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Neutral monism is a monistic metaphysics. It holds that ultimate reality is all of one kind. To this extent neutral monism is in agreement with idealism and materialism. What distinguishes neutral monism from its better known monistic rivals is the claim that the intrinsic nature of ultimate reality is neither mental nor physical. This negative claim also captures the idea of neutrality: being intrinsically neither mental nor physical in nature ultimate reality is said to be neutral between the two.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. History
- 3. The Neutral Entities
- 4. Background: Realism and Empiricism
- 5. Reduction and Construction
- 6. Arguments for Neutral Monism
- 7. Objections to Neutral Monism
- 8. Philosophical Applications
- 9. Neutral Monism and Other Doctrines
- 10. Concluding Remarks
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Monisms, neutral or otherwise, differ on the question whether ultimate reality is one or many. With the possible exception of Spinoza (see the section “Neutral Monism and the Dual Aspect Theory”) neutral monists have chosen pluralism: there are many neutral entities. Moreover, neutral monism is noneliminativist: there is more to reality than just the basic neutral entities. There are also all of the commonly recognized physical and mental entities. This minimal characterization of the doctrine suffices to define the two central questions neutral monism must answer. First, what is the nature of the neutral entities that form ultimate reality? Second, what is the relationship of these neutral entities to everything else that exists?
Though neutral monism is a quite general doctrine about the nature of reality, it is usually understood in a much narrower sense, viz., as an attempt to come to terms with the mind-body problem. This focus on the relationship of mind and body has naturally led neutral monists to break the second question into two more limited ones. Thus we end up with three questions:
- What is the nature of the neutral entities that form ultimate reality?
- What is the relationship of these neutral entities to matter?
- What is the relationship of these neutral entities to mind?
Most versions of neutral monism are versions of noneliminativist reductionism. Mental and physical phenomena are real but reducible to/constructible from the underlying neutral level. It differs from other versions of reductionism—be they materialistic or mentalistic, eliminative or noneliminative—by insisting on the neutrality of the basis. And its reductionism sets it apart from certain versions of nonreductive theories—emergentism and the dual aspect theory come to mind—with which it is sometimes compared or identified.
Not all versions of neutral monism answer questions (i)–(iii) in the same way. A commitment to just the core of the doctrine places only minimal constraints on the final shape of a fleshed out version of the theory. Any given version of neutral monism is, to a large extent, a function of the philosophical goals and the other philosophical commitments that guide its creator in the construction of the theory. What we confront, in every single case, is a core of neutral monistic ideas, mixed up with a rich and varying set of better or worse philosophical ideas and aspirations that are largely independent of neutral monism proper. This must be kept in mind when evaluating the versions of neutral monism on record. Some of their features that tend to offend contemporary philosophical sensibilities the most may be dispensable scaffolding only.
The notion of neutrality once occupied a central position in the discussion of the mind-body problem. No fewer than nine of the seventeen possible types of mind-body theory on C. D. Broad's famous list of 1925 (Broad 1925) are classified as forms of “neutralism.” An updated version of this list would most likely not even contain the term “neutrality” (or any of its cognates). The notion of neutrality, and hence the doctrine of neutral monism, plays no role in the current debate. It lives on only as an obscure encyclopedia entry.
The number of neutral monists is small; the number of self-declared neutral monists is considerably smaller; the number of philosophers whose classification as neutral monist has gone unchallenged is probably zero. The lists of neutral monists vary considerably in length and composition. The list below contains the names contained in the intersection of most of them, plus a few additions.
Baruch Spinoza (1632–77) leads off most lists. It can be argued, however, that he is better classified as a dual aspect theorist or a panpsychist rather than as a neutral monist. (see the section “Neutral Monism and the Dual Aspect Theory” below).
Phenomenalists, dualists, materialistically inclined naturalists, and neutral monists have, by turns, recognized and rejected David Hume (1711–1776) as one of their own. The attempt to claim him as an ancestor of neutral monism is therefore controversial. But the following quotations make a strong case for counting Hume as an early proponent of the doctrine.
I shall at first suppose; that there is only a single existence, which I shall call indifferently object or perception, according as it shall seem best to suit my purpose, understanding by both of them what any common man means by hat, or shoe, or any other impression, convey'd to him by his senses. (Hume 1739, 366)
What we call a mind, is nothing but a heap or collection of different perceptions, united together by certain relations…Now as every perception is distinguishable from another, and may be consider'd separately existent; it evidently follows, that there is no absurdity in separating any particular perception from the mind; that is, in breaking off all its relations, with that connected mass of perceptions, which constitute a thinking being…If the name of perception renders not this separation from a mind absurd and contradictory, the name of object, standing for the very same thing, can never render their conjunction impossible. External objects are seen, and felt, and become present to the mind; that is, they acquire such a relation to a connected heap of perceptions, as to influence them very considerably in augmenting their number by present reflexions and passions, and in storing the memory with ideas. The same continu'd and uninterrupted Being may, therefore, be sometimes present to the mind, and sometimes absent from it, without any real or essential change in the Being itself. An interrupted appearance to the sense implies not necessarily an interruption in the existence. The supposition of the continu'd existence of sensible objects or perceptions involves no contradiction. (Hume 1739, 207–208)
These passages suggest two central ideas of Neutral monism. First, there is the idea of neutral entities: entities that are not intrinsically or essentially percepts or objects but can be counted as either, given the relevant context. Second, the idea that mind and body are reducible to/constructible from these neutral entities. Though this may not be the only plausible reading of these passages (see, e.g., Bricke 1980, Flagge 1982, 1991, Backhaus 1991) the case for counting Hume as an early neutral monist has considerable merit. While it may be controversial whether Hume really was a neutral monist, his enormous influence on the development of subsequent versions of neutral monism is beyond serious doubt.
Ernst Mach (1838–1916) occupies a central position in the history of neutral monism. He influenced William James and Bertrand Russell and, through them, all of the writers on neutral monism in the English speaking world. His importance for the development in the German speaking world is hard to overestimate. Among the philosophers to build on Mach's ideas was Rudolf Carnap in his Aufbau. (Carnap 1928) As a physicist who also did physiological and psychological research, Mach strove to adopt an inclusive and economical framework that would allow him to pursue all of these inquiries in a unified and coherent fashion. In the simple components of experience—hot and cold, red and green, sweet and sour, etc.—he finds the basic elements whose functional interrelations are studied by the various sciences. While a given element is, intrinsically, neither mental nor physical, the various groups to which it belongs may display functional relationships that are characteristic of physics or of psychology. In this case the neutral element forms part of the subject matter of physics and of psychology. It can be called physical, qua constituent of the one group, and mental, qua constituent of the other group, but is the same unchanging element that is regarded in these two different contexts:
Thus the great gulf between physical and psychological research persists only when we acquiesce in our habitual stereotyped conceptions. A color is a physical object as soon as we consider its dependence, for instance, upon its luminous source, upon other colors, upon temperatures, upon spaces, and so forth. When we consider, however, its dependence upon the retina…it is a psychological object, a sensation. Not the subject matter, but the direction of investigation, is different in the two domains. (Mach 1886, 17–18)
The primary source for Mach's views on neutral monism are a number of essays and chapters contained in his books that were originally published in (Mach 1886), (Mach 1905), and (Mach 1923). The size of these books grew significantly as they went through numerous editions. Some of the important papers on neutral monism are not contained in the available English translations of these works.
Richard Avenarius (1843–96) wrote at the same time as, but independently of, Mach. They happily acknowledged the considerable convergence of their thoughts about neutral monism (and numerous other topics). Together with Mach he was the main target of Lenin's attack on empiriocriticism. His influence on German Positivism was strong. Due to its difficulty his work finds few readers. Avenarius's name is now primarily associated with the notion of introjection. It happens when the object of perception is mistakenly taken to exist in the perceiver—it is “the internalization of the ‘seen’ etc. into the human being” (Avenarius 1891, 200). According to Avenarius, the consequences of this mistaken inward projection are momentous:
And it is this introjection which, as a rule turns the ‘before me’ into an ‘in me’, the ‘disclosed’ into an ‘imagined’ [Vorgestelltes], the ‘constituent of the (real) environment’ into a ‘constituent of the (ideal) thinking,’ the ‘tree’ with its mechanical energies into an ‘appearance’ of the stuff of which dreams are made. (Avenarius 1891, 201)
In thus creating an inner world, the natural monism of experience is bifurcated into a world in which mind and matter, self and world stand opposed to each other. The purpose of Avenarius's monumental Critique of Pure Experience is to overcome this pathological development and to restore the natural, thoroughly monistic, conception of the world. The main sources for his reflections on neutral monism are contained in his (Avenarius 1888/90), (Avenarius 1891), and (Avenarius 1894/95). Beginning with the second edition of his (Avenarius 1891), the last three essays were reproduced as an appendix to this work.
Joseph Petzoldt (1862–1929) is one of a number of German speaking positivists who took themselves to be working in the tradition of Mach and Avenarius. Petzoldt is notable for the dedication with which he tried to bring this philosophy to a broader audience. About three quarters of his substantial (Petzoldt 1900) are dedicated to a careful and more approachable exposition of the main ideas of Avenarius's Critique of Pure Experience (1888/90). And in his (Petzoldt 1906) is a somewhat popularized retelling of the history of philosophy seen through the critical eyes of his heroes Mach and Avenarius. Petzoldt is included in this list as a representative of the many less well known philosophers in the positivist tradition who were enthusiastic champions of neutral monist thought as we find it set out in the much more original works of Mach and Avenarius.
William James's (1842–1910) empiricism—his “radical standing by experience” (James 1904a, 52)—plays a central role in his adoption of neutral monism. His critique of the of the relational account of experience—according to which the self directs an act onto an object—was the model upon which Russell shaped his analysis of experience. James presents this argument as an attack on a particular conception of consciousness. He finds it in the Neo-Kantian tradition and in the early analytic tradition. And today we can find it in philosophies as diverse as existentialism and philosophical naturalism. Roughly, it is the notion of consciousness as a diaphanous, transparent, elusive medium or container of some sort in which the objects of consciousness appear. The objects in consciousness are clearly before the mind. But consciousness itself seems to elude our grasp forever. This thin notion of consciousness is the one James wants to eliminate:
I believe that ‘consciousness,’ when once it has evaporated to this estate of pure diaphaneity, is on the point of disappearing altogether. It is the name of a nonentity, and has no right to a place among first principles. Those who still cling to it are clinging to a mere echo, the faint rumor left behind by the disappearing ‘soul’ upon the air of philosophy. (James 1904b, 2)
His radical proposal is to simply discard this shadowy something and to make do with what remains, with what used to be the object of the conscious act. He introduces the term “pure experience” to stand for this datum. Prior to any further categorization, pure experience is, according to James, neutral—neither mental nor material:
The instant field of the present is at all times what I call the ‘pure’ experience. It is only virtually or potentially either object or subject as yet. For the time being, it is plain, unqualified actuality, or existence, a simple that. (James 1904b, 23)
Mind and matter, knower and known, thought and thing, representation and represented are then interpreted as resulting from different groupings of pure experience. The essays in which James sets out his radical empiricism are among the most influential and most readable documents of the neutral monistic literature. It is probably fair to say that James converted Russell to neutral monism. And his influence on the neutral monists among the American New Realists is massive. The primary source for James's views on neutral monism are the essays collected in his (James 1912).
Ralph Barton Perry (1876–1957) is the most visible of the American New Realists to adopt neutral monism. As student and friend of James he spent considerable time explaining James's views. He produced some of the clearest expositions of the doctrine. But he also extended James's radical empiricism. His treatment of realism in his (Perry 1912a) does, for example, contain a chapter on “A Realistic Philosophy of Life” in which such topics as faith, value, and morality are treated. But Perry did not shy away from criticizing James's views. He is, for example, keenly aware that James's writings on neutral monism invite the objection that neutral monism is but phenomenalism relabeled. James is criticized for not making it sufficiently clear that pure experience must be able to exist outside of all consciousness.
If pure experience is indeed neutral, then it is capable of being actual in the absence of that peculiar modification of itself which constitutes consciousness. But James frequently writes as though experience and conscious experience were the same thing…it is regrettable that James was not more persistently and stubbornly consistent in this own radicalism. If experience is to have the physical and metaphysical scope which he attributed to it, it must be boldly emancipated from all conscious or mental implications. (Perry 1938, 98–100)
The main source for Perry's views about neutral monism is contained in his (Perry 1912a).
Edwin B. Holt (1873–1946), one of the American New Realists, developed a detailed neutral monist theory of consciousness. After arguing that “the fact is that both minds and physical objects are and are ‘real’, and they are composed of one and the same substance—neutral stuff” (Holt 1914, 124), Holt tries to show how consciousness can find its place in this world of neutral elements. He begins with the idea that an organism is capable of responding to certain aspects of its environment. The features of the environment that are thus selected he calls a cross-section of the environment. This environmental cross-section is “comparable with the cross-section [of the environment] defined by a searchlight” (Holt 1914, 174). Armed with these notions, Holt is ready to present his account of consciousness:
We have seen that the phenomenon of response defines a cross-section of the environment without, which is a neutral manifold. Now this neutral cross-section outside of the nervous system, and composed of the neutral elements of physical and nonphysical objects to which the nervous system is responding by some specific response,—this neutral cross-section, I submit, coincides exactly with the list of objects of which we say we are conscious. This neutral cross-section as defined by the specific reaction of reflex-arcs is the psychic realm:—it is the manifold of our sensations, perceptions and ideas:—it is consciousness. (Holt 1914, 182)
This makes consciousness external and objective in the highest degree:
Consciousness is extended in both space and time:—in space as spatial objects are extended, consciousness being actually such parts of the objects as are perceived, i.e., such parts as are consciousness; and in time as a quarter-hour, a day, or a week, is extended…Consciousness also, of course, changes in time and moves about in space. (Holt 1914, 210–211)
There is no trace of ‘introjection’ in this picture; “the house of the brain is not haunted” as Holt puts it. (Holt 1914, 310). There is much else in Holt's work that is remarkable. Though his focus is on the mind-body problem and on consciousness in particular, Holt's neutral monistic picture is notable for its ambition to present a more comprehensive neutral monistic metaphysics. His attempt to find a place for logic and mathematics in his neutral monism are remarkable, if perhaps not successful. The main sources for Holt's views about neutral monism are his (Holt 1912) and (Holt 1914).
After sympathizing with neutral monism for some time (see especially Russell 1914, Russell 1918), Bertrand Russell (1872–1970) finally adopted it in his (Russell 1919). Russell's enduring fame is responsible for the fact that neutral monism did not completely vanish from the philosophical spotlight. But the identification of neutral monism with Russell's views has also had some unfortunate consequences. First, over the years Russell's account of neutral monism underwent considerable change. That made it difficult to get a clear fix on the doctrine. Second, the final version of Russell's neutral monism is very far removed from the sort of view we find in James, Mach, and Avenarius. It does, for example, exhibit the “sin” of introjection in the most striking way. That has caused considerable confusion about the nature of neutral monism and the question whether or when Russell did or did not reject it. None of this helped to improve the reputation of neutral monism. While Russell is responsible for some of the darkness currently surrounding neutral monism, a good part of it must be attributed to impatient and unsympathetic readings of his work. The detail and rigor of his presentation of neutral monism surpasses that found in the works of the other authors working in this tradition. Hence Russell's work will be referenced frequently throughout this entry. The main sources for Russell's views on neutral monism are his (Russell 1921), (Russell 1927a, b), and (Russell 1956a).
In the course of the recent Russell renaissance a number of authors have started to pay attention to the considerations that led Russell to neutral monism. While all of these authors stop short of embracing neutral monism, their works show marked parallels to Russell's central ideas. Daniel Stoljar (2001, 2006), Grover Maxwell (1978), Galen Strawson (2003), and Michael Lockwood (1981, 1989, 1998) gravitate toward physicalism. David Chalmers (1996, 2003) and Peter Unger (1999) are more inclined to consider neutral monism as a live option.
