to plastic natures and vegetative souls—is consistent with the PSR.

The second point of particular importance in Du Châtelet's discussion of first principles of knowledge is what I take to be her moderate form of nativism, in contrast with Descartes' very strong form. Du Châtelet does not have the sort of first principles of knowledge, together with a commitment to voluntarism, that lead to the doctrine of innate ideas, as we see in Descartes. That is, Descartes has been characterized as a voluntarist who believes that God created the eternal truths through an act of will; God did not understand, through an act of the intellect, that the eternal truths just are true independently of any will, his own included. Fine details on Descartes' position with respect to the voluntarist-intellectual debate aside, it is true that he does believe God endowed all rational creatures with innate ideas of the eternal truths such that we might all come to know their certain truth despite the fact that they could have been otherwise. Du Châtelet does not endorse this kind of nativism. But it is true that, unlike Locke for example,[9] she does think there are some universally held principles such as the belief that something cannot be and not be at the same time (PC), and to this degree, she does seem committed to some sort of nativism. But because of her requirement that one demonstrate a contradiction (in the case of the PC) or that one demonstrate the reasons one has for one's actions (in the case of the PSR, e.g. IP §8, p. 128–9) in employing these universally-held first principles of knowledge, her nativism is of a different and weaker form than is Descartes' nativism. Hers describes innate rules of reasoning that (as we shall see) can then be used to develop a metaphysics, while Descartes' nativism directly delivers robust metaphysical information about the world. Once again, we see shall the impact of this characteristic of Du Châtelet's starting point upon her methodology as well as her understanding of the relation between physics and metaphysics.

3. God

One of Descartes' first metaphysical first principles that he proves is the existence and nature (as benevolent) of God. His primary reason for this is to call upon a benevolent God as a guarantor of the truth of his clear and distinct ideas. Immediately after her discussion of her first principles of knowledge, Du Châtelet also turns to metaphysical first principles that can be derived from the epistemology, and she too turns to a proof for the existence and nature of God. But her reasons for doing so are different from Descartes' immediate reasons as just articulated. For Du Châtelet, as Marcy Lascano has rightly argued, “wanted to provide a ground for physics that would explain the rational basis of the workings of the universe. Proving that an eternal, good and rational being created the universe would provide such a ground” (Lascano 2011, 743). In Du Châtelet's words, “[t]he study of nature elevates us to the knowledge of the supreme being; this great truth is even more necessary, if possible, to good physics than to morality, and it ought to be the foundation and conclusion of all the research we make in this science” (IP §18, p. 138). As shown above, Du Châtelet believes in the interconnectedness and systematicity of the natural world as a whole, and she believes that this is a crucial general reason why God has chosen to actualize this world. And so, it seems humans do have cognitive access to this sufficient reason for why God chose this world as opposed to any other world. In fact, Du Châtelet links the interconnectedness and systematicity of the natural world as a whole with perfection (§26), thus indicating that God's sufficient reason for his choice of this world over any other possible worlds in a further principle, namely, the Principle of the Best. Du Châtelet's belief in the interconnectedness and systematicity of the natural world as a whole in the is key to her method and physics, even though (as I will show) there are limits to the role that can be played in physics by these metaphysical features of the world. Nonetheless, establishing the existence of God as one who would choose to actualize such a world is Du Châtelet's next crucial step.

I will not go into the details of her argument for the existence and nature of God (see Lascano 2011). I simply note here that hers is a cosmological argument for the existence of God, specifically one starting from the existence in the world of contingent beings. Thus, her distinction between necessity and contingency as developed in her material on the PC and the PSR, together with further use of the PSR in her chapter on God, lead to her particular proof for God's existence. She argues:

All that exists has a sufficient reason for its existence. The sufficient reason for the existence of a being must be within it, or outside it. Now the reason for the existence of a contingent being cannot be within it, for if it carried the sufficient reason for its own existence, it would be impossible for it not to exist, which is contradictory to the definition of a contingent being. So the sufficient reason for the existence of a contingent being must necessarily be outside it…. This sufficient reason cannot be found in another contingent being, nor in a succession of such beings, since the same question will always arise at the end of this chain, however it may be extended. So it must come from a necessary Being that contains the sufficient reason for the existence of all contingent beings, and for his own existence, and this being is God. (IP §19.5–6, p. 139, translation altered)

