Thought experiments are devices of the imagination used to investigate the nature of things. They are used for diverse reasons in a variety of areas, including economics, history, mathematics, philosophy, and the sciences, especially physics. Most often thought experiments are communicated in narrative form, frequently with diagrams. Thought experiments should be distinguished from thinking about experiments, from merely imagining any experiments to be conducted outside the imagination, and from psychological experiments with thoughts. They should also be distinguished from counterfactual reasoning in general, as they seem to require an experimental element, which seems to explain the impression that something is experienced in a thought experiment. In other words, though many call any counter-factual or hypothetical situation a thought experiment, this seems too encompassing. It seems right to demand that they also be visualized (or perhaps smelled, tasted, heard, touched); there should be something experimental about a thought experiment.
The primary philosophical challenge of thought experiments is simple: How can we learn about reality (if we can at all), just by thinking? More precisely, are there thought experiments that enable us to acquire new knowledge about the intended realm of investigation without new empirical data? If so, where does the new information come from if not from contact with the realm of investigation under consideration? Finally, how can we distinguish good from bad instances of thought experiments? These questions seem urgent with respect to scientific thought experiments, because most philosophers and historians of science “recognize them as an occasionally potent tool for increasing our understanding of nature. […] Historically their role is very close to the double one played by actual laboratory experiments and observations. First, thought experiments can disclose nature's failure to conform to a previously held set of expectations. Second, they can suggest particular ways in which both expectation and theory must henceforth be revised.” (Kuhn, 1977, p. 241 and 261) The questions are urgent regarding philosophical thought experiments, because they play an important role in philosophical discourse. Philosophy without thought experiments seems almost hopeless.
There is widespread agreement that thought experiments play a central role both in philosophy and in the natural sciences. General acceptance of the importance of some of the well-known thought experiments in the natural sciences, like Maxwell's demon, Einstein's elevator or Schrödinger's cat. Probably more often than not, these, and many other thought experiments have led the careful analysis of their epistemic powers to the conclusion that we should not portray science as an exclusively empirical activity (see Winchester, 1990, p. 79).
The 17th century saw some of its most brilliant practitioners in Galileo, Descartes, Newton, and Leibniz. And in our own time, the creation of quantum mechanics and relativity are almost unthinkable without the crucial role played by thought experiments. Much of ethics, philosophy of language, and philosophy of mind is based on the results of thought experiments as well, including Searle's Chinese room, Putnam's twin earth, and Jackson's Mary the colour scientist. Philosophy, even more than the sciences, would be severely impoverished without thought experiments, which suggests that a unified theory of thought experiments is desirable to account for them in both the sciences and the humanities (see Boniolo, 1997; Cooper, 2005, pp. 329–330; Gähde, 2000). That is to say: since the sciences, especially physics, and philosophy both make use of thought experiments, then, other things being equal, a unified account seems desirable.
There have been attempts to define “thought experiment”, but likely it will be better to leave the term loosely characterized, so as not to prejudice the ongoing investigation. Of course, we need to have some idea as to what thought experiments are to guide a proper philosophical analysis (see Haggqvist, 2009), but this does not mean we need to begin with a technical definition, specifying necessary and sufficient conditions. In fact, many of the most important concepts we deal with remain rather loosely defined when philosophical inquiry begins, e.g., religion or democracy. Luckily, there are plenty of examples to refer to in order to circumscribe our subject matter well enough. As well as those already mentioned, there are Newton's bucket, Heisenberg's gamma-ray microscope, Einstein's elevator, Leibniz's mill, Parfit's people who split like amoebas, and Thomson's violinist. Everyone is probably familiar with some of these. Less familiar thought experiments include “the dome”, a relatively new thought experiment and probably the simplest example of indeterminism in Newtonian physics. Imagine a mass sitting on a radially symmetric surface in a gravitational field. Guided by Newton's laws of motion one comes to realize that the mass can either remain at rest for all times, or spontaneously move in an arbitrary direction (see Norton, 2008). This thought experiment triggers a number of very interesting questions concerning the nature of Newtonian theory, the meaning of “physical”, and the role of idealizations in physics. And, of course, does it show what it claims?
In the following we will first highlight some of the most common features of thought experiments. A proposal follows for classifying thought experiments, before reviewing the state of the debate on thought experimenting, preceded by some remarks about the history of philosophical inquiry into thought experiments. We conclude by highlighting some of the recent developments surrounding the so-called laboratory of the mind.
- 1. Common Features of Thought Experiments
- 2. Types of Thought Experiments: A Taxonomy
- 3. The Debate Over Thought Experiments
- 4. Recent Developments
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Thought experiments are conducted for diverse reasons in a variety of areas, be it in the moral, mathematical, or natural realm (see, e.g., De Mey, 2006). We leave aside those that simply entertain. Some thought experiments fulfil a specific function within a theory (see Boorsboom et al., 2002). Others are executed because it is impossible to run the experimental scenario in the real world (see Sorensen, 1992, pp. 200–202). Sometimes thought experiments help to illustrate and clarify very abstract states of affairs, thereby accelerating the process of understanding (see Behmel, 2001). Again others serve as examples in conceptual analysis (see Cohnitz, 2006). Most attention is received by those that are taken to provide evidence in favour of or against a theory, putting them on a par with real-world experiments (see Gendler, 2004). The different ways to use thought experiments, of course, do not exclude one another.
