Epistemology of Geometry

First published Mon Oct 14, 2013

Geometrical knowledge typically concerns two kinds of things: theoretical or abstract knowledge contained in the definitions, theorems, and proofs in a system of geometry; and some knowledge of the external world, such as is expressed in terms taken from a system of geometry. The nature of the relation between the abstract geometry and its practical expression has also to be considered.

This essay considers various theories of geometry, their grounds for intelligibility, for validity, and for physical interpretability in the period largely before the advent of the theories of special and general relativity in the 20th century. It turns out that a complicated interplay between shortest and straightest is at work in many stages.

Before the 19th century only one geometry was studied in any depth or thought to be an accurate or correct description of physical space, and that was Euclidean geometry. The 19th century itself saw a profusion of new geometries, of which the most important were projective geometry and non-Euclidean or hyperbolic geometry. Projective geometry can be thought of as a deepening of the non-metrical and formal sides of Euclidean geometry; non-Euclidean geometry as a challenge to its metrical aspects and implications. By the opening years of the 20th century a variety of Riemannian differential geometries had been proposed, which made rigorous sense of non-Euclidean geometry. There were also significant advances in the domain of abstract geometries, such as those proposed by David Hilbert. It follows that the terms ‘geometry’ and ‘physical space’ do not have simple meanings in the 19th century, and changing conceptions of these terms do not follow a simple pattern of refinement. Their inter-relations therefore also have a complicated history.

1. Epistemological issues in Euclid's geometry

A detailed examination of geometry as Euclid presented it reveals a number of problems. It is worth considering these in some detail because the epistemologically convincing status of Euclid's Elements was uncontested by almost everyone until the later decades of the 19th century. Chief among these problems are a lack of clarity in the definitions of straight line and plane, and a confusion between shortest and straightest as a, or the, fundamental geometrical property. (See the many comments collected in Heath's edition of Euclid's Elements.) The implications for the parallel postulate will be treated separately, see section on Non-Euclidean geometry.

The first four Books of Euclid's Elements are about straight lines and circles, but it is well known that the concept of a straight line receives only a most unsatisfactory definition. A line is said to be “a breadthless length”, and a straight line to be a line “which lies evenly with the points on itself”. This may help convince readers that they share a common conception of the straight line, but it is no use if unexpected difficulties arise in the creation of a theory—as we shall see.

To those who decided to read the Elements carefully and see how the crucial terms are used, it became apparent that the account is both remarkably scrupulous in some ways and flawed in others. Straight lines arise almost always as finite segments that can be indefinitely extended, but, as many commentators noted, although Euclid stated that there is a segment joining any two points he did not explicitly say that this segment is unique. This is a flaw in the proof of the first congruence theorem (I.4) which says that if two triangles have two pairs of sides equal and the included angle is equal then the remaining sides of the triangles are equal.

Theorem I.4 is interesting in another way. Theorem I.2 carries a scrupulous, and by no means obvious, proof that a given line segment in a plane may be copied exactly with one of its end points at any prescribed point in the plane. Theorem I.4 properly requires a proof that an angle may likewise be copied exactly at an arbitrary point, but this Euclid cannot provide at this stage (one is given in I.23, which, however, builds on these earlier results). He therefore gave a bald claim that one triangle may be copied exactly in an arbitrary position, which makes one wonder why such care was expended on I.2. In fact, the whole concept of motion of figures was to become a prolonged topic of discussion in Arab/Islamic times. (on deduction in Euclid, see Mueller 1981).

A plausible reading of Elements Book I is that a straight line can be understood as having a direction, so that there is a straight line in every direction at every point and only one straight line at a given point in a given direction. The parallel postulate then says that lines which cross a given line in equal angles point in the same direction and do not meet. But this must be regarded as an interpretation, and one that requires quite some work to make precise.

Direction is, nonetheless, a more plausible candidate than distance; Euclid did not start with the idea that the straight line joining two distinct points is the shortest curve joining them. The relevant primitive concept in the Elements is that of equality of segments, such as all the radii of a given circle. Euclid stated as Common Notion 4 that if two segments can be made to coincide then they are equal, and (in the troublesome I.4) he used the converse, that if two segments are equal then they can be made to coincide. Segments are such that either one is smaller than the other or they are equal, and in I.20 Euclid showed that “in any triangle two sides taken together in any manner are greater than the remaining one.” This result has become known as the triangle inequality, and it goes a long way to proving that the line segment joining any two distinct points is the shortest curve through those points. Once the parallel postulate is introduced Euclid showed that opposite sides of a parallelogram are equal, and so the distance between a pair of parallel lines is a constant.

But there is another weakness in the Elements that is also worth noting, although it drew less attention, and this is the nature of the plane. The plane has another sub-standard definition, evidently modelled on that of the line: “a plane surface is a surface which lies evenly with the straight lines on itself” (and, unsurprisingly, “a surface is that which has length and breadth only”). After that, the word ‘plane’ is not mentioned in the first four Books, although they are solely concerned with plane geometry. When Euclid turned to solid geometry in Book IX, he began with three theorems to show successively that a straight line cannot lie partly in a plane and partly not, that if two straight lines cut one another they lie in a plane and every triangle lies in a plane, and that if two planes meet then they do so in a line. However, he can only be said to claim these results and make them plausible, because he cannot use his definition of a plane to prove any of them. They do, however, form the basis for the next theorems: there is a perpendicular to a plane at any point of the plane, and all the lines perpendicular to a given line at a given point form a plane.

Once again, I.4 is problematic. Consider, for the purpose of a reduction ad absurdum, that one has two triangles, ABC and ABC on the same side of their common base BC, and such that BA = BA′ and CA = CA′. It is intended to show that therefore the vertices A and A′ coincide, and for this one must, as Gauss observed (in unpublished remarks, see Gauss Werke 8, 193), use the fact that the triangles lie in the same plane. A good definition of a plane is required, one that allows this result to be proved.

Let us say that a purely synthetic geometry is one that deals with primitive concepts such as straight lines and planes in something like the above fashion. That is, it takes the straightness of the straight line and the flatness of the plane as fundamental, and appeals to the incidence properties just described. It is resistant to the idea of taking distance as a fundamental concept, or to the idea of replacing statements in geometry by statements about numbers (say, as coordinates), although it is not hostile to coordinate geometry being erected upon it.

Let us also say for present purposes that a metrical geometry is one in which distance is a primitive concept, so line segments can be said to have the same length, congruent figures have corresponding sides equal in length, and geometrical transformations preserve lengths. We can also allow that similarities are allowed: these are transformations that produce scale copies of figures. (No theorem in Euclid's Elements depends on the actual size of a figure: any theorem that applies to one figure applies to all its scale copies.)

Elementary geometry in the modern West moved in a confused way towards making distance the primary primitive concept, while often maintaining the Euclidean emphasis on straightness, thus frequently muddling the implications of the different concepts. A notable example of this being nonetheless productive was John Wallis's argument in defence of the parallel postulate (given as a lecture in 1665 and published in Wallis 1693). It rested, as he realised, on the ability to make arbitrary scale copies of a triangle, and this seems to be the first time that the equivalence was recognised between these two systems;

  1. Euclid's Elements
  2. Euclid's Elements with the parallel postulate removed and the assumption that arbitrary similar figures exist added.