Lascano has noted the influence of both Leibniz and Locke on Du Châtelet's cosmological proof (Lascano 2011, passim). She also notes that Du Châtelet makes a similar mistake to one Aquinas makes in his Five Ways, in assuming that an infinite chain of causes cannot simply extend into the past with no need of a supermundane cause (Lascano 2011, 756). It is a shame that Du Châtelet's acquaintance with the ideas of Samuel Clarke (Hutton 2012) did not extend as far as his cosmological proof from contingency to necessity for the existence of God, for if it had, then perhaps she would have sidestepped this error. Nonetheless, again as Lascano points out, her proof is a notable improvement on Locke's, and the key point I wish to draw from her discussion of God is that articulated above, namely the importance to Du Châtelet's scientific endeavors of God and the nature of the world he creates.

4. Metaphysics

In the preface to the Foundations, Du Châtelet writes: “It is certain that there are a number of points in metaphysics which lend themselves to demonstrations just as rigorous as the demonstrations of geometry, even if they are different in kind” (Avant-propos, XII). Du Châtelet's first epistemological principles thus help to establish the certain truth of some metaphysical claims. At least two of these claims, she believes, are necessarily true. So, for example, and echoing Leibniz, because of the infinite divisibility of extension, and because atoms are extended, atoms cannot be the ultimate beings of nature; simple substances (or monads) must be such beings, and the PC establishes this necessary (in Du Châtelet's mind) metaphysical fact (IP §121). The argument for this runs as follows. Atoms, defined as indivisible, extended particles of matter are actually divisible, and thus their very definition, taken together with the fact of their divisibility, implies a contradiction. So atoms cannot be the necessary beings out of which matter is composed; indeed, they are by definition impossible. How does Du Châtelet justify the claim to atoms' divisibility? She justifies this claim based upon the PC: ‘there is no contradiction in the divisibility of extended things,’ and atoms are extended thing (IP §121). Notice here, she must be relying upon a conceptual divisibility rather than a physical divisibility (for atoms are defined as physically indivisible), though one could bolster this argument by claiming that if an atom is conceptually divisible by us, then it is physically divisible by an omnipotence God, and therefore is in neither way indivisible. Indeed, the divisibility of anything—atoms or something else—that is extended indicates that extension is composed and not simple; it is composed out of the parts into which it can be divided (IP §120). So nothing extended—neither atoms nor any other piece of extension—can serve as the simple beings out of which composed beings are made. Only things that are unextended can serve as those simple beings (IP §122). Since this conclusion follows from the PC, it is a conclusion about the necessary constitution of the simple beings of our universe.

This introduces a further feature of Du Châtelet's PC in addition to those identified above. The PC, in the case of simple beings, establishes both the necessary existence and nature of simple beings. That is, simple beings are necessarily unextended (their nature), and they necessarily must exist so as to explain the fact of existing composed, extended beings—a fact established by our experience that such composed beings do indeed exist. But this is what we might call a hypothetical necessity (as opposed to what we might call an absolute necessity). That is, these necessary facts about the simple beings of our world obtain only on the hypothesis that our world actually does exist. God could have not created our world, and had he so chosen to not create any world, then simple beings which actually exist (with the nature of being unextended) need not have existed at all.

This discussion of Du Châtelet's understanding of the (hypothetically) necessary metaphysical constitution of the world further underscores a point about her first principles of knowledge mentioned above. While the fundamental metaphysical truth that only unextended beings can serve as the simple beings of the created world—simple beings out of which complex beings are made—may be repugnant to sense and imagination, reason (as captured by her PC in this case) demands we believe it (IP §135). But this indicates that Du Châtelet—like Wolff—may start with a psychological conception of the PC, but (again like Wolff), she takes this psychological conception of the principle to indicate that there are underlying logical and ontological truths which are the source of our psychological response to contradictions. So one of Du Châtelet's first principles, in this case, gives us knowledge of metaphysical essences. Importantly, Du Châtelet takes her conclusion that substances must be simple in the way just characterized to be necessarily true on the hypothesis that God chooses to actualize our world.