Theorizing about thought experiments usually turns on the details or the patterns of specific cases. Familiarity with a wide range of examples is crucial for commentators. We will provide a few. One of the most beautiful early examples of thought experimenting (in Lucretius, De Rerum Natura 1.951–987; see Bailey, 1950, pp. 58–59) attempts to show that space is infinite: if there is a purported boundary to the universe, we can toss a spear at it. If the spear flies through, it isn't a boundary after all; if the spear bounces back, then there must be something beyond the supposed edge of space, a cosmic wall that stopped the spear, a wall that is itself in space. Either way, there is no edge of the universe; space is infinite.
This example nicely illustrates many of the most common features of thought experimenting: we visualize some situation that we have set up in the imagination; we let it run or we carry out an operation; we see what happens; finally, we draw a conclusion. It also illustrates their fallibility. Since the time of Lucretius, we've learned how to conceptualize space so that it is both finite and unbounded. Imagine a circle, which is a one dimensional space. As we move around, there is no edge, but it is nevertheless finite. The universe might be a three-dimensional version of this topology.
Figure 1. “Welcome to the edge of the Universe”
Often a real experiment that is the analogue of a thought experiment is impossible for physical, technological, ethical, or financial reasons (see, e.g., Sorensen, 1992, pp. 200–202); but this needn't be a defining condition of thought experiments. The main point is that we seem able to get a grip on nature just by thinking, and therein lies the great interest for philosophy. How is it possible to learn apparently new things about nature without new empirical data?
One possible answer is to claim that we possess a great store of “instinctive knowledge” picked up from experience. This is the solution that Ernst Mach offered (see Mach, 1897 and 1905; for most instructive assessments of his views see Kühne, 2006, pp. 165–202, and Sorensen, 1992, pp. 51–75). One of Mach's favourite examples of thought experimenting is due to Simon Stevin (see Mach, 1883, pp. 48–58). When a chain is draped over a double frictionless plane, as in Fig. 2a, how will it move? Add some links as in Fig. 2b. Now it is obvious. The initial setup must have been in static equilibrium. Otherwise, we would have a perpetual motion machine; and according to our experience-based “instinctive knowledge”, says Mach, this is impossible. We do not have to perform the experiment in the real world, which we could not do, anyway, since it would require a perfectly frictionless plane. The outcome seems compelling.
Figure 2(a) and 2(b) “How will it move?”
Judith Thomson provided one of the most striking and effective thought experiments in the moral realm (see Thomson, 1971). Her example is aimed at a popular anti-abortion argument that goes something like this: the fetus is an innocent person. All innocent persons have a right to life. Abortion results in the death of a fetus. Therefore, abortion is morally wrong. In her thought experiment we are asked to imagine a famous violinist falling into a coma. The society of music lovers determines from medical records that you and you alone can save the violinist's life by being hooked up to him for nine months. The music lovers break into your home while you are asleep and hook the unconscious (and unknowing, hence innocent) violinist to you. You may want to unhook him, but you are then faced with this argument put forward by the music lovers: The violinist is an innocent person. All innocent persons have a right to life. Unhooking him will result in his death. Therefore, unhooking him is morally wrong.
However, the argument, even though it has the same structure as the anti-abortion argument, does not seem convincing in this case. You would be very generous to remain attached for nine months, but you are not morally obligated to do so. The parallel with the abortion case is evident. Thomson's thought experiment is effective in distinguishing two concepts that had previously been run together: “right to life” and “right to what is needed to sustain life.” The fetus and the violinist might each have the former, but it is not evident that either has the latter. The upshot is that even if the fetus has a right to life (which Thomson does not believe but allows for the sake of the argument), it may still be morally permissible to abort.
Those opposed to Thomson's view have two options. They can either dismiss her thought experiment as a useless fiction. In fact, thought experiments as a method in ethics have their critics (see, e.g., Dancy, 1985 ). Alternatively, they can provide a different version of the same scenario to challenge the conclusion. It is a very intriguing feature of thought experiments that they can be “rethought” (see Bokulich, 2001).