In the Encylopédie Méthodique (1784: vol. 2, 132), d'Alembert defined geometry as the science that teaches us to know the extent, position, and solidity of bodies. It principles are founded, he went on, on truths so evident that it is not possible to contest them. A line (in the sense of a curve) is one-dimensional, and the shortest line joining two points is the straight line. Parallel lines are lines that, however far they are extended will never meet because they are everywhere equidistant.

Joseph Fourier, in a discussion with Monge, also took the concept of distance as fundamental, but he began with three-dimensional space. He then defined successively the sphere, the plane (as the points equidistant from two given points) and the line (as the points equidistant from three given points). This did at least give him definitions of these previously troubling concepts (see Bonola 1912, 54).

Adrien-Marie Legendre was a mathematician sympathetic to the didactic aims of the Elements but not to its original formulations. He wrote several different versions of his Éléments de géométrie (1794) with a view to restoring Euclidean rigour in the teaching of geometry, which in his view had been corroded by texts, such as one by Clairaut (1741), that relied on notions of self-evidence. They differ largely, as he had to admit, in their unsuccessful attempts to deduce the parallel postulate.

In all these editions Legendre took a firmly metrical point of view. His opening definition of the first edition proclaimed that “Geometry is a science that has as its object the measure of extent”. Extent, he explained, has three dimensions, length breadth, and height; a line is a length without breadth, its extremities are called points and a point therefore has no extent. A straight line is the shortest path from one point to another; surfaces have length and breadth but no height or depth; and a plane is a surface in which if two arbitrary points are joined by a straight line this line lies entirely in the surface.

Legendre then set out to prove the theorems of the Elements together with some results Euclid had preferred to assume, such as (Legendre's first result): any two right angles are equal. His Theorem 3 proved that the line joining two distinct points is unique (its existence having been tacitly assumed to be a consequence of the definition of a straight line). Familiar congruence theorems follow in each edition until the parallel postulate could no longer be ignored. Once the existence of parallel lines was assured Legendre showed that they were equidistant.

In fact, Legendre's attempts to restore rigour to the treatment of elementary geometry was no better than Euclid's, and in some ways worse, not only because his attempts to prove the parallel postulate inevitably failed, but because he smuggled more into his account than he realised. But its chief significance for present purposes is that it exemplifies the attempt to ground elementary geometry on a concept of distance, or rather, and more precisely, on the idea that a straight line is the curve of shortest distance between any of its points. Distance itself is not defined.

To conclude: a reasonable view at the time would have been that metrical geometry needed to put its house in order, and it probably could not do so by grafting the concept of distance onto a structure modelled on Euclid's Elements. This is an awkward position for traditional geometry to be in, and it may have opened people's minds to the possibilities of alternatives. Certainly, two were to be produced. One, projective geometry, amplified and improved the synthetic side of geometry. The other, non-Euclidean geometry, was a new and challenging metrical geometry. But before we look at them, we turn to contemporary philosophical discussions of geometry.

2. Epistemological issues in applied geometry

It is a useful over-simplification to say that around 1800 the view was that there was one physical space (the universe), and that this space was described by the geometry in Euclid's Elements, which was the only candidate for such a task. Disputes concerned the rigorous presentation of this geometry and its precise application to the physical world. The nature of the knowledge that geometry provided was also a matter of some discussion.

Locke (see the entry on Locke) took from the Aristotelian tradition the idea that Euclidean geometry and rational theology are the exemplars of scientific knowledge, but sought to ground his philosophy in intuitive, demonstrative, and sensitive kinds of knowledge. Intuitive knowledge is what is grasped immediately; demonstrative knowledge avails itself of the intermediate steps of a proof, as in geometry. Both these forms of knowledge are certain. Sensitive knowledge is not certain: it is what we learn through our senses, it presents effects but not causes, it is at best partial and may be deceptive. But because Locke grounded certain knowledge on knowledge of essences, which he felt were forever hidden from us, he was forced to defend this weaker form of knowledge as appropriate to human knowledge. Space can be thought of as composed of all (actual and possible) positions of objects; pure space is space with all solid bodies removed, and distance the primitive concept we use to discuss the separation between bodies.

In his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690) Locke asserted that

When we possess ourselves with the utmost security of the demonstration, that the three angles of a triangle are equal to two right ones, what do we more but perceive, that equality to two right ones does necessarily agree to, and is inseparable from, the three angles of a triangle? (Essay IV.i.2)

and later that

…the idea of a right-lined triangle necessarily carries with it an equality of its angles to two right ones. Nor can we conceive this relation, this connexion of these two ideas, to be possibly mutable, or to depend on any arbitrary Power, which of choice made it thus, or could make it otherwise. (Essay IV.iii.29, pp. 559–560)

Sensitive knowledge of the corresponding objects, however, could never have this degree of certainty, and because our knowledge derives from our knowledge of objects it would seem that scientific knowledge of space is of a different kind from our knowledge of geometry. Thus, for Locke, Euclidean geometry provided one kind of knowledge, and experience and scientific experiment, another. Indeed, one might say that an epistemological gap remains to this day in philosophy in the form of a distinction between empirical and a priori knowledge that is still widely recognised.

The situation with Hume is more complicated, but also arguably clearer because the gap is addressed directly. In his A Treatise of Human Nature (1739–1740) he defended the certainty of arithmetic and algebra, but withheld it from geometry on the grounds that our knowledge of points and lines is inherently imprecise. The truths of Euclidean geometry were not truths about the world but of an abstract system, and would remain true if there were no figures in the world that correspond to their Euclidean equivalents. The isosceles triangle theorem, which asserts the equality of two sides of a triangle having two equal angles, is to be understood, Hume suggested, as the claim that in the given circumstances, two sides of a triangle are approximately equal—and interpreted this way the claim is certain (see Badici 2011 and de Pierris 2012).

In Kant's metaphysics (see his Critique of Pure Reason (1781/1787) and the entry Kant's views on space and time) the situation is again more complicated or sophisticated. Kant introduced the notion of a priori knowledge in contrast to a posteriori, and synthetic knowledge in contrast to analytical knowledge to allow for the existence of knowledge that did not rely on experience (and was thus a priori) but was not tautological in character (and therefore synthetic and not analytic). Analytic statements are a priori, the contentious class of a priori non-analytic statements contains those that could not be otherwise and so provide certain knowledge. Among them are the statements of Euclidean geometry; Kant ascribed synthetic a priori status to the knowledge of space. He also ascribed certainty to Euclidean geometry. But, wrote Kant, it is not the philosopher who knows that the angle sum of a triangle is two right angles, it is the mathematician, because the mathematician makes a particular construction that makes the truth of the claim demonstrable (see Critique, A 716, B 744).

Among the French philosophes, the dominant position in the 1770s was the Cartesian one, which, as exemplified by Clairaut's Élémens de géométrie (1741) was perhaps unduly naïve in its insistence on clear and immediate ideas. The position of d'Alembert, in his articles in the Encylopédie Méthodique (1784), was more sophisticated. The objects of geometry are to be understood by abstracting from bodies every quality except that of being penetrable, divisible, and figured extents. Among these objects are lines, that lack breadth, and surfaces, that lack depth. Truths established about the objects of geometry are purely abstract and hypothetical, because there is no such thing, for example, as a perfect circle. The demonstrated properties can hold of actual circles only insofar as the actual object approaches the state of being a perfect circle,

They are, in some sense, a limit and, if one can put it this way, the asymptote of physical truths, the term for those objects that approach as closely as one wishes without ever arriving at it exactly. (see Encylopédie Méthodique II, 132)

However, if mathematical theorems do not exactly hold in nature, these theorems at least serve with sufficient precision in practice. To be demonstrated with complete rigour they must be considered as holding of bodies in a state of abstract perfection that they do not really have.