Kenneth Sayre's (1929-) version of neutral monism is highly original. It shares none of the striking but nonessential features that are common to all the other versions of neutral monism discussed here. Unlike all the other versions of the doctrine it is not an outgrowth of an amalgam of realist and empiricist philosophemes. Information theory and Platonism form the background in which Sayre's interpretation of neutral monism is rooted. Sayre sets out his project in the following terms:
If the project…is successful, it will have been shown not only that the concept of information provides a primitive for the analysis of both the physical and the mental, but also that states of information…existed previously to states of mind. Since information in this sense is prior to mentality, but also implicated in all mental states, it follows that information is prior also in the ontological sense…Success of the present project thus will show that an ontology of informational states is adequate for an explanation of the phenomena of mind, as distinct from an ontology of physical events. [And Sayre adds:] It is a reasonable conjecture that an ontology of information is similarly basic to the physical sciences… (Sayre 1976, 16)
More recently Sayre has provided the following helpful characterization of his position:
Neutral Monism is the view that neither mind nor matter is ontologically basic, but are both reducible (in some appropriate sense of reduction that requires specification) to another more fundamental principle that is “neutral” between them. The neutral monism I advocate holds that the fundamental principle to which both mind and matter are reducible is not a substance in any sense (Aristotelian, Cartesian, whatever), but is rather [a] structure of a sort that can only be represented mathematically. This structure is what information theorists…call “information.” The neutral monism I advocate, accordingly, has more in common with the ontology of the late Platonic dialogues than with that of the early Russell which the name ‘neutral monism’ commonly brings to mind. (Memo circulated in the Notre Dame philosophy department)
Many of the objections directed against neutral monism are primarily concerned with the peculiarities that mainstream neutral monism inherits from its accidental rootedness in realist and empiricist traditions described below. The fact that nearly all extant forms of neutral monism share these peculiar but nonessential features makes it easy to overlook that they are merely accidental features of neutral monism. The existence of Sayre's version of the doctrine is a most welcome check on these sorts of arguments. By comparing it to the standard versions of neutral monism we can, for example, see that the pervasive link between the neutral elements and perceptual contents is a mere historical artifact: most neutral monists happened to be empiricists of sorts—hence this particular link. Sayre's choice of mathematical structures as the “fundamental stuff” forcefully brings home the point that this near universal way of specifying the neutral basis is not written into the neutral monist doctrine. The main source for Sayre's views on neutral monism is his (Sayre 1976).
Given that the definition of “neutrality” involves the notions of the mental and the physical (or mind and body), the neutral monist must rely on some notion of the physical and the mental. But the explication of these notions is not the main task of neutral monism. Different ways of drawing the mind/body distinction will yield different versions of neutral monism. For the nature of the entities that are neutral between mind and body will depend on the nature of mind and body. Neutral monism is not committed to any particular way of drawing the mind/body distinction. That is not to say, of course, that neutral monism is compatible with all possible ways of drawing the distinction. Proposals that define the mental and the physical as complements of each other are unacceptable; for they leave no room for a realm that is neutral between the two. Proposals that make irreducibility into a defining characteristic of mind or body are unacceptable; for they rule out reductionist approaches by fiat. Within these constraints there is a wide variety of notions of mind and body that neutral monists can and do work with.
The main task of a neutral monist theory is therefore to show how, given a certain notions of mind and body, a class of neutral entities can be specified and how mental and physical states can be reduced to/constructed from these entities. The success of a given version of neutral monism should be judged primarily on the basis of how well it handles these three problems. One may still want to reject a theory that passes this test if it is based on a problematical or absurd way of drawing the mind/body distinction. But this sort of critique is not a critique of neutral monism as such; it is a critique of the way in which the problem is posed, not a critique of the way in which this ill-posed problem was solved.
In the opening paragraph the notion of neutrality was introduced as follows:
- A basic entity is neutral just in case it is intrinsically neither mental nor physical.
But there are other plausible ways of spelling out this notion. Reflection on the thesis that all nonbasic physical and mental entities are reducible to/constructible from basic neutral entities may lead one to one of the following explications of the notion of neutrality:
- A basic entity is neutral just in case it figures in the reduction bases of both physical and mental nonbasic entities.
- A basic entity is neutral just in case it can figure in the reduction bases of both physical and mental nonbasic entities.
Another approach to the notion of neutrality begins with the notion of law:
- A basic entity is neutral just in case mental and physical laws are applicable to it.
These notions of neutrality are not equivalent and can pull apart. But neither proponents nor opponents of neutral monism have been careful to distinguish them, thus inviting needless confusions.
Take, for example, Russell's discussion in The Analysis of Mind. Russell holds that there are sensations, images, and particulars “probably equally (or almost equally) transient, which make up that part of the material world that does not come into the sort of contact with the living body that is required to turn it into a sensation” (Russell 1921, 144). In the following passage Russell tells us how particulars of these three kinds differ from each other and what sorts of laws are applicable to them:
The American Realists are partly right, though not wholly, in considering that both mind and matter are composed of a neutral-stuff which, in isolation, is neither mental nor material. I should admit this view as regards sensations: what is heard or seen belongs equally to psychology and to physics. But I should say that images belong only to the mental world, while those occurrences (if any) which do not form part of any “experience” belong only to the physical world. There are, it seems to me, prima facie different kinds of causal laws, one belonging to physics and the other to psychology. The law of gravitation, for example, is a physical law, while the law of association is a psychological law. Sensations are subject to both kinds of laws, and are therefore truly “neutral” in Holt's sense. But entities subject only to physical laws, or only to psychological laws, are not neutral, and may be called respectively purely material and purely mental. (Russell 1921, 25–6)
Here we find Russell making use of three or four of the four neutrality criteria listed above. First, sensations are classified as neutral, according to (1). Then images are declared not neutral, according to (2) (or (3)—both interpretations are plausible). Next particulars of the third kind are deemed to be not neutral, according to (2). Finally criterion (4) is invoked to classify sensations as neutral, and to explain what the notions of pure mentality and materiality amount to. And Russell seems to imply that images and particulars of the third kind are, respectively, purely mental and purely physical, according to criterion (4). Up to this point the liberal use of different criteria has not caused any problems—the various criteria cohere in yielding a position that, remarkably, isn't recognizably neutral monist. But at the end of the book we find Russell speculating about the ultimate scientific account, a fundamental unifying science. These passages privilege (4)—the law criterion—and suggest a quite different picture (a much more truly neutral monist picture, in fact):
I think…that an ultimate scientific account of what goes on in the world, if it were ascertainable, would resemble psychology rather than physics…such an account would not be content to speak, even formally, as though matter, which is a logical fiction, were the ultimate reality. I think that, if our scientific knowledge were adequate to the task, which it neither is nor is likely to become, it would…state the causal laws of the world in terms of…particulars, not in terms of matter. Causal laws so stated would, I believe, be applicable to psychology and physics equally; the science in which they were stated would succeed in achieving what metaphysics has vainly attempted, namely a unified account of what really happens, wholly true even if not the whole of truth, and free from all convenient fictions or unwarrantable assumptions of metaphysical entities. (Russell 1921, 305–6)
This is a powerful expression of a monistic vision. One set of laws governs all particulars. So all particulars are neutral, according to the “law criterion.” And there are other passages in Russell's text—utilizing criterion (1)—that also suggest a neutral monistic interpretation:
The data of psychology do not differ in their intrinsic character from the data of physics. I have maintained that sensations are data for psychology and physics equally, while images, which may be in some sense exclusively psychological data, can only be distinguished from sensations by their correlations, not by what they are in themselves. (Russell 1921, 297)
Particulars that form part of no experience are not mentioned in this passage. But the idea it conveys is that all particulars are intrinsically the same. So if sensations are neutral because they are intrinsically neither mental nor physical, and all other particulars have the same intrinsic nature as sensations, then all particulars are neutral, at least according to the first definition of neutrality. In this way criteria (1)-(4) do pull apart, sorting some of Russell's particulars—images and particulars of the third kind—into mutually exclusive groups.
This has made it difficult to understand The Analysis of Mind. And there are other ways in which the failure to distinguish these criteria has caused confusion. Some of the most prominent interpreters of Russell appear to work with criterion (2), according to which neutral monism holds that all constituents of the world must be experienced (be a constituent of a mind). This vividly raises the suspicion that neutral monism is a version of phenomenalism. Moreover, this interpretation makes it incomprehensible how Russell could continue to call himself a neutral monist after admitting inferred and unexperienced particulars into the basis of his system. What these critics fail to see is that Russell had other, nonequivalent, criteria of neutrality to work with. Given these other criteria, the idea of neutrality does not give rise to the phenomenalism suspicion and the existence of inferred and unexperienced particulars is unproblematical.
The point of this discussion is not to accuse Russell or his critics of being unclear about the notion of neutrality. Nor is the goal to arbitrate between these (and other possible) notions of neutrality. The purpose is to draw attention to the fact that a number of disputes centered on questions such as: Can an unexperienced particular be neutral? Is X really a neutral monist? When did X embrace/reject neutral monism? are fueled by no more than an insufficiently precise notion of neutrality. Different criteria of neutrality are available and they yield different results when applied to a given body of work. A critique of neutral monism that overlooks this point will hold little interest.
The minimal characterization of neutral monism yields limited information about the neutral elements. One learns that (i) there are neutral elements, and that (ii) mind and matter are constructible from them. This places certain constraints on what falls into the domain of neutral entities: it must be neutral and the kind of thing from which mind and matter can be constructed. The preceding discussion of neutrality has shown that this notion can be spelled out in various ways, and that the consequences of adopting any one of them will vary according to how the mind/matter distinction is spelled out.
Sense-data—considered as possible candidates for the basic entities of neutral monism—strikingly illustrate this point. Different ways of drawing the mind/matter distinction have placed sense-data on the side of matter (e.g., Russell, 1914a,b; 1915); on the side of the mind (e.g., Frank Jackson, 1977); or on neither side (e.g., H.H. Price, 1932). If these three philosophers were to help themselves to the first definition of neutrality—a basic entity is neutral just in case it is intrinsically neither mental nor physical—sense data would count as neutral for Price, but Russell and Jackson would have to deny their neutrality (albeit for different reasons).
The requirement that mental and physical things be constructible from the neutral elements further narrows down the scope of possible candidates for the basic elements of neutral monism. Mach, for example, thinks that the basic entities of physics (considered as neutral) could not serve as the elements of neutral monism because they do not satisfy the constructibility constraint:
Notice one thing. While there is no difficulty in building up every physical experience from sensation, that is mental elements, we can foresee no possibility of representing any mental experience in terms of elements currently used in physics: i.e., from the masses and motions in the rigid form that alone is serviceable in that special branch of science. (Mach 1905, 12, fn 7)
Many contemporary philosophers will suspect that Mach got it backwards. For present purposes it matters not whether Mach or his modern critics are right. Either way, the point illustrates the claim that certain views about the construction of mind and matter appear to place substantive limitations on what the basic elements of neutral monism can be.
Similar considerations apply to attempts to construct concrete reality out of abstract objects. Neutral monists are not the only ones to have attempted this. The materialist Quine, for example, has proposed to construe physical objects as “classes of quadruples of numbers” (Quine 1981, 17). One version of neutral monism finds the neutral basis in the domain of abstract objects: mind and matter are viewed as information structures. Recently Chalmers has explored this idea in his (Chalmers 1996). But the abstractness of his scheme is limited by the concession that the information states that make up the world might have to be grounded in protophenomenal properties. (See the section “The Neo-Russellians”). Sayre, on the other hand, makes no such concession. He holds a pure information view according to which both mind and matter are, ultimately, mathematical structures:
Contrary to current dogma in some quarters that materialism and dualism are the only ontological options on the horizon, a more plausible alternative from the cybernetic point of view is some version of neutral monism…Sayre attempts to articulate a monism in which neither information-functions [in Shannon's technical sense] of cognitive activity nor probabilistic functions at the quantum level of matter are further reducible to mental or physical features, making mathematical (statistical) structures more basic ontologically than either mind or matter. (Sayre 1996, 312)
Those who fail to see how to construct the concrete out of the abstract will hold that the constructibility constraint on the neutral entities eliminates proposals along these lines. These are some of the ways in which the possible domain of neutral entities is limited by such factors as which criterion of neutrality is chosen, how the mind/matter distinction is drawn, and how the process of construction is envisioned. But general constraints of this sort do not uniquely specify a set of neutral entities. Which entities are singled out as the neutral base is, therefore, largely a matter of the philosophical background assumptions guiding the neutral monist in the process of theory construction.
Sayre's version of neutral monism is rooted in the Platonic tradition, but the philosophical background that shapes the development of the mainstream versions of the doctrine is characterized by two factors: (i) a strong reaction against idealism; (ii) a wholehearted embrace of empiricism. This shared philosophical background makes for a certain uniformity across the different versions of neutral monism advocated by Mach, James, the New Realists, and Russell. This mainstream version of the doctrine finds the neutral elements in the immediate data of experience—in the given of traditional empiricism. And it construes these given elements of experience as real and mind-independent—in keeping with its anti-idealist or realist bias.
The expression “the given,” as it is used here, stands for the phenomenal features immediately presented to us in experience: the tastes, the smells, the colors, the sounds, etc. that experience (both veridical and nonveridical) acquaints us with. H.H. Price points to these features in the following well known passage:
When I see a tomato there is much that I can doubt. I can doubt whether it is a tomato that I am seeing, and not a cleverly painted piece of wax. I can doubt whether there is any material thing there at all. Perhaps what I took for a tomato was really a reflection; perhaps I am even the victim of some hallucination. One thing however I cannot doubt: that there exists a red patch of a round and somewhat bulgy shape, standing out from a background of other colour-patches, and having a certain visual depth, and that this whole field of colour is directly present to my consciousness. (Price 1932, 3)
Price's red, bulgy patch is a characteristic example of an element given in experience. Empiricism—the doctrine that all our concepts and all our knowledge are grounded in experience—assigns a central role to the given. (For discussions of the given see: Price 1932, Lewis 1929, Moser 1985, Fales 1996). The idea to identify the neutral elements with the elements given in experience therefore naturally suggests itself to a neutral monist under the sway of empiricism. Their realism leads the mainstream neutral monists to construe the given elements of experience as mind-independent entities. The idealistic view that for these items to be is to be perceived is rejected as fallacious. There is nothing intrinsically mental about Price's red patch, nor does the existence of this red patch depend on Price's awareness of it. The patch can exist prior to Price's awareness of it, and it can continue to exist after Price's attention has lapsed. Thus the elements given to us in experience are credited with an autonomous existence. Price's red patch—realistically construed—is one of the neutral elements forming ultimate reality. According to the mainstream version of neutral monism mind and matter are constructs out of just such entities. This is how the joint operation of the empiricism and the realism that shape mainstream neutral monism gives rise to its most characteristic claim: that the neutral elements of being are given to us in experience.
The two sections that follow provide more detail about how empiricism and realism—the two broad philosophical commitments in which mainstream neutral monism is rooted—shape the doctrine we find in the writings of Mach, James, the American New Realists, and Russell. The subsequent sections on substance and the ego point to further consequences of the empiricist point of view adopted by the mainstream neutral monists. The Humean dissolution of substance together with the abandonment of the ego play an important role in establishing the case for the neutrality of the given. Another trait of mainstream neutral monism is its embrace of the bundle theory of concrete particulars (encompassing both persons and other things). This too is a consequence of the empiricism informing the view. The relationship between neutral monism and the bundle theory is discussed in the section “Objections to Neutral Monisms” subsection “Principles of Bundling.”
It must be stressed that neutral monism is independent of the realism and empiricism that happen to have shaped its best known versions. It does not entail them, nor is it entailed by them. The close historical association of these doctrines makes it very difficult to understand the traditional versions of neutral monism in isolation from this particular background.
The influence of a broadly Humean empiricism on the mainstream versions of neutral monism is profound. The empiricist background is powerfully present in the thinking of the central figures of neutral monism: Mach, James, and Russell. This basic empiricist stance played a big role in shaping the doctrines that we now know as neutral monism. It guided the neutral monists to look to the given in their search for the neutral entities. It encouraged them to deny substance, both material and mental, thereby allowing them to construe the given in a suitably neutral manner. It also made it quite natural for them to opt for bundle-theoretic accounts of persons and other concrete particulars.
Neutral monism insists on the neutrality of the basic entities; nothing is said about their epistemic accessibility. But a neutral monist who is also an empiricist will tend to search for neutral entities in a domain that is immediately accessible in experience. The empiricist sympathies of the neutral monists manifest themselves in their choice of neutral entities. James's pure experience, Mach's elements, the sensations and images of the earlier Russell, and the events and percepts of the later Russell are all rooted in the given of the empiricist tradition. In this way the notion of a neutral entity gets tied up with the idea of immediate accessibility. This connection between the notions of neutrality and givenness is a pervasive but inessential ingredient at the core of most neutral monist doctrines.