Like arguments, thought experiments can be criticized in different ways. Perhaps the set up is faulty; perhaps the conclusions drawn from the thought experiment are not justified. Similar criticisms can arise in real experiments. Counter thought experiments are perhaps another form of criticism. They do not target the premises or conclusions involved in a particular thought experiment but question the phenomenon, i.e. the non-propositional heart of an imagined scenario (see Brown, 2007a). For example, Daniel Dennett is convinced that Frank Jackson's Mary thought experiment is poor evidence to oppose physicalism in philosophy of mind. Mary, who knows everything physics can possibly know about colours but grew up in a colourless environment, allegedly learns something new when she sees a red tomato for the first time. Now she knows what its like to experience red. This is an argument for qualia as something over and above the physical. Instead of a red tomato Dennett, in his version of the thought experiment, presents Mary with a bright blue banana. In his version of the story (which seems just as plausible as Jackson's), Mary balks and says she is being tricked, since she knows that banana are yellow, and this, says Mary is a consequence of knowing everything physical about colour perception. Mary does not learn anything new when she sees coloured objects for the first time, so there is no case agains physicalism after all.
Clearly, thought experiments are characterized by an intriguing plasticity, and this raises the interesting question of what it is that preserves the identity of a thought experiment. Replacing a red tomato with a blue banana might still leave us with the same thought experiment––slightly revised. But, at what point do we get a new thought experiment? This is not merely a question about conceptual vagueness. It helps to facilitate a discussion of the intuitively most plausible view about the cognitive efficacy of thought experiments, namely that thought experiments are identical with arguments. In light of cases where the discussion of one and the same thought experiment played an important role in settling a dispute, the following problem arises: how can one and the same thought experiment support opposing views about a particular matter if the arguments that correspond to the different versions of the thought experiment that were entertained by the disputing parties are significantly different? The dilemma is: we could say that if there is more than one argument then there is more than one thought experiment involved in the dispute. But, if that is true then the disputing parties simply talked pass each other. One party presented an argument that the other party ignored while presenting their own. Alternatively, we can say that one thought experiment can correspond to many different arguments. But, if that is true then it becomes unclear in what non-trivial sense thought experiments are supposed to be identical with arguments (see Bishop, 1999).
The plasticity of thought experiments coheres with another feature of thought experiments, namely that they seem to have “evidential significance only historically and locally, i.e., when and where premises that attribute evidential significance to it […] are endorsed.” (McAllister, 1996, p. 248)
The simplest taxonomy for thought experiments is to classify them according to their use. But, of course, there are many other ways of classifying thought experiments: science vs. philosophy, normative (moral or epistemic) vs. factual, and so on.
Karl Popper's taxonomy distinguishes between heuristic (to illustrate a theory), critical (against a theory) and apologetic (in favour of a theory) thought experiments (see Popper, 1959). His case in favour of a critical and against an apologetic use of thought experiments is very limited. He focuses exclusively on quantum physics and doesn't really say much to address the primary epistemological challenge presented by the success of critical thought experiments.
In the following, we will present a preliminary taxonomy (see Brown, 1986, pp. 4–11) that has not gone unchallenged (see Norton, 1993b). It is less rough than Popper's and only limited in that it focuses largely on the class of those thought experiments that are taken to function in theory choice. The main division is constructive vs. destructive and resembles Popper's distinction between apologetic and critical thought experiments. Each of these is subject to further divisions.
Among destructive thought experiments, the following subtypes can be identified: the simplest of these is to draw out a contradiction in a theory, thereby refuting it. The first part of Galileo's famous falling bodies example does this. It shows that in Aristotle's account, a composite body (cannon ball and musket ball attached) would have to fall both faster and slower than the cannon ball alone.
A second subtype is constituted by those thought experiments that aim to show that the theory in question is in conflict with other beliefs that we hold. Schrödinger's well-known cat paradox, for instance, does not show that quantum theory (as interpreted by Bohr) is internally inconsistent (see Schrödinger 1935, p. 812; translation: Trimmer, 1980, p. 328): “A cat is penned up in a steel chamber, along with the following diabolical device (which must be secured against direct interference by the cat): in a Geiger counter there is a tiny bit of radioactive substance, so small, that perhaps in the course of one hour one of the atoms decays, but also, with equal probability, perhaps none; if it happens, the counter tube discharges and through a relay releases a hammer which shatters a small flask of hydrocyanic acid. If one has left this entire system to itself for an hour, one would say that the cat still lives if meanwhile no atom has decayed. The first atomic decay would have poisoned it. The q-function of the entire system would express this by having in it the living and the dead cat (pardon the expression) mixed or smeared out in equal parts.” This thought experiment shows that quantum theory (as interpreted by Bohr) is in conflict with some very powerful common sense beliefs we have about macro-sized objects such as cats––they cannot be both dead and alive in any sense whatsoever. The bizarreness of superpositions in the atomic world is worrisome enough, says Schrödinger, but when it implies that same bizarreness at an everyday level, it is intolerable.
There is a third subtype of negative thought experiments, namely when, in effect, a central assumption or premiss of the thought experiment itself is undermined. For example, as we have seen above, Thomson showed with her thought experiment that “right to life” and “right to what is needed to sustain life” had been run together. When distinguished, the argument against abortion is negatively affected.