The curves studied in geometry are not perfectly straight nor perfectly curved, the surfaces are not perfectly flat nor perfectly curved, but the more nearly they are so, the more they approach the state of having those properties that one proves about lines exactly straight or curved, and of surfaces exactly flat or curved.

These reflexions, d'Alembert continued, will be enough to refute the sceptics, who complain that geometrical objects do not really exist, and others ignorant of mathematics who regard it as a useless and pointless game.

It would seem, therefore, that philosophers found no problems in Euclid's Elements, but Hume, d'Alembert, and others of an empiricist persuasion disputed the applicability of the theorems on the grounds that the objects of geometry might have no corresponding objects in the world. Philosophers more open to the idea of a wide range of certain knowledge (as, for example, Kant) could grant geometrical theorems the status of a priori truths that could not be other than they are.

2.1 Implications of mechanics

Physical space was the naïve, three-dimensional version of the space of Euclid's Elements and of Cartesian coordinatised three-dimensional geometry, and this was how Newton had regarded it in his Principia Mathematica (1687). It was conceived of as a neutral arena with no properties of its own, that was permeated by various kinds of forces that were created by, and in turn influenced, physical bodies. Chief among these was the force of gravity, which mathematicians in the Cartesian tradition regarded as a mysterious, even unacceptable, concept when it was introduced, but which by the start of the 19th century had been shown by Laplace to be capable of dealing well with all the known motions of the solar system. As a consequence, gravity had become a natural, primitive concept no longer in need of further explanation, and after 1800 it was reasonable of people who worked on the new theories of magnetism and electricity to consider them as forces and to model them, where appropriate, on Newtonian gravity.

Physical space, as described by Newton in his Principia, is to be studied by passing from observations of bodies in motion relative to one another and timed by an arbitrary clock to the corresponding true motion in absolute space and time. As Newton put it at the end of his first Scholium, the purpose of his treatise was to show

how to determine true motions from their causes, effects, and apparent differences, and, conversely, of how to determine from motions, whether true or apparent, their causes and effects.

There was clearly no doubt in Newton's mind about the Euclidean nature of physical space, and indeed there seems to have been no doubts among astronomers in the 17th century that space was describable in the terms used in Euclid's Elements. It is also likely that the growing recognition of the merits of Newton's physics cemented a belief that space was three-dimensional, homogeneous, isotropic, and to be described as if it was an infinite coordinate grid, thus exemplifying the theorems—if not precisely the definitions—of the Elements.

Among the geometrical aspects of physical space that Newton established is the statement of his first law:

Every body preserves in its state of being at rest or of moving uniformly straight forward, except insofar as it is compelled to change its state by forces impressed.

There is also the result that a homogeneous spherical solid exerts the same gravitational effect on other bodies as would an equal mass concentrated at the centre of the body. That is to say, such bodies behave in a way that is provably, and not merely approximately, the same as point masses. In this way points and lines acquire physical significance in his theory of dynamics.

It was Laplace who gave the strongest argument for saying that physical space obeys Euclidean geometry. In his Exposition du système du monde of 1796 (see Book V, Ch. V, p. 472) he added an interesting note (quoted in Bonola 1912: 54) to say that

The attempts of geometers to prove Euclid's Postulate on Parallels have been up till now futile. However, no one can doubt this postulate and the theorems which Euclid deduced from it. Thus the notion of space includes a special property, self-evident, without which the properties of parallels cannot be rigorously established. The idea of a bounded region, e.g., the circle, contains nothing which depends on its absolute magnitude. But if we imagine its radius to diminish, we are brought without fail to the diminution in the same ratio of its circumference and the sides of all the inscribed figures. This proportionality appears to me a more natural postulate than that of Euclid, and it is worthy of note that it is discovered afresh in the results of the theory of universal gravitation.

This is strikingly similar to the view of Wallis well over a century before, although Laplace did not mention Wallis and may not have known of his discussion on the parallel postulate.

Around 1800, therefore, it was generally true that problems with the truth claims of Euclidean geometry had been located among the general problems about our knowledge of the external world. Confidence in philosophical and scientific circles in the validity of Euclidean geometry per se was high.

3. Projective geometry

In the opinion of many in the 19th century, Euclidean geometry lost its fundamental status to a geometry that was regarded as more general: projective geometry. (For an introduction to geometry in the 19th century, see Gray 2011. Projective geometry is described in the entry, Nineteenth Century Geometry, see also the essays by various authors in Bioesmat-Martagon 2011.) Projective geometry has its own foundational problem, akin to that of distance in Euclidean geometry, which concerns the concept of cross-ratio, and we need to follow the moves to create projective geometry as an independent subject, to define cross-ratio in this setting, and to resolve the epistemological issues that are raised (an achievement associated with Klein's Erlangen Programme). We shall also see that the growth of projective geometry creates the arena for Hilbert's axiomatisation of geometry.

Plane projective geometry took a particular boost from Jean Victor Poncelet's book of 1822 Traité des propriétés projectives des figures where he showed the power of projective methods under the provocative formulation of non-metrical geometry. The fundamental character of the new geometry resides in the way it can be thought of as capturing the simplest properties of the straight line—two distinct points define a unique line, two distinct lines meet in at most one point—while discarding the metrical concepts of distance and angle.

Poncelet's claims for transformations of the plane that map lines to lines were rewritten by Chasles (1837) in a more rigorous way that highlighted the invariance of cross-ratio. The cross-ratio of four points A, B, C, D on a line is defined to be AB.CD / AD.CB, and if the points are mapped to A′, B′, C′, D′ respectively by a projective transformation, then

AB.CD / AD.CB = A′B′.C′D′ / A′D′.C′B′.

However, this left the subject in the uncomfortable position of seeming to be more general than Euclidean geometry, because Euclidean, metrical, transformations are projective transformations but not conversely, while still seeming to rely on a metrical concept in the definition of its fundamental invariant.

This issue was tackled in the 1840s and 1850s by Georg Karl Christian von Staudt. His two books (1847, 1856–1860) attempted to give foundations for projective geometry that made it an autonomous subject, independent of Euclidean geometry. They were hard to read, and imperfect in a number of ways, but the task of creating a rigorous theory could be seen for the first time as a matter of completing a task already begun. Von Staudt argued that the transformations of plane projective geometry could map any triple of collinear points to any other, and any quadruple of points (no three of which were collinear) to any other, but not any quadruple of collinear points to any other. He then made a detailed study of collinear quadruples. He also made brief remarks about how Euclidean geometry could be obtained from projective geometry, and from these it could be seen that his theory of collinear quadruples reduced to the familiar theory of cross-ratio as soon as the concept of Euclidean distance was added to projective geometry. This insight was made clear and explicit by Klein in a number of papers in the early 1870s. The first readable textbook on projective geometry, and the one that gave it its name, was Cremona's Elementi di geometria projettiva of 1873, and after that the subject swiftly rose to become the fundamental classical geometry.