When James tries to explain the nature of pure experience—the “materia prima of everything” (James 1905b, 138)—he always points us to our sensations and feelings. Though he went back and forth on the question of just how tight the connection between ordinary sensation and pure experience is, he never broke this connection entirely. Sometimes he holds that it takes a special state of consciousness to discover pure experience:
‘Pure experience’ is the name which I gave to the immediate flux of life which furnishes the material to our later reflections with its conceptual categories. Only new-born babes, or men in semi-coma from sleep, drugs, illnesses, or blows, may be assumed to have an experience pure in the literal sense…Pure experience in this state is but another name for feeling or sensation. (James 1905c, 93–4)
At other times James suggests that pure experience is readily given to us in everyday experience:
Let the reader arrest himself in the act of reading this article now. Now this is a pure experience, a phenomenon, or datum, a mere that or content of fact. ‘Reading’ simply is, is there; and whether there for some one's consciousness, or there for physical nature, is a question not yet put. At the moment, it is there for neither; later we shall probably judge it to have been there for both. (James 1905b, 145–6)
But at all times he holds that the domain of pure experience is right there, before our eyes, as it were.
“Elements” is the term that Mach prefers to use for his neutral entities. Red, green, blue, warm, cold, etc. are typical examples. Despite the fact that Mach much prefers the less loaded term “elements,” he acknowledged that “usually, these elements are called sensations” (Mach 1886, 22). This is so because our primary way of encountering elements is in the form of sensations:
We only use the additional term “sensation” to describe the elements, because most people are much more familiar with the elements in question as sensations (colors, sounds, pressures, spaces, times, etc.). (Mach 1886, 16)
Mach makes it quite clear that his elements—whether they be sensations or not—are to be found in the given elements of experience:
For me the elements A B C…[these are “complexes of colors, sounds, and so forth, commonly called bodies”] are immediately and indubitably given, and for me they can never afterwards be volatilized away by considerations which ultimately are always based on their existence. (Mach 1886, 45)
In Russell's early writings on neutral monism experience is an important source of neutral entities. Those that are experienced are our sensations and images:
The stuff of the world, so far as we have experience of it, consists, on the view that I am advocating, of innumerable transient particulars such as occur in seeing, hearing, etc., together with images more or less resembling these…Sensations are what is common to the mental and physical worlds; they may be defined as the intersection of mind and matter. (Russell 1921, 143–4)
Russell's switch to an event ontology does not break the tight connection between the neutral entities—now understood as events—and experience. All of the examples he picks to illustrate his notion of an event are experiences:
Everything in the world is composed of ‘events’…An ‘event,’ as I understand it…is something occupying a small finite amount of space-time…When I speak of an ‘event’ I do not mean anything out of the way. Seeing a flash of lightning is an event; so is hearing a tyre burst, or smelling a rotten egg, or feeling the coldness of a frog. (Russell 1927b, 222)
And Russell's way of singling out those events that are percepts nicely ties in with the traditional epistemic claims made on behalf of the given. A percept, he tells us, “is what is most indubitable in our knowledge of the world” (Russell 1927b, 105).
This accidental but pervasive association of empiricism with neutral monism explains why most extant versions of the doctrine locate the neutral elements in experience, in the given. The attempt to find the neutral basis in the given has one obvious virtue: it makes the neutral elements into something with which we are intimately acquainted. This blocks the serious worry that neutral monism is the pointless endeavor of reducing that which is (relatively) well understood—mind and matter—to something unknown and, possibly, unknowable. This way of familiarizing us with the “neutral” basis does, however, immediately raise the new (and equally serious) worry that neutral monism has now become a non-neutral, mental monism. For, surely, it is obvious that the given—assuming that it is not a myth—is as mental (and, therefore, non-neutral) as it gets.
The neutral monists were well aware of this problem and marshaled a number of considerations in support of the neutrality of the given. First, they argued that the given element in experience is real, in the sense of being mind independent. Second, and in keeping with their background empiricism, they mounted an attack on substance, both mental and material. In a world devoid of mental (and material) substances there is nothing to impart mentality (or materiality) to the given features of experience. If there are no substances it follows that there is no substantial self. The arguments directed against a substantive subject (self/ego) yield a third set of considerations in support of the neutrality of the given. The primary purpose of these attacks is to get rid of (apparently) irreducibly mental entities and capacities. But these considerations can also serve to support the thesis of the neutrality of the given.
The turn away from idealism at the begin of the 20th century (pioneered by G.E. Moore, Russell, and the American New Realists) led to an unconditional embrace of a certain form of realism about the objects of mental states in general, and the objects of perceptual states in particular. Realism about these objects amounts to the claim that they are mind-independent: their existence does not depend on their being the object of a mental act. This realism, accepted by all the mainstream neutral monists, plays the crucial role of stripping the given of its mentality. This is the single most important step in shaping the given into a viable source of neutral elements. Note that this realism is no more part of neutral monism than the empiricism with which it tends to go hand in hand.
Moore thought that the correct analysis of sensation reveals that “the blue,” for example, of a sensation of blue was a real, independent object:
And what my analysis of sensation has been designed to show is, that whenever I have a mere sensation or idea, the fact is that I am then aware of something which is…not an inseparable aspect of my experience. The awareness which I have maintained to be included in sensation is the very same unique fact which constitutes every kind of knowledge: “blue” is as much an object, and as little a mere content, of my experience, when I experience it, as the most exalted and independent real thing of which I am ever aware…Merely to have a sensation…is to know something which is as truly and really not a part of my experience, as anything which I can ever know. (Moore 1903, 27)
According to T.P. Nunn—whose views on this matter influenced Russell—“careful introspection and the plain man” support the principle that “what is existentially present to the mind in perception is something extra-mental—something that would be as it is in perception even if it were not perceived.” (Nunn 1909–10, 202–3) Russell, not yet converted to neutral monism, concurs. He holds that the objects that become our sense-data (the notorious sensibilia) are mind-independent:
Logically, a sense-datum is an object, a particular of which the subject is aware. It does not contain the subject as a part…The existence of the sense-datum is therefore not logically dependent upon that of the subject…There is therefore no a priori reason why a particular which is a sense-datum should not persist after it has ceased to be a datum, nor why other similar particulars should not exist without ever being data. (Russell 1914a, 146)
Russell's way of making the transition from the nonmentality of the perceptual object to the neutrality of sensations (or percepts) is traced out in the section “Giving up the Ego” below. The quotes by Moore, Nunn and Russell emphasize the nonmentality and the independence of the object of experience from its being experienced. Perry takes the matter further by insisting that the independence and the neutrality of the object of experience are readily discernible in introspection:
When I attempt to discover the generic character of the contents revealed by introspection, I meet at once with a most significant fact. Distributively, these contents coincide with other manifolds, such as nature, history, and the contents of other minds. In other words, in so far as I divide them into elements, the contents of my mind exhibit no generic character. I find the quality ‘blue,’ but this I ascribe also to the book which lies before me on the table; I find ‘hardness,’ but this I ascribe also to the physical adamant; or I find number, which my neighbor finds also in his mind. In other words, the elements of the introspective manifold are in themselves neither peculiarly mental nor peculiarly mine; they are neutral and interchangeable. (Perry 1912a, 277)
This is the way in which the neutral monists take their sort of realism to open up a window onto what is subsequently identified as the world of neutral entities. Their inclination to see these entities—the colors, noises, hardnesses, etc.—as neutral gains additional support from a further feature of the traditional empiricism they embrace.
Empiricism (of a Humean variety) influences the neutral monists in another significant way. The elimination of substance, both material and mental, smoothes out the transition from realism to neutral monism. The items that confront us in perception—the colors, sounds, textures, etc.—are best thought of as neutral because there do not exist mental and physical substrata that might impart mentality or physicality to these items.
According to Humean empiricism the redness one experiences when seeing a tomato cannot be taken as a physical property of the tomato's material substance; nor can it be taken to be a modification of the spiritual substance of the perceiving mind. For on this view, neither one of these substances exists. The redness itself is the primary datum. The tomato and the mind that perceives it are constructed from such primary data. This is the sense in which the redness is more fundamental than and neutral between the perceived physical object and the mind that perceives it.
Mach's rejection of substance—in the form of Kant's Ding an sich—is not the fruit of his empiricist philosophy but the direct result of an intuitive vision:
At about the age of fifteen, I lighted, in the library of my father, on a copy of Kant's Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics. The book made at the time a powerful and ineffaceable impression upon me, the like of which I never afterwards experienced in any of my philosophical reading. Some two or three years later the superfluity of the rôle played by “the thing in itself” abruptly dawned upon me. On a bright summer day in the open air, the world with my ego suddenly appeared to me as one coherent mass of sensations, only more strongly coherent in the ego. Although the actual working out of this thought did not occur until a later period, yet this moment was decisive for my whole view. (Mach 1886, 30)
But in retrospect Mach made his allegiance to Hume quite clear when he says: “That my starting point is not essentially different from Hume's is of course obvious” (Mach 1886, 46). Russell's rejection of material substance dates back to the period before he embraced neutral monism. Upon adopting neutral monism this skepticism about substance is extended to mental substances. In an amusing passage “the substance philosophy” is identified as one of the “savage superstitions of the cannibals” (Russell 1956a, 138). Writing in a more sober tone, Russell has this to say about substance:
The conception of substantial identity with varying properties is embedded in language, in common sense, and in metaphysics. To my mind, it is useful in practice, but harmful in theory. It is harmful, I mean, if taken as metaphysically ultimate: what appears as one substance with changing states should, I maintain, be conceived as a series of occurrences linked together in some important way. (Russell 1927a, 152)
The neutral monists among the American New Realists were also fully aware of the importance of this move away from substance. Realists, like Thomas Reid, who did not abandon substance were accused of having an “alliance with substantialism” (Perry 1912a, 103). And in reply to Josiah Royce's claim that “realism is fond of substances, of ‘inner’ or ‘deeper’ fundamental facts, and of inaccessible universes” Perry tells us that “it happens that the realism of the present day has strong aversions for these sorts of things” (Perry 1912a, 103).
The most unforgiving attack on the notion of substance is contained in Joseph Petzoldt's book Das Weltproblem (1906). The book presents the last 2500 years of philosophy as a long battle against the pernicious substance concept. After many setbacks (the worst of which was held to be Kant) the final victory allowed the neutral monist philosophies of Mach and Avenarius to emerge. (Petzoldt prefers the label “Positivism” for this position). The confluence of empiricism, the denial of substance, and the ideas of neutral monism is strikingly illustrated by this work.
Russell had given up on material substance long before accepting neutral monism. But his belief in the substantial self and its mental acts was the main obstacle to his embracing neutral monism. Reviewing James's Essays in Radical Empiricism he writes:
On ground of the purest empiricism, from mere inspection of experience, I for my part should hold it obvious that perception is in its intrinsic nature a fact of relation, involving an act as well as an object. For this reason, I cannot accept James's view, in spite of its very attractive simplification of the world. (Russell 1912, 574)
But by the time he wrote The Analysis of Mind Russell had changed his mind. Empiricism now seemed to dictate that the self be given up:
Empirically, I cannot discover anything corresponding to he supposed act; and theoretically I cannot see that it is indispensable. We say: “I think so-and-so,” and this word “I” suggests that thinking is the act of a person. Meinong's “act” is the ghost of the subject, or what once was the full-blooded soul. (Russell 1921, 17–18)
Thus he is now free to adopt a neutral monist position. The thought that leads him from the demise of the self to the neutrality of sensations is interesting. By collapsing what used to be the purely physical sense-datum with what used to be the purely mental sensory act he arrives at a new entity—unhelpfully called a sensation—that is neutral and can figure in both physical and mental contexts.
If we are to avoid a perfectly gratuitous assumption, we must dispense with the subject as one of the actual ingredients of the world. But when we do this, the possibility of distinguishing the sensation from the sense-datum vanishes; at least I see no way of preserving the distinction. Accordingly the sensation that we have when we see a patch of colour simply is that patch of colour, an actual constituent of the physical world, and part of what physics is concerned with…But it does not follow that the patch of colour is not also psychical, unless we assume that the physical and the psychical cannot overlap, which I no longer consider a valid assumption. If we admit—as I think we should—that the patch of colour may be both physical and psychical, the reason for distinguishing the sense-datum from the sensation disappears, and we must say that the patch of colour and our sensation in seeing it are identical. (Russell 1921, 142–3)
Looking back on his reasons for adopting neutral monism Russell provides a somewhat simpler account of the role that the denial of the self played in his thinking:
So long as the ‘subject’ was retained there was a ‘mental’ entity to which there was nothing analogous in the material world, but, if sensations are occurrences which are not essentially relational, there is not the same need to regard mental and physical occurrences as fundamentally different. It becomes possible to regard both a mind and a piece of matter as logical constructions formed out of materials not differing vitally and sometimes actually identical. (Russell 1959, 103)
We find the same empiricism-driven connection between neutral monism and the denial of the self in Mach's thought. Treating the ego as a “real unity,” Mach (1886, 28) poses scientific, epistemic, and ethical problems. When Mach declares that “the ego must be given up” (Mach 1886, 24), it is this understanding of the ego as a real unity that he has in mind. At the same time he acknowledges the utility and importance of the ego, understood as a practical unity:
To bring together elements that are most intimately connected with pleasure and pain into one ideal mental-economical unity, the ego; this is a task of the highest importance for the intellect working in the service of the pain-avoiding, pleasure-seeking will. (Mach 1886, 23)
But he is quick to point out that the utility of this “mental-economical unity” is quite limited. In purely theoretical contexts this notion “may prove to be insufficient, obstructive, and untenable” (Mach 1886, 23). Thus Mach's acknowledgment of the limited utility of the ego, understood as a practical unity, does not change his verdict that “the ego must be given up.”
James had discarded the substantive self, or the soul, long before he officially embraced his radical empiricism. In The Principles of Psychology he calls it “a complete superfluity” (James 1890, 329)—unobservable and devoid of explanatory power. Summing up his harsh critique of the soul he has this to say:
Altogether the Soul is an outbirth of that sort of philosophizing whose great maxim…is: “Whatever you are totally ignorant of, assert to be the explanation of everything else.” (James 1890, 329)
It should not come as a surprise to find the neutral monists engaged in the battle against the ego. The ego is the single most “threatening” entity they have to deal with: a purely mental entity, irreducible to neutral elements. Faithful to the tradition of Humean empiricism, mainstream neutral monism attempts to circumvent this problem by adopting a bundle-theoretic account of the self. This opens mainstream neutral monism to all the objections that have been leveled against the bundle-theoretic account of the self. It is an interesting question whether the bundle theory of the self is an integral part of mainstream neutral monism, or just another accidental historical accretion that can easily be discarded, should it prove troublesome. (see the section “Objections to Neutral Monism” subsection “Principles of Bundling”).
Neutral monism was introduced as a form of reductionism. But a quick glance at neutral monist writings yields many passages that sound unabashedly eliminativist. Here is a sampling. Mach: “Both [object and ego] are provisional fictions of the same kind.” (Mach 1905, 9). Russell: “What I wish to do…is to re-state the relations of mind and brain in terms not implying the existence of either” (Russell 1956a, 135). Avenarius: “What I know is neither physical nor mental but only some third kind of thing.” (Approvingly quoted in (Mach 1905, 13)). James: “It seems to me that the hour is ripe for it [consciousness] to be openly and universally discarded” (James 1904b, 3). But these statements are misleading. The project is not to radically redraw the boundaries of our concepts. It is not being suggested that the concepts mind, matter, belief, desire, self, etc. fail to carve nature at her joints. The reconstructed concepts map onto the old ones. The difference is one of metaphysical depth only. Mach's declaration, say, that the ego is irredeemable, is directed only against Cartesian dualism and, to use Dennett's illuminating term, Cartesian materialism. Humean bundle selves are in no danger. And James would be surprised to learn how literally his advice to discard consciousness has been taken by some contemporary philosophers. He was merely urging us to adopt a relational definition of consciousness.
Even if it is granted that the proponents of neutral monism did not intend it as a form of eliminativism, the worry that it is eliminativist may persist. All reductionist doctrines give rise to this suspicion, as is evidenced by the ongoing debate about the place of the mind in reductive materialism. At the end of the day the reductive materialist hopes to be able to describe and explain the world in purely physical terms. The neutral monist has an analogous vision that “in a completed science, the word ‘mind’ and the word ‘matter’ would both disappear, and would be replaced by causal laws concerning ‘events’” (Russell 1927b, 226). This vividly raises the question how the distinction between explaining and explaining away is to be drawn. Some have argued that the boundary between reductionism and eliminativism a merely pragmatic matter. But it must be noted that the difficulties that neutral monism encounters on this front are no different from those that any reductionist doctrine has to face.
The neutral monists have employed various more or less clearly articulated strategies for the construction or reduction of mental and physical entities. Most neutral monists will agree with Sayre when he says that neither conceptual analysis nor empirical inquiry can establish the truth of neutral monism. Instead Sayre opts for a version of the best explanation strategy, here illustrated in its application to mental phenomena:
The appropriate tactic, I believe, rather is to offer the thesis as an explication of how perceptual consciousness ought to be understood in the context of inquiry, and by way of support to show that commonly recognized features of perception gain intelligibility when conceived in terms of these informational processes. (Sayre 1976, 156)
Mainstream neutral monism starts out with the system of neutral elements—Mach imagines it as “a viscous mass, at certain places (as in the ego) more firmly coherent than in others.” (Mach 1886, 17) To say that a physical object or an ego exists in this system is to say that certain of the system's elements are interconnected in certain characteristic ways. These functional element complexes exhibit many of the important features of the physical objects and the selves of our commonsense ontology. Thus the commonsense ontology of physical objects and selves finds its place in the world of neutral monism. But Mach makes it clear that this constitutes only a partial vindication of the ontology of commonsense. The scientist must transcend this superficial ontological scheme and investigate the functional interconnections of the elements themselves.
Russell's notion of a logical construction originated in his work on mathematical logic. But he argues that it is of quite general philosophical significance. He calls it the “supreme maxim of scientific philosophizing” and formulates it as follows: “Wherever possible, logical constructions are to be substituted for inferred entities.” (Russell 1914b, 149) A somewhat fuller explanation of the method governing constructions reads as follows:
Given a set of propositions nominally dealing with the supposed inferred entities, we observe the properties which are required of the supposed entities in order to make these propositions true. By dint of a little logical ingenuity, we then construct some logical function of less hypothetical entities which has the requisite properties. This constructed function we substitute for the supposed inferred entities, and thereby obtain a new and less doubtful interpretation of the body of propositions in question. (Russell 1914b, 150)
Prior to his conversion to neutral monism Russell argued that physical objects are constructions out of sense-data. Upon accepting neutral monism he rejected sense-data. But the project of construction became even more ambitious: both physical and mental objects are now understood as constructions out of neutral elements.
The handful of examples of neutral monistic reduction sketches presented in the next two sections may not inspire confidence. In fact, it may seem that the neutral monist reductive project is hopeless. For it poses harder problems than those that have remained unsolved by materialistic or idealistic versions of reductionism. Their respective starting points at least guarantee that the job of accounting for the world is half done before it is even begun. The neutral monist, on the other hand, starts with something—the neutral entities—that is less well understood than either matter or mind, and neither matter nor mind may be assumed at the outset of the construction.
But a less bleak assessment of the situation is possible. Neutral monism's reductive rivals have also had limited success. The neutral monist can explain this. Idealism and materialism start from familiar but faulty conceptions of mind and matter. This negates the alleged head-start that these reductionisms enjoy over neutral monism. More importantly, it explains why certain reductions are not forthcoming. Take the “hard problem of consciousness” (Chalmers 1996), for example. The neutral monist holds that the intractability of this problem is due to the faulty conception of matter assumed in the materialistic framework. The difficult question how matter can produce a sensation with intrinsic qualitative character does not even arise for the neutral monist. Matter does not cause sensations. Matter is, instead, to be understood as a complex of particulars among which there can be sensations—as Mach laconically puts it: “Bodies do not produce sensations, but complexes of elements (complexes of sensations) make up bodies” (Mach 1886, 29). It is true that the actual constructions of matter and mind may still be lacking. But at least the neutral monist framework is one that makes these constructions possible.
Among the mental items that have received particular attention in the neutral monist literature are consciousness (Holt 1914, James 1904b, Sayre 1976), knowledge (James 1904a, 1904b), the emotions (James 1905, Russell 1921) the will (Russell 1921), belief (Russell 1921), and, most of all, the self (James 1912, Mach 1886, Russell 1921). Not all writers emphasize the same topics; but there is broad agreement about the mental targets for neutral monistic reduction.
Russell's Analysis of Mind is the most sustained attempt to present neutral monistic accounts of mental phenomena. According to Russell, belief is the “central problem in the analysis of mind.” It is “the most ‘mental’ thing we do, the thing most remote from what is done by mere matter” (Russell 1921, 231). A successful analysis must display it as composed solely of neutral elements. Here is how Russell sums up his proposed analysis:
(a) We have a proposition, consisting of interrelated images, and possibly partly of sensations; (b) we have the feeling of assent, which is presumably a complex sensation demanding analysis; (c) we have a relation, actually subsisting, between the assent and the proposition, such as is expressed by saying that the proposition in question is what is assented to. (Russell 1921, 251)
James devotes considerable attention the analysis of knowledge. He considers the case in which he is thinking of (or imagining) Memorial Hall and raises the question what it would take for this to be case of knowledge. He proposes the following answer:
If I can lead you to the hall, and tell you of its history and present uses; if in its presence I feel my idea, however imperfect it may have been, to have led hither and to be now terminated; if the associates of the image and of the felt hall run parallel, so that each term of the one context corresponds serially, as I walk, with an answering term of the others; why then my soul was prophetic, and my idea must be, and by common consent would be, called cognizant of reality. (James 1904a, 55–56)
James uses this example to illustrate one typical form of cognition—a situation involving “two pieces of actual experience belonging to the same subject, with definite tracts of conjunctive transitional experience between them” (James 1904a, 53). In this setting the first experience functions as conceptual knowledge about the object represented by the second experience. James's provides the following description of this sort of cognitive relation:
It consists in intermediary experiences (possible, if not actual) of continuously developing progress, and, finally, of fulfillment, when the sensible percept, which is the object, is reached. The percept here not only verifies the concept, proves its function of knowing that percept to be true, but the percept's existence as the terminus of the chain of the intermediaries creates the function. Whatever terminates that chain was, because it now proves itself to be, what the concept ‘had in mind.’ (James 1904a, 60–1)
The primary target for neutral monistic reduction is the ego. For it promises to be the most reduction-resistant among the many mental items awaiting neutral monistic reconstruction. In keeping with the empiricist background, one finds mainstream neutral monists embracing some version of the bundle theory of the self. Mach states his view as follows:
The primary fact is not the ego, but the elements (sensations)…The elements constitute the I. I have the sensation green, signifies that the element green occurs in a given complex of other elements (sensations, memories). When I cease to have the sensation green, when I die, then the elements no longer occur in the ordinary, familiar association. That is all. Only and ideal mental-economical unity, not a real unity, has ceased to exist. (Mach 1886, 23–24)
James's writings on radical empiricism only contain brief passages on the self. He maintains that we can experience a peculiarly intimate relation that holds “between terms that form states of mind, and are immediately conscious of continuing each other” (James 1904a, 45). The self can then be understood in terms of this relation:
The organization of the Self as a system of memories, purposes, strivings, fulfillments or disappointments, is incidental to this most intimate of all relations, the terms of which seem in many cases actually to compenetrate and suffuse each other's being. (James 1904a, 45)
James's detailed account of a “no-self” theory of the self is contained in The Principles of Psychology, dating back to his pre-neutral monist phase. Any bundle theorist, neutral monistic or otherwise, would be well advised to mine the resources James provides there. James is quite critical of the associationist accounts along Humean lines and attempts to take the account significantly further.
There is some measure of consensus about the mental targets of reduction. It is less clear what the appropriate physical candidates are. Much of the discussion is devoted to the concept of matter. Many of the more concrete examples are taken from what Ryle calls medium sized dry goods. But this focus on macro entities raises the question of the place of the microphysical entities in neutral monism. The neutral monists are divided on this question. Mach famously rejected unobservable entities and so saw no need to reconstruct them logically. But in Russell's hands the theoretical entities of physics become he prime targets of reduction. This change of focus is a symptom of profound reorientation of the whole neutral monistic project.
The following discussion begins by presenting two versions of the model of construction employed by mainstream neutral monism. Both versions of this model suggest that observable macro objects are the natural target of neutral monistic reduction. It closes with a more detailed look at Russell's version of neutral monism and shows that the adoption of a different model of construction forms an important step in Russell's tendency to identify the micro particles of physics as the primary objects of neutral monistic reduction.
The neutral monism of Mach, James, and the American New Realists is epistemically motivated: the aim was to break out from behind the curtain of sense-data (or ideas) and to allow the mind direct access to the external things. This was achieved by classifying the given elements of experience as neutral entities out of which the knowing mind and the known object where then to be constructed. In the ideal case a particular neutral element would do double duty: the neutral red patch would function as the color of the apple and as the sensation of the observer. On this conception, the apple ends up being a construction of (at least) all of its appearances—its redness, roundness, bulginess, taste, fragrance, etc. This is the sort of picture suggest by the following passage from Mach: “thing, body, matter, are nothing apart from the combinations of the elements,—the colors, sounds, and so forth—nothing apart from their so-called attributes” (Mach 1886, 7). James presents a slightly more elaborate picture:
This ‘pen,’ for example, is, in the first instance, a bald that, a datum, fact, phenomenon, content, or whatever other neutral or ambiguous name you may prefer to apply. I called it …a ‘pure experience.’ To get classified either as a physical pen or as someone's percept of a pen, it must assume a function, and that can only happen in a more complicated world. So far as in that world it is a stable feature, holds ink, marks paper and obeys the guidance of a hand, it is a physical pen. That is what we mean by being ‘physical,’ in a pen. (James 1905d, 123–4)
James and Mach agree that the pen, considered as a physical object, consists of just the properties it appears to have: it is the complex made up of a color, a shape, a texture, etc. But this simple model leads to problems. An apple that presents a red appearance to one observer and a shiny white appearance to another observer will suffer from an overcrowding of colors on its surface. This sort of problem is addressed by Russell's more sophisticated account (dating back to the time before his conversion to neutral monism). Russell locates the appearances out of which the apple is constructed not at the place where the apple is, but at the places of the observers to whom they appear. He uses the term “perspective” for the places at which the apple presents an appearance. Many appearances will be available at a given perspective, viz., appearances of all the objects that are visible from that place. Employing this terminology of perspectives, he provides the following instructions for the construction of the apple:
By the similarity of neighbouring perspectives, many objects in the one can be correlated with objects in the other, namely with the similar objects. Given an object in one perspective, form the system of all the objects correlated with it in all the perspectives; that system may be identified with the momentary common-sense “thing.” Thus an aspect of a “thing” is a member of the system of aspects which is the “thing” at that moment…All the aspects of a thing are real, whereas the thing is a merely logical construction. (Russell 1914a, 96)
This alleviates the overcrowding problem: the red appearance and the shiny white appearance are now no longer competing for the same space—they each reside at the perspectives of the observers to which they respectively present themselves. Assuming that no two observers can occupy the same perspective, there is now enough room for all the colors the thing appears to have. This proposal significantly changes the commonsense conception of a physical object, but it does preserve the epistemic vision that motivated neutral monism in the first place: the mind enjoys direct access to the physical world—knowledge and its object are one.
The characteristic feature of the of this construction procedure is that it gathers up into one object the spatially scattered appearances of the object they are said to constitute. A particular oddity to this way of proceeding is that the groups that are physical objects are “hollow”—the apple presents apple-appearances all around it but it does not present such appearances where it is, i.e., in the region occupied by the apple. This central region “may be as small as an electron or as large as a star” (Russell 1927a, 217). It is this feature of the view that critics such as A.O. Lovejoy have in mind when they call Russell's view “centrifugal realism” (Lovejoy 1930, 203) according to which “all material things…are built around holes” (Lovejoy 1930, 198). Russell happily acknowledged this consequence of his view and expressed in such slogans as: “‘Matter’ is a convenient formula for describing what happens where it isn't” (Russell 1927b, 126).
Russell never abandons this construction procedure. But in his later works on neutral monism he introduces a second construction procedure that amounts to a complete reversal of his earlier model. The characteristic feature of second construction procedure is that it gathers up into one object the events that are at the place that is occupied by the object they are said to constitute. The first procedure—the distal model—relies exclusively on construction materials that are not locally available: the regular appearances of the object at all the different places at which it appears; the second procedure—the proximal model—relies exclusively on construction materials that are locally available: the events—among which there are appearances of all the different objects appearing there—occurring at the place occupied by the object. It might be said that the hole at the center of an object, distally construed, is the whole of the same object, proximally construed. The slogan that Russell uses to characterize the proximal model is this: “The matter in a place is all the events that are there…” (Russell 1927a, 385).
Two factors explain the introduction of the proximal model. First, Russell had previously used this sort of construction successfully in other areas. He constructs points (in space and in time) out of groups of overlapping (or “compresent”) events. (Russell 1914a; he still uses the same method in Russell 1927a and Russell 1948). Thus the strategy of constructing something out of locally available particulars rather than out of far-flung appearances was well-established method by the time he turns to neutral monism. Second, the version of neutral monism defended in The Analysis of Mind does not provide a satisfactory account of sensations or experiences, i.e., of those appearances that are actually enjoyed by a subject. Physical objects are constructions out of their regular appearances, i.e., appearances undistorted by any intervening medium, such as fog, colored glass, eyes and optic nerves. Hence sensations, which are irregular appearances of the perceived physical object, are no part of it. That means that one's sensation of a red apple is not part of the apple. And since this red apple sensation is not a regular appearance of any other physical object either, it is not part of any physical object. The same holds true of all sensations. So Russell's claim that “sensations are what is common to the mental and physical worlds; they may be defined as the intersection of mind and matter” (Russell 1921, 144) is untenable. And the place of sensations in the physical world remains a mystery. (Woodfield 1990 raises this problem in an interesting way). The introduction of the proximal construction principle addresses this problem. The causal theory of perception places sensations (or percepts, as they are later called) into the brain of the perceiver. And according to the proximal model, the physical entities that make up the brain are to be construed out of locally available particulars, among which are the percepts. Thus the red apple percept finally finds a physical home, viz., the physical entity in the percipient's brain which it helps to constitute (proximally). Invoking the proximal model of construction, Russell asks: “What sort of a group is [the electron]?” and answers “Obviously it includes all the events that happen where the electron is” (Russell 1927a, 320–1). Bringing this thought to bear on the question of the place of percepts in the brain, he writes:
While its [the brain's] owner was alive, part, at least, of the contents of his brain consisted of his percepts, thoughts, and feelings. Since his brain also consisted of electrons, we are compelled to conclude that an electron is a grouping of events, and that, if the electron is in a human brain, some of the events composing it are likely to be some of the “mental states” of the man to whom the brain belongs. (Russell 1927a, 320)
This is the path that leads Russell to consider the theoretical particles of physics as the primary targets for neutral monistic construction.
The question whether the distal and the proximal models of construction can coherently coexist is interesting, but Russell never addresses the issue. A neutral monist of Russell's persuasion may be best served by abandoning the distal model altogether. The proximal model provides a strategy for constructing the micro particles of physics. In the special case of the particles that make up one's brain one is familiar with intrinsic nature of the particulars that enter into the construction of the physical micro particles. In this unique case one is afforded an inside view of matter. As to the intrinsic nature of the rest of the micro particles, one can only speculate. All macroscopic physical objects are composed of physical micro particles. Contrary to the original intent of mainstream neutral monism, macrophysical objects are not subject to neural monistic construction, i.e., they are not to be understood as constructions out of appearances according to the distal model. This view about the physical world combines physical reductionism—of the macrophysical to the microphysical—with neutral monistic reductionism about the microphysical. Every physical thing is composed of microphysical entities which are constructions out of percepts and other neutral particulars.
This shift in the physical objects that are the targets of neutral monistic reduction—the shift from the distal reduction of macrophysical objects to the proximal reduction of microphysical objects—constitutes a radical reversal of the original epistemic vision that inspired mainstream neutral monism. This issue is taken up in the section “Philosophical Applications” subsection “Russell's Internalism.”
In the eyes of its proponents, the case for neutral monism rests in the way in which it combines a number of virtues. It is a view of great ontological simplicity. Those who, like Russell and Mach, praise ontological parsimony highly, are powerfully attracted to it. It is a view in which there is no room for questionable metaphysical entities such as things-in-themselves or souls. The more positivistically inclined among the neutral monists—Mach, Avenarius, Petzoldt—saw this as a great virtue. It is a view that, according to its champions, provides satisfying solutions to some of the perennial philosophical problems. James, for example, believes that it does finally explain how we can gain knowledge of the “external world.” And Russell thinks that it affords a complete solution to the mind-body problem. It is a view that appears to be in tune with what physics and psychology tell us about matter and mind—this is a point that Russell emphasized. It is a view that provides a philosophical basis equally suitable for physical and psychological research. Mach emphasized this point. And it is a view that fits naturally with the philosophical background assumptions—empiricism and realism—shared by all of the mainstream neutral monists.
The neutral monists were much more interested in advertising and (to some extent) demonstrating these virtues than in (i) constructing arguments to the effect that neutral monism must be, or is, or probably is, or might be the true philosophy; and (ii) formulating arguments against all the competing views. In part this may reflect the fact that the neutral monist literature remained small, never got much beyond the programmatic stage, and did not draw large amounts of criticism. And in part it may have to do with the peculiarity of some of its leading philosophers. Mach did not much care to engage the philosophers and always emphasized that he was not one of them. James, a friend of big pictures and philosophical visions, was not unduly troubled by philosophical minutiae. And Russell—while no stranger to argumentative precision and philosophical controversy—was primarily concerned to provide clear statements of the view, as he felt that he had been “almost universally misunderstood” (Russell 1959, 12).
The list or arguments for neutral monism therefore consist, for the most part, in a list of it's theoretical virtues and of the philosophical promises it held out.
Russell liked to motivate neutral monism by observing that physics was making matter look less material while psychology was making mind more material. Neutral monism explains these developments. Here is how he puts it in the Preface to The Analysis of Mind:
The view that seems to me to reconcile the materialistic tendency of psychology with the anti-materialistic tendency of physics is the view of William James and the American New Realists, according to which the “stuff” of the world is neither mental nor material, but a “neutral stuff,” out of which both are constructed. (Russell 1921, 6)
Russell argues that the abstractness of modern physics makes it difficult to see how there could be perceptual evidence for physics. What is needed is “an interpretation of physics which gives a due place to perceptions; if not, we have no right to appeal to the empirical evidence” (Russell 1927a, 7). Here is how Russell sets out the challenge for himself:
We shall seek to construct a metaphysics of matter which shall make the gulf between physics and perception as small, and the inferences involved in the causal theory of perception as little dubious, as possible. We do not want the percept to appear mysteriously at the end of a causal chain composed of events of a totally different nature; if we can construct a theory of the physical world which makes its events continuous with perception, we have improved the metaphysical status of physics, even if we cannot prove more than that our theory is possible. (Russell 1927a, 275)
In Russell's view, neutral monism rises to this challenge. This does not prove it correct, but it is a strong argument in its favor.
The main reason that is usually cited for Mach's adoption of neutral monism has to do with considerations of the economy and unity of science. He famously says:
I make no pretensions to be a philosopher. I only seek to adopt in physics a point of view that need not be left behind when one looks into the domain of another science. For they all should form one whole, after all. (Mach 1886, 30. My translation)
Mach does not question that the traditional notions of body, mind, ego, etc. have their uses in the limited domains for which they were created. “For, unquestionably, every form of thought that has been designedly or undesignedly constructed for a given purpose, possesses for that purpose a permanent value” (Mach 1886, 32). But when different disciplines come into contact with each other new conceptual instruments are called for:
When, however, physics and psychology meet, the ideas held in the one domain prove to be untenable in the other. From the attempt at mutual adaptation arise the various atomic and monadistic theories—which, however, never attain their end. If we regard sensations…as the elements of the world, the problems referred to appear to be disposed of in all essentials, and the first and most important adaptation to be consequently effected. This fundamental view…can at present be adhered to in all fields of experience; it is consequently the one that accommodates itself with the least expenditure of energy, that is, more economically than any other, to the present temporary collective state of knowledge. (Mach 1886, 32)
This passage introduces another theme that played a central role in Mach's philosophy of science—the principle of economy. It is closely related to the notion of parsimony which has been a dominant role in Russell's thought.
Russell's “supreme maxim of scientific philosophising” (Russell 1914b, 149)—another formulation of which is “Wherever possible, substitute constructions out of known entities for inferences to unknown entities” (Russell 1924, 326)—succinctly expresses the ideas that are known as parsimony principles, principles of economy, or Occam's razor. Neutral monism can be seen as a paradigm instance of this striving for parsimony. Upon finally accepting the neutral monism, Russell tells us that “this view is very attractive, and I have made great endeavours to believe it” (Russell 1919, 299). The value of this sort of economy is more than purely aesthetic. Russell provides the following rationale for his principle: substituting propositions that do not contain inferred entities for ones that do saves one (fallible) inferential step. The value of employing constructions thus consist in an epistemic gain:
This is an economy, because entities with neat logical properties are always inferred, and if the propositions in which they occur can be interpreted without making this inference, the ground for this inference fails, and our body of propositions is secured against the need of a doubtful step. (Russell 1924, 326)
The “immense simplification” (Russell 1959, 103–4) afforded by neutral monism therefore supports it on two counts: its makes neutral monism ontologically simpler and epistemologically less risky than its rivals.
The type of objection most frequently raised against neutral monism expresses the suspicion that it is a mental, not a neutral, monism. The allegedly neutral elements are taken to be either wholly or partially mental. This concern is stated in different ways. It is said, for example, that neutral monism is a form of (Berkeleian) idealism, of phenomenalism, or of panpsychism. Commenting on Mach (and Avenarius and Petzoldt), Lenin put the point this way:
No evasions, no sophisms (a multitude of which we shall yet encounter) can remove the clear and indisputable fact that Ernst Mach's doctrine that things are complexes of sensations is subjective idealism and a simple rehash of Berkeleianism. (Lenin 1909, 34)
And, for once, Karl Popper agrees with Lenin:
I do not think that [neutral monism] is a satisfactory theory. Its allegedly neutral elements are only called “neutral”: they are, unavoidably, mental; and so is, clearly, the procedure of the “construction” of physical objects. Thus “neutral” monism is so only in name. In fact, it is a subjective idealism, very much in the Berkeleyan manner. (Popper/Eccles 1977, 199)
Recently Thomas Nagel has added his voice to this chorus. After expressing his sympathy with the general idea of neutral monism, he concludes that “this is too much like reducing the physical to the mental” (Nagel 200, 210). A number of the neo-Russellians (see the section “Neutral Monism and the Neo-Russellians”) cite phenomenalism as a reason for distancing themselves from Russell's neutral monism. Strawson tells us that when Russell adopts the name “neutral monism” for his own view “he seems too mean something very peculiar (and phenomenalistic) by it.” (Strawson 1994, 97) Herbert Feigl and Maxwell embrace the Russell of The Analysis of Matter who, according to them, has abandoned neutral monism. Maxwell says that none of the “usual (phenomenalistic) senses” of the term “neutral monism” apply to Russell's later work. (Maxwell 1976, 354) Feigl states that “the data upon which the [neutral monistic] construction is based turn out to be items of immediate experience (sentience) and are thus ‘mental’ after all…” (Feigl 1958, 426). But by the time Russell writes The Analysis of Matter he has left behind his “early positivistic, phenomenalistic or ‘neutrally monistic’ views” (Feigl 1975, 26–7). And Chalmers thinks that Russell's version of neutral monism raises the “threat of panpsychism” (Chalmers 1996, 154) and “might best be seen as a version of idealism” (Chalmers 1996, 155). It seems, then, that sympathizers and critics of neutral monism agree that there is nothing neutral about neutral monism. The neutrality label only hides that fact that the monism in question is a mentalistic one.
The mentalism suspicion has two (connected) sources. The alleged neutrality of the elements is questioned, first, because it is thought that the elements cannot exist outside of minds; second, because it is thought that they are intrinsically mental. The labels the neutral monists chose for their elements—“appearance,” “sensation,” “percept,” “pure experience”—do nothing to defuse these concerns. And many of the things they have said about their neutral base of elements do suggest that the mentality suspicion is justified.
Existence in the Mind?
I begin by briefly discussing how Mach, James and Russell fare with respect to the first problem—the worry that the particulars at the basis of their systems can only exist in minds. Mach is hard to pin down on general metaphysical questions of this nature. As a self-declared non-philosopher, he does not seriously engage these sorts of questions. Here is a typical passage in which he speaks with irony about the “-isms” so beloved by the philosophers:
All kinds of current popular views have been comfortably read into my words; I have been accused of idealism, Berkeleyanism, even of materialism, and other “-isms,” of all of which I believe myself to be innocent. (Mach 1886, 48)
It is probably best to think of him, anachronistically, as a Carnapian, as someone who is happy to use whatever “language” is convenient for the job at hand, without thereby committing himself to any metaphysical consequences. Winding up a discussion about the different goals and assumptions embodied in the dualistic world picture of commonsense, a narrowly focused scientific investigation, and the all encompassing sort of picture that he is trying to develop, Mach writes:
Nothing will be changed in the actual facts or in the functional relations, whether we regard all the data as contents of consciousness, or partially so, or as completely physical. The biological task of science is to provide the fully developed human individual with as perfect a means of orientating himself as possible. No other scientific ideal can be realized, and any other must be meaningless. (Mach 1886, 36–7)
The point seems to be that “anything goes,” metaphysically speaking, so long as the enterprise serves our goal of successfully navigating the world. Consequently it appears that the charge of insufficient neutrality—mostly articulated as the charge of phenomenalism or idealism—is not justified when directed against Mach. His “neutrality” extends across the various “-isms” of which he is allegedly guilty.
Is there pure experience outside of all minds? James gives us two answers: a clear methodological one and an obscure metaphysical one. Speaking about the method of radical empiricism he has this to say:
The principle of pure experience is also a methodological postulate. Nothing shall be admitted as fact, it says, except what can be experienced at some definite time by some experient; and for every feature of fact ever so experienced, a definite place must be found somewhere in the final system of reality. In other words: Everything real must be experienceable somewhere, and every kind of thing experienced must somewhere be real. (James 1904c, 160)
James makes it clear that this methodological maxim is not intended as a claim about what there is. In addressing the questions whether radical empiricism precludes “the possibility of (a) something unexperienced and (b) action of experience upon a noumenon” he says:
My reply is: Assuredly not the possibility of either—how could it? Yet in my opinion we should be wise…to restrict our universe of philosophical discourse to what is experienced or, at least, experienceable. (James 1906, 243)
While “refusing to entertain the hypothesis of trans-empirical reality at all” (James 1905e, 195) the Jamesian radical empiricist remains open to the possibility of a noumenal realm. But the nature of this trans-empirical reality remains unclear. Is it “made up” of pure experience—such portions of pure experience, presumably, as are neither experienced nor experienceable by anybody? James's claim that pure experience is the “materia prima of everything” (James 1905b, 138) suggests as much. But James remains frustratingly elusive on the topic. Without a clear answer to the question whether there is or can be pure experience outside of all minds, the suspicion that James's neutral monism is really a form of idealism or phenomenalism cannot be laid to rest.
The view that Russell's “neutral” elements are mental—in the sense of being confined to an existence in he mind—is quite popular and quite wrong. Its endorsement by such figures as W.T. Stace (1946), A.J. Ayer (1971), and Feigl (1975) has given it considerable authority. But all of Russell's work on neutral monism bears out the falsity of this view. In Russell's later work on neutral monism (The Analysis of Matter and later works) the emphasis on mind-independence is most glaringly obvious. Hence the critics who accuse him of phenomenalism are given to interpret this work as a revolutionary (and welcome) change in his philosophy, amounting to an abandonment of neutral monism. The mistaken view that Russell's earlier neural monism is phenomenalistic naturally leads to this mistaken diagnosis of the development of his philosophical views. Here is how Lockwood sums up his careful and persuasive rebuttal of the phenomenalism suspicion:
Not only does no part o the definition of neutral monism in any way require that it be even quasi-phenomenalistic, there is no phase in Russell's intellectual development at which he would simultaneously have considered himself a neutral monist and any kind of phenomenalist at all. Neutral monism and phenomenalism are both logically independent and, in the history of Russell's thought, temporarily non-overlapping doctrines. (Lockwood 1981, 152)
The phenomenalism suspicion surfaced early, and Russell tried to set the record straight:
I have never called myself a phenomenalist, but I have no doubt sometimes expressed myself as though this were my view. In fact, however, I am not a phenomenalist. For practical purposes, I accept the truth of physics, and depart from phenomenalism so far as may be necessary for upholding the truths of physics. (Russell 1922, 480)
Similar statements are scattered throughout all of his later works. But neither the anti-phenomenalistic spirit of his neutral monism, nor his explicit disavowals of phenomenalism have managed to take the wind out of the sails of the phenomenalism suspicion. A different, and interesting, question concerns the quality of Russell's anti-phenomenalistic arguments and the legitimacy of his anti-phenomenalistic assumptions. But these questions rarely take center stage when it is stated that Russell's neutral monism is just a version of phenomenalism. For the most part, the accusations seem to rest on the (admittedly very misleading) terminology that Russell employs in stating his views. Statements like “a thing just is the collection of its appearances” do indeed sound like the purest phenomenalism. But this impression vanishes without a trace once Russell's idiosyncratic use of “appearance” is understood.
The use of the problematical terms “appearance,” “sensation,” “percept,” and “pure experience” may well be the main source of the enduring appeal of the critic's conviction that the “neutral” elements are confined to an existence in the mind. For the logic of these notions seems to require a subject: appearances appear to someone; sensations, percepts, and experiences (pure or otherwise) are always, and necessarily, owned by some subject or other. This poses two problems. First, it seems to introduce a mental subject—a mental entity that owns these experiences, percepts, etc. Second, if all of the monist's elements are mental, in the sense of having to exist in a mind, then the resulting monism is mental, not neutral. Hume's bundle theory of the self—embraced by all of the neutral monists in the empiricist tradition—is an attempt to answer the first problem. The owner of an experience is thereby reduced to a bundle of other experiences. This gets around the need for an irreducibly mental owner of experience. But this reconstruction of the subject does not afford a solution to the second problem. It still might be true that every element must reside in a mind, albeit a mere bundle-mind. Again it was Hume who showed how to address this second problem. He boldly proclaimed the independence of perceptions:
All [particular perceptions] are different, and distinguishable, and separable from each other, and may be separately consider'd, and may exist separately, and have no need of any thing to support their existence. (Hume 1739, 252)
Following Hume's lead, the neutral monists adopted the following strategy: deny that appearances or the given need a subject and maintain that “the given is subjectless.” We find this idea explicitly endorsed in Mach and Russell. It also plays a prominent role in the ensuing positivist tradition. Even before Russell rejected the ego and embraced neutral monism he endorses the possibility of “free floating” appearances. These were the unsensed sensibilia of his earlier system. Such free floating appearances—appearances that are not appearances for anybody—would, for example, occur in a zombie:
If—per impossibile—there were a complete human body with no mind inside it, all those sensibilia would exist, in relation to that body, which would be sense-data if there were a mind in the body. (Russell 1914b, 144)
But free floating appearances are not confined to the heads of the mindless. Any place from which a given object could be perceived if an observer were present there contains an appearance of that object. So appearances are not only independent of the minds that might be aware of them; they are also independent of the sensory mechanisms that usually serve them up to conscious minds:
It may be thought monstrous to maintain that a thing can present any appearances at all in a place where no sense organs and nervous structure exist through which it could appear. I do not myself feel the monstrosity. (Russell 1914b, 152)
By the time he writes The Analysis of Mind, Russell makes it clear that “appearance” is merely a shorthand for a more general notion that has no built-in reference to a subject:
When I speak of “appearances,” I do so only for brevity: I do not mean anything that must “appear” to somebody, but only that happening, whatever it may be, which is connected, at the place in question, with a given physical object—according to the old orthodox theory, it would be a transverse vibration in the æther. (Russell 1921, 101)
The decision to give up the (substantial) ego and to replace it with a construction of given elements requires one to embrace the thesis of the subjectlessness of the given. The given is then viewed as logically prior to any subject to whom it may be given, notwithstanding the grammatical suggestion to the contrary that the term “given” carries with it. The thesis that the given does not have a “first-person ontology” (John Searle's term) played a central part in the ensuing positivist/empiricist tradition. It features prominently in Rudolf Carnap's Aufbau. He writes:
The basis could also be described as the given, but we must realize that this does not presuppose somebody or something to whom the given is given. (Carnap 1928, 102)
In section 65 of the same work—entitled “The Given Does Not Have a Subject”—he goes on to develop this thesis at some length. And Moritz Schlick presents this thesis as a core tenet of any true positivism:
The strongest emphasis should be laid on the fact that primitive experience is absolutely neutral or, as Wittgenstein has occasionally put it, that immediate data “have no owner”…the genuine positivist denies (with Mach etc.) that original experience “has that quality or status, characteristic of all given experience, which is indicated by the adjective ‘first person’”…To see that primitive experience is not first-person experience seems to me to be one of the most important steps which philosophy must take towards the clarification of its deepest problems. (Schlick 1936, 472–3)
For Mach the importance of the subjectlessness of the given resides in the following fact: the elements of his neutral monism are derived from the given. Hence they will inherit certain features of the given. If it turns out that the given presupposes an entity that is to be put together out of elements, then the construction of this entity out of elements will be circular (assuming that the elements inherit this crucial presupposition). More specifically: if the elements presuppose the self, the construction of the self out of elements will be circular. This threat to neutral monism is blocked if the given does not have a subjective ontology.
The second well-spring of the suspicion that neutral monism is a form of phenomenalism (or idealism, or panpsychism) is the conviction that the supposedly neutral elements are really intrinsically mental. By insisting that the given is a window onto the neutral elements, the mainstream of neutral monism naturally invites this challenge. For the given qualities of experience—qualia, qualitative properties, phenomenal properties, sensory qualities and so on—have, traditionally, been taken to be paradigms of the mental.
James calls this kind of consideration the “commonest objection” against his claim that pure experiences is neutral. The features of affective states are perceived as especially troublesome:
In our pleasures and pains, our loves and fears and angers…we have, I am told by many critics, a great realm of experience intuitively recognized as spiritual, made, and felt to be made, of consciousness exclusively, and different in nature from the space filling kind of being which is enjoyed by physical objects. (James 1905b, 138)
Based, primarily, on the James-Lange theory of the emotions James concludes that affective features can “serve as an excellent corroboration” (1905b, 142) of his theory. He also points to the “shifting place of ‘secondary qualities’ in the history of philosophy” as providing further confirmation of the fact that
‘inner’ and ‘outer’ are not coefficients with which experiences come to us aboriginally stamped, but are rather results of later classification performed by us for particular needs. (James 1905b,146)
Before embracing neutral monism Russell held a sense-datum theory. While textbook orthodoxy now classifies sense-data as mental entities, sense-datum theorists typically took them, and the properties they exemplify, to be nonmental. This tendency is very pronounced in Russell. In the following passage he emphasizes the nonmental nature of the “objects of sense”:
Let us ask ourselves whether the quality designated by the word ‘mental’ does, as a matter of observation, actually belong to object of sense, such as colours or noises. I think any candid person must reply that, however difficult it may be to know what we mean by ‘mental,’ it is not difficult to see that colours and noises are not mental in the sense of having that intrinsic peculiarity which belong to beliefs and wishes and volitions, but not to the physical word. (Russell 1915, 127)
Though written before his conversion to neutral monism, the passage can serve as a perfect characterization of the neutral elements that replace the sense-data (and sensibilia) of Russell's earlier view. The “sensations” he is left with upon giving up on the subject and its mental acts inherit this nonmental, neutral character of his earlier objects of sense.
The previous objection boils down the claim that the neutral monist's elements are too mental to be neutral. The current objection reverses this charge. Thomas Nagel—a philosopher sympathetic to the project of neutral monism—has recently leveled the following objection against the Russellian version of the doctrine:
The theory also leaves untouched the problem of relating the subjectivity of the mental to its physical character. Russell did have something to say about this—identifying subjectivity with dependence on the specific character of the individual brain—but I don't think this is sufficient. (Nagel 2000, 210)
The short version of Russell's take on subjectivity goes like this:
Suppose some scene—say in a theatre—is simultaneously seen by a number of people and photographed by a number of cameras. The impression made upon a person or a camera is in some respects like that made upon other persons and cameras, in other respects different. We shall call the elements which are alike ‘objective’ elements in the impression, and those which are peculiar we shall call ‘subjective.’ (Russell 1927b, 122)
In The Analysis of Matter (222–225) Russell spells out this notion of subjectivity in some detail, distinguishing three distinct sources of this sort of subjectivity, and so on. But those who share Nagel's concern will not be impressed by an account along these lines, however detailed the development. The notion of subjectivity that drives this objection is a quite different. According to Nagel, an organism undergoes experiences with a subjective character “if and only if there is something that it is like to be that organism—something it is like for the organism” (Nagel 1974, 166).
This account of subjective experience seems to involve two factors: (i) the qualitative factor—there being something it is like for someone; (ii) the subjective factor—there being someone for whom it is like something. (see Levine 2001) The first factor finds a natural place in Russell's neutral monism. Events with an intrinsic qualitative dimension are among the events that constitute the matter of our brains. But in virtue of what do these qualitative events become like something for me, for the subject? While Russell does not specifically address this question, the bundle-theoretic framework does suggest an answer. These qualitative events get to be like something for me because they (partially) constitute me—I am the bundle to which they belong.
Lockwood closes his excellent piece on Russell's neutral monism (Lockwood 1981) with the claim that it “raises questions that seem exceedingly intractable”:
Granted that we have no reason to believe in a radical qualitative discontinuity between the mental and the physical, how are we to conceive those regions of the physical universe from which we assume awareness to be absent? Does it make sense, even, to speak of intrinsic qualities that, though in some sense continuous with the phenomenal, nevertheless do not literally figure as features of a “point of view,” in Nagel's sense—there being, presumably, no “what is it like to be a chair”? (Lockwood 1981, 157)
One might try to resist Lockwood's challenge by pointing out that, throughout his neutral monist period, Russell's official position has been one of complete agnosticism with respect to the intrinsic nature of the physical world (excepting living brains). This is readily apparent in his later writings (Russell 1927a, 1948, 1956a, 1959). In these works the insight that we know nothing about the intrinsic nature of matter is presented as they key for his proposed solution of the mind-body problem:
The gulf between percepts and physics is not a gulf as regards intrinsic quality, for we know nothing of the intrinsic quality of the physical world, and therefore do not know whether it is, or is not, very different from that of percepts. (Russell 1927a, 264)
The Analysis of Mind is not usually read in this way. Russell is taken to affirm that sensations are, literally, parts of the objects that are being sensed. It seems to follow that the rose that looks red to me is (partially) composed of a red quale. But a careful reading of this early statement of the doctrine reveals that Russell denies that sensations form part of the things we perceive. Only the regular appearances of a thing make it up. It's irregular appearances—roughly, appearances distorted by intervening media—do not form part of the matter of the appearing thing:
Every regular appearance is an actual member of the system which is the star…But presently the light of the star reaches our atmosphere. It begins to be refracted, and dimmed by the mist, and its velocity is slightly diminished. At last it reaches a human eye, where a complicated process takes place, ending in a sensation…Now, the irregular appearances [among which are the sensations of the star] are not, strictly speaking, members of the system which is the star, according to our definition of matter. (Russell 1921, 134–5)
And Russell adds that it is a mistake to think that an irregular appearance of an object must “bear any resemblance to he regular appearances as regard its intrinsic qualities” (Russell 1921, 136). It follows that the agnosticism about the intrinsic qualities of matter—so prominently on display in Russell's later work on neutral monism—is already in place in his first full statement of the view.
But it may be questioned whether the appeal to agnosticism is a satisfactory reply to Lockwood's worry. For the point of Russell's insistence on our ignorance about the nature of matter is to show that matter might, for all we know, be intrinsically similar to our experiences. And that is already more than Lockwood is willing to grant. There is, moreover, one strand of Russell's reflections on the causal theory of perception that seems to demand a degree of similarity between the sensation or percept and the intrinsic nature of the matter that causes it. Were it not for this similarity between the percept and the last link in the physical causal chain that produced it, the appearance of the percept would be a mystery:
So long as we adhere to the conventional notions of mind and matter, we are condemned to a view of perception which is miraculous. We suppose that a physical process starts from a visible object, travels to the eye, there changes to another physical process, causes yet another physical process in the optic nerve, finally produces some effect in the brain, simultaneously with which we see the object from which the process started, the seeing being something “mental,” totally different in character from the physical process which precede and accompany it. (Russell 1927b, 111)
Russell argues that his view of mind and matter renders this miracle intelligible by explaining how a percept can be similar in nature to the physical process that produces it. If we adopt his view
We no longer have to contend with what used to seem mysterious in the causal theory of perception: a series of light-waves or sound-waves or what not suddenly producing a mental event apparently totally different from themselves in character. (Russell 1927a, 400)
Note that the degree of mystery reduction is proportional to the degree of similarity in character between the percept and its causal antecedent. That is, the mystery engendered by the causal theory of perception, will only be dispelled if the intrinsic qualities of the perceptual mechanism is sufficiently similar to that of the percepts it produces. This shows that Russell's commitments concerning the intrinsic nature (of at least some) of the matter of which we are unaware is more substantive than his avowed agnosticism might indicate.
It is tempting to think that the neo-Russellians (see the section “Neutral Monism and the Neo-Russellians”)—Chalmers and Stoljar in particular—have a solution to the problem that Russell appears to face. Chalmers's protophenomenal properties and Stoljar's o-physical properties have an intrinsic, qualitative nature while being distinct from the phenomenal properties of our experience. But note that it is precisely the intelligibility of the “objective” existence of these quasi-phenomenal properties—properties that are “in some sense continuous” with the phenomenal properties—that Lockwood doubts. He does not even mention the possibility that full-blown phenomenal properties might constitute “those regions of the physical universe from which we assume awareness to be absent.” Presumably he considers this idea to outlandish to even merit consideration.
There are questions that divide the philosophical community into those who see them as “exceedingly intractable” and those who fail to see the problem altogether. Lockwood's question may belong into this class. Russell, and Humeans in general, take it for granted that all perceptions, being distinct “may be conceiv'd as separately existent, and may exist separately, without any contradiction or absurdity” (Hume 1739, 634). So while they may be agnostic about the intrinsic properties of the matter that makes up an ordinary chair, they are not disturbed by the idea that these properties might be phenomenal, or protophenomenal, or o-physical. Unlike Lockwood, they do not see that this could be so only if it were like something to be the chair, or if the chair had a point of view. These intrinsic qualities exist without existing for anybody.
According to the mainstream version of neutral monism, persons and other things are bundles of neutral elements. This invites questions regarding the principles effecting the bundling. Hume, the creator of the bundle theory, was the first to despair over this problem. The reasons for his despair are not easy to discern. A recent paper distinguishes thirteen different interpretations of Hume's objection to this own theory. (Ellis 2006). But even if the shortcomings of the bundle theory are not as simple and as glaring as is sometimes suggested, the neutral monist may be well advised to not tie the fate of neutral monism to the fate of the bundle theory.
Among the many features that mainstream neutral monism inherits from its empiricist roots is an aversion to substance (in the sense of a substratum). Concrete particulars are accordingly—and again in keeping with the empiricist background—viewed as bundles of particulars. In this way the bundle theory makes its way into most versions of neutral monism and comes to seem like an integral part of the doctrine. But it is no such thing. Consider, for example, the main rival of the bundle theory: the theory according to which a thing is composed of a bare substratum together with its attributes. A neutral monist treatment of the attributes can proceed along the same lines as in the bundle theory. And the bareness of bare substrata appears to make them into paradigms of neutrality—ideally suited for inclusion in a neutral monistic framework. It would seem, then, that neutral monism is not wedded to any specific account of concrete particulars. Its association with the bundle theory is a matter of historical contingency.
The mainstream neutral monist can sacrifice the bundle theory should the problems surrounding the bundling relation prove intractable. But dropping this part of the standard package does not endanger the core idea of neutral monism. Every neutral monist who strives for completeness will want to offer an account of the structure of concrete particulars. And every theory in this domain will be controversial—as is borne out by any textbook on metaphysics. But the problems that neutral monism encounters on this front are general metaphysical problems with no particular bearing on neutral monism as such.
Nonveridical experience poses a problem for realistic accounts of perception. Dreams, hallucinations, and illusions are experiences in which the purported object of the experience does not exist or fails to exist in the manner it is presented. These nonveridical experiences can, therefore, not be construed as relations between a perceiver and these objects. Their nonexistence unsuits them to play this role. And the relativity of perception—a thing appearing to have different perceptual properties from different vantage points, for different observers, and under different conditions—appears to furnish every object with more properties than it can bear, many of which are incompatible with each other. Given the strong element of realism in the mainstream versions of neutral monism, one might expect that the existence of nonveridical experience poses a problem for the doctrine.
But the neutral monists blithely deny that dreams, hallucinations, and illusions pose a difficulty. The following statements by Mach and Russell make the point vividly:
When we consider elements like red, green, hot, cold and the rest, which are physical and mental in virtue of their dependence on both external and internal circumstances, and are in both respects immediately given and identical, the question as to illusion and reality loses its sense. Here we are simultaneously confronted by the elements of the real world and of the ego. The only possible further question of interest concerns their functional interdependence…(Mach 1905, 7–8).
The first thing to notice is that there are no such things as “illusions of sense.” Objects of sense, even when they occur in dreams, are the most indubitably real objects known to us. What, then, makes us call them unreal in dreams? Merely the unusual nature of their connection with other objects of sense…Objects of sense are called “real” when they have the kind of connection with other objects of sense which experience has led us to regard as normal; when they fail this, they are called “illusions.” But what is illusory is only the inferences to which they give rise; in themselves, they are every bit as real as the object of waking life. (Russell 1914a, 92–93)
Mach and Russell do not endorse the absurd view that we never make mistakes. We do, but these mistakes, which manifest themselves as unfulfilled expectations, are the result of hasty assumptions and faulty inferences. But the experiences that occasion our errors—sticks that look bent when immersed in water, etc.—are all encounters with reality. There is nothing mistaken or inaccurate about them. Two features of the neutral monistic version of realism combine to yield this astonishing result. First, the perceptual objects about which neutral monism is realistic are not ordinary physical objects but neutral elements. An experience without an object would, therefore, have to be an experience in which the corresponding neutral elements is missing. But that is not possible because—and this is the second point—the experience is the neutral element (when embedded in an appropriate context). For the neutral monist denies the duality of act and object—“the patch of colour and our sensation in seeing it are identical” (Russell 1921, 143)—and hence the possibility of an act of experiencing not directed at any object is impossible. An experience of red, say, simply is a red element playing its role in a grouping of elements that is a mind. If there is no red element, there is no experience as of red. And a red element that is not appropriately integrated into a mental bundle is no experience at all. The case in which there is an experience as of red without the corresponding red element cannot occur.
What this account presupposes is the possibility of elements that occur in mental bundles without, at the same time, belonging to a bundle of elements that make up a physical object. Russell has called these elements “wild particulars”:
It is to be observed that there is no a priori necessity for particulars to be susceptible of this double classification [into mental and physical groups]. There may be what might be called ‘wild’ particulars, not having the usual relations by which the classification is effected; perhaps dreams and hallucinations are composed of particulars which are ‘wild’ in this sense. (Russell 1915, 134–5)
This idea of the possibility of wild particulars survives Russell's turn towards neutral monism. In The Analysis of Matter the same idea is expressed in the following terms: “A percept may not belong to any group [forming a physical object] at all; in that case it has no objectivity. Hallucinations and dreams come under this head” (Russell 1927a, 222). Note that an account of the alleged “illusions of sense” that involves wild particulars is incompatible with at least one of the definitions of “neutrality” presented above. If a basic entity is neutral just in case it figures in the reduction bases of both physical and mental nonbasic entities, then a wild particular—one that belongs only to a mind—is not neutral. Given this understanding of neutrality, a theory that allows wild particulars cannot be counted as a neutral theory. But there are other accounts of neutrality available, allowing the neutral monist to avoid this particular problem.
How satisfactory is the neutral monist way of saving realism from the problems posed by nonveridical experience? On technical grounds, it must be counted a success: every experience—be it illusory, hallucinatory, a dream, or whatnot—is guaranteed to have an object, viz. the neutral element that is the experience. This result is a natural consequence of the theory. The traditional problem that nonveridical experience poses for realistic theories of perception does not even present itself in the neutral monist framework.
The relativity of perception raises a different problem: there is a perceived object, but it is in danger of becoming the bearer of an open-ended number of incompatible properties. But objects that underwent neutral monistic reconstruction according to the distal model (see the section “Reduction of the Physical”) can accommodate an indefinite number of apparently incompatible properties—the object has each of the many incompatible properties “at a different place,” viz., at the place from which it appears to have that property. This explains how an object can really have all the many properties it appears to have. Thus neutral monism, employing the distal model, is uncompromised by the fact of perceptual relativity.
Can this account satisfy those who adopted realism in the hope that it would yield an enormous epistemic dividend: a direct, unmediated grasp of reality? The philosopher for whom reality consists, first and foremost, of physical objects as ordinarily conceived, may have serious doubts. The neutral monist's objects, constructed according to the distal method, are only very distant relatives of the objects one originally wanted to know. The method turns an ordinary object into an “infinitely various porcupine, which is not merely here in this room (as we commonly take it to be) but sticks out as it were in all sorts of directions and to all sorts of distances…” (Price 1932, 56) The neutral monist can explain how this porcupine can be directly known. But the critic may hold that direct knowledge of porcupines is not worth having. The problem encountered here is quite general and arises whenever ontological solutions to epistemological problems are offered. The knowledge secured in this manner concerns objects that are quite different from those one set out to know. Berkeley's reconstruction of physical objects is the most notorious instance of this type. A philosopher encountering neutral monism with a firmly entrenched conception of ordinary physical objects may find it no less objectionable than Berkeley's proposal. But it is further question whether this reaction should cause a neutral monist undue worry.
Especially Russell's later version of neutral monism stands in marked contrast to all other versions of mainstream neutral monism. According to Russell, all objects of perception are located in the percipient's brain. This means that Russell can avail himself of all the resources of a traditional sense-datum theory in his account of error. But this advantage brings with it the main disadvantage of the sense-datum theory: Russell's version of neutral monism is realistic only in the most attenuated of senses. Every perception has a mind-independent object, but no object of perception is ever external to the perceiver. (For more on this aspect of Russell's neural monism see the section “Russell's Internalism”)
The promise to solve certain problems is often the main reason to adopt a philosophical theory. Neutral monism seemed to promise much to those who embraced it.
Neutral monism is comprehensive metaphysics, but it has mostly been construed as an attempt to address the mind-body problem. The solution of this problem is therefore the biggest philosophical promise this theory makes to its advocates. As Russell sees it, the theory has kept its promise:
[Neutral monism] affords an immense simplification. I was glad when I realized that abandonment of the ‘subject’ made it possible to accept this simplification and to regard the traditional problem of the relation of mind and matter as definitely solved. (Russell 1959, 103–4)
The solution turns, to a large part, on a clearing the field of bad “metaphysical” entities. The “two problems of the ‘unfathomable’ thing and the equally ‘unexplorable’ ego” are disposed of as pseudo problems. (Mach 1905, 8). “For us” Mach writes “the world does not consist of mysterious entities, which by their interaction with another, equally mysterious entity, the ego, produce sensations, which alone are accessible. For us, colors, sounds, spaces, times,…are provisionally the ultimate elements, whose given connexion it is our business to investigate” (Mach 1886, 29–30).
Much of Russell's work (before and during his neutral monist period) was concerned with the question how perception fits into the physical world and how perception can give us evidence of the physical world. It is a problem in which the mind-body problem and the problem of knowledge (see the next section) come together. The Analysis of Matter can profitably be viewed as a lengthy meditation on the problem of perception. Here is how the problem poses itself for Russell:
All empirical evidence consists, in the last analysis, of perceptions; thus the world of physics must be, in some sense, continuous with the world of our perceptions, since it is the latter which supplies he evidence for the laws of physics…We must therefore find an interpretation of physics which gives a due place to perceptions; if not, we have no right to appeal to the empirical evidence. (Russell 1927a, 6–7)
And neutral monism is the “metaphysic of matter” that bridges the “gulf between physics and perception” (Russell 1927a, 275) by explaining how a percept can result from a purely physical brain process in a nonmiraculous way. (see also the discussion in the section “The Nature of the Extra-Cranial World”)
The other main reason to adoption of neutral monism was its promise to make the world cognitively accessible again. The epistemic motivation for neutral monism is particularly clear in James:
My thesis is that if we start with the supposition that there is only one primal stuff or material in the world, a stuff of which everything is composed, and if we call that stuff ‘pure experience,’ then knowing can easily be explained as a particular sort of relation towards one another into which portions of pure experience may enter. The relation itself is a part of pure experience; one of its ‘terms’ becomes the subject or bearer of the knowledge, the knower, the other becomes the object known. (James 1904b, 4)
Neutral monism tries to forge the tightest possible connection between the knower and the known—that of identity. James puts it as follows:
A given undivided portion of experience, taken in one context of associates, play[s] the part of the knower, or a state of mind, or ‘consciousness'; while in a different context the same undivided bit of experience plays the part of a thing known, of an objective ‘content.’ In a word, in one group it figures as a thought, in another group as a thing. (James 1904b, 9–10)
Holt particularly emphasizes the numeric identity of thought with its object:
We have become wedded, or indeed welded to the phrase—my thought is of an object—when we ought to say and mean—my thought is a portion of the object—or better still,—a portion of the object is my thought:—exactly as a portion of the sky is the zenith. (Holt 1914, 149)
If, as Aristotle said, ‘thought and its object are one,’ so are sensations and perceptions one with their ‘objects.’ In fact, there are not sensations or perceptions and their objects. There are objects, and when these are included in the manifold called consciousness they are called sensations and perceptions. (Holt 1914, 219)
If thought and its object, percept and perceived, representation and represented are identical, then the mind must break out of the confines of the brain. The neutral monists happily acknowledge that “thoughts ain't in the head:” “the soul, so called, is extended in space” (Holt 1914, 153).
Avenarius was the most outspoken advocate of this idea. The original epistemic sin, as he sees it, is the “introjection” of mental states into the brain. He spends considerable time providing a genetic analysis of how the intellectual catastrophe of introjection could have happened. But he also presents straightforward arguments that are supposed to show the falsity of introjection:
The brain has ganglia and nerve fibers, has neuroglia and vessels, has different colors (is colored this way or that) and so on. But neither the most detailed anatomical dissection, nor an arbitrarily powerful microscope would reveal thoughts qua components of thinking, much less thinking itself as part or property of the brain. (Avenarius 1891, 67)
Considerations of this sort lead him to summarize his views about introjection in a remarkable paragraph:
The brain is not the dwelling-place, seat or producer of thought; it is not the instrument or organ, it is not the vehicle or substratum, etc., of thought.
Thought is not an indweller or command-giver, it is not a second half or aspect, etc., nor is it a product; it is not even a physiological function of the brain, nor is it a state of the brain at all. (Avenarius 1891, 76)
Mach approvingly quotes this passage and tells us that Avenarius conception seems “to approximate very nearly to my own.” (Mach 1886, 28) Rudolf Wlassak, whom Mach quotes as an authority on Avernarius, argues that the “discovery of the illegitimacy of introjection” reveals “all problems connected with the relation of our ‘sensations,’ ‘presentations’ and ‘contents of consciousness’ to the material things” as well as the “problems as to projection we meet in theories of space, the exteriorization of the space-sensations, etc.” as pseudo-problems. (Mach 1886, 54) And Petzoldt celebrates Avenarius for having done away with
the barbaric quid pro quo that lets the psychological sensations get into the brain together with the physiological stimulations, and which then have to be moved back out again, of course. (Petzoldt 1906, 170)
The radical externalism about the mental evidenced by these passages stands in the service of overcoming “the problem of the external world” by making it into the immediate object of our thought, or better, by making our thoughts be portions of it. That neutral monism allowed for this nonidealistic fusion of mind and world, thereby opening our cognitive doors onto the world, was what attracted most neutral monists to this doctrine in the first place.
Finally, it must be emphasized that Russell's versions of neutral monism never did deliver the direct perceptual grasp of the external physical object that the standard versions of the mainstream doctrine were designed to achieve. While this many not be obvious in The Analysis of Mind (see the discussion in the section “The Nature of the Extra-Cranial World”), Russell's later works on neutral monism (Russell 1927a, 1927b, 1956a) emphasize the fact that perception is limited to what goes on in our brains. Considerations about the causal theory of perception persuade him to place the percept into the percipients brain. And the proximal model of construction (see the section “Reduction of the Physical”) allows him to understand the “introjected” percept as a constituent of the matter that forms the percipient's brain. Hence he can proclaim that “I know about what is happening in the brain exactly what naïve realism thinks it knows about what is happening in the outside world” (Russell 1927b, 104). A slightly longer version of this goes as follows:
I maintain an opinion which all other philosophers find shocking: namely, that people's thoughts are in their heads. The light from a star travels over intervening space and causes a disturbance in the optic nerve ending in an occurrence in the brain. What I maintain is that the occurrence in the brain is a visual sensation. I maintain, in fact, that the brain consists of thoughts—using ‘thought’ in its widest sense, as it is used by Descartes…What I maintain is that we can witness or observe what goes on in our heads, and that we cannot witness or observe anything else at all. (Russell 1959, 18–19)
This position is still realistic in the minimal sense guaranteed by neutral monism: there can be no objectless experience, because the object and the experience of it are one—there is one neutral element (an event or percept) that plays this double role. But in all other respects Russell's internalistic version of neutral monism is the antithesis of the realist spirit that informed the versions of the doctrine we find in Mach, James, and the American New Realists. Perceptual contact with external objects becomes as indirect and as inferential as in the representative theories of perception—e.g., the sense-datum theory—that neutral monism was designed to overcome.
The pervasive externalism of mainstream neutral monism makes Russell's radical turn towards internalism particularly disorienting. The point here is not to assess Russell's reasons for this disturbing conclusion. The point is to demonstrate, one final time, how accommodating the neutral monist framework is, and how little of that which may seem most characteristic about the neutral monist doctrines on record is really part of neutral monism. Neither the externalism of Mach, James, Avenarius, Holt, etc., nor the internalism of Russell have anything to do with neutral monism. These doctrines may be what attracted these philosophers to neutral monism in the first place. It may well be that these philosophers would have given up neutral monism had they convinced themselves that it was incompatible with them. But none of this makes externalism or internalism (or a host of other philosophical theses that tend to come along with it) a part of neutral monism. Neutral monism proper may have many problems. But many of its alleged problems are not problems of it but of some philosophical burr so firmly attached to neutral monism that it is easily mistaken as an integral part of it.
Neutral monism was characterized as a noneliminativist version of reductionism. It takes mental and physical phenomena to be real but reducible to the underlying neutral level. It differs from other versions of reductionism—be they materialistic or mentalistic, eliminative or noneliminative—by insisting on the neutrality of the basis. And its reductionism sets it apart from certain versions of nonreductive theories—panpsychism, emergentism, and the dual aspect theory come to mind—with which it is sometimes compared or identified.
The claimed differences between neutral monism and other forms of reductionism—materialism and phenomenalism—are easily stated, but they may be hard to assess in particular cases. Consider phenomenalism (mentalistic reductionism), for example. The official difference between neutral monism and phenomenalism is obvious: phenomenalism reduces everything to mental entities; neutral monism reduces everything to neutral entities. The difficulty arises because it can be questioned whether the allegedly neutral entities of a given version of neutral monism—Mach's version, say—are genuinely neutral or merely relabeled mental entities. In this case the dispute concerns the truth of a particular claim of a particular version of neutral monism, not the overall structure of neutral monistic theories. Such a dispute can only be settled by a careful investigation of the specific case. Various versions of neutral monism have been suspected of phenomenalism. (see the section “Not Neutral but Mental” above). But the materialism suspicion is rare or nonexistent. Most likely this is an artifact of the contingent connection between the given and the neutral entities that characterizes mainstream neutral monism.
The worry that neutral monism collapses into mentalistic or materialistic reductionism can also be raised on a quite general level. It might be argued that the category of the neutral is inherently problematical and that therefore the so-called neutral entities will either be mental or physical but not neither. In this case the debate will have to address the concept of neutrality, not particular accounts of neutrality offered by this or that version of neutral monism.
Panpsychism is the doctrine that every physical particular enjoys some measure of mentality. On the face of it, panpsychism and neutral monism are as different as could be. Neutral monism reduces mental and physical phenomena, panpsychism does not; neutral monism holds that the “materia prima” is neutral, panpsychism does not. And neutral monism assumes that there are genuinely physical (i.e., nonmental) phenomena that need reducing, panpsychism does not.
Given these differences, it is not easy to see the force of the panpsychism accusation. The thought must be that the allegedly neutral entities are not neutral between mind and matter but really a little bit of each; and that the activity that the neutral monists describe as “reducing physical and mental phenomena to constructions of neutral entities” is really not quite that, but whatever it is that panpsychists do when they explain how it all hangs together.
Inasmuch as this raises a worry for neutral monism, it is of the same general kind as the one encountered in the discussion of phenomenalism. Perhaps the panpsychist is right in suspecting a that a given way of specifying the neutral elements yields physical elements that have a mental admixture. But the problem may also be a quite general one: perhaps the world is such that the only entities there can be (basic or otherwise) are psychophysical in nature.
A detailed investigation of the particular criterion of neutrality at issue will address the first worry. The task of addressing the second, general problem is best entrusted to the panpsychist. If it can be proven that everything is psychophysical, a problem may arise; but until then neutral monism is in the clear.
It is tempting to think that neutral monism can be combined with emergentism. Begin with a simple world that contains only neutral elements. As complexity increases physical and/or mental features emerge from the neutral basis. This appears to be a world of which neutral monism and emergentism are true. Ultimate reality—that upon which everything else depends—is neutral and monistic. And in its more developed form this world also contains emergent features. But the neutral monist must resist this ecumenical compromise. Neutral monism is a reductive thesis; emergentism is not. That is, neutral monism is true of a world only if putting it through the (logical) grinder yields no nonneutral elements. A world with emergent features does not satisfy this standard. Emergent features—be they mental or physical—cannot be reduced to the lower level features from which they arise. Hence the grinder's output will contain neutral as well as physical and/or mental elements. Both monism and neutrality are lost if emergentism is added onto neutral monism.
The view with which neutral monism is most often compared or identified is the dual aspect theory. The dual aspect theory takes many forms. Its relationship to neutral monism is therefore difficult to discern. All versions of the theory appear to be committed to the view that there are certain substances—god or nature (Spinoza 1677), persons (Strawson 1959), body or brain (Thomas Nagel, 1986), information (a view explored by David Chalmers 1996)—that are intrinsically neither material nor mental. Nevertheless these substances can present themselves under the aspect of the mental and the aspect of the physical. And these aspects are distinct yet inseparable and basic in the sense of being irreducible to each other or to anything else. The neutral monistic note on which this theory seems to open quickly fades as the higher order features of the two aspects are filled in. According to neutral monism a given group of neutral elements is mental or physical depending on which other groups it happens to be connected with. That is, the features of mentality and physicality are independent of each other. A given group of elements might have both features, or one or the other, or neither. It all depends on the company the group keeps. Therefore the two aspects of materiality and mentality are not inseparable. The irreducibility claim fares no better. A group's being mental and/or physical just consists in it's occurring in a certain context. That is, in the neutral monistic framework the features of mentality and physicality are paradigms of reducibility.
The felt need to demarcate neutral monism from the double aspect theory is clearly expressed in the following quotation from William James. In an attempt to fend off false friends he makes it quite clear that he does not wish to be categorized as holding a double aspect view.
The positivism or agnosticism of our times, which is proud of its roots in the natural sciences, is happy to describe itself by the name of monism. But it is a monism in name only. It poses an unknown reality, but tells us that this reality always presents itself under two “aspects,” the conscious aspect and the material aspect, And these two sides remain as irreducible as extension and thought, the fundamental attributes of Spinoza's God. In effect, contemporary monism is pure Spinozism. (James 1905, 109).
And a few pages later he tells us that his version of monism is “absolutely opposed to the so-called bilateral monism of the scientific positivist or Spinozist” (James 1905, 117). Mach's refusal to identify his views with those of Gustav Theodor Fechner—the leading double aspect theorist in 19th century Germany—is similarly forceful:
The view here advocated is different from Fechner's conception of the physical and psychical as two different aspects of one and the same reality. In the first place, our view has no metaphysical background, but corresponds only to the generalized expression of experiences. Again, we refuse to distinguish two different aspects of an unknown tertium quid; the elements given in experience, whose connexion we are investigating, are always the same, and are of only one nature, though they appear, according to the nature of the connexion, at one moment as physical and at another as psychical elements. (Mach 1886, 61)
Questions can be raised about Mach's claim that Fechner's view requires a tertium quid—Fechner is sometimes understood as asserting the identity of the physical and the mental. But Mach's claim that his neutral monism is significantly different from Fechner's view stands, no matter how this interpretative dispute is settled.
A handful of contemporary writers on the metaphysics of mind can be classified as neo-Russellians. They use arguments and arrive at conclusions that bear a striking resemblance to certain features of Russell's (later) neutral monism; but they stop short of endorsing it. The central Russellian idea taken up by all of these authors is the thesis of the inscrutability of matter (so labeled by John Foster in (1982)). It says that science tells us only about the relational, structural features of matter; it is silent about the its intrinsic nature. The thesis suggests that the difficulties we encounter in understanding the relation of mind and matter is due to a faulty, nonscientific picture of matter. Adoption of a scientifically informed, “thinned out,” conception of matter reveals the illusory character of the apparent conflict between mental and physical properties. This core idea is to be found in all of the neo-Russellians. But they all reject Russell's claims about the intrinsic nature of mater—they all reject his way of providing “stuffing for matter” (Armstrong 1961, 189). He held that matter is (partly) constituted by the phenomenal properties that are given to us in experience—properties that, according to him, are basic and neutral.
The agreement that Russell's way of providing stuffing for matter is a failure does not result in a neo-Russellian consensus about how to account for the intrinsic nature of matter. But the disagreement among the neo-Russellians is not complete. Significantly, all neo-Russellians join ranks in rejecting Russell's claim that phenomenal properties are neutral. This view expresses itself in the complaint that Russell's neutral monism is a form of idealism, or panpsychism, or phenomenalism. These are rather different charges but they all express the worry that Russell's “neutral” monism is really a form of mentalistic monism. Inasmuch as the neo-Russellian movement can be seen as embodying an objection to Russell's neutral monism, it is this: Russell attempt to secure a neutral basis in the phenomenally given did not succeed. Instead he ended up with a version of idealism/panpsychism/phenomenalism.
The neo-Russellians deny that phenomenal properties, construed as neutral and basic, form the intrinsic nature of matter. But their reasons for rejecting this suggestion differ, as do the conclusions they reach upon discarding it. Some of them reject both parts of the claim, i.e., they hold that the phenomenal properties are neither neutral nor basic. On this view phenomenal properties are nonphysical mental properties that are, in some sense, dependent on a set of nonmental properties. Accordingly, the philosophers in this group have to specify a new set of properties that satisfy two criteria. These properties must be able to (i) constitute the phenomenal properties and (ii) serve as the intrinsic nature of matter. Other neo-Russellians concede that phenomenal properties are basic but deny that they are neutral. They follow Russell in holding that the phenomenal properties help constitute the intrinsic nature of matter. But, as identity theorists, they hold that these basic phenomenal properties are physical properties. By making phenomenal properties basic, this position circumvents the daunting problem of construing phenomenal properties out of (as yet unknown) nonphenomenal properties. But it does face the difficulty of providing an intelligible account of what it is for a phenomenal property to be physical.
Among contemporary and recent philosophers who either are neo-Russellians or are sympathetic to neo-Russellian ideas we find David Chalmers (the only “mere” sympathizer in the lineup) and Daniel Stoljar. They belong into the group pinning their hope on a third, as yet unknown, set of properties that constitute both mind and matter. Grover Maxwell (and his teacher, Herbert Feigl), Michael Lockwood, and Galen Strawson belong to the second group. While fully aware of Russell's self-understanding as neutral monist, they suggest that he can profitably be read as an identity theorist. In their hands neo-Russellianism turns into a version of physicalism.
Two quite distinct lines of thought lead Chalmers to seriously consider neo-Russellian ideas. One the one hand, he is attracted to “a picture of the world as a world of pure information” (Chalmers 1996, 303). But in the end this picture strikes him as too thin and too inhospitable to the properties that triggered this metaphysical speculation—the phenomenal properties. How can we solidify this world picture while also finding place for the intrinsic natures of the phenomenal properties? One way to do it is to adopt a Russellian strategy:
Perhaps, then, the intrinsic nature required to ground the information states is closely related to the intrinsic nature present in phenomenology. Perhaps one is even constitutive of the other. That way, we get away with a cheap and elegant ontology, and solve the two problems in a single blow. (Chalmers 1996, 304–5)
The other consideration that leads Chalmers to sympathetically consider Russellian ideas is grounded in worry that naturalistic dualism leads to epiphenomenalism. By being made into the categorical bases of the dispositional properties of physics the phenomenal properties are seen to play an indispensable role in the causal process.
But Chalmers acknowledges that the Russellian view—the view that makes the phenomenal into (part of) the construction base—raises worries about idealism and panpsychism. Thus he suggests that we consider a modified version of Russell's doctrine that holds that the intrinsic, nonrelational properties that anchor physical/informational properties are protophenomenal properties. The switch to protophenomenal properties has the result that “the mere instantiation of such a property does not entail experience, but instantiation of numerous such properties could do so jointly” (Chalmers 1996, 154). This lays to rest the panpsychism/idealism worry and makes it plausible to classify this doctrine as a version of neutral monism. But this way of addressing the panpsychism worry raises its own questions: What are these protophenomenal properties and how do they combine into the phenomenal properties? Chalmers sees the problem and states it forthrightly:
It is hard to imagine how this would work (we know that it cannot work for standard physical properties), but these intrinsic properties are quite foreign to our conception. The possibility cannot be ruled out a priori. (Chalmers 1996, 154)
But the neutral monist may think that we can do better than that. If Russell (and James, and Mach) are right in holding that the qualitative/phenomenal properties encountered in experience are neutral, the threat of idealism and panpsychism is empty. In that case there is no need to postulate protophenomenal properties, and the questions about their nature and their relation to phenomenal properties never arise.
Stoljar starts off in a Russellian vein: because physics traffics only in dispositional properties it cannot tell us the whole truth about physical objects: it cannot tell us about the intrinsic nature of the items that have these physical dispositions. At this juncture Russell proposes to conceptualize the intrinsic nature of physical objects in neutral terms. But Stoljar disagrees. As he sees it, the properties that are “required by a complete account of the intrinsic nature of paradigmatic physical objects” (Stoljar 2001, 313) (together with the properties that supervene on these properties) are physical properties. So we have two kinds of physical properties: those physical theory tells us about (t-physical properties), and those that are needed to account for the intrinsic, categorical nature of physical objects (o-physical properties). Notwithstanding their striking differences, t-physical and o-physical properties are physical properties. Stoljar welcomes this result for he develops his two-pronged analysis of the physical in the service of a defense of physicalism.
The Russellian suggestion that qualitative properties might play the role assigned to o-physical properties is brusquely rejected as incompatible with physicalism. “Of course, the categorical o-physical properties are not themselves qualia. But in combination—perhaps also in combination with the t-physicals—they may constitute qualia” (Stoljar 2001, 320). But this answer does raise questions of its own. How are we to think of these o-physical properties? And how do they (plus some t-physical properties) combine to form qualia? Stoljar sees that these are hard questions. He acknowledges that we do not have (and may never have) concepts for his postulated class of physical properties. And, naturally, it is unknown how unknown properties might combine to form qualia.
What is the neutral monist to make of Stoljar's position? The arguments that Stoljar deploys are similar to those that lead Russell to accept neutral monism. The only thing that seems to keep Stoljar from taking the leap is his commitment to physicalism. But those who do not share Stoljar's metaphysical commitments may see his arguments as weakening the case for physicalism while strengthening the case for neutral monism. And those versions of the doctrine that seek the neutral elements in the domain of the given do provide resources with which to address questions raised by the introduction of o-physical properties. The Russellian neutral monist anchors the neutral properties in the given, thereby turning them from unknown (or unknowable) properties into properties that we know directly. And the question of how to construe them out of underlying materials does not arise—they are the material that underlies all else and nothing underlies them.
In his more recent work (Stoljar 2006), Stoljar approaches these issues from a different angle. The ignorance hypothesis—“the hypothesis that we are ignorant of a type of experience-relevant nonexperiential truth” (6)—forms the centerpiece of his epistemic view. He sympathetically presents Russell's speculations about the nature of these hidden experience-relevant properties. But from Stoljar's current vantage point, any attempt to specify the nature of these non-experiential but experience-relevant properties is both unnecessary and risky: “We notice that the more abstract position [that remains silent about the nature of these properties] is vastly more plausible than its Russellian version[special character:mdash]and the reason is precisely that it is so much less committal about the precise content of our ignorance” (122).
Stoljar's aim is to show that the truth of the ignorance hypothesis suffices to block the most powerful anti-physicalist arguments: arguments based on the conceivability of zombies (Chalmers 1996) and the knowledge argument made famous by Frank Jackson's Mary case (Jackson 1982). The Russellian neutral monist will grant that this limited goal may best be served by Stoljar's noncommittal position. But he will also note that this strategy, even if completely successful, will not explain how experience fits into the natural order. Russell's bold speculations about the intrinsic, categorical nature of matter may well turn out to be false. Stoljar is right about this. But, on the other hand, they do promise an intellectually satisfying account of the place of experience in the world.
By identifying phenomenal properties with physical properties the neo-Russellians in the second group arrive at a version of a materialistic identity theory pioneered by Schlick and Feigl (Schlick 1918; Feigl 1958, 1975; see also Stubenberg 1997). Maxwell was a nonmaterialistic physicalist (Maxwell 1978). Strawson used to be an agnostic materialist (Strawson 1994); now he is a realistic materialist monist (Strawson 1999, 2003). And Lockwood is a Russellian Materialist (Lockwood 1998). This profusion of labels must not blind one to the fact that these authors share a vision of what true materialism/physicalism amounts to, a vision that differs profoundly from that presented in the canonical texts on materialism. Strawson puts it most forcefully:
When I say that the mental, and in particular the Experiential, is physical, and endorse the view that “experience is really just neurons firing,” I mean something completely different from what some materialists have apparently meant by saying such things. I don't mean that all aspects of what is going on, in the case of conscious experience, can be described by current physics, or some nonrevolutionary extension of it. Such a view amounts to radical “eliminativism” with respect to consciousness, and is mad. My claim is different. It is that the Experiential (considered just as such)—the feature of reality we have to do with when we consider experiences specifically and solely in respect of the Experiential character they have for those who have them as they have them—that “just is” physical. (Strawson 2003, 51–2)
All three authors follow Russell in emphasizing our profound ignorance of the intrinsic nature of matter. Physics and physiology “provide us with no knowledge (or precious little) about the intrinsic properties of individual brain events” (Maxwell 1978, 395). As our knowledge of matter shrinks our freedom to speculate about the relationship of mind and mater grows. Having emphasized our ignorance of the intrinsic nature of matter, Maxwell continues: Thus the possibility is entirely open that some of these brain events just are our twinges of pain our feelings of joy and sorrow, our thoughts that two plus two equals four, etc.“ (Maxwell 1978, 395) Strawson thinks along parallel lines when he says:
Many take the [mind-body problem] to be the problem of how mental phenomena can be physical phenomena given what we already know about the nature of the physical. But those who think this are already lost. For the fact is that we have no good reason to think that we know anything about the physical that gives us any reason to find any problem in the idea that mental phenomena are physical phenomena. (Strawson 2003, 50)
And Lockwood pursues this idea further by hinting at the reasons why one might be tempted to perform this, prima facie, unlikely identification of mental properties with the intrinsic features of the physical. Consciousness “provides us with a kind of ‘window’ on to our brain, making possible a transparent grasp of a tiny corner of a materiality that is in general opaque to us” (Lockwood 1989, 159). More recently he has spelled out this thought as follows:
Do we therefore have no genuine knowledge of the intrinsic character of the physical world? So it might seem. But, according to the line of thought I am now pursuing, we do, in a very limited way, have access to content in the material world as opposed merely to abstract casual structure, since there is a corner of the physical world that we know, not merely by inference from the deliverances of our five sense, but because we are that corner. It is the bit within our skulls, which we know by introspection. In being aware, for example, of the qualia that seemed so troublesome for the materialist, we glimpse the intrinsic nature of what, concretely, realizes the formal structure that a correct physics would attribute to the matter of our brains. In awareness, we are, so to speak, getting an insider's look at our own brain activity. (Lockwood 1998, 88)
This, then, is the materialist version of Russell's neutral monism. But the neutral monist who looks for the reasons that persuade these philosophers to recast Russell's view in a materialist vein finds little. Maxwell (1976, 354, fn. 25) and Strawson (1994, 97, fn. 6) make brief remarks to the effect that neutral monism is phenomenalistic. Lockwood does not make this claim—in fact he has written the best reply to the ubiquitous “phenomenalism suspicion” (Lockwood 1981). Strawson further alleges that neutral monists are committed to the “indefensible claim that experience itself might be mere appearance, not really real at all” (Strawson 1994, 53). His thought is that neutral monism holds that “experiential and nonexperiential phenomena…are mere appearances of a single and single-natured substance whose nature we do not know” (Strawson 1994, 98). While this objection does have force against certain versions of neutral monism—e.g., a version that might be developed on the basis of Chalmers speculations about protophenomenal properties—it does not apply to Russell's version of the doctrine. Rather than reducing away experience, Russell understands it as a neutral and basic, i.e., unreducible, feature of reality.
On the whole it appears that the decision to adopt a materialistic reading of Russell's neutral monism is more an expression of a commitment to materialism than a decision based on weighty arguments against neutral monism. Strawson is disarmingly candid about this. On page one of Mental Reality he informs the reader that he assumes that there is a physical world and that he assumes monism and that these two assumptions amount to the assumption of materialism. (Strawson 1994, 1) It is this kind of prior commitment to a world view that makes it so tempting to interpret Russell as a materialist. While the neutral monist can respect this posture, it is a sentiment he is under no obligation to share.
The extant versions of neutral monism are complex doctrines combining a core of neutral monistic ideas with a rich mixture of philosophical background assumptions, many of them quite idiosyncratic.
Some of the more striking and disconcerting features of a given version of neutral monism—Russell's final version, say—are therefore not flaws of neutral monism but of the hodgepodge of ideas that has come to be known by this name.
The following claims, all of which feature prominently in Russell's discussion of neutral monism, may serve to illustrate the point: the only thing one ever sees is ones own brain (therefore the only brain the neurophysiologist observes while performing open brain surgery her patient is her own brain); sensations—colors, sounds, smells, etc.—are not mental but neutral; ones thoughts are in ones head; the electrons in ones brain are composed of thoughts. These are the sorts of claims that have tended to give neutral monism a bad name. But they form no part of neutral monism nor do they follow from it. They are grounded solely in the philosophical background assumptions on which Russell relies in working out his version of the doctrine.
The point of dwelling on the content and the role that these philosophical background assumptions have played in the development of the extant versions of neutral monism is twofold. First, a clear understanding of these assumptions makes it possible to evaluate them as well as the complex neutral monistic doctrines they helped shape. Second, a clear understanding of these assumptions makes it possible to reveal the minimal core of neutral monism by subtracting them from the complex doctrines available in the literature.
Given the present philosophical climate, it seems unlikely that a fuller, philosophically and historically more adequate, understanding of the extant versions of mainstream neutral monism will result in their revival. But for those who remain disinclined toward dualism while having no sympathy for the currently fashionable monisms, neutral monism, stripped of all its extraneous accretions, may afford an interesting framework to explore. Reduced to its minimal core (see the opening paragraph and the “Introduction”), neutral monism carries few commitments and offers great flexibility of development.
Sayre's strictly informational version of the doctrine as well as the ideas recently explored by Chalmers (protophenomenal properties) and Stoljar (o-physical properties) hint at the existence of a great variety of possible hypotheses about the nature of ultimate reality awaiting further exploration. The fixation on the hypothesis of the experiential, given-based, nature of ultimate reality, so characteristic of the mainstream versions of neutral monism, is thereby overcome. The discussion of the notion of neutrality (begun in the section “The Neutral Entities”) provides additional evidence for the belief in the plasticity of the neutral monist framework. As additional notions of neutrality become available the number of candidates for inclusion in the domain of neutral entities may grow. And the exploration of the notions of construction and reduction may prove to be of even greater importance in turning neutral monism into a viable alternative. The prospects of carrying out the neutral monistic constructions of mind and matter are tied to the availability of sufficiently flexible notions of construction or reduction. In the exploration of this issue the neutral monist can join forces with his fellow reductionists.
While some of us may think that the cause of neutral monism is best served by adopting the motto “Back to Russell,” the gist of these remarks has been to encourage a complete break with the mainstream tradition of neutral monism. The elegant simplicity of neutral monism is barely discernible under the enormous amount of old-fashioned philosophical baggage with which this theory has been burdened. The best strategy may be to disregard this tradition and to focus on the minimalist but very flexible framework afforded by the core claims of neutral monism. Falling far short of embodying a theory, these core claims provide only theory schema—a schema that can be filled in in quite diverse and unanticipated ways. Viewed from this perspective, neutral monism may still hold some promise, even if it should be true that the mainstream versions of the doctrine have been justly forgotten.
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[Please contact author with suggestions.]
consciousness | dualism | Hume, David | James, William | logical constructions | mind/brain identity theory | panpsychism | perception: epistemological problems of | perception: the problem of | physicalism | qualia | Russell, Bertrand | sense-data
I would like to thank David Chalmers for the help he gave me while writing this piece. His many suggestions, all of them helpful and constructive, and his encouragement have been invaluable.