Bodily Awareness

First published Tue Aug 9, 2011; substantive revision Wed Oct 7, 2015

We are aware of our bodies. I see the world by opening my eyes and in so doing, I feel the motion of my eyelid. I feel that my legs are crossed and that my arm is raising. I feel tired and thirsty. I feel cold. I feel my teeth begin to chatter. My back itches. The way we relate to our body, including the way we perceive it, control it and affectively react to what happens to it, is unlike the way we relate to other objects.

Despite its richness, bodily awareness has attracted relatively little attention from philosophers with the notable exception of phenomenologists. Neuropsychologists and psychiatrists, however, have confronted the multi-faceted phenomenology of bodily awareness through a wide variety of disorders. In addition, the study of the body is now crucial in cognitive neuroscience. Bodily illusions have raised a wide range of philosophical questions about the underlying mechanisms of bodily self-awareness. The notion of bodily awareness is at the crossroads of philosophical debates on the self, perception, action and space. This entry will focus on three main questions: (i) How does the awareness of one's body differ from the awareness of other objects? (ii) What are the roles of action and mental representations of the body for bodily awareness? (iii) What makes us feel our body as our own?

1. Characterizing bodily awareness

Bodily awareness may seem less rich and detailed than visual awareness, which can be analysed as full of fine-grained colour shades and well-individuated three-dimensional shapes that move around. All we experience is this constant blurry fuzzy “feeling of the same old body always there” (James, 1890, p. 242). Yet, as soon as we pay attention to our body, we become aware of the position and movements of our limbs, of the contact of our clothes on our skin, of the muscle pain in our legs, of our feeling of thirst. It may be difficult to describe what we feel, but what we feel can be so intense that we are sometimes not able to think of anything else than our body.

1.1 The phenomenology of bodily awareness

Although introspectively familiar, it is hard to exactly pinpoint the nature of the specific relation that we have with our body. What makes our body so special may be that unlike other physical objects, not only do we perceive it through external senses, but we have also an internal access to it through bodily sensations. One way to characterize the relation that we have only with our body (or what we experience as our body) is thus to say that only our body appears to us from the inside. In contrast, many bodies, including our own, can appear to us from the outside. The duality of access to our body is best expressed in what is known as the touchant-touché phenomenon. When we touch our knee with our hand, we have a tactile experience of our knee from the outside (touché), but we have also a tactile experience of our knee from the inside (touchant), and the same is true of the hand.

Despite the constant flow of information about our body from the inside, our bodily awareness is surprisingly weak. While typing on a laptop, we do not vividly experience our fingers on the keyboard. Our conscious field is primarily occupied by the content of what we are typing, and more generally by the external world rather than by the bodily medium that allows us to perceive it and to move through it. We use the body, but we rarely reflect upon it.The body has thus this peculiar feature. It is always immediately present to the subject (Merleau-Ponty, 1945; O’Shaughnessy, 1980), but the most permanent and preponderant object in life may also be the most elusive one (Leder, 1990).

This is not to say, however, that we are completely unaware of our body. Our attention can turn to our body for instance in acute sensations of pain, or in motor learning. In addition, one may claim that we are constantly conscious of the presence of our body, though at the margin of the stream of consciousness. As James (1890, 242) says, “Our own bodily position, attitude, condition, is one of the things of which some awareness, however inattentive, invariably accompanies the knowledge of whatever else we know.” Similarly, Gurwitsch (1985, 31) asserts: “There is no moment in our conscious life when we are completely unaware of our bodily posture, of the fact that we are walking, standing, sitting, lying down”.

The question then arises: how detailed is marginal bodily awareness? Are we constantly conscious of the body in all its details or only as a unitary whole without any internal differentiation? At first sight, bodily awareness seems to be reducible to an unarticulated feeling. However, both James and Gurwitsch describe a more specific phenomenology, not only global feelings of bodily presence, but also particular sensations of bodily posture and state. In The Will, O'Shaughnessy (1980) argues that in order to act, we need to be pre-attentively conscious of all the points of the body at any moment. However, he later criticizes his own view for lack of parsimony and plausibility (O'Shaughnessy, 1995). Instead, he suggests that we are permanently aware of our body as an undifferentiated whole, except when acting. Actions then automatically trigger a precise awareness of the bodily effectors, while the other parts of the body recede in awareness. His latter claim, however, raises another set of issues about the relationship between bodily awareness and action (Wong, forthcoming), which will be addressed in section 2.4.

1.2 Sources of bodily awareness

One strategy to analyse the phenomenology of bodily awareness is to track its origin. As said earlier, we perceive our body not only from the outside, but also from the inside. Although widely accepted, the distinction between the two experiential modes of presentation of the body is rarely spelled out and often reduced to the dichotomy between external senses and body senses, which include touch, proprioception, the vestibular, the nociceptive and the interoceptive systems.

Touch is mediated by cutaneous mechanoreceptors. It carries information both about the external world (shape of the touched object) and about the body (pressure on the specific part of the skin) (Katz, 1925). Furthermore, touch is said to process many types of properties including texture, temperature, solidity, humidity, contact, weight, pressure, force, vibration, and so on.

Proprioception provides information about the position and movement of the body. The mechanisms of proprioception include muscle spindles, which are sensitive to muscle stretch, Golgi tendon organs, which are sensitive to tendon tension, and joint receptors, which are sensitive to joint position.

The vestibular system in the inner ear provides information about the balance of the body. It includes three roughly orthogonal semicircular canals, which are sensitive to motion acceleration as our head moves in space, and two otolith organs, which are sensitive to the pull of gravity.

Nociceptors respond to dangerously intense mechanical stimuli, to mechanothermal stimuli or to thermal and chemical stimuli. According to the dominant theory, noxious signals are inhibited, enhanced or distorted by various factors via a gating mechanism at the level of the spinal cord that controls the amount of signals from the periphery to brain structures and via a central gating mechanism (Melzack and Wall, 1983).

Interoception provides information about the physiological condition of the body in order to maintain optimal homeostasis, namely, cardiovascular, respiratory, energy (feeding and glucose), and fluid (electrolyte and water) balances. The parasympathetic system is sensitive to mechanical, thermal, chemical, metabolic, and hormonal status of skin, muscle, joints, teeth and viscera.

At the cortical level, tactile, proprioceptive and nociceptive signals are processed in the primary and secondary somatosensory cortex. Interestingly, the primary somatosensory area (SI) generally follows the natural anatomical divisions of body parts, having receptive fields confined to single fingers or limbs (Penfield and Rasmussen, 1950; Blankenburg et al., 2003). Penfield and Boldrey (1937) described the somatotopical organization of SI that associates cortical areas to specific parts of the body surface resulting in the metaphor of a “Homunculus”. The Homunculus, however, is a distorted representation of the body. In particular, some body parts are over-represented, whereas others are under-represented. For instance, a relatively large cortical area responds to hand-related signals and a relatively small cortical area responds to torso-related signals. Furthermore, SI does not represent the anatomical contiguity of body parts. For instance, the hand-specific area is next to the face-specific area. In addition to the somatosensory cortex, the body is represented at the level of several brain areas, including the insula (for nociceptive and interoceptive signals), the extrastriate and the fusiform body areas (for visual information about the body) and the right parietal cortex (for multimodal representations of the body) (Blanke et al., 2010; Craig, 2003; Berlucchi and Aglioti, 1997, 2010; Mancini et al., 2011).

Through body senses, one gains information about the body, which can lead to bodily experiences of various types (Eilan et al. 1995). David Armstrong (1962) proposes distinguishing bodily sensations, like pain and touch, which are experienced as being located in a particular part of the body and bodily feelings, like hunger, thirst and tiredness, which are not. Within the category of bodily sensations, he then distinguishes transitive bodily sensations, in which there is an object independent of the sensations (for example, tactile sensations), and intransitive bodily sensations, in which there does not seem to be such an independent object (for example, tickles). Most of the debate in philosophy has focused on intransitive bodily sensations like pain (see the entry on Pain). By contrast, bodily feelings are rarely mentioned in the philosophical literature, though recent work in neuroscience on the interoceptive system posits them at the core of bodily awareness and even of the self (Craig, 2003; Damasio, 1999; Seth, 2013).