Its basic concepts were the points, lines, and planes of a space that was ℝ3 enriched with a what was often called plane at infinity, so that any two coplanar lines meet. Prior to axiomatisations of the theory at the end of the 19th century, point, line, and plane were undefined concepts, with an intuitive interpretation that allowed for a ready passage between projective and Euclidean geometry. The allowed transformations of the geometry map points to points, lines to lines, and planes to planes and preserve cross-ratio. They act transitively on the space, so no point, line, or plane is special, and therefore lines that are parallel in any finite part of the space may be mapped to intersecting lines and vice versa.

In its synthetic form the successes of projective geometry were largely confined to the simplification it brought to the study of conics—all non-degenerate conics (the circle, ellipse, parabola, and hyperbola) are projectively equivalent. In its algebraic form projective geometry proved itself almost essential in the study of plane algebraic curves of any degree, and, extended to projective spaces of higher dimensions, to the study of algebraic surfaces. All this contributed to the central importance attributed to a non-metrical geometry based on little more than the concept of the straight line and on the incidence properties of lines and planes.

Projective geometry also possessed one startling feature, called duality and regarded by Cremona as a law of logic. In plane projective geometry it is possible to exchange the terms ‘point’ and ‘line’, ‘coincident’ and ‘concurrent’ and in this way exchange valid statements. As a result all definitions, theorems, and proofs in projective geometry have a dual character. The dual of the statement of Desargues' theorem and its proof, for example, is the converse of the theorem and its proof. In three dimensions, the terms ‘point’ and ‘plane’ can be exchanged in the same way, and lines are exchanged with other lines. This raises an intriguing epistemological issue: it is easy to conceive of space as made up of points, but impossible to regard it intuitively as made up of lines. To make matters worse, space is three-dimensional when regarded as made up of points, but four-dimensional when made up of lines.

3.1 Coordinate transformations; Kleinian geometry

Klein's Erlangen Programme and what has become known as the Kleinian view of geometry is described in the entry, Nineteenth Century Geometry. It has come to stand as the principal source of the view that geometry can be defined as a group acting on a space, and a geometrical property is any property invariant under all the transformations of the appropriate group.

Klein advocated this view in a pamphlet published when he became a Professor at the University of Erlangen in 1872 and other publications in journals in the 1870s in order to re-unify geometry. He presented a way of showing that metrical geometries, such as Euclidean and non-Euclidean geometry, and other geometries, such as inversive geometry and birational geometry, can be regarded as special cases of projective geometry (as can affine geometry, which he did not know about in 1872).

The fundamental geometry was real projective geometry, say in two dimensions. In this geometry the space is real projective space, and the group is the group of all projective transformations. This group maps points to points, lines to lines, curves of degree n to curves of degree n, and, importantly, the cross-ratio of four collinear points is left unaltered by any projective transformation. In the Kleinian viewpoint, this establishes that points, lines, curves of degree n, and the cross-ratio of four collinear points are properties of the geometry.

Projective geometry incorporated the other geometries in a variety of ways. Klein indicated that one may seek to add to the list of configurations, in which case the group that keeps them invariant will generally be smaller than the principal group, or one may seek to enlarge the group, in which case the class of invariant configurations will generally shrink. Klein had only recently succeeded in showing that non-Euclidean geometry arises as a sub-geometry by confining attention to the interior of a conic in projective space and to the subgroup that maps the interior of that conic to itself (see Klein 1871, 1873).

The epistemological character of Klein's Erlangen Programme becomes clearer when one looks at how it resolved the well-known nagging doubt about the definition of cross-ratio in projective geometry. Klein's answer proceeded by analogy with lengths in Euclidean or non-Euclidean geometry. In those geometries, the corresponding group preserves straight lines, and any point can be mapped to any other point, but there is no transformation in the group that can map a line segment onto a proper sub-segment of itself. Any arbitrary but fixed line segment can therefore be taken as unit of length and used to measure line segments, by constructing arbitrary multiples and sub-multiples of it and arranging them as one would a ruler. Now to measure the length of a segment AB, one simply lays the point A at one end of the ruler and sees where the point B falls on the ruler.

Klein's insight, following von Staudt, was that an exactly similar argument involving quadruples of collinear points can be used to define cross-ratio in projective geometry. The projective group preserves straight lines, and any ordered triple of collinear points can be mapped to any ordered triple of collinear points, and the map that sends a given ordered triple of distinct points to another ordered triple of distinct points is unique, but there is no transformation in the group that can map a quadruple of four collinear points onto an arbitrary such quadruple. Any arbitrary but fixed collinear quadruple can therefore be taken as unit of ‘size’, and a complicated but not difficult argument allows one to produce arbitrary multiples and sub-multiples of it that can be used to measure cross-ratios, by arranging as one would a ruler. Rather than give the details, it is better to give this suggestive illustration of why this can be done. Let the cross-ratio of the four collinear points P, Q, R, S be measured by mapping the points onto the points A, B, C, D on the real line, where A is at the origin, C at ∞, and D at 1, so it is the position of B that determines the cross-ratio. This is uniquely determined, and if the length of AB is x, we find that AB.CD / AD.CB = x.

In the language of the time, length is a two-point invariant of the Euclidean or non-Euclidean group, and cross-ratio is a four-point invariant of the projective group.

3.2 Hilbert and others on axiomatic projective geometry

Problems with some technical issues in projective geometry, and the rising standards of rigour at the end of the 19th century provoked attempts to axiomatise the subject. The task was taken up most energetically by Pieri, Peano, and a number of other Italian geometers in the second half of the 19th century, and they succeeded in giving a rigorous account of real and complex projective geometry in two and three dimensions (see Marchisotto and Smith 2007). But they managed at the same time to reduce the subject to a rigorous training for geometry teachers, and did not appreciate the avenues for research that they had opened. It was left to David Hilbert to revitalise the axiomatic approach to geometry (see Hallett and Majer 2004).

Hilbert had been introduced to a number of controversies about elementary projective geometry that concerned what results in what settings implied what other results. The most notable concerned Desargues's theorem. In 3-dimensional projective geometry, Desargues's theorem is a consequence of the incidence axioms alone, but it is a theorem about points and lines in a projective plane (and so in 2-dimensional geometry) yet no-one had been able to derive it from the incidence axioms of 2-dimensional projective geometry. It had come to be suspected that it might not be deducible from those axioms alone, and Giuseppe Peano was able to show that indeed it could not be deduced without some extra assumptions. Independently, Hilbert also gave an example of a geometry meeting all the incidence axioms of 2-dimensional projective geometry but in which Desargues's theorem was false. It was later replaced by the simpler example found by the American mathematician and astronomer F.R. Moulton in all later editions of Hilbert's Grundlagen der Geometrie (1899).

In the axiomatic geometries that Hilbert put forward, the fundamental objects (points, lines, planes) are not defined. Instead, Hilbert specified how they can be used and what can be said about them. He presented five families of axioms, sorted according to the concepts they employed or codified. He then created a variety of geometries obeying a variety of axioms systems, and established the consistency of them by giving them coordinates over suitable rings and fields—often his geometries admit many interpretations or models. This gave these geometries all the consistency of arithmetic, and led to Hilbert's interest in attempts to ground arithmetic in some form of set theory and logic.

Hilbert's approach thrived because he had come to realise that there was a mathematics of axioms, a study of different but inter-related axiom schemes and their implications. Poincaré, in his review (1902) of Hilbert's book, accepted the new geometries as valid, but regretted that they were, as he put it, incomplete, because they lacked a psychological component. By this he meant that they could not be accommodated in his explanation of how we have some knowledge of the geometry of physical space, because they could not be innately acquired.