A fourth sub-type of negative thought experiments are “counter thought experiments” (see Brown, 2007a). Norton very usefully introduces a related idea: “thought-experiment/anti-thought-experiment pairs” (see Norton, 2004, pp. 45–49). Above, we have already encountered this subtype in our discussion of Lucretius' spear-thought experiment, and with Dennett's reply to Frank Jackson's much discussed Mary the colour scientist thought experiment. Here we would like to add one more example, namely Mach's counter thought experiment against absolute space. In his Principia Mathematica, Newton offers a pair of thought experiments as evidence for absolute space. One is the bucket with water climbing the wall, the other is a pair of spheres joined by a cord that maintained its tension in otherwise empty space. The explanation for these phenomena, argues Newton, is absolute space: the bucket and the joined spheres are rotating with respect to space itself. In response, Mach modifies the scenario a little bit and argue that, contra Newton, the two spheres would move toward one another thanks to the tension in the cord, and if we rotated a very thick, massive ring around a stationary bucket, we would see the water climb the bucket wall (see for further discussion of Mach's counter thought experiment to Newton's: Kühne, 2006, pp. 191–202). In short, the point of Mach's counter thought experiments is to describe the phenomena of the thought experiments' scenarios differently, that is, to declare that different things would happen. Mach's counter thought experiment undermines our confidence in Newton's. Absolute space might be a plausible explanation of the phenomena in Newton's thought experiments, but now, in light of Mach's counter thought experiment, we're not so sure of the phenomena itself and thus of the idea of absolute space.
Figure 3. Stages in the bucket experiment
Figure 4. Two spheres held by a cord in otherwise empty space
To be effective, counter thought experiments needn't be very plausible at all. In a court of law, the jury will convict provided guilt is established “beyond a reasonable doubt.” A common defence strategy is to provide an alternative account of the evidence that has just enough plausibility to put the prosecution's case into some measure of doubt. That is sufficient to undermine it. A counter thought experiment need only do that much to be effective.
As for the second type of thought experiments, the constructive ones, there are many ways they could provide positive support for a theory. One of these is to provide a kind of illustration that makes a theory's claims clear and evident. In such cases thought experiments serve as a kind of heuristic aid. A result may already be well established, but the thought experiment can lead to a very satisfying sense of understanding. In his Principia, Newton provides a wonderful example showing how the moon is kept in its orbit in just the same way as an object falls to the earth (see Ducheyne, 2006, pp. 435–437). He illustrates this by means of a cannon shooting a cannon ball further and further. In the limit, the earth curves away as fast as the ball falls, with the eventual result being that the cannon ball will return to the spot where it was fired, and, if not impeded, will go around again and again. This is what the moon is doing. We could arrive at the same conclusion through calculation. But Newton's thought experiment provides that elusive understanding. It's a wonderful example of the “aha effect” that is so typical of thought experiments.
Figure 5. “The shot heard around the world”
Thomson's violinist showed that abortion could be morally permissible even when the fetus has a right to life. Similarly, Einstein's elevator showed that light will bend in a gravitational field, because according to the principle of equivalence, there is no difference between such a frame of reference and one that is accelerating in free space; the laws of physics are the same in all. Suppose then, an observer is inside an elevator sealed off from the outside so that the observer cannot tell whether he is in a gravitational field or accelerating. If it were accelerating, and if a light beam were to enter one side, then, due to the elevator's motion, the beam would appear to drop or curve down as it crossed the elevator. Consequently, it would have to do the same thing if the elevator was in a gravitational field. Therefore, gravity ‘bends’ light.
Maxwell's demon showed that entropy could be decreased: The second law of thermodynamics implies that heat won't pass from a cold body to a hot one. In classical thermodynamics this law is quite strict; but in Maxwell's kinetic theory of heat there is a probability, though extremely small, of such an event happening. Some thought this a reductio ad absurdum of Maxwell's theory. To show how it is possible to violate the second law, Maxwell imagined a tiny creature who controls a door between two chambers. Fast molecules from the cold box are let into the hot box, and slow molecules from the hot are allowed into the cold. Thus, there will be an increase in the average speed in the hot box and a decrease in the average speed of molecules in the cold. Since, on Maxwell's theory, heat is just the average speed of the molecules, there has been a flow of heat from a cold body to a hot one.