Moreover, she even uses her PSR to establish other claims about material substance, claims that she also takes to be necessary. In using the PSR, we observe the phenomenal facts of our actual world, and we can then posit hypotheses about what must further be true of substance in order to make those facts possible.[10] We see this method at work in several sections of the Institutions; for example, monads are active, she concludes, because this would explain the brute fact of motion in the phenomenal world, and she goes so far as to claim that force is also necessary to the nature of matter (IP §139). At the same time, precisely because things do not always move in the natural world, this force must be of two kinds: active force—the source of motion—and passive force, or inertia—the source of rest (IP §142). From her letter to Maupertuis of 30 April 1738 (#122), we know that she was familiar with Leibniz's work on dynamics and metaphysics, having sought out his articles on the topics—articles such as “The Brief Demonstration of the Error of Descartes” and “A Specimen of Dynamics”. So again, phenomena of our actual world that Leibniz details in those papers lead Du Châtelet to the same conclusions regarding the metaphysics of substance that Leibniz reaches—namely, that the unextended simple substances are also internally active through their possession of force, as this claim helps explain the phenomena of the natural world.[11]

Precisely because the elements of matter are simple, unextended active monads, what we see around us as extended must be merely phenomenal, and she does endorse this Leibnizian-Wolffian[12] conclusion. Throughout her seventh chapter “On the Elements of Body”, she follows the Leibnizian tradition in concluding that metaphysical reality must consist in unextended monads. Consequently, what we see in nature as extended must be mere phenomena and not real in the fullest metaphysical sense. She concludes, for example, that phenomena, known best through sense, result from the confusion of simple beings (IP §152–5), and that just as monads are characterized by active and passive force (now termed primitive force), so too are phenomenal bodies to be thought of as possessing force—both derivative active and passive force (IP §158–9). Thus, suppositions such as Newton's that the natural world can be described with reference to inelastic, invisible, extended atoms must be suppositions not about ground floor metaphysics but about the derivative physical world which is merely phenomenal in a broadly Leibnizian sense. This has led Linda Janik to helpfully characterize Du Châtelet's account of the created world as a three-tier account (Janik 1982, 106): the basic metaphysical tier of unextended monads, the subvisible physical tier of (for Du Châtelet) extended matter which is also imbued with derivative force, and the visible physical tier of bodies in motion and at rest. Without working through the details of her picture, including the coherence or difficulties with it, what this three-tier account permits is significant separation between metaphysics and physics. We see this when we consider the following. We can know that there is a systematic interconnection among all elements of the created world—the PSR, together with what we can derive of God's nature seem to establish this for Du Châtelet—we cannot always know all the details of that systematicity. Moreover, we can expect that this systematicity occurs most fundamentally at the level of ground floor metaphysics—that is, among unextended monads. But Du Châtelet does not spell out in detail how exactly the metaphysical tier and physical tiers are related to each other (Iltis 1977, 36–7). And so, while the systematic interconnectedness we experience at the level of phenomena—the realm of physics, that is—surely has some grounding in metaphysics, crucially, we cannot know many details of the connection among realms. While it is certainly true that there is some connection between the metaphysics and physics—for example, the force, which belongs to monads explains the brute phenomena of motion and rest in the physical world—physics does enjoy significant autonomy from metaphysics (Janik 1982, 106; Barber 1967, 209).[13] We see the impact of this on her physics in §6 below.

5. Scientific Methodology

Du Châtelet herself was a hobbyist scientist. She set up a lab at her estate Cirey in which she and Voltaire both undertook experiments (e.g. Walters 1967). Her descriptions of experiments undertaken to determine the nature and propagation of fire in her Dissertation on the Nature and Propagation of Fire attest to this fact. She was also well educated on scientific advancements of her day, most especially in astronomy and physics. Her comments in the Foundations on scientific methodology focus primarily on her analysis of the method of great astronomers and physicists. Here, I focus on her explicit theorizing on the role of hypotheses in science, for her views on this topic place her clearly at the start of the hypothetico-deductive tradition in scientific methodology.

At the close of her chapter on hypotheses, Du Châtelet’s writes: [14]

And so good hypotheses will always be the product of the greatest men. Copernicus, Kepler, Huygens, Descartes, Leibniz, and even Newton himself, have all devised useful hypotheses to explain complicated and difficult phenomena. The example of these great men, and of their successes, should make us see that those who wish to ban hypotheses from philosophy, intend harm to the interests of science” (IP §71).[15]

In this declaration, Du Châtelet establishes how out of step—though not necessarily entirely to her detriment—she was with her own milieu. Members of the Royal Society in Britain and Academie Royale in France in the 18th century tended to eschew the use of hypotheses, preferring what they took to be a scientific focus on empirical facts.[16] Moreover, Newton was seen by many of his admiring contemporaries to have captured the value of the Societies’ approach in his scientific practice and in his famous motto hypotheses non fingo.[17] Among the most vocal spokespersons in eighteenth century France for this approach was none other than Du Châtelet’s housemate during her years spent drafting the Foundations, Voltaire who, in his Elements of Newton’s Philosophy, contrasts Descartes and Newton along exactly these lines.[18] In siding with the use of hypotheses, in once again lauding Descartes for this aspect of his method,[19] and in suggesting that Newton himself makes use of hypotheses, Du Châtelet establishes herself as no mere mimic of ‘greater’ men of her time. The fact that this highly innovative chapter survives her massive rewrites after her tutelage under Koenig also throws into question the doubt cast upon her originality by Koenig's charge of plagiarism.[20]

Du Châtelet distinguishes those who use hypotheses well from those who use them badly, and she recognizes a third group—those who eschew the use of hypotheses altogether largely due to perceived misuse of them among their predecessors and contemporaries. Among those who use hypotheses poorly are those working in the Cartesian tradition and those in “the Schools” who are especially guilty of spouting unintelligible jargon (IP Avant-Propos VIII, §55). The key downfalls of those who make bad use of hypotheses are the mistakes of taking them as truth (IP §62–63), and of building theories and systems upon them that resemble “fables” and “dreams” (IP §55) more than they resemble a science of nature firmly rooted in empirical knowledge of nature. As a consequence of previous abuse of hypotheses, Du Châtelet notes that many in her own century have entirely shied away from their use—or at least claim to have done so—which they regard as (quoting Newton) the “poison of reason and the plague of philosophy” (IP §55). Du Châtelet stresses that it is a mistake, however, to believe that hypotheses are useless in physics just because they have been abused in the past (IP §63), and she suggests that hypothetical thinking is not only useful, but indeed necessary; without hypotheses, almost no progress would have been made in astronomy (IP Avant-Propos VIII, §57), and they are also valuable in physics (IP §55). She even goes so far as to claim “without hypotheses… there would be no astronomy now” (IP §57). To bolster her case, she details a few recent successes in astronomy which relied pivotally on the use of hypotheses with theories of Copernicus (IP §57 and §67), Kepler (IP §58) and Huygens (IP §57 and §67) featured as evidence. Those who refuse to include hypothetical thinking in their scientific method are guilty of retarding the progress of science no less than are those who include such thinking but do so badly (IP §54).

Du Châtelet believes that hypotheses are necessary because not all phenomena can be explained through reliance upon first principles alone—there is a gap between first principles and observed phenomena in the world in the sense that the scientist cannot deduce the cause of those phenomena directly or through chains of deduction from the first principles. Neither can experiment directly tease out such a cause. “Hypotheses are… sometimes very necessary… in all cases when we cannot discover the true reason for a phenomenon and the attendant circumstances, neither a priori, by means of truths [identified as principles in §53] that we already know, nor a posteriori, with the help of experiments” (IP §60). And: “[P]hilosophers frame hypotheses to explain the phenomena, the cause of which cannot be discovered either by experiment or by demonstration” (IP §56).

Recall that for Du Châtelet, these first principles include epistemological principles—the principles of contradiction and sufficient reason (IP §4 and §8). Du Châtelet writes that “a hypothesis… [must] not be in contradiction with the principle of sufficient reason, nor with any principles that are the foundation of our knowledge” (IP §61). But I take it that the principles constraining the sorts of hypotheses the scientist can posit also include metaphysical principles which can be derived directly from foundational principles of knowledge. For Du Châtelet, as shown above, these include the three-tier metaphysical account she develops, the nature of matter, and so forth.

In her opening comments on hypotheses, Du Châtelet writes: “The true causes of natural effects and of the phenomena we observe are often so far from the principles on which we can rely and the experiments we can make that one is obliged to be content with probable reasons [hypotheses] to explain them” (IP §53 emphasis added; c.f. §56). She anticipates that these probable reasons aim at truth about the causal structure of the world and not just at an accurate description and prediction of phenomena. This is interesting because this situates Du Châtelet squarely within one particular tradition with respect to hypotheses. Historically, there have been two key directions in which thinking about hypotheses developed, indeed from Ancient times, and certainly throughout the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries as well. According to one approach—typified by Ptolemy in pre-modern thought and sometimes associated with “save the phenomena” type explanations—hypotheses are posited merely because they are useful instruments, mere mathematical calculating devices especially useful for prediction and scientific practice. The aim with hypotheses, according to this approach, is not to propose a true account of the nature of things since reaching true conclusions about the world is not necessarily relevant when formulating hypotheses according to this tradition which focuses more pointedly on prediction. According to the second approach—typified by Aristotle in pre-modern thought and sometimes associated with causal explanations—hypotheses are posited in order to provide an explanation of how experienced effects might have come about. The aim is to give a true account of the nature of things, especially the causal nature of things.[21] In starting off her chapter on hypotheses with a mention of “the true causes of natural effects”, Du Châtelet indicates her commitment to the Aristotelian tradition vis à viz hypotheses, a point which becomes abundantly clear as her chapter on hypotheses proceeds.

Du Châtelet thinks hypotheses are useful (in addition to their providing a necessary step in scientific method) because “when a hypothesis is once posed, experiments are often done to ascertain if it is a good one, experiments which would never have been thought of without it” (IP §58). They are useful, that is, for suggesting innovative experiments. Such experiments can add plausibility to a hypothesis if the results of them indicate that the hypothesis captures the truth, but a single experiment which falsifies a hypothesis is enough to require the scientist to reject it, or at least, to reject whatever part of the hypothesis is deemed faulty, for a hypothesis “can be true in one of its parts and false in another” (IP §65). As an example to explain how this might be the case, she cites Descartes’ hypothesis of a vortex of fluid matter being the cause of the gravitational pull of bodies to the earth. As an example of her remarkable open-mindedness, she rejects the specifics of Descartes’ hypothesis in light of Huygen’s demonstrations that it does not square with observed facts, while also allowing that “it cannot be legitimately concluded that a vortex, or several vortices, conceived of in a different way, cannot be the cause of these movements” (IP §65). In this case, then, falsifying data requires that we invalidate only part of Descartes’ hypothesis.

So Du Châtelet takes an extremely friendly view of the role of hypothesis in scientific reasoning. Still, wary of those who make bad use of hypotheses, Du Châtelet puts strict limits on their use. A hypothesis must “not only [explain] the phenomenon that one had proposed to explain with it, but also that all the consequences drawn from it agree with the observations” (IP §58). Herein, we have the idea that a good hypothesis will explain a plethora of effects including many not originally under investigation. Du Châtelet believes that the more such effects that can be explained (as well as the more experiments performed which turn out as predicted by the hypothesis), the more probable the hypothesis is. Indeed, Du Châtelet makes the very strong claim that “hypotheses finally become truths when their probability increases to such a point that one can morally present them as certain” (IP §67), though the psychological context of the passage (“as a very great degree of probability gains our assent, and has on us almost the same effect as certainty”) indicates that a highly probable hypothesis is merely highly probable and not strictly true, and that Du Châtelet’s considered position is “that hypotheses become the poison of philosophy when they are made to pass for the truth” (IP, Avant-Propos VIII)[22]. According to Du Châtelet, part of the scientist’s job is to “have certain knowledge of the facts that are within our reach, and to know all the circumstances attendant upon the phenomena we want to explain… for he who would hazard a hypothesis without this precaution would run the risk of seeing his explanation overthrown by new facts that he had neglected to find out about” (IP §61). So the scientist must become acquainted with many empirical facts so as to ensure that she is not ignorant of potentially falsifying data (IP §64).

Du Châtelet’s belief that hypotheses gain strength the more phenomena they explain indicates a commitment to the idea of simplicity and systematicity of causes, and the orderly interconnectedness of cause and effects in the created world. These features, to recall the discussion above of her PSR, are explicitly associated with the PSR, and that principle’s metaphysical dimension.[23] For not only is the PSR a principle which guides our own search for knowledge, it is a principle which guided God in his choices when creating the world (IP §23) which, as the best possible world, is “the one where the greatest variety exists with the greatest order, and where the largest number of effects is produced by the simplest laws” (IP §28). So the ability of hypotheses to explain a plethora of phenomena is a direct result for Du Châtelet of the real systematicity of the world’s causal structure itself.[24] This point drives home the claim I made above that Du Châtelet is squarely in the Aristotelian tradition with respect to hypotheses; hypotheses are meant to capture the true causal structure of our systematically interconnected world, and are not only calculating or predictive devices by which the scientist merely gives an accurate description of the phenomena. At the same time, and we shall see this in the next section, the fairly significant degree of separation between metaphysics and physics mentioned at the close of the previous section will put strict limits on how much the scientist can appeal to systematic interconnectedness in physics.

One final constraint Du Châtelet prescribes in the use of hypotheses is her requirement that an “intelligible” link be articulated between hypothesized cause and observed phenomena that the hypothesis is meant to explain. This is to guard against “the unintelligible jargon of the Schoolmen” (IP Avant-Propos VIII). Again echoing points made above, for Du Châtelet, an intelligible explanation is, broadly speaking, a mechanical explanation according to which one must explain how a mechanism can produce a plant, for example, by relying upon an explanation of how each particle of matter is able to produce the effect that it does produce (IP §10 and §12). Her general commitment to mechanism in some form is played out throughout the Institutions.[25]

To conclude, let me turn to Du Châtelet’s definition of a useful hypothesis:

So hypotheses are only probable propositions, which have a greater or lesser degree of probability according to whether they satisfy a larger or fewer number of the circumstances that accompany the phenomena that we want to explain by means of the hypotheses. And since a very high degree of probability encourages our agreement so as to have nearly the effect upon us as certainty, hypotheses eventually become truths for us if their probability increases to such a point that this probability can morally pass for certainty…. In contrast, an hypothesis becomes improbable in proportion to the number of circumstances found for which the hypothesis does not give a reason. And finally, it becomes false when it is found to contradict a well-established observation. (IP §67)

At the start of this section, I mentioned that Du Châtelet is at the forefront of the emergence of the embrace of the hypothetico-deductive in scientific explorations. Some have attributed such a method to Descartes (e.g. Lauden 1981) while others have disputed this, due to his refusal to devise testing experiments and to take falsifying data seriously (McMullin 1990, 44; McMullin 2008, 98; and Sakellariadis 1982, passim). On both points, Du Châtelet departs notably from Descartes due to her very friendliness to this sort of engagement with the empirical. Nonetheless, as also mentioned above, she is somewhat out of step with her own time precisely because of her unabashed endorsement of the need for hypotheses. Moreover, her endorsement of the Aristotelian idea of hypotheses, and her belief in the systematic unity of the natural world, shows that she also embraces there being a relation between metaphysics and physics, even while she also believes that there are limits to what we can know about that relation. This is no surprise given my characterization of her above as a natural philosopher, a pre-modern stance despite her standing on the cusp of modern conceptions of hypotheses and scientific methodology. She is truly standing between two worlds, the old world of natural philosophy and the soon to emerge new world of modern science as we now know it.

6. Newtonian Attraction

The first ten chapters of the Foundations provide the epistemology, metaphysics and theorizing on scientific methodology that is meant to provide the foundations for the remaining chapters on Newtonian physics. An evaluation of the success of that seemingly paradoxical project must await a much more sustained treatment than I can give it here. Rather, in this final section of this survey of Du Châtelet's natural philosophy, I focus on one chapter of that later material both to show ways in which the earlier chapters affect those that follow, and to show the limits to the characterization of Du Châtelet as a metaphysical systematizer.[26] This chapter is chapter 16: On Newtonian Attraction.

In this chapter, she argues against some of Newton's followers who aimed to universalize Newton's attraction. While Du Châtelet argues that Newton's theory of attraction is better than Descartes' vortices at explaining the effects of gravity, and that Newton's theory of attraction can satisfactorily explain a wide range of other phenomena such as tidal movements, the rotation of the earth, and irregularities in the movement of the moon, she criticizes Newton's disciplines for extending Newton's theory of attraction too far. In one especially interesting section, she focuses on the Newtonian theories (IP §389–92) of John Freind (1675/76–1728) and John Keill (1671–1721).

In §391, titled “The usage that Mss. Freind and Keill have made of the principle of attraction” (notably, she discusses only Keill therein), she writes:

At the end of his Introductio ad veram Astronomiam (Introduction to the True Astronomy), Mr. Keill set several propositions, through which he maintains we can deduce geometrically the majority of phenomena by means of this attraction, if it is powerful in contact.

According to these propositions, not only are cohesion and chemical effects the result of attraction, but so too are the spring of bodies and the phenomena of electricity….

We find the source of all these applications of attraction in the questions that Mr. Newton posed at the end of his Optics.[27] The disciples of this great man believed that his doubts might serve even as a basis for their hypotheses: but it must be admitted that some of these hypotheses are a bit forced and that there is a great difference in accuracy between the applications of attraction to celestial phenomena and the use one makes of it in the other effects I just mentioned. Also this use of attraction is not as universally received by the same Newtonians, as the use of it when one is in fact explaining astronomical phenomena. (IP §391; emphasis added)[28]

In essence, what Du Châtelet disputes in Keill's universalization of Newton's theory of attraction is his use of it to explain, among other phenomena, the cohesion of bodies and their spring, or elasticity. To make these claims, which focus specifically on features intrinsic to bodies rather than on relational features that bodies bear, Du Châtelet believes these thinkers must claim that attraction is a property of matter itself (IP §389–92).[29] Her mention in this passage of his “forced” hypotheses alerts us to the fact that she believes Keill is using hypotheses in forwarding this claim about matter. As the previous section showed, she can have no quibble with the fact that he uses hypotheses, yet she clearly dissents from his hypotheses with respect to the nature of matter and the phenomena he wishes to explain through this matter theory.

According to Du Châtelet, the PSR positively rules out extending attraction to account for the nature of matter. How so? The argument seems to be that if attraction (as some sort of active principle or force) were to be inherent in bodies, then bodies would always move, and yet bodies always moving is contrary to our experience of the physical world. There is no sufficient reason—an inherent passive principle within bodies, for example, to counteract the active force—to account for the brute fact that bodies are also sometimes at rest. So attraction cannot be an inherent property of matter (c.f. IP Avant-propos VII). Yet for attraction to explain the cohesion of bodies, it would need to be an inherent property. So attraction cannot be employed as the cause of the cohesion of bodies.

Three crucial points for a consideration of Du Châtelet's scientific method and her position between pre-modern and modern conceptions of natural philosophy and then science emerge from this discussion of Newtonian attraction. First, the role played by experience of the world is crucial for her. If our experience (in this case, the brute fact that bodies are sometimes at rest) falsifies an hypothesis (namely, that attraction belongs to matter), then the hypothesis must be rejected. Second, while Du Châtelet accepts the systematic interconnection of the created world as a feature of it, and as a sort of heuristic in our scientific practice, she puts strict limits on the scientist's appeal to a systematic account of phenomena, especially in light of falsifying experience. So, while the universalizing of Newton's theory of attraction to account for a plethora of phenomena would represent a more interconnected physical system, this systematicity must be rejected in light of our experiences of nature. Finally, while it is true that Du Châtelet thinks a full scientific account must try to give the causes of phenomena we experience—whether those be causes in the basic metaphysical tier or causes in the derivative, subvisible physical tier—when scientists are unable to give a causal account without violating the empirical facts of nature, then they ought not to give such an account. So while it is true that Du Châtelet invokes hypotheses in her approach to natural philosophy, and while it is true that in doing so, she departs radically from those who believe that the aim of science is to merely describe (ideally in mathematical terms) the phenomena without appeal to metaphysical systems underlying those phenomena, the particular—indeed, very modern—flavor of her theory of hypotheses puts strict limits on that metaphysics. This underscores the point made at the close of §4 above: there is a connection between metaphysics and physics in Du Châtelet's view, but we are not always able to ascertain that connection, and so, the scientist cannot claim systematic unity in physics when doing so runs roughshod over empirical data or either of her two foundational principles. While still a natural philosopher, she has taken a decisive step toward modern science in her masterwork, Foundations of Physics.

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Condillac, Étienne Bonnot de | Descartes, René | feminist (interventions): history of philosophy | feminist (topics): perspectives on science | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Newton, Isaac | possible worlds | principle of sufficient reason | scientific method | Voltaire | voluntarism, theological

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