4. Non-Euclidean geometry

Investigations of the parallel postulate began in Greek times, continued in the Islamic world, and were undertaken in the early modern West. But, for reasons which are still unclear, after around 1800 it became easier for people to imagine that Euclid's Elements might not be the only possible system of metrical geometry. Among the factors that can help explain how the unthinkable became thinkable even outside the community of mathematicians was the accumulation of theorems based on assumptions other than the parallel postulate. It would seem that the production of novel, consistent consequences of such a radical assumption, and the failure to find a contradiction, inclined some people to contemplate that there might indeed be a whole geometry different from Euclid's.

The signal example of this shift is the Law Professor F.K. Schweikart, who in 1818 sent Gauss via Gerling, a colleague of his at the University of Marburg, an account of a geometry quite different from Euclid's. Schweikart's geometry was accepted by Gauss, who replied that all the properties of the new geometry could be derived once a value was given for a constant that appeared in Schweikart's account. But what Gauss had accepted, and on what grounds, is less clear. Gauss had already found fault with several defences of Euclid's Elements, and as the years went by he came to be entirely confident that there was a new, two-dimensional geometry different from Euclidean plane geometry. This geometry could be described by formulae that he would have seen were akin to those of spherical geometry. But he did not describe a three-dimensional geometry of this kind, leaving open the possibility that the two-dimensional geometry was some kind of formal, meaningless oddity. On the other hand, in correspondence with Bessel he made it clear that he could not ascribe to Euclidean geometry the certainty he gave to arithmetic, which was a priori, and both he and Bessel kept open the possibility that astronomical regions of space might fail to be Euclidean.

Credit for the first fully mathematical descriptions of space in terms other than Euclid's must therefore go to Janòs Bolyai in Hungary and Nicolai Ivanovich Lobachevskii in Russia independently. Bolyai in his “Appendix scientiam spatii absolute veram exhibens” (1832) and Lobachevskii in his “Neue Anfangsgrunde der Geometrie” (1835) and again in his Geometrische Untersuchungen (1840) replaced the parallel postulate with the assumption that given a line and a point not on that line, there are many lines through the point that lie in the plane defined by the given point and the given line and that do not meet the given line. Of these, as they then showed, one line in each direction is asymptotic to the given line, and these asymptotic lines divide the family of all the other lines in the given plane and through the given point into two families: those that meet the given line, and those that do not. Much work then followed, famously similar in each case, in particular to show that in the three-dimensional space described by their assumptions there is a surface upon which Euclidean geometry holds, and to deduce the existence of trigonometrical formulae describing triangles in the plane. These formulae resemble the corresponding formulae for triangles on the sphere.

All this convinced both Bolyai and Lobachevskii that the new geometry could be a description of physical space and it would henceforth be an empirical task to decide whether Euclidean geometry or non-Euclidean geometry was true. Lobachevskii even attempted to determine the matter by astronomical means, but his results were utterly inconclusive.

It is, of course, true, that no amount of consistent deductions in the new geometry rules out the possibility that a contradiction does exist, but the intriguing relationship of the new geometry to spherical geometry, and the existence of trigonometric formulae for triangles strongly suggested that the new geometry was at least consistent. Those who did accept it, and they were very few, nonetheless may well have welcomed a better account than the one Bolyai and Lobachevskii provided. But before turning to what that involved, it is worth pausing to appreciate the formulae.

It is not just that there are formulae, but that they hint at an alternative formulation of geometry, one in which the geometry described in Euclid's Elements might prove to be but a special case. If there could be another way to define geometry, one that would lead to these formulae in various cases, the way would be open to rethink all of the questions about geometry that critical examination had opened. The person best placed to do this in the 1830s and 1840s was Gauss. He knew very well what Bolyai and Lobachevskii had done, and his differential geometry gave him the means to proceed, but, curiously, he did not do so. In the early 1840s he wrote some notes that show he could connect the new two-dimensional geometry with geometry on a surface of constant negative curvature, but he did nothing with this observation.

On the other hand, the mere existence of formulae would not suffice to make them geometrical in character. This need to give them a geometrical grounding was recognised by Lobachevskii in his earliest publications, but because they were in Russian they were not read outside Russia (nor were they appreciated by Russian mathematicians). He dropped his considerations of this kind in his pamphlet of 1840, upon which much of his reputation depends to this day, but brought them back in his last presentation, the Pangéométrie (1856), which, however, did no better than the earlier versions.

Lobachevskii argued firstly that geometry was a science of bodies in space, and that space is three-dimensional. The most primitive concept was that of contact, and its opposite, a cut separating two bodies. Two bodies not in contact are separated and a suitable third body in contact with both of them measures the distance between them, a concept that was otherwise undefined. He could therefore define a sphere with its centre at a given point as the collection of all points equidistant from a given point. He then showed how to define a plane by capturing the intuition that given two distinct points a plane is the collection of points in space that are the same distance from each of the two given points. In his terms, given two points a plane is the set of points common to two spheres of equal radius, one centred on one of the points and the other on the other. A line can be defined similarly.

With the intuition that distance is the primitive concept comes a greater appreciation of motion, or at least the results of being able to move objects around without altering them. One can imagine transporting a rigid body around, say a cube with sides of unit length, and using one of its sides to mark out lengths. We shall see later that the possibilities inherent in this process occasioned a chicken-and-egg debate between Bertrand Russell and Henri Poincaré at the end of the 19th century.

The new geometry posed a radical challenge to Euclidean geometry, because it denied traditional geometry its best claim to certainty, to wit, that it was the only logical system for discussing geometry at all. It also exploited the tension known to experts between the concepts of straightest and shortest. But in other ways it was conventional. It offered no new definitions of familiar concepts such as straightness or distance, it agreed with Euclidean geometry over angles, it merely offered a different intuition about parallel lines based on a different intuition about the distant behaviour of straight lines. Its proponents did not offer a sceptical conclusion. Bolyai and Lobachevskii did not say: “See, there are two logical but incompatible geometries, so we can never know what is true.” Instead, they held out the hope that experiments and observations would decide. The epistemological price people would have to pay if astronomical observations had come down in favour of the new geometry would, in a sense, have been slight: it would have been necessary to say that straight lines have an unexpected property after all, but one only detectable at long distances or with remarkable microscopes. To be sure, many of the theorems of Euclidean geometry would then have to be reworked, and their familiar Euclidean counterparts would appear only as very good approximations. But that is broadly comparable to the situation Newtonian mechanics found itself in after the advent of special relativity.

5. Riemannian geometry

The much more significant change came with the arrival of Bernhard Riemann's great extension of Gaussian differential geometry. Many of the epistemological issues are already raised with Gauss's work (1828), so we turn to it first.

Gauss thought deeply about what it is to define a surface, and he found that three definitions of successive generality are possible. One can assume that at least locally the surface can be given in the form, z = f(x,y) for some function f of x and y. This is true of regions of the sphere, but not of all of it at once. More generally, one can assume that the surface is made up of those points (x,y,z) that satisfy an equation of the form f(x,y,z) = 0, as the sphere is. More generally still, said Gauss, it might be that a surface was given locally by three functions each of two variables u and v. These two variables are to be thought of as the coordinates of points in a plane, and the functions x(u,v), y(u,v), and z(u,v) together give the coordinates of points on the surface in space. In this setting, every point of a piece of a surface has u and v coordinates in the plane. The distance between two points on the surface corresponding to (u,v) and (u + du,v + dv) in the plane is given by a version of the Pythagorean theorem by a formula of the form

(*)     ds2 = E(u,v)du2 + 2F(u,v)dudv + G(u,v)dv2

where E, F, and G are determined by the functions x, y, and z and satisfy EGF2 > 0.

Gauss was able to define a measure of the curvature of the surface at a point, and he found something remarkable about it: the measure of curvature depends only on E, F, and G and their derivatives with respect to u and v, but not on the functions x(u,v), y(u,v), and z(u,v) directly. The precise expression is long and complicated, but the implication is, as Gauss pointed out, that his measure of the curvature of a surface at a point is intrinsic: it is entirely determined by measurements in the surface and does not involve any question of a third dimension at right angles to the surface. Given a metric, a formula (*) for distance, the curvature can be found. If, for example, the formula for distance is that for a map of the sphere on the plane, the curvature will be found to be the reciprocal of the square of the radius of the sphere.

Gauss also investigated when one surface can be mapped onto another in such a way that distances are not altered: if two points P and Q on the one surface are a distance d apart, then so are their images on the other surface. Gauss was able to show that a necessary condition for this to happen is that the curvatures at corresponding points are the same. For example, the cylinder and the plane are locally isometric; although curved, the cylinder has zero curvature in Gauss's sense, just as does the plane, which is why printing from a rotating drum is possible.

This means that there are geometric properties one can infer from a map of a surface that are independent of the details of the map and refer to the surface itself. Its Gaussian curvature at each point is known, and there are other properties that one can infer from knowing ds2, for example, the curve of shortest length between two points (subject to certain conditions).

It was not immediately appreciated that Gauss's approach allowed mathematicians to define surfaces as regions of the plane with a particular metric that are not to be obtained from surfaces in Euclidean 3-dimensional space. Of course, if one defines a surface as the image of a map from a piece of ℝ2 to ℝ3, then of course it is in ℝ3. But if one defines a surface as a region of ℝ2 with a particular metric, then there may be no surface in ℝ3 to which it corresponds. The first person to appreciate this seems to have been Riemann, who also extended this idea to any number of dimensions.

Riemann's ideas were both profound and naïve, and for that reason they proved difficult to make precise, but we can content ourselves with being naïve initially. He supposed he was given a space (he called it a ‘manifoldness’) in which one can at any point impose a coordinate system at least on all points near to an arbitrary initial point, and if, when one does that, every point is related to the initial point by a list of n numbers he said that the space is n-dimensional. We can think of this process as providing a map of at least that part of the space near the initial point onto ℝn. So far, this differs from the surface case only in that two dimensions have been replaced by n.

He then supposed there was a means of saying what the distance was infinitesimally, by generalising the formula for ds2 from 2 to n variables. (He even allowed that entirely different formulae be used, but we shall not describe that part of his theory, which lay fallow for many years).

Next, he checked that this intrinsic property of curvature persisted in higher dimensions, which it does. This is essentially because the n-dimensional object has lots of 2-dimensional surfaces to which the Gaussian theory applies, so a notion of curvature of a n-dimensional object at a point can be derived from a consideration of the 2-dimensional surfaces that pass through the point.

Now he asked, what more do we want to be able to do geometry? There are properties of the space that are independent of the coordinate system. If two different coordinate systems give out different coordinates, but do it in such a way that the distance between the points is preserved, then either system allows us to do geometry, and when we do we find that the two coordinate systems agree on the curvatures at each point, on the distances between points, and so forth.

Because the formula for ds2 was written down subject to only a few restrictions, there is no reason to believe that a Riemannian geometry is defined with respect to an antecedent Euclidean geometry. There is no claim that an n-dimensional Riemannian geometry is to be obtained by a map from an n-dimensional subset of some Euclidean N-dimensional Euclidean space. This means that geometry can be done without reference to any Euclidean geometry: Euclidean geometry is no longer epistemologically prior to any study of other geometries. The reign of Euclid was—theoretically—over.

5.1 Geodesics and connections

Given a concept of distance on a manifold it is possible to talk about geodesics—a geodesic joining two points is a curve of shortest length between those two points. Existence and uniqueness questions can be raised, and often answered. A significant advance was made independently by Tullio Levi-Civita in 1917 and Hermann Weyl in 1918, inspired by Einstein's theory of general relativity, when they showed how to define parallelism on a curved manifold (on Levi-Civita's contribution, see Bottazzini 1999 and on Weyl's contribution see Scholz 2001). Roughly speaking, in Weyl's presentation (1918), two vectors at different points are parallel if they belong to a family of vectors along a curve that do not vary along the curve. It is an effect of curvature that this definition is independent of the family of vectors but depends on the curve unless the curvature is zero; vectors on a typical manifold can only be said to be parallel along a curve.

The concept of distant parallelism allows a vector to be moved along an arbitrary curve in a way that keeps it parallel to itself at every point. This became referred to as a way of establishing a connection between different points, and the theory became called the theory of connections on manifolds. In particular, it is possible to ask if a family of tangent vectors to a curve is composed of vectors parallel to the tangent vector at the starting point. If so, the curve is a natural candidate to be considered the straightest curve between its end points, because the tangent vector never accelerates along the curve.

Connections can be defined independently of the metric, but if the metric and the connection are compatible it can be shown that any small piece of this curve is the shortest curve joining its end points, so the straightest curves on a manifold are the geodesics. In modern differential geometry, geodesics are defined via connections.

5.2 Riemann and Beltrami and rigorous non-Euclidean geometry

Riemann's “Ueber die Hypothesen …” (given as a lecture in 1854, published posthumously in 1867) and Beltrami's “Saggio” (1868) gave different but equivalent accounts of 2-dimensional non-Euclidean geometry by describing it as the geometry on the interior of a disc with a novel metric. Riemann's account, which was stated in n dimensions, agrees with the one that Poincaré was to use in many short publications in 1880 and 1881 but only describe explicitly in his major paper (Poincaré 1882). In this metric, geodesics are arcs of circles perpendicular to the boundary of the disc and angles are represented correctly. In Beltrami's version, geodesics are represented by straight line segments that are chords of the disc. The Riemann and Beltrami discs swiftly persuaded mathematicians that the non-Euclidean geometry of Bolyai and Lobachevskii did, after all, make rigorous mathematical sense. Poincaré's contribution a decade later was to make non-Euclidean geometry the natural geometry for certain topics elsewhere in mathematics, chiefly the developing and important subject of Riemann surfaces.

The importance of a rigorous account of any part of mathematics should not be ignored, but the acceptance of Riemannian geometry in the setting of non-Euclidean geometry went beyond the presentation of a consistent formalism. It marks the acceptance of the view that geometry is whatever can be described in the Riemannian formalism. The door is opened to the view that there are many geometries, each of which must be consistent, and none of which need to refer to Euclidean geometry. The number of dimensions of the ‘space’ under discussion, the topological character of that ‘space’, and the precise metric are all matters of indifference. There is a 2-dimensional geometry of such-and-such a kind because a suitable metric can be found; because there is, as it were, a map of it, not because a surface has been found in ℝ3 with the right properties. Indeed, it was later shown (Hilbert 1901) that there is no surface in ℝ3 corresponding precisely to non-Euclidean 2-dimensional space.

Riemann was clear that the epistemological implications of this way of doing geometry were immense. Mathematicians should no longer need to abstract some fundamental intuitions from what they believe about physical space, such as the nature and properties of straight lines or circles, and seek to build a true geometry on the basis of some axiomatic expression of those intuitions. Rather, the direction of thought should go in the opposite direction: mathematicians were free to construct infinitely many geometries and to see which applied to physical space. In this connection, it was soon shown that it is possible to do theoretical mechanics in the setting of non-Euclidean geometry.

6. The intelligibility of non-Euclidean geometry

The epistemological significance of projective geometry rests on its implications for the nature and rigour of classical geometry. The epistemological significance of non-Euclidean geometry rests more on the possibility that it could be true in whatever way that Euclidean geometry could be true. We therefore turn to 19th century examinations of the intelligibility of geometry.

6.1 Herbart's philosophy

Johann Friedrich Herbart became Kant's successor in Königsberg in 1808, where he remained until going to Göttingen in 1833, where he died in 1841, but he was no orthodox Kantian. His major work, the two-volume Psychologie als Wissenschaft neu gegrundet auf Erfahrung, Metaphysik, und Mathematik of 1824–1825, sought to ground psychology in philosophy, and treated experience and metaphysics equally. Using some rather fanciful mathematics he endeavoured to show how memory works and how repeated stimuli of certain kinds cause the brain to learn to perceive, for example, lines, parallel lines, intersecting lines, and surfaces. There are no innate ideas, in Herbart's opinion; visual space is constructed from experience, most significantly by means of the conceptual act of inferring continuity in spatial processes. And concepts are generated by clusters of memories, upon which logic then operates independently of their origins. This was Herbart's way of avoiding grounding logic in psychology.

Herbart's ideas influenced Riemann (see Scholz 1982). Riemann regarded natural science as the attempt to understand nature by the use of precise concepts, which are to be modified in the light of our experience with them. He expected the most successful concepts to be quite abstract, and agreed with Herbart that they could not be a priori in the Kantian fashion. Moreover, it was their origin in perception that gave these concepts their significance for science. In notes he wrote for himself (see Riemann Werke 1990: 539 Riemann said that he agreed with Herbart in matters of psychology and epistemology, but not ontology or with his ideas about the construction of the concepts of space, time, and motion. The disagreement masks a deeper sympathy. Herbart had advocated a three-dimensional real world of causally connected but discrete monads, which the mind treats via the concept of a continuum, which it supplies, thereby turning its discrete experiences into spectra of possibilities. Riemann saw no reason to restrict attention to three dimensions, and moved the continuous spectra of possibilities into the very general geometrical concepts he was creating.

This diminished, or perhaps left behind, the role of experience that Herbart had emphasised. Riemann was making conscious what Herbart had said occurred naturally: if experience generates concepts with which we frame the world, then, said Riemann, let mathematics generate more precise and flexible concepts with which to conduct science.

6.2 Helmholtz and Poincaré

Riemann's ideas in turn influenced Hermann von Helmholtz, who published several influential essays on how our knowledge of geometry is possible. In his “Über die thatsächlichen Grundlagen der Geometrie” (1868) he endeavoured to show how only a limited number of Riemannian geometries can be constructed in which there is a concept of rigid body motion. He argued that it is our experience of rigid bodies that teaches us what space is like, and in particular what distance is. He further claimed that a 2-dimensional space that admits rigid body motions would either be the Euclidean plane or the sphere. Beltrami wrote to him to point out that he had overlooked the possibility of non-Euclidean geometry, and Helmholtz not only agreed, but wrote a further essay (1870) in which he explained how it would be possible for us to have knowledge of this geometry in the Kantian sense (synthetic a priori). Many Kantians refused to be convinced, most likely from a sense that Kant had surely believed that we have impeccable knowledge of that kind about Euclidean geometry, but one person that these ideas very likely influenced was Henri Poincaré (see Gray 2012).

As soon as Poincaré began to write his popular philosophical essays about geometry, he made it clear that his chief concern was with how we could rely on any geometry at all. He was well aware of the great range of Riemannian geometries, and of the conclusion of Helmholtz's speculations, by then made rigorous in the work of Sophus Lie, that a very limited number of geometries admitted rigid body motions. His concern in his “On the foundations of geometry” (1898) was with epistemology.

Poincaré argued that the mind quickly realises that it can compensate for certain kinds of motions that it sees. If a glass comes towards you, you can walk backwards in such a way that the glass seems unaltered. You can do the same if it tilts or rotates. The mind comes to contain a store of these compensating motions, and it realises that it can follow one with another and the result will be a third compensating motion. These mental acts form a mathematical object called a group. However, the mind cannot generate compensating motions for other motions it sees, such as the motion of the wine in the glass as it swirls around. In this way the mind comes to form the concept of a rigid body motion, that being precisely the motion for which the mind can form a compensating motion.

Poincaré then considered what group the group of compensating motions could be, and found that, as Helmholtz had suggested and Lie had then proved, there was a strictly limited collection of such groups. Chief among them were the groups that come from Euclidean and non-Euclidean geometry, and as abstract groups they are different. But which one was correct?

Poincaré's controversial view was that one could never know. Human beings, through evolution and through our experience as infants, pick the Euclidean group and so say that space is Euclidean. But another species, drawing on different experiences, could pick the non-Euclidean group and so say that space was non-Euclidean. If we met such a species, there would be no experiment that would decide the issue.

One could imagine, he said, making large triangles and measuring the angles. The sides of the triangle are, shall we say, made by rays of light. Let us suppose that within the limits of experimental error the result of the experiment is that the angle sum of the triangle is less that π, a result consistent with non-Euclidean geometry but inconsistent with Euclidean geometry. The only conclusion one can draw, said Poincaré, is that either light rays travel along straight lines and space is non-Euclidean or that space is Euclidean and light rays travel along curves.

We can summarise his argument this way. Our knowledge of the geometry of the external world is founded on our mental ability to deal with a group of rigid body motions. There is a very limited store of these groups, but no experiment can decide between them. All we can do is make a choice, and we shall choose the simplest one. As it happens, that was the Euclidean group, because, said Poincaré, we had found that one of its properties not shared with the non-Euclidean group, was particularly simple. But the human species had, as it were, made a choice, and that choice was now innate in the human mind. Because of the way knowledge is acquired and the fact that there is more than one appropriate group, we can never know whether space is Euclidean or non-Euclidean, only that we construct it as Euclidean.

This twist on the Kantian doctrine of the unknowability of the Ding an sich (the thing in itself) and our confinement to the world of appearances, was congenial to Poincaré as a working physicist, but there is an important distinction to make. The viewpoint just explained is Poincaré's philosophy of geometrical conventionalism. He advocated conventionalism in other areas of science, arguing that what we call the laws of nature (Newton's laws, the conservation of energy, and so forth) were neither empirical matters open to revision nor absolute truths but were well established results that had been elevated to the role of axioms in present scientific theories. They could be challenged, but only if a whole scientific theory was being challenged, not idly when some awkward observations were made. Faced with a satellite that did not seem to be obeying Newton's laws one should, said Poincaré, consider some as-yet unnoticed force at work and not seek to re-write Newton. But a new theory can be proposed, based on different assumptions that rewrite a law of nature, because these laws are not eternal truths—we could never know such things. And if a new theory were to be proposed, one can only choose between the new and the old on grounds of convenience.

The crucial distinction here is that scientific conventionalism operates at a high level. The choices are made consciously and intellectually, the debate is only open to people with a considerable amount of specialised education. Geometrical conventionalism operates on the mind before it is capable of any kind of formal instruction, and if it did not operate the unfortunate subject would be incapable of any knowledge of the external world.

6.3 Poincaré versus Russell

Poincaré's views brought him into collision with Bertrand Russell in the 1890s when he was emerging from his brief Hegelian phase and entering his Kantian phase. Russell was trying to establish the Kantian a priori by arguing that there is one fundamental geometry, which is projective geometry, and we have synthetic a priori knowledge of it (see Griffin 1991 on Russell and Nabonnand 2000 on the controversy).

There can be little doubt that Poincaré, with his much greater command of mathematics, won much of the debate, as Russell, with his characteristic willingness to admit his errors, was willing to concede. But a significant difference of approach between them was never to be resolved. Poincaré's analysis began with the idea of rigid bodies, from which a concept of distance is created. Russell argued on the contrary, that whatever we may discover the concept of distance to be we know before we begin that the distance from London to Paris is more than a metre. This Poincaré denied in his “Des fondements de la géométrie: à propos d'un livre de M. Russell” (1899).

In Poincaré's view, we only know what the distance from one point to another is when we have found out what rigid bodies do, and this knowledge has become innate in us. In Russell's view, no discussion of the concept of distance could even contemplate that the distance from London to Paris is less than a metre—we would know we were not talking about distance if we said something like that. Poincaré insisted that talk of what we know should always be dependent on how we know it; without such an analysis the claims were not knowledge claims at all. Russell wanted distance to be regarded as a fundamental intuition.

A mathematical illustration may illuminate the disagreement. For Poincaré, talk about what we might call ordinary geometry, the sense of space that we have prior to advanced instruction, is really about the ability we have to measure things. We can carry a rigid body around, and use it as a ruler. It is because we can do that that we can speak of the distance between places. If you want to make the set-up more abstract, there must be a space and a group that acts on the space and moves points in the space around. If this group has the property that however a region of that space is moved around it is never mapped onto a proper subset of itself then one can construct rigid bodies and talk about distance.

For Russell, one is free to take a space and assign a ‘distance’ to each pair of points (subject to some simple rules which I omit). Relative to this sense of distance, one can say if, as a region is moved around, points in it remain the same distance apart or not. We have done this for our sense of distance on the surface of the Earth, and we can do this whether or not we also have some rigid body motions. In mathematical terms, Russell would be happy with what is called a metric space. The point is not that one could impose a metric on the surface of the Earth in which a particular pair of points, say in Cambridge, were a metre apart and London and Paris were only half a metre apart—one could—but that one can talk about distance without presupposing the action of a group. Some metric spaces admit the action of groups that preserve distance, others do not, but distance can be defined without talking about a group. Poincaré was never confronted with exactly this argument—metric spaces are an invention of the 20th century—but we know what he would have said. He would have said that it was valid mathematics but entirely formal and could not be considered as genuine knowledge because it lacked a psychological dimension. We know this because it was his criticism of the axiomatic geometries constructed by Hilbert (see below).

Poincaré's arguments also met with objections from the Italian mathematician Federigo Enriques. Poincaré had argued that one way to see the validity of the geometrical conventionalist argument was to consider a disc in which everything was made of the same material, which expanded as it heated, and in which the temperature was a particular function of the distance of the centre of the disc. This function, which Poincaré specified, ensured that the metric in the disc, as measured by rods made of the same material as the disc, was that of non-Euclidean geometry. Creatures living in the disc would report that their space was non-Euclidean; we would reply that there space was Euclidean but subject to the distorting effect of temperature field. Plainly each side can maintain their position free of self-contradiction.

Enriques argued, in his Problemi della Scienza (1906), that this was unreasonable. The creatures would be right to ascribe a geometry to their space (and, indeed, non-Euclidean geometry) because the distorting force is beyond their control. Their geodesics are built in to the space, and it would be unreasonable of them to ascribe the paths of geodesics to the operation of a ‘force’ because that ‘force’ was not something they could even in principle manipulate. Heat, the gravitational effect of massive objects, all these distorting influences are things that can be allowed for, because they can be changed. If, in the experiment above, it were to be claimed that space is Euclidean but our candidates for straight lines are deformed it should be possible to vary the degree of deformation. One might conduct the experiment further away from any massive objects, in emptier regions of space. If different experiments gave even slightly different results one would, in accordance with Poincaré's own criteria for changing scientific conventions, look for something in the circumstances that was responsible for the deviation of the light rays from straightness. But if all experiments agreed, Enriques argued that it would be rational to conclude that light rays travelled on geodesics and the geometry of space was non-Euclidean.

It is also worth noticing that the growing sophistication of ideas about how theoretical geometry relates to practical experience, and about the nature of the knowledge that geometry supplies, belong to a family of changes across all of mathematics by 1900. An autonomous discipline of mathematics emerged that placed an increasing emphasis on formal aspects of the subject and offered a complicated and often distant relationship with the world of experience. This modernist turn in mathematics is discussed in various places (see Gray 2008 and the literature cited there).

7. Concluding remarks

This essay has examined the main branches in the development of geometry until the early years of the 20th century under the headings of theoretical or abstract knowledge, empirical and other analyses of the intelligibility of such knowledge, and the deductive character of that knowledge.

The status of the straight line in elementary Euclidean geometry as both the shortest curve joining any two of its points and as the curve that points always in the same direction was disentangled. One line of enquiry led to geometries that emphasised straightness as the fundamental property (typically, projective geometry) and the other to geometries that emphasised the shortest aspect. The former approach was seen from the start as a non-metrical one, and became the favoured arena for formal, even axiomatic investigations of geometry as a deductive enterprise. The price was having less and less to say about physical space (as Poincaré observed). The concept of geometry was radically enlarged, but in ways that were not intended to be accounts of an intelligible space.

The metrical account led to a progressive elucidation of a significant obscurity in Euclid's Elements: the parallel postulate. For much of the 19th century, this was the only alternative to Euclid's that was proposed as an intelligible geometry, even though it was generally agreed that only the most delicate experiments could hope to decide the matter. Poincaré's contested view was that no experiment could so decide, and this raised important issues about the way abstract terms are to be interpreted.

Beyond the eye-catching idea of one alternative to Euclid's system of geometry, which had stood for two thousand years, there was the panoply of metrical geometries hinted at in Gauss's work on differential geometry and elaborated by Riemann. Here it finally proved possible to explain the relationship between straightest and shortest in a suitably general setting. It also became possible to discuss geometry as a body of ideas that grew out of naive ideas of length, angle, shape, and size, and to do so in a sophisticated and rigorous way without appealing to axioms, whether or not those axioms were intended as distillations of intelligible experience. In this way, it became possible to apply geometrical ideas in novel settings and in novel ways.

By the end of the first decade of the 20th century, it was clear that Euclidean geometry had lost its pre-eminent position. There were better formal, axiomatic systems (such as those proposed by Hilbert and some mathematicians in the school around Peano). There were rich systems that were more fundamental, in the sense of using fewer properties of the figures of traditional geometry such as the straight line (the many versions of projective geometry). And there was a profusion of metrical geometries with more natural starting points and deeper theories.

As a result, ideas about how theoretical geometry of whatever kind relates to the space around us had become much more sophisticated. The truth of geometry was no longer to be taken for granted, but had become in some measure empirical, and philosophical ideas about the intelligibility of geometry had also deepened.

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