1.3 Disorders of bodily awareness

Another way to analyse the phenomenology of bodily awareness is to investigate the variety of bodily disorders. As reported by one amputated soldier with a phantom leg, “I am more sure of the leg which ain't than of the one that are” (in Mitchell, 1871, 566). As soon as one component of bodily awareness is disrupted, the body is brought to the foreground of consciousness and one realizes the complexity and the richness of the experience of the supposedly ‘same old body’. Bodily disorders are not rare, and can be encountered in both neurological (after brain lesion, peripheral lesion, migraine and epileptic seizure) and psychiatric conditions. By analysing a few of those disorders, one may shed some light on what it is like to feel embodied.

  • Out-of-body experience (cf. Blanke and Mohr, 2005). Some individuals feel that they are located outside of their body, which they can see often from an elevated location: “He felt as if he were at the other end of the room, as if he were floating in space below the ceiling in the corner facing the bed from where he could observe his own body in the bed” (Lunn, 1970).

  • Supernumerary phantom limbs (cf. Miyazawa et al., 2004). After brain lesions and in some psychiatric disorders, some people report experiencing the presence of more than two legs and two arms: “Examiner: How did you notice that you had a third arm? Patient: The first time was when I had visitors in the hospital. I was waving goodbye with my right hand and I thought it was strange, as they did not wave back… And I moved my arm a second time, looking at it, but did not see an arm” (In Staub et al., 2006, p. 2142).

  • Somatoparaphrenia (also called asomatognosia or alien hand sign, cf. Vallar and Ronchi 2009; Feinberg, 2009). Following a brain lesion or epileptic seizure, patients deny ownership of one of their limbs, and can attribute it to another individual: “Examiner: Whose arm is this? AR: It's not mine. Ex: Whose is it? AR: It's my mother's. (…) Ex: So, where is your left arm? AR: It's under there (indefinite gesture forwards).” (In Bisiach et al., 1991, p. 1030).

  • Alice in Wonderland syndrome. Some individuals suffering from migraine aura vividly experience their body parts as growing in size (i.e. macrosomatognosia) or as shrinking (i.e. microsomatognosia): “Sometimes I feel ‘real tall’—and I'm only five feet two! I'll feel weird and tall, and walk into my kitchen and feel like my head is going to hit the ceiling and like I'm towering over the countertops.” (, cool aura page, February 2, 2000—see the Other Internet Resources).

  • Peripheral deafferentation (cf. Cole and Paillard, 1995). After rare acute neuropathy, some patients lose all tactile and proprioceptive information on their body. They no longer know where their limbs are without looking at them: “IW: I looked where my legs were before I started. I looked where my arms were. I looked where my body was and then I started to sit-up very gradually. And I was so euphoric at having sat-up for the first time that I almost fell out the bed because I lost the concentration” (Rawlence and Crichton-Miller 1998).

  • Anosognosia for hemiplegia (cf. Vallar and Ronchi, 2006; Vuilleumier, 2004). Although paralyzed, patients experience that they can move and that their body is immediately available to carry any action they may intend. “N: Could you go surfing on the sea should you wish to do so? NS: Why not, if the wind is strong enough” (Cocchini et al., 2002, p. 2031).

These are only a few examples of the many ways bodily awareness can be distorted (see Vignemont, 2010 for a comprehensive list of bodily disorders). Each of them highlights some aspects of ordinary phenomenology of bodily awareness, which normally remain dim and elusive. To experience one's body is to experience one's body as a whole in a specific location in the external space, which constitutes the centre of one's visuo-spatial perspective on the world (cf. out-of-body experience). To experience one's body is to experience from the inside the presence of parts of one's body (cf. supernumerary limbs). To experience one's body is to experience the body parts as one's own, as part of oneself (cf. somatoparaphrenia). To experience one's body is to experience the shape and size of the body parts (cf. Alice in Wonderland syndrome). To experience one's body is to experience the posture and the location of the body parts (cf. deafferentation). To experience one's body is to experience the limbs immediately available to carry any movement one may intend to perform (cf. anosognosia for hemiplegia).

2. Theories of bodily awareness

In the philosophical literature on bodily awareness, one can distinguish two main approaches. These can be called the representationalist approach and the sensorimotor approach. They both give a privileged significance to bodily awareness and they share the same interest in pathological disorders, action and the spatiality of bodily experiences. The claims they respectively defend, however, are different in both their methodology and their content. Whereas the representationalist approach is mainly anchored in analytic philosophy, the sensorimotor approach is mainly anchored in the phenomenological tradition. Whereas the former posits mental representation(s) of the body at the core of bodily awareness, the latter highlights the importance of interacting with the world.

2.1 The representationalist approach

Until the end of the 19th century, bodily awareness was typically understood in terms of a bundle of internal bodily sensations. Bonnier (1905) first introduced the term schema to refer to the spatial organization of these bodily sensations. But it was only in Head and Holmes (1911)'s fundamental paper (discussed in the next section) that one finds the first systematic analysis of the way(s) the brain represents the body. They initiated what might be called the representationalist approach to bodily awareness (e.g., O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Vignemont and Massin, 2015; Carruthers, 2008; Longo and Haggard, 2010).

Proponents of the representationalist approach claim that in order to account for bodily awareness one needs to appeal to mental representations of the body. On a minimal definition of the notion of representation, a body representation is an internal structure that has the function to track the state of the body and encode it, that can misrepresent it and that can be decoupled from it.

Interestingly, a large number of the representationalist advocates argue that there is more than one type of body representations, leading to several taxonomies of body representations. But before describing them, let us consider the motivations to posit the existence of body representation(s).

2.1.1 Why body representations?

Three main reasons have been offered to explain why bodily awareness might require body representation(s). The first reason finds its origin in disturbances of bodily awareness. Most of the literature on body representation can be found in patient studies (Schilder, 1935; Lhermitte, 1942; Cole and Paillard, 1995, Schwoebel and Coslett, 2005; Sirigu et al. 1991). With the help of the notion of body representation, and thus of body misrepresentation, one can easily explain how the way the body is experienced can be at odds with the physical reality of the body. Phantom limbs may be one of the clearest expressions of the existence of body representations (Schilder, 1935; Hilti and Brugger, 2010). Patients feel the presence of their amputated limb because the physically missing limb is still represented. On the other hand, the body can be physically intact while its representation is impaired. For instance, patients with autotopagnosia are not able to correctly identify the parts of their body. According to Schwoebel and Coslett (2005), autotopagnosia results from a deficit of the representation that normally encodes spatial and functional relations among body parts (i.e. body structural description). Most bodily disorders are thus interpreted in terms of disruption of representations of the body.

The second reason focuses on the spatial organization of bodily awareness (Bonnier, 1905; O'Shaughnessy, 1980, 1995; Vignemont, 2014a). Over an extended period, all bodily experiences share the same spatial content of the structural shape of the body. To account for this commonality, O'Shaughnessy posits the existence of a long-term body image (similar to the notion of body structural description) that plays a structural role in spatially shaping bodily experiences. Consequently, if the long-term body image is distorted, if it represents, for instance, an octopus-shaped body, if it represents a part that no longer exists like an amputated limb or if it represents an artificial extension like a cane, then one can have bodily experiences in one's tentacle, phantom limb or at the tip of the cane.

The last reason to postulate body representation is to account for our ability to move our body. In order to act, one needs to know where one's limbs are and how far they can reach. However, on the model of the Perception-Action model of vision (Milner and Goodale, 1995, 2008), it has been suggested that what is needed for action is different in many respects from what is needed for bodily experiences. If so, action may recruit a specific type of body representation, which is encoded in a sensorimotor format (Paillard, 1999; Djikerman and de Haan, 2007; Vignemont, 2010).