Parfit's splitting persons shows that survival is a more important notion than identity when considering personhood (for a critical discussion see Gendler, 2002). We say they “show” such and such, but, “purport to show” might be better, since some of these thought experiments are quite contentious. What they have in common is that they aim to establish something positive. Unlike destructive thought experiments, they are not trying to demolish an existing theory, though they may do that in passing. In principle, given the fact that thought experiments can be rethought (see Bokulich, 2001), and that the evidential significance is dependent on historical and local accomplishments (see McAllister, 1996), it cannot be irrelevant to identify the intention of the thought experimenter, if one wants to determine the type of a thought experiment: “An imaginary experiment should be judged on its specific purpose.” (Krimsky, 1973, p. 331)
Arguably, thought experimenting has been practiced since the time of the Pre-Socratics. They “invented thought experimentation as a cognitive procedure and practiced it with great dedication and versatility.” (Rescher, 2005, p. 2; see also Diamond, 2002, pp. 229–232; Glas, 1999; Ierodiakonou, 2005; Irvine, 1991; Rescher, 1991 and 2005, pp. 61–72). It seems that medieval science relied heavily on thought experiments (see King, 1991). According to Grant (2007, 201), during the late Middle Ages “the imagination became a formidable instrument in natural philosophy and theology in ways that would have astonished” ancient Greek natural philosophers, especially Aristotle. “ With a few exceptions that involved problems of motion, “the scholastics” made no meaningful effort to transform their hypothetical conclusions into specific knowledge about the physical world. They did, however, assume that although these hypothetical conclusions were naturally impossible, God could produce them supernaturally if he wished.” There is a class of medieval thought experiments that does not rely on counterfactuals but also depends on theological assumptions to study matters non-theological, namely those thought experiments in late medieval epistemology involving angels (see Perler, 2008).
The 17th century saw some of its most brilliant practitioners in Galileo, Descartes, Newton, and Leibniz (see Brown, 1986; Ducheyne, 2006; Gendler, 1998; Koyré, 1968; Kuhn, 1964, pp. 246–252; McAllister, 1996 and 2005; McMullin, 1985; Palmieri, 2003 and 2005; Prudovsky, 1989). Noteworthy also is the important role thought experiments play in Darwin's case for evolution by natural selection (see Lennox, 1991). And in our own time, the creation of quantum mechanics (see Kühne, 2005, pp. 280–317; Popper, 1959; Stöltzner, 2003; Van Dyck, 2003; Yourgrau, 1967) and relativistic physics (see Brown, 1987; Kassung, 2004; Kühne, 2005, pp. 227–279; Norton, 1991 and 1993) are almost unthinkable without the crucial function of thought experiments.
Mach is commonly credited with introducing the term “thought experiments” (Gadankenexperimente). “This view is incorrect, however! […] it can be substantiated that it was used […] already in 1811.” (Witt-Hansen, 1976, p. 48; see also Buzzoni, 2008, pp. 14–15; 61–65; Cohnitz, 2008; Kühne, 2005, pp. 92–224; Moue et al., 2006, p. 63). This is to say that the term “thought experiment” derived from the Danish “Tankeexperiment.” And before thought experimentation was introduced by word, we can find in the work of the German philosopher-scientist Georg Lichtenberg (1742–1799) a tacit theory of “experiments with thoughts and ideas.” These experiments help to overcome habits of thought that can inhibit scientific progress, and make possible an enlightened philosophy (see Schildknecht, 1990, pp. 21; 123–169; Schöne, 1982). Lichtenberg's “aphoristic experiments” (see Stern, 1963, pp. 112–126) reflect “that Lichtenberg's scientific preoccupations are the formal and thematic prolegomena to his work as a literary artist.” (Stern, 1963, p. 126) Lichtenberg's reflections on thought experimentation resemble those of Popper and Kuhn, and it is plausible to think of him as one important figure of the very first period in the history of philosophical inquiry into thought experiments (see Fehige and Stuart, 2014).
Accordingly, the modern history of the philosophical investigation into thought experiments can be divided into four stages: in the 18th and 19th century the awareness of the importance of thought experiments in philosophy and science emerges. In addition to Lichtenberg, special mention should be made of Novalis (see Daiber, 2001; Fehige, 2013), and Hans-Christian Ørsted. The topic reemerges in a more systematic manner at the beginning of the 20th century with little relation to the attempts made at the first stage. The stakeholders of the second stage were Pierre Duhem, Mach, and Alexius Meinong (see Duhem, 1913, pp. 304–311; Mach, 1883, pp. 48–58, 1897 and 1905; Meinong, 1907). A third stage, probably due to the rediscovery of the importance of scientific practice for a proper understanding of science, followed in the first part of the second half of the 20th century. Again, the contributions of this stage bear little relation to the two previous stages. While the third period has seen a number of noteworthy contributions (Cole, 1983; Dancy, 1985; Dennett, 1985; Fodor, 1964; Helm; Gilbert, 1985; Helm et al., 1985; Krimsky, 1973; McMullin, 1985; Myers, 1986; Poser, 1984; Prudovsky, 1989; Rehder, 1980a,b; Yourgrau, 1962 and 1967), the protagonists of this period were Alexandre Koyré, Thomas S. Kuhn and Karl Popper. The ongoing philosophical exploration of thought experiments began in the 1980s, and marks the fourth stage. Arguably, it has been the most prolific one of all four stages. With some very important sign-postings (Horowitz; Massey (eds.), 1991; Sorensen, 1992a, b, c; Wilkes, 1988) the ongoing discussion took off after 1991. James Robert Brown and John D. Norton (see for a concise statement of each position Brown, 2004a; Norton, 2004) have carried on a debate that others find useful, especially to contrast with their own alternative accounts. “The views of Brown and Norton represent the extremes of platonic rationalism and classic empiricism, respectively.” (Moue et al., 2006, p. 69) They will be described below.
Not all of the rapidly growing contributions address what we deem to be the primary philosophical challenge of thought experimenting. Still, an astonishing array of different types of views in response to this challenge has already become manifest. We cannot discuss here all the authors who are representative for each type of view which we will identify, including: the skeptical objection, the intuition based account, the argument view, conceptual constructivism, experimentalism, and the mental model account.
We begin with the skeptical objection. Of course, particular thought experiments have been contested. But for the most part, thought experimenting in the sciences has been cheerfully accepted. Duhem, the great historian of physics, is almost alone in what has been understood as an outright condemnation of scientific thought experiments (see Duhem, 1913, pp. 304–311). A thought experiment is no substitute for a real experiment, he claimed, and should be forbidden in science, including science education. However, in view of the important role of actual thought experiments in the history of physics — from Galileo's falling bodies, to Newton's bucket, to Einstein's elevator — it is unlikely that anyone will feel or should feel much sympathy for Duhem's strictures.
Philosophers can be as critical as Duhem when it comes to thought experimenting in their own field (see Peijnenburg; Atkinson, 2003; Thagard, 2014; Stuart, 2014). At least thought experiments in science, the skeptic claims, can be tested by physical experiment. However, this is clearly false, since frictionless planes and universes empty of all material bodies cannot be produced in any laboratory. The results of philosophical thought experiments, however, cannot be even approximately tested. Skeptics say little about why thought experiments enjoy such popularity in philosophy. We are inclined to say that skeptics underestimate the importance of thought experiments for the creative mind in any field.
Few are outright skeptics, however. Many take a more ambiguous stance. Sören Häggqvist, for example, has developed a normative model for philosophical thought experiments (see Häggqvist, 1996 and 2009). Surprisingly, none of the commonly accepted philosophical thought experiments named above satisfies his model. And the process of identifying successful thought experiments is only the first step in addressing what we consider the primary philosophical challenge of thought experiments. It gets much messier once we begin to ask exactly how reliable “successful” thought experiments are. Granted, there is some justice in worrying about the reliability of philosophical thought experiments (see, e.g., Klee, 2008). This might be true for ethics (see Dancy, 1985, Jackson, 1992), conceptual analysis (see Fodor, 1964), and philosophy of mind: “A popular strategy in philosophy is to construct a certain sort of thought experiment I call intuition pump. […] Intuition pumps are often abused, though seldom deliberately.” (Dennett, 1985, p. 12) The claim by Dennett and others is that thought experiments too often rest on prejudice and faulty common sense; they are inherently conservative, while real science will likely result in highly-counterintuitive outcomes.
Frequently discussed is the skeptical challenge raised by Kathleen Wilkes. She expresses a deep suspicion of scenarios such as Derek Parfit's people splitting like an amoeba (see Parfit, 1987; Gendler 2002). Wilkes wants philosophy “to use science fact rather than science fiction or fantasy” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 1), and therefore to refrain from using thought experiments because they are “both problematic and positively misleading.” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 2) She claims that thought experiments about personal identity in particular often fail to provide the background conditions against which the experiment is set (see Wilkes, 1988, p. 7). She thinks we would not know what to say if we encountered someone who split like an amoeba. She insists that a legitimate thought experiment must not violate the known laws of nature. We do agree with Wilkes that underdetermination can be a problem. But instead of dismissing thought experiments in philosophy we should consider it a crucial factor in assessing the quality of a thought experiment (see Rescher, 2005, pp. 9–14). The more detailed the imaginary scenario in the relevant aspects, the better the thought experiment (see Brendel, 2004, pp. 97–99; Häggqvist, 1996, p. 28).
We also agree that the inferences drawn in thought experimenting are highly problematic if the hypothetical scenario “is inadequately described.” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 8) But Wilkes seems to think that the lack of description is unavoidable, which supposedly amounts to a reason against philosophical thought experimenting on personal identity because persons are not natural kinds. This makes it impossible to fill in necessary information to make the thought experiment work given its unavoidable underdetermination. Wilkes thinks that “whenever we are examining the ranges of concepts that do not pick on natural kinds, the problem of deciding what is or what is not ‘relevant’ to the success of the thought experiment is yet more problematic than the same question as it arises in science; and, unlike the scientific problem, it may not even have an answer in principle.” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 15) She adds that scientific laws — especially those describing biological kinds like human beings — “are not disjoint and independent, detachable from one another […]. They are interrelated, to varying degrees of course.” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 29) This implies, for example, that “a full psychophysiological account of the processes of human perception must at some stage link up with part at least of linguistic ability; for we typically see things under a certain description, and that description may be a very sophisticated one.” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 29) These considerations have her rule out experiments that challenge the human monopoly of personhood. No thought experiment, claims Wilkes, is well conceived if it involves non-human animals or computers as persons. But also those thought experiments can be ruled out which involve the “fission or fusion of humans” because it is not theoretically possible. “The total impact of the sum of laws that group us together as human beings (a natural kind category) precludes our splitting into two […] or fusing with someone else.” (Wilkes, 1988, p. 36)
One can ascertain here all too well the inherent difficulties in thinking about personal identity and the limited benefit some thought experiments might have for what is deemed the proper metaphysics of personal identity. Nevertheless, good reasons have been given in favour of the use of thought experiments about personal identity (see Beck, 2006; Kolak, 1993; Hershenov, 2008). We also feel that the problems about thought experiments on personal identity reveal more about the intricate nature of the subject than about the usefulness of philosophical thought experiments. And, disregarding other shortcomings in Wilkes' skepticism (for further discussion of Wilkes' views see Beck, 1992; Brooks, 1994; Focquaert, 2003; Häggqvist, 1996, pp. 27–34), her suggestion that thought experimental scenarios would have to satisfy current scientific knowledge about the relevant entities featured in a thought experiment is highly implausible. We learn a great deal about the world and our theories when we wonder, for instance, what would have happened after the big bang if the law of gravity had been an inverse cube law instead of an inverse square. Would stars have failed to form? Reasoning about such a scenario is perfectly coherent and very instructive, even though it violates a law of nature.
To some extent we should share Wilkes's concern that thought experimenting seems to be constrained only by relevant logical impossibilities and what seems intuitively acceptable. This is indeed problematic because intuitions can be highly misleading and relevant logical impossibilities fairly ungrounded if they cannot be supplemented by relevant theoretical impossibilities based on current science in order to avoid the jump into futile fantasy. But in order to dismiss thought experimenting as a useful philosophical tool one has to show that intuition cannot be a source of knowledge and that an epistemic tool should be useless because there is a serious chance it can fail. Timothy Williamson has argued that we should forget about intuition as a cushion in the philosophical armchair (see Williamson, 2004a,b, 2008, pp. 179–207, and 2009). The importance of intuitions in philosophy has been neglected in the past (see Williamson, 2004b, p. 109–110), and only recently intuition received some of the attention it deserves (see, e.g., DePaul; Ramsey (eds.), 1998). Besides the traditional divide between empiricists, rationalists and skeptics, it is not only a very non-uniform use of the word “intuition” that makes it difficult to assess the progress of the last years of philosophical inquiry about intuitions. The situation has been complicated by the contributions of experimental philosophers on intuitions who add different reasons to question their reliability. Generally speaking, the reliability of intuitions has been challenged on two grounds. One stems from an evolutionary explanation of the capacity to intuit; another is due to experiments which supposedly show the cultural relativity of intuitions.
The current discussion of intuitions has barely made an impact on philosophical reflections about thought experiments. As far as philosophical thought experiments are concerned, this is as it should be, according to Williamson. In this respect George Bealer can be cited in support of Williamson, because for Bealer the talk about philosophical thought experiments reveals a conceptual confusion. Philosophy, he claims, is about “rational intuitions” and thought experiments can be only about “physical intuitions” (see Bealer, 1998, pp. 207–208, and 2002, p. 74). To many, this is an implausible claim as is his “phenomenology of intuitions”, with its strict separation of “rational intuitions” from “physical intuitions”, or the immutability of “rational intuitions”. There are good reasons to believe that thought experiments appeal to intuitions in order to give us new insights about different realms of investigation, including philosophy. This kind of positive connection is what Williamson has in mind when addressing the role of intuitions in philosophical thought experiments like the famous Gettier cases, which overnight found acceptance by the philosophical community in their aim to refute the view that knowledge is justified true belief. While Williamson expects “armchair methods to play legitimately a more dominant role in future philosophy” (Williamson, 2009, p. 126), he thinks that “we should stop talking about intuition.” (Williamson, 2004b, p. 152). This does not impress proponents of what we call an intuition-based account of thought experiments, and probably for good reasons, given the problems in Williamson's approach (see, e.g., Ichikawa and Jarvis, 2009).
The intuition-based account of thought experimenting comes in a naturalistic version (see Brendel, 2004; Gendler, 2007), and in a Platonistic version (see Brown, 1986, 1987, 1991a, 1991b, 1993, 2004a,b, 2005, 2007a,b,c). Brown holds that in a few special cases we do go well beyond the old empirical data to acquire a priori knowledge of nature (see also Koyré, 1968). Galileo showed that all bodies fall at the same speed with a brilliant thought experiment that started by destroying the then reigning Aristotelian account. The latter holds that heavy bodies fall faster than light ones (H > L). But consider Figure 6, in which a heavy cannon ball (H) and light musket ball (L) are attached together to form a compound object (H+L); the latter must fall faster than the cannon ball alone. Yet the compound object must also fall slower, since the light part will act as a drag on the heavy part. Now we have a contradiction: H+L > H and H > H+L. That's the end of Aristotle's theory. But there is a bonus, since the right account is now obvious: they all fall at the same speed (H = L = H+L).
Figure 6. Galileo: “I don't even have to look”
Brown claims this is a priori (though still fallible) knowledge of nature, since there are no new data involved, nor is the conclusion derived from old data. Neither is it some sort of logical truth (for the latest and most technical challenge of this claim see Urbaniak, 2012). This account of thought experiments can be further developed by linking the a priori epistemology to accounts of laws of nature that hold that laws are relations among objectively existing abstract entities. It is thus a form of Platonism, not unlike Platonic accounts of mathematics such as that urged by Kurt Gödel.
The two most often repeated arguments against Brown's Platonism are: it does not identify criteria to distinguish good from bad thought experiments, and it violates the principle of ontological parsimony. These are weak objections, and perhaps find widespread acceptance because Platonism seems to be unfathomable these days, given the general popularity of various forms of naturalism. If intuitions really do the job in a thought experiment, the first objection is weak because neither rationalists nor empiricists have a theory about the reliability of intuitions. So the objection should be that intuitions probably just do not matter in human cognition. However, there are good reasons to question the truth of this claim (see Myers, 2004). This is not to marginalize the problems that arise when admitting intuitions as a source of knowledge and justification, especially in philosophy (see Hitchcock, 2012).
As for the second objection, the appeal to Occam's razor is in general problematic when it is employed to rule out a theory. Whatever we eliminate by employing the principle of parsimony we can easily reintroduce by an inference to the best explanation (see Meixner, 2000). And this is exactly what a Platonist contends his or her Platonism about thought experimenting to be, while conceding that the Platonic intuition appears miraculous. But are they really more miraculous than sense perception, which seems similar in many respects to Platonic intuition? One might want to say yes, because supposedly we have no clue at all how Platonic intuition works but we do have some idea about the nature of sense perception. We know that if an object is far away it appears smaller in vision, and under certain light conditions the same object can look quite different. However, is it really impossible to state similar rules to capture the nature of Platonic intuition? If you are drunk or lack attention you most probably will not be very successful in intuiting anything of philosophical value.
A review of the relevant psychological literature will reveal further criteria that could be employed to identify good and bad conditions for Platonic intuition while thought experimenting. Yet, proponents of the naturalistic version of the intuition based account wonder how necessary Platonism is once this move is entertained in defence of the reliability of intuitions (see Miščević, 2004).
John Norton has been one of the most influential contributors to the literature on thought experiments. In some respects he can be cited in support of Williamson, as his approach claims to provide sufficient reason to dismiss not only Platonism but any intuition based account altogether (see Norton, 1991, 1993, 1996, 2004a,b, 2008). Norton is the most important defender of what we call “the argument view” of thought experiments. Even though the argument view seems to be a natural option for empiricists, it seems that most empiricists find Norton's argument view too strong. For this reason, many participants in the thought experiments debate place themselves between the extremes of Norton and Brown, who function as useful foils for apparently more moderate outlooks. By contrast, Norton and Brown (with tongue in cheek) agree with Bernard Shaw on the virtues of moderation, when Shaw said of the typical member of the middle class that he is moderately honest, moderately intelligent, and moderately faithful to his spouse.
Norton claims that any thought experiment is really a (possibly disguised) argument; it starts with premises grounded in experience and follows deductive or inductive rules of inference in arriving at its conclusion. The picturesque features of any thought experiment which give it an experimental flavour might be psychologically helpful, but are strictly redundant. Thus, says Norton, we never go beyond the empirical premises in a way to which any empiricist would object.
There are three objections that might be offered against Norton. First, his notion of argument is too vague. However, this might not be the best objection: arguments can be deductive (which are perfectly clear) or inductive. If the latter are unclear, the fault is with induction, not with Norton's argument view. Second, it is argued that Norton simply begs the question: every real world experiment can be rephrased as an argument, but nobody would say that real world arguments are dispensable. The account does not address the question: where do the premises come from? A thought experiment might be an essential step in making the Norton-style reconstruction. Third, a thought experiment that is presented in argument form loses its typical force. The soft-point in Brown's Platonism is linked to the strength of Norton's account because Norton claims that any other view implies a commitment to “asking the oracle.” “Imagine an oracle that claims mysterious powers but never delivers predictions that could not be learned by simple inferences from ordinary experience. We would not believe that the oracle had any mysterious powers. I propose the same verdict for thought experiments in science.” (Norton, 1996, pp. 1142–1143) Defenders of empiricist alternatives deny this dispensability thesis.
Among these empiricist alternatives is what we could call conceptual constructivism, taken up by Van Dyck (2003), to account for Heisenberg's ɣ-ray microscope, Gendler (1998, pp. 415–420), and Camilleri (2014), in navigating a middle ground between the views of Norton and Brown. The view was first proposed by Kuhn (1964). He employs many of the