2.1.2 How many body representations?

There is therefore more than one reason to posit the existence of body representations. However, these reasons may also be a source of difficulty for the representationalist approach, as they lead to posit a multiplicity of body representations. Clearly, one single body representation cannot suffice to account for the variety of bodily disorders and for the variety of aspects of bodily awareness. There needs to be more, but how many? Two? Three? Four?

The first taxonomy was offered by Head and Holmes (1911). They distinguished between three types of body representations. The postural schema encodes the relative position of body parts after each movement. The superficial schema is the model of the skin surface of the body used for localizing bodily sensations. The two body schemata are “before they enter consciousness” (p. 187). In contrast, the body image is when “recognizable change enters into consciousness” (p. 187). Head and Holmes's complex taxonomy, however, was soon forgotten. For a long time, the terms of body schema and body image were indifferently used (see for instance Schilder, 1935). As for the fine-grained distinction between postural and superficial schema, it has completely disappeared. Nonetheless, since the eighties there has been a renewal of interest for distinguishing various types of body representation (O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Paillard, 1980; Gallagher, 1986), although there is little agreement, neither on the way to individuate the distinct types of body representations, nor on their precise number (for review, see Vignemont, 2010). One can distinguish at least three main taxonomies.

The temporal dyadic taxonomy (O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Carruthers, 2008) is based on the dynamics of body representations. One can contrast the representation of long-term bodily properties such as limb size and the representation of short-term bodily properties such as limb posture. Long-term body representations are relatively stable in adulthood. They may include some innate components that carry information about the structure of the human body (for example, two-arm/two-leg). On the other hand, short-term body representations are constantly updated on the basis of afferent and efferent information.

The functional dyadic taxonomy (Paillard, 1999; Dijkerman and de Haan, 2007; Vignemont, 2010) is based on the functional role played by each body representations. The underlying assumption is that the way one uses information about the body determines the way the information is encoded. It draws a distinction between the body image and the body schema on the Perception-Action model of vision. The body schema is used for action planning and action control. It consists in sensorimotor representations of bodily properties that are relevant for action. The body image groups all the other representations about the body that are not used for action, whether they are perceptual, conceptual or emotional (Gallagher, 1995).

The triadic taxonomy (Schwoebel & Coslett 2005; Sirigu et al. 1991) introduces another way to take apart the various types of body representations, which is based on their format. This new criterion leads to a three-fold distinction: sensorimotor body representation (also called body schema), visuospatial body representation (also called body structural description) and conceptual body representation (also called body semantics).

The taxonomies can be conceived as more orthogonal than contradictory. The problem, however, is that they result in opposite interpretations of the very same bodily disorders. For instance, personal neglect (i.e. lack of exploration of half of the body) has been interpreted as resulting from a deficit of body schema (Coslett, 1998), from a deficit of body image (Gallagher, 1995), or of attention (Kinsbourne, 1995). Furthermore, although most taxonomies rely on neuropsychological dissociations, it does not seem likely that they can account for all bodily disorders. Even three types of body representation might not suffice to explain all the possible dissociations. On the other hand, one may wish to avoid a quasi-infinite list of body representations.

Some may then conclude that the project of individuating distinct types of body representations is a “slippery issue” (Holmes & Spence, 2005, p. 16) that should be avoided. But should we then give up the notion of body representation itself or merely the enterprise of classifying distinct body representations? We shall see now an alternative approach, the sensorimotor approach to bodily awareness, which favors the most radical solution.

2.2 The sensorimotor approach

Although strongly influenced by Husserl (1913) and by Gurwitsch (1985), the most comprehensive treatment of the phenomenology of bodily awareness within the sensorimotor approach can be found in Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception (1945) (see Carman, 1999 for a systematic comparison between Husserl's and Merleau-Ponty's views of bodily awareness). The sensorimotor view can be articulated into three related claims: (i) the body is not an object that can be represented; (ii) the presence of the body is the presence of the body in the world, and (iii) the body we experience is the body in action. By positing action at the core of bodily awareness, Merleau-Ponty initiated a long tradition of phenomenological investigation of bodily awareness (Henri, 1965; de Preester, 2007; Gallagher, 2005; Legrand, 2006; Mishara, 2004; Thompson, 2005; Zahavi and Parnas, 1998), as well as the recent sensorimotor theories of consciousness (O'Regan and Noë, 2001; O'Regan, 2011; Noë, 2004; Hurley, 1998; Thompson, 2005).

2.2.1 The lived body

“The body is not one more among external objects” (MP, 1945, 92). Merleau-Ponty draws the distinction between the objective body made of muscles, bones and nerves and the lived body, that is, the body that we experience in pre-reflective awareness. He argues that the lived body is not an object that can be perceived from various perspectives, left aside or localized in objective space. It cannot even be represented because, on his view, representing the body necessarily involves adopting an objective stance on the lived body. The objectified body could then no longer anchor the way we perceive the world. Further criticisms against the notion of representation can be found in the most radical versions of the more recent embodied approach (Thelen and Smith, 1994; Turvey and Carello, 1995; van Gelder, 1995; Gallagher, 2008). On their views, representations are inadequate because they are too costly and they are unnecessary because they can be easily replaced by sensorimotor loops .

Instead of body representations, Merleau-Ponty appeals to the notion of action to account for the lived body. The lived body is understood in terms of its practical engagement with the world. The bodily space is a space of actions endowed with existential meanings, of ways of existing towards objects. The body schema therefore consists in a sensorimotor function rather than a sensorimotor representation (Gallagher, 2005). The unity of the lived body derives from comprehensive bodily purposes. The action needs not be performed, but can remain virtual movements, what Siewert (2005) calls bodily know-how (i.e. practical knowledge of how to act with or towards a part of one's body). In Merleau-Ponty's words, the lived body consists in an “I can” (p. 137). He illustrates his view with a series of dissociations between the lived body and the objective body. For instance, the patient Schneider was unable to localize where a mosquito was stinging him, and yet, was able to scratch his leg where he was stung (it was later found that this patient faked part of his symptoms, for details see Goldenberg, 2003). As for phantom limbs, Merleau-Ponty interprets them as resulting from the preserved readiness to move the amputated limbs.

Merleau-Ponty argues in favor of the constitutive role of action for consciousness in general. As such, he can be considered as one of the ancestors of the recent sensorimotor approach, which elevates the importance of bodily interactions with the world in explaining cognitive activities. On this view, conscious experiences are inseparable from bodily activities or from sensorimotor expectations (Siewert, 2005; O'Regan and Noë, 2001; Noë, 2004; Hurley, 1998; Thompson, 2005; O'Regan, 2011). Hence, what we feel is said to be determined by what we do and what we know how to do. More specifically, perceptual experiences constitutively depend on our ability to keep track of the interdependence between sensory inputs and motor outputs, this ability being grounded in the procedural knowledge of how the way one moves affects the sensory signals that one receives (or how the movement of objects affects these signals). Although vision has received the most attention, the sensorimotor approach is more likely to be true of tactile experiences than those of any other senses. Noë (2004, 1) even starts his book Action in perception by claiming “All perception is touch-like”. O’Regan (2011, 157-158) also proposed to account for bodily experiences in sensorimotor terms: “For example, when something tickles you on your arm, you can move your other hand and scratch the tickled location (…) What we mean by feeling something in a particular place in our bodies is precisely that certain sensorimotor laws apply”.

2.2.2 To what extent does bodily experiences require action?

That the body that we experience from the inside differs from the physical body is hardly controversial. The notion of representation actually enables such a decoupling. The representationalist approach is also compatible with the hypothesis that the body is not experienced like an object among others. In this sense, one could say that the representationalist approach and the sensorimotor approach agree on the notion of the lived body. But in this sense only. According to the representationalist view, the lived body can be an intentional object without being transformed into an object among others. Subjectivity is not incompatible with intentionality.

Another problem that the sensorimotor approach faces concerns the role of action. Actions are encoded within an egocentric spatial frame of reference, which is centred on the agent’s body. But can such a reference frame suffice to account for the felt location of bodily experiences? When I feel something tickling my arm, I feel it as being located in a specific area of my arm, and if I move my arm, I still feel it at the same location. Yet the egocentric coordinates of my arm have changed. It thus seems that sensorimotor knowledge is not encoded in the right kind of spatial frame to account for the bodily location of sensations (Vignemont, 2014b).

Another difficulty comes from empirical dissociations between action and bodily awareness, which indicate that sensorimotor knowledge is neither necessary nor sufficient for bodily experiences (Vignemont, 2011). If bodily awareness consisted in bodily know-how, then one could not have one without the other. However, it has been recently found that the possession of accurate bodily know-how does not guarantee that one consciously feels touch or feels where the touch occurs (Paillard et al., 1983; Anema et al., 2009). For instance, patients with numbsense have no tactile awareness, but retain a surprising ability to point to where they were touched: “But, I don't understand that. You put something there; I do not feel anything and yet I got there with my finger. How does that happen?” (Paillard et al., 1983, p. 550). The Rubber Hand Illusion as well indicates that bodily know-how can be at odds with bodily experiences. Botvinick and Cohen (1998) found that if one looks at a rubber hand, while one’s own hand is hidden, and both the rubber and the real hands are synchronously stroked, one locates one’s hand as being at a location that is closer to the rubber hand than it is to one's actual hand. Proponents of the sensorimotor approach might argue that one feels one’s hand to be closer to the rubber hand because one is misleadingly induced to expect that if one reaches the location close to the rubber hand, one will touch one’s own hand. However, it was found that participants accurately grasped the stimulated hand with their opposite hand at its real location, and not at the illusory location that they reported (Kammers et al., 2009).

Proponents of the sensorimotor approach may deny that bodily know-how, as displayed in these tasks, includes the type of actions that are constitutive of bodily experiences (Noë, 2010). This answer assumes that there are two types of bodily know-how, only one of which constitutively linked to bodily experiences. Proponents of the sensorimotor approach then need to clarify and defend their distinction at the conceptual level (how does one draw the line between the ‘right’ bodily know-how and the ‘wrong’ bodily know-how?) and at the empirical level (is there evidence of dissociation between two types of bodily know-how?).

2.3 A milder sensorimotor approach

The difficulties that the most radical version of the sensorimotor approach faces does not entail that action plays no role for bodily awareness. As noted by Schilder (1935, p. 112), “we do not know much about the body unless we move it”. One can then propose various compromises between the representationalist approach and the sensorimotor approach. One can, for example, argue that action plays a causal role in calibrating body representations. During the first few years of our life, we learn about our body through action and self-exploration (Rochat, 1998). We later update our body representation while moving. For instance, after tool use we include the spatial and functional parameters of the tool in the representation of our body (Cardinali et al., 2009). Hence, action intervenes at many stages to inform us about our body.

The question then is whether this role of action gives a motor format to the representation of the body that is exploited for bodily awareness. This hypothesis seems especially intuitive in the case of kinaesthetic experiences (Wong, 2009) and in the case of pain (Klein, 2007, 2015; Hall, 2008; Martinez, 2011). Because of its motivational dimension, it has indeed been suggested that pain has an imperative content. According to the imperative view, pain does not correspond to the perception of bodily damage; rather it prescribes actions to perform. Although appealing in its general shape, the imperative theory is more problematic when it comes to the details. What actions does pain prescribe? It seems that there are so many possible pain-related behaviors that there is risk losing the unity of the feeling of painfulness (for discussion see Bain, 2011; Jacobson, 2013).

Another mild sensorimotor approach consists in claiming that bodily experiences are structured by the representation of bodily affordances, that is, of body parts described in terms of movements they afford (Alsmith, 2012; McDowell, 2011; O’Shaughnessy, 1980; Brewer, 1995; Bermúdez, 2005; Smith, 2009). On this view, when I feel the contact of the table on my arm, I feel it on the body part that can do such and such movements. Unlike the imperative view, this hypothesis does not imply that I will automatically perform the movements. But if I were to react, and retrieve my arm for instance, I would not need to translate the location of my sensation to a motor format to plan the movement because where I feel the table is already encoded in a motor format. The question for this mild sensorimotor approach is then twofold. First, what is the nature of what O’Shaughnessy (1980) calls a practical photograph of the body? Despite the frequent invocation of action-centred representations (or something similar), little work has been devoted to the articulation of the core features that distinguish them from other forms of representation. Second, is such an action-centred representation sufficient to account for the focality of the localization of our bodily experiences (e.g., pinprick right here on my arm)?

2.4 To what extent does action require bodily experiences?

According to the sensorimotor approach, bodily awareness requires action. But one may be tempted to make the opposite claim and argue that action requires bodily awareness (O’Shaughnessy, 2000). Action requires detailed information about the long-term and short-term properties of the bodily effectors. But does the information need to reach the threshold of awareness, even at the margin? Several empirical results cast some doubts on the necessity of kinaesthetic experiences for action control (Wong, forthcoming). First, deafferented subjects who have no kinaesthetic and tactile awareness of their body retain their ability to control their movements as long as they receive visual feedback. Second, even healthy subjects have limited awareness of the details of their bodily movements and rely more on visual information (Fourneret and Jeannerod, 1998). Third, as described earlier with the Rubber Hand Illusion, action can be immune to bodily illusions (Kammers et al., 2009). Fourth, action requires fast processing of information, whereas bodily awareness takes time. Hence, kinaesthetic experiences do not seem to be necessary for action. The body is not always immediately present in all its details to the subject, even when acting. Yet as Descartes pointed out, we are not like pilots in a ship. The difference indeed is that we are able to feel our ship from the inside. Hence, there must still be a connection, still to be explored, between our capacity to act directly with our body and our capacity to feel our body from the inside (Wong, forthcoming).

3. Bodily awareness and perception

Is bodily awareness a kind of perceptual awareness? In other words, am I aware of my body in the same way as I am aware of the sea in front of me? One difference is that I see and hear the sea, but I am aware of my body from the inside thanks to the body senses, which go beyond the classic five senses. Yet, if those body senses behave like sensory systems that lead to perceptual experiences, then there seems to be little difference between my awareness of the sea and my awareness of my body. Another way for bodily awareness to be perceptual would be if it resulted not only from information conveyed by body senses, but also from information conveyed by more classic sensory modalities, including vision and audition. The literature on bodily awareness often takes for granted the fact that our bodily experiences are exclusively based on body senses. However, this view neglects the essential role that vision plays in our bodily experiences, which has been recently revealed by the experimental literature on multisensory interactions.

3.1 Do bodily experiences qualify as perceptual experiences?

Many debates on bodily experiences concern their perceptual nature. The perceptual debate has been the most vivid in the case of pain (see Aydede, 2006), but it can be raised for other bodily experiences as well (Gallagher, 2003). There are at least five worries that may disqualify bodily experiences from being perceptual. First, not all body senses are under voluntary control. I cannot decide to proprioceive my body or to check my glycaemia. Second, they rarely give rise to distinct conscious experiences. For instance, both the interoceptive and the vestibular system are continuously active even at rest, but we are not continuously aware of the state of our viscera and of gravity. Third, it has been argued that bodily sensations do not contribute to bodily knowledge (Anscombe, 1962; McDowell, 2011). Fourth, some bodily experiences, like pain but also interoceptive feelings (e.g., hunger), seem subjective and incorrigible. Fifth, body senses may appear as giving access only to a single object, namely our own body.

However, some of the worries outlined above may just evaporate if one gives up theories of perception that treat vision as the paradigm of sense perception (Shoemaker, 1994, for instance). Actually, it is even controversial that every external sense, including olfaction for example, meets all the constraints posited by visuo-centric models. Other worries may be unjustified. It is false to assume that all body senses convey facts only about one's body (Gallagher, 2003; Bermudez, 1998; Schwenkler, 2013). For instance, the vestibular system encodes the motion of the head relative to the outside world. Another question is whether one should analyse the object of the body senses at the level of the sensory receptors or at the representational level. For instance, nociceptive receptors are restricted to one's body, but recent results in social neuroscience show that the same cortical representations are used when one’s body is injured and when another’s body is injured (Singer et al., 2004). Such interpersonal representations may cast doubt on the sole object view of the body senses (Vignemont, 2014c).

At this stage, it may be useful to appeal to Armstrong's classification to articulate the perceptual debate of bodily experiences. Transitive bodily sensations are the easiest to account for in perceptual terms. It is generally accepted that we have a perceptual sense of touch, bodily posture, movement, and of balance (Armstrong, 1962; Bermudez, 1998; Martin, 1995). Intransitive bodily sensations, like pain, are more of a problem (Aydede, 2009), though Armstrong himself defends a perceptual view of all bodily sensations. Finally, bodily feelings seem to be the most resistant to a perceptual account.

3.2 The importance of vision for bodily experiences

Classically, one draws a contrast between bodily awareness and visual awareness of the body. Vision does indeed give access to our own body as well as to many other bodies and we can fail to visually recognize the body that we see as our own. Most literature on visual awareness of the body is restricted to the analysis of face recognition in mirror, and its possible failures. However, the discovery of the Rubber Hand Illusion, along with other recent empirical findings on multisensory interaction, raises new fascinating questions about the consequences of seeing one's body for bodily experiences. In particular, it has encouraged psychologists and neuroscientists to study proprioception and touch no longer in isolation but in their interaction with vision. The Rubber Hand Illusion indeed results from the incorrect integration of somatosensory information and visual information about the rubber hand. It can be explained by three major facts about the sensory systems. First, optimal estimates of bodily properties require combination of information from various sensory channels. Second, vision can dominate over proprioception and touch because it often offers more accurate and precise spatial information (Welch and Warren, 1980). Third, visual information can affect the phenomenal content of bodily experiences. What we feel is determined not only by information from body senses, but also by information from external senses.

The various ways bodily experiences are affected by visual information are too many to be listed here. Let me just mention a few effects. For instance, viewing the body part that is touched (without viewing the touching object) enhances tactile acuity and accuracy (Tipper et al., 1998; Kennett et al., 2001). The mere presence of visual information can suffice to induce bodily experiences (Durgin et al., 2007). However, if visual information is incongruent one way or the other with tactile experiences, or if they are in competition for attentional resources, then it can be detrimental to tactile acuity and accuracy (Di Pellegrino et al., 1997; Spence et al., 2004). A last striking example comes from individuals with mirror-touch synaesthesia, who experience tactile sensations on their body when they see another individual being touched (Blakemore et al., 2005).

What are the implications of these multisensory effects for bodily awareness? Philosophers have become only recently interested in multimodality (O'Callaghan, 2011; Macpherson, 2011; Spence and Bayne, 2015; Hill and Bennett, 2014). There is still little agreement on the way to define it. In particular, one must be careful to distinguish between perceptual, attentional and cognitive multimodality, though they can come together. Distinctions need also to be made between conversion effects (i.e. recoding into the format of another modality) and convergence effects (i.e. recoding in a common amodal format) and between short-term and long-term effects. With the help of this preliminary conceptual grid, one can determine to what extent and in what manners bodily experiences are constitutively multimodal (de Vignemont, 2014a). This requires not only analysing the experimental literature on visuo-somatosensory effects, but also comparing bodily experiences in sighted and blind individuals (for experimental results in blind people, see Kinsbourne and Lempert, 1980; Röder et al., 2004; Yoshimura et al., 2010; Goldreich and Kanics, 2003; Petkova et al., 2012). One may then conclude that bodily awareness would not be the same if one were blind.

4. The spatiality of bodily awareness

In Armstrong's classification, bodily feelings such as thirst are not ascribed to a specific part of the body, though they can be associated to localized sensations (e.g., sensation of dryness in the throat). By contrast, bodily sensations are spatially ascribed at more or less determinate body locations, which can be reported and acted upon. For instance, when you feel your legs crossed, you are aware of (i) a specific bodily property (e.g., posture) and (ii) the part of the body where the property is instantiated (e.g., legs). More formally, one might distinguish the descriptive component and the spatial component of bodily sensations (Bermudez, 1998; Dokic, 2003). The spatial component, however, displays puzzling features, which do not seem to be captured by typical treatments of spatiality. What grounds the spatiality of bodily awareness? And in which spatial frames of reference is the body experienced?

4.1 The peculiarity of the spatiality of bodily sensations

As Merleau-Ponty (1945, 98) warns, “ordinary spatial relations do not cross” the experience of the space of the body. It seems indeed that the way we experience bodily space does not follow some basic spatial rules. For instance, the pain that I feel in my thumb is not felt in my mouth when my thumb is in my mouth (Block, 1983). Nor does it seem to make sense to claim that the pain in my thumb is far from the pain in my foot. How can one envisage accounting for bodily space in terms of Cartesian reference frame when one cannot provide a center of this frame, nor suggest axes on which one could compute distances and directions (Bermudez, 1998, 2005)? The problem affects not only intransitive sensations like pain, but also transitive sensations like tactile sensations, which have their own peculiarities. For instance, according to Martin (1992), touch has no unified tactile field equivalent to the visual field (see also Richardson, 2011; Hopkins, 2011).

One may conclude that the claim that one feels pain in the finger does not indicate the location of the sensation, but rather the state of the finger (Noordhof, 2001). It becomes then questionable whether bodily sensations themselves are intrinsically spatial. There is indeed a long tradition initiated in the 19th century by psychologists such as Wundt, Titchener and James, which denies “that there can be in a sensation any element of actual locality, any tone as it were which cries to us immediately and without further ado, ‘I am here’, or ‘I am there’” (James, 1890, p. 798). But if spatial ascription does not derive from the spatial content of bodily sensations themselves, then what is at its origin? According to the Local sign theory, each sensible nerve gives rise to its own characteristic sensation that is specific to the body part that is stimulated. Alternatively, according to behaviorist theories, the ‘place’ of the sensation is the part of the body towards which one has the disposition to act like scratching (see for instance Anscombe, 1962)

However, both views suffers from several serious flaws, including the absence of qualitative differences between sensations in distinct body parts (Holly, 1986; O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Margolis, 1966; Coburn, 1966) and the failure to account for sensations in phantom limbs (Baier, 1964). It is thus hard to explain spatial ascription of bodily sensations if bodily sensations are not intrinsically spatial.

By contrast, representational theories seem to fare better in their account of the spatial peculiarities of bodily sensations (Tye, 1995, 2002). On this view, bodily sensations have a spatial intentional content that represents the sensations (or the cause of the sensations) as being located in a part of the body. In intentional contexts, co-referential terms cannot safely be substituted. This explains, for instance, why the pain in my thumb is not felt in my mouth though my thumb is in my mouth.

4.2 Dual spatial content

Another spatial peculiarity of bodily sensations is their dual frames of reference. If bodily sensations were ascribed only to parts of our body, then our bodily posture would make no difference for our bodily experiences. No matter whether our hands are crossed or not, we are touched on the right hand. However, experimental studies have found that posture does make a difference. When our hands are crossed and one hand is touched after the other, we have difficulties in judging which hand was touched first, (Yamamoto and Kitazawa, 2001). Bodily sensations thus seem to be located relative to two distinct frames of reference, which can be in conflict (e.g., the touch on your left hand is represented on the right). In O’Shaughnessy’s (1980) terms, we experience sensations “at-a-part-of-body-at-a-point-in-body-relative-space”. In Bermudez’s (2005) terms, bodily sensations have both A-location (i.e. bodily frame of reference independent of the posture of the body) and B-location (i.e. external frame relative to the posture of the body).

A-location involves mastering a kind of folk anatomy that segments the body into categorical parts such as hand, foot, leg, and so forth. But is folk anatomy really necessary for spatial ascription of bodily sensations (see debate between Vesey, 1964 and Margolis, 1966)? Furthermore, how do we individuate body parts (Vignemont et al., 2005)? Are body parts individuated on the basis of their visual features like geons (Andersen, 1978; Biederman, 1987; Brown, 1976)? Or on the basis of their functional salience like joints (Cholewiak and Collins, 2003; Morrison & Tversky, 2005; Bermudez, 1998; Vignemont et al., 2008)? Interestingly, recent cross-cultural studies have shown that linguistic categorization of body parts can vary substantially. For instance, a single term can refer to the whole upper limb with no distinction between hand and arm (Majid et al., 2006). We still know very little of the origins of what seems like one of the most basic experiences, namely, that we feel touch on the hand.

B-location can be conceived in egocentric terms (Evans, 1985; Brewer, 1995). But what is the relationship between the egocentric frame exploited by bodily sensations and the egocentric frame exploited by visual experiences of external objects. Are they one and the same? And if so, in what sense is the spatiality of our bodily sensations different from the spatiality of the experiences of other objects? Marcel (2003) argues that we can interact with external objects because we represent our body and the world within the same frame. However, it seems highly unlikely that we localize our sensations in the external space in the same way that we localize objects. In particular, it does not seem that we are aware of the touch on our hand because we are aware that it is at such location in the external space where our hand happens to be (Holly, 1986; O’Shaughnessy, 1980; Brewer, 1995). Rather, B-location is derivative from A-location (Bermudez, 2005).

4.3 Peripersonal space

A last peculiarity of the spatiality of bodily awareness should be noted. One may believe that our representation of the world is structured under a binary mode. There is the bodily self and then there is the rest of the world. One may also believe that the bodily self has clear boundaries, boundaries that are those of one’s body. However, both conceptions have been recently revealed as misleading. Between the self and the external space, there is a small zone in which boundaries are blurred. What is close to the body is indeed directly relevant for the self and yet outside bodily boundaries. Neuroscientific evidence of the special processing of the zone surrounding the body has been found in 1981 by Rizzolatti and his colleagues. They found that some neurons were activated both by tactile stimuli and by visual stimuli presented in the space close to the body of a monkey. They coined the term of peripersonal space to refer to this multisensory spatial area.

Since then, numerous studies in monkeys and humans, both in healthy and pathological conditions, have shown that peripersonal space is represented in a special way in the brain (for review, see Brozzoli et al., 2012). Those findings raise new philosophical puzzles about perception, space, self-awareness and social cognition, which remains to be solved (Fulkerson, 2014; Vignemont and Iannetti, 2015). Here is a sample of questions. What is the relationship between the perception of peripersonal space on the one hand, and action and emotion on the other hand? Do peripersonal representations contribute to bodily self-awareness? What differences peripersonal space makes for social interaction?

5. The sense of body ownership

Not only am I aware that I am touched on the hand, but I am aware that I am touched on my hand, and on nobody else's hand. Interestingly, although most of the time I feel my own biological body as my own, the sense of ownership (i.e. I am aware that the hand is mine) can sometimes be at odds with the fact of body ownership (i.e. the hand is mine), like in some bodily illusions and in syndromes of bodily alienation. One may then ask: what does it mean to feel one’s body as one’s own? What distinguishes a body part felt as one’s own from a body part felt as alien? The debate on the sense of bodily ownership has been structured along two main issues. First, is there a feeling of ownership (i.e. positive phenomenology of “mineness”) in addition to the judgment of ownership? In a nutshell, one can defend either an eliminativist view (i.e. no experience of ownership, cf. Bermudez, 2011), or a reductionist view (i.e. experience of ownership that can be reduced to other properties of bodily experiences, cf. Martin, 1995; Dokic, 2003; Vignemont, 2007, forthcoming), or an inflationary view (i.e. an irreducible experience of ownership, cf. Gallagher, 2005). According to the reductionist conception, the feeling of body ownership has its source in some more fundamental facts about bodily awareness. This raises the second main issue: which facts are relevant, and how can they ground the sense of body ownership?

5.1 The phenomenology of mineness

What is it like to feel one’s body as one’s own? But first, does it feel like anything? According to Bermudez (2011, 2015), there is no feeling of mineness, which goes over and above the mere experience of the physical properties of the body, no distinctive positive phenomenology of ownership as such. Bermudez, (2011, 2015) applies to the sense of ownership Anscombe’s (1962) argument on knowledge of bodily position (see also McDowell, 2011). He argues that like sensations of position, experiences of ownership cannot be independently describable, and thus cannot ground judgments of ownership. He then concludes that one does not feel one’s body as one’s own (for another cognitive account of the sense of bodily ownership, see Alsmith forthcoming).

By contrast, Peacocke (2014) and Vignemont (2007, 2013) claim that there is an experiential component to the sense of bodily ownership. They base their argument on illusions of bodily ownership, such as the Rubber Hand Illusion. Further recent bodily illusions that involve the whole body also indicate that one can feel a virtual avatar or another individual’s body as one’s own (Ehrsson, 2007; Lenggenhager et al., 2007). These illusions might be taken as evidence that experiences of ownership are actually independently describable insofar as participants report feeling as if a body part belonged to them while judging that this is not their own body part (Harcourt, 2008). Further support against the eliminativist view comes from the study of syndromes of bodily alienation, in which patients report feeling as if their own limb did not belong to them (e.g., depersonalization, somatoparaphrenia; deafferentation; Body Integrity Identity Disorder). Interestingly, not all of those patients are delusional. Some only feel as if their hand were alien, for instance, without judging that it is not their own. On Peacocke’s and Vignemont’s views, our body can be manifested to us as our own in a more primitive form than judgments. One may then talk of experiences of ownership, in the same way as one can talk of experiences of agency (Bayne & Pacherie, 2007). Although sometimes called feelings of mineness, one should not conceive experiences of ownership in terms of pure raw feels without representational properties. There are actually two ways they can be understood in representational terms. The specific phenomenology of ownership can arise either from non-conceptual content that represents one’s body as one’s own, or from a specific mode of presentation of bodily representations.

Bermudez, (2015), however, deny the relevance of the borderline cases of bodily ownership previously described. It is true that the interpretation of the Rubber Hand Illusion remains controversial: do participants really feel the rubber hand as their own (they show only mild agreement when explicitly asked? cf. Longo et al., 2008)? Even if it were a true illusion of ownership, still this would not suffice for Bermudez to show that experiences of ownership are independently describable, and thus exist because, “There is no way of characterizing the content of our experience of our own bodies that can exclude the fact that we experience our bodies as our own” (2015, p. 44). The challenge for theories of bodily ownership is thus to find a way to offer such an independent characterization. To do so, one strategy consists in analysing what grounds the sense of bodily ownership.

5.2 The grounds of the sense of body ownership

Reductionist approaches to the sense of bodily ownership aim at accounting for the sense of ownership in terms of specific properties of bodily experiences. Three main candidates have been suggested, which respectively reduce the sense of bodily ownership to spatial awareness, to agentive awareness and to affective awareness (for cognitivist models, see Makin et al., 2008; Tsakiris, 2010).

5.2.1 The spatial conception

According to Martin (1993, p. 212), we have a sense of bodily ownership because “we have a sense of ourselves as being bounded and limited objects within a larger space, which can contain other objects”. Martin (1995) defends what he calls the Sole object view, according to which sensations are experienced within the boundaries of one’s own body. In other words, there cannot be any sensation that does not fall within the limits of the bodily space as it is experienced. When I feel a bodily sensation, I do not feel it in one body as opposed to another body. I feel it in my own body. Bodily sensations thus confer a sense of ownership on the body part in which they are felt to occur (see also Brewer, 1995; Dokic, 2003). The sense of bodily ownership is grounded in the sense of the spatial boundaries of one’s body, within which one can feel sensations.

In order to defend his reductionist conception, Martin (1995) appeals to a reductio ad absurdum. If the sense of ownership is not exhausted by the spatial phenomenology of bodily experiences, then it should be possible for there to be cases in which one has bodily experiences while experiencing the converse of ownership, namely, disownership. According to Martin, there could not be such cases (for a similar prediction, see also Bain, 2003; Dokic, 2003). However, what Martin and the others claim to be inconceivable actually exists. Bodily sensations and bodily ownership can be taken apart (Vignemont, 2013). On the one hand, one may argue that in referred sensations in tools, one feels sensations as being located at the end of the tool, and yet does not feel the tool as part of one’s body. On the other hand, patients with syndromes of bodily alienation can feel sensations as being located in a body part that feels as alien to them.

A further difficulty for the spatial conception is the risk of exclusion of the first person from the sense of ownership. It seems that the awareness of bodily boundaries that is given by bodily experiences can only guarantee that the boundaries are true only of one’s body, but this is different from the sense of bodily ownership. One can be aware of the boundaries of the body without being aware of the boundaries of the body qua one’s own.

5.2.2 The agentive conception

The spatial conception has difficulties accounting for the self-referentiality of the sense of ownership. One may then wonder whether the sense of bodily ownership cannot borrow, so to speak, its self-referentiality from the self-referentiality of agency. On the agentive conception, the sense of bodily ownership is given by the sense of the spatial boundaries of one’s body as being under direct control (Vignemont, 2007; Gallese and Sinigaglia, 2010; Davies et al., 2001). This is not to assume that the sense of agency and the sense of bodily ownership are one and the same thing. Still, there is an intuitive sense in which bodily control and bodily ownership must go hand in hand. In particular, the sense of disownership seems to be nicely explained by the lack of bodily control “The body is a unity of actions, and if a part of the body is split off from action, it becomes ‘alien’ and not felt as part of the body” (Sacks, 1984, p. 166). Furthermore, it is possible to elicit illusions of bodily ownership by controlling an avatar in a virtual reality setting (Slater, 2008).

However, the relationship between ownership and bodily control is complex (Carruthers, 2009). For one thing, it is not clear whether what matters is the sense of being able to control one’s body or the actual ability to control it. Furthermore, one should not forget that most patients that are paralysed do not feel disownership. Finally, as said earlier, the main illusion of ownership is the Rubber Hand Illusion, which seems to have no agentive component whatsoever (Longo et al., 2008; Kammers et al., 2009).

5.2.3 The affective conception

One may then turn to a different source of self-referentiality, that is, the affective significance of the body for the self. The affective conception, however, is often only implicitly defended, and the exact nature of the affective significance of the body not well articulated. For example, some philosophers and neuroscientists have recently highlighted the importance of affective factors for self-consciousness. On their view, what they might call the “bodily self” (Damasio, 1999; Craig, 2003; Seth, 2013) or the phenomenology of mineness (Mishara, 2004) is based on the interoceptive system. Their account, however, is not restricted specifically to the sense of bodily ownership, but rather to self-awareness in general.

Still, it is interesting to note that the main measure of ownership illusions is affective (e.g. skin conductance response, cf. Ehrsson et al., 2007). This measure is also used in the study of the feeling of familiarity. The familiarity one experiences with people one knows cannot be reduced to the sensory content of visual experiences. Rather, it consists in a kind of affective coloring of the experience of objects and events that have personal significance. This affective coloring can be missing, as it is the case in Capgras syndrome. Patients can see that a person is visually identical to their spouse for example, but they do not feel that she is their spouse that they see and they believe that this person must be an impostor. Their sensory phenomenology is thus intact, but they lack the affective responses normally associated with it. One may then interpret syndromes of bodily alienation, such as somatoparaphrenia, as a kind of Capgras syndrome for one’s body parts (Feinberg and Roane, 2003).

There is, however, a main difference between the sense of ownership and the feeling of familiarity. Arguably, one feels only a single body as one’s own, while one feels many faces familiar. Hence, one cannot reduce the former to the latter. Still, the notion of familiarity can point to us the path to undertake. One may argue that the sense of ownership is a kind of affective feeling that highlights the significance of the body for the self (Vignemont, forthcoming). The affective significance that defines familiarity results from previous encounters with the object that feels familiar, and it does not guide how to behave with the object in the next encounter (one’s enemy feels familiar, for instance). By contrast, the affective significance that defines the sense of ownership results from selective pressure, and it guides how one should try to protect it for self-preservation. Hence, bodily awareness is not simply about one’s body. It is about one’s body for the self, for its needs and interests.

6. The epistemology of bodily awareness

“It is tempting to think that because our bodies are, as it were, so close to us, the scope for illusions here is minimal. In fact, however, recent research in this area has presented some of the most striking illusions in all the literature” (Smith, 2002, 24). We have already seen some of them, but the list is even longer. On the other hand, the satisfaction conditions of some bodily experiences are difficult to articulate. Can one have an illusory pain for example? Furthermore, there seems to be at least one type of error that all bodily experiences may be immune to, namely, error through misidentification relative to the first-person.

6.1 Bodily illusions

Through body senses we have a privileged, though not exclusive, access to our body. It may then be tempting to conclude that the privileged immediate access that we have to our body is a source of infallible knowledge. However, there are a wide variety of bodily illusions. We have already seen the Rubber Hand illusion, which indicates that one can feel a rubber hand as one's own after only a couple of minutes of synchronous stroking of one's hand and a rubber hand. Another famous bodily illusion is the Pinocchio illusion (Lackner, 1988). Vibrations of muscle tendons induce illusory kinaesthetic sensations (e.g. arm stretching during biceps tendon vibration and arm flexing during triceps tendon vibration, though the arm remains still). If at the same time one holds one's nose with the stimulated arm, then one feels one's nose elongating (during biceps tendon vibration) or shrinking (during triceps tendon vibration). One may also mention what might be called the Dentist illusion. After having been to the dentist, one often feels as if one's mouth or lips were inflated though they look normal. And indeed it was experimentally shown that complete lips anaesthesia could induce the sensation of the lips increasing in size by as much as 100% (Gandevia and Phegan, 1999).

Those illusions are only a few within a long list. They are actually not surprising if bodily experiences are perceptual. One may, however, wonder whether there are illusions that correspond to every single type of bodily experiences, including pain. In this latter case, the distinction between appearance and reality may be difficult, if not impossible. Some phenomena, however, might be interpreted as cases of illusory pain. For instance, in the thermal grill illusion, when one presses one's fingers on two warm objects surrounding one cool object, the cool object feels painfully hot. But is this illusion more a thermal illusion or a pain illusion? Another possible candidate is the phenomenon of referred pain. One can sometimes experience pain at a location distinct from the location of the cause of pain. It then seems that the spatial content of pain is illusory. However, this is true only if one defends the view that the location of pain is the location of its cause. If pain seems infallible, it is even more so for bodily feelings like thirst and hunger.

6.2 Immunity to error through misidentification of bodily self-ascriptions

Though there are various interpretations of the notion of immunity to error (hereafter IEM), it is typically accepted that if I feel in pain, I cannot be wrong about who is in pain. Most accounts of IEM have focused on self-ascriptions of mental states like bodily sensations, but one may raise similar questions for self-ascriptions of physical bodily properties (e.g. size, weight, posture). The debate is then articulated around three main questions: (i) Can bodily self-ascriptions be immune to error, and if so, what are the appropriate grounds that secure bodily IEM (e.g., Vignemont, 2012)? (ii) Is bodily IEM of a different type from mental IEM (e.g., Coliva, 2012)? (iii) Does bodily IEM reveal the bodily nature of the self (e.g., Cassam, 1997; Chen, 2011; Smith, 2006)?

According to the dominant view on bodily IEM, which has been defended by Evans (1982) and others (e.g., Bermudez, 1998; Dokic, 2003; Brewer, 1995; Cassam, 1995), perceiving one's body through body senses grounds bodily self-ascriptions that are immune to error through misidentification. There are indeed no other bodies than one's own that one can directly access to through body senses. One can thus dispense with identifying whose body one experiences when one experiences it from the inside. For instance, one cannot rationally doubt that the arms that are crossed are one's own when one knows the position of the arms through proprioception. Most theories then reject vision as an appropriate candidate for bodily IEM. For the most part, visual experiences of one's body do not guarantee bodily IEM: I can see my arms crossed and rationally doubt whether those are my arms or not. However, there may be exceptions (Bermudez, 1998; Vignemont, 2012). For instance, I can see my nose if I close one eye. I then cannot doubt that this is my own nose when I see it from this specific angle. Hence, one should not rule out all visual experiences as being inappropriate for bodily IEM. There are some visuo-spatial perspectives from which we can see our body such that we cannot rationally doubt that the body is our own. Indeed, the body that we see that way has always been our own. Our cognitive system has evolved with this invariant fact, making self-identification process superfluous and error through misidentification impossible.

Bodily experiences, and possibly some visual experiences, seem to guarantee bodily IEM. Some may deny, however, that bodily self-ascriptions display the same type of IEM as mental self-ascriptions (Shoemaker, 1968). The IEM of pain self-ascriptions, for instance, may seem absolute or logical. On this view, there is no possible world where I can feel pain and be mistaken about who is feeling pain. By contrast, one can easily conceive that my proprioceptive system is connected to another body. When I judge that my legs are crossed on the basis of proprioception (or what we may call quasi-proprioception), I may actually be feeling someone else's legs. Bodily IEM is only de facto (true only in the actual world) (Evans, 1982).

But if bodily IEM is only de facto, what can it tell us about the true nature of the self? Yet Evans (1982) and Cassam (1997) use bodily IEM as an argument against the Cartesian view of the self. In a nutshell, bodily awareness is the awareness of oneself qua subject, as shown by bodily IEM. One can therefore self-ascribe bodily properties as well as mental properties to the self without self-identification. Hence the object of such judgments, the self, is not a Cartesian ego, but a bodily subject of both mental and physical properties. One may, however, wonder if one is entitled to draw such a metaphysical conclusion from the epistemological fact of bodily IEM (Chen, 2011; Smith, 2006).

7. The functional role of bodily awareness

Via body ownership, bodily awareness may thus play a role in grounding self-awareness (Bermudez, 1998; Neisser, 1992), and even a non-Cartesian view of the self (Evans, 1982; Cassam, 1997). Its significance may even extend further. Stressing the importance of the body for the mind actually constitutes one of the main claims of the recent approach of Embodied cognition (see the entry Embodied Cognition) (Clark, 1997). The body is said to affect not only perception, emotion, and action, but also higher mental processes. Gallagher (2005, 247) concludes: “nothing about human experience remains untouched by human embodiment”. However, one should distinguish the role of the physical body, the role of bodily activities and the role of bodily awareness. This section will briefly discuss only the latter, and in particular in relation to emotion, perceptual awareness and social cognition.

7.1 Emotions

Theories of emotion have oscillated between cognitive theories and embodied theories. On the one hand, some theories have focused on the intentionality of emotions, accounting for emotions in purely cognitive terms (Solomon, 1993). It is not clear, however, how they differentiate propositional attitudes and emotions. On the other hand, other theories have focused on the phenomenology of emotions, explaining certain (if not all) emotions in terms of experiences of bodily changes (e.g., James, 1884, Damasio, 1999; Prinz, 2004; Niedenthal, 2007). There are some states, including pain, pleasure and disgust, that can be conceived either as emotions or as bodily sensations. A recent study even showed that conventional painkillers could decrease psychological distress (Dewall et al., 2010). For other types of emotions, however, the link with bodily sensations seems more remote.

Embodied theories of emotions have been criticized for their failure to account for the target of the emotion (I feel frightened of the dog, for instance). Furthermore, even for primary emotions, which seem the most embodied, there is some opacity concerning the specific nature of their bodily component. Does this component refer to physiological states, subpersonal recording of physiological states, bodily sensations and/or bodily expressions of emotions? For instance, it was shown that if you hold a pen horizontally between your lips, artificially forcing you to smile, the cartoon that you read looks funnier (Strack et al., 1988). But is it the feeling of smiling that makes you happy or the fact of smiling?

7.2 Perceptual awareness

Merleau-Ponty emphasizes how the lived body anchors the awareness of the world. Similarly, O'Shaughnessy (1980) argues that bodily awareness is a major determinant of perceptual awareness by spatially structuring it. When I see that the book is on my left on the table, my visual experience of the book is spatially organized by my body in two distinct ways. First, the book is directly located relative to the location of my body. This egocentric location is especially important for action. I need to locate the book relative to my hand for me to grasp it. Second, even the location of the book relative to the table is determined by my body. It is only from my perspective that the book is on the table. From the spider's perspective on the ceiling, the book is under the table. Bodily space thus orients external space by offering spatial axes such as up and down, left and right, front and back.

The influence of bodily awareness on perception has been said to go beyond anchoring reference frames. According to some, bodily awareness affects not only how we perceive the location of objects, but also their other properties, including affordances or what Campbell (1994) calls causally indexical properties. Causally indexical properties like the weight of an object have immediate implications for our actions. As such, they depend on the state of our body that will carry on the actions. For instance, some results indicate that the effortful experience of wearing a heavy backpack makes slopes look steeper and distances seem longer (Proffitt et al., 2003). The authors concluded that what we feel determines what we perceive. However, these results are controversial (Durgin et al., 2009).

7.3 Social cognition

Another example of the influence of bodily awareness concerns social perception, that is, the perception of cues in other people indicating their mental states like facial expressions. Since Lipps (1900), it has been recurrently suggested that when perceiving other people's actions, we mentally simulate or re-enact their bodily movements (Goldman, 2006; Gallese, 2001). This view seems to be confirmed by the discovery of mirror systems for action. It was found that perceiving another individual acting partially activates the same regions in the brain as when one is acting (Rizzolatti et al., 1995; Decety et al., 1997). Shared cortical networks have also been found for empathy. Brain imaging studies have shown overlapping brain activity when subjects feel pain and when they observe another in pain (Singer et al., 2004), when they feel being touched and when they see another being touched (Keysers et al., 2004), when they inhale disgusting odorants and when they observe disgust-expressive faces (Wicker et al. 2003).

What makes motor and affective resonance special is that it goes beyond mere conceptual sharing. One does not share abstract knowledge about the observed action or emotion; one shares what might be called embodied knowledge or knowledge in a bodily format. Four related questions can then be raised. First, to what extent and in what manner is social cognition embodied (Goldman and Vignemont, 2009; Goldman, 2012; Vignemont, 2014c)? Does one exploit representations about the body in social cognition or only representations with what may be called a bodily format? And in the latter case, what is a bodily format? Second, is motor resonance similar to affective resonance (Jacob and Vignemont, forthcoming)? Third, what mechanisms generate motor resonance and affective resonance? Do they directly derive from the perception of actions and facial expressions (Gallese, 2001; Gallagher, 2005)? Or are they mediated by processing of contextual information (Csibra, 2007; Vignemont and Singer, 2006)? Fourth, what role do motor resonance and affective resonance play for mindreading? Do they result in the understanding of other people's mental states (Goldman, 2006; Rizzolatti and Sinigaglia, 2008) or not (Jacob, 2008)?

8. Conclusion

Bodily awareness reveals a new rich territory for philosophical exploration in its own right, but it also provides a new approach to general issues on perception, action, self and space. Empirical research on body representations, bodily sensations, bodily illusions, and self-awareness has grown exponentially. A comprehensive understanding of bodily awareness will likely require taking on board its insight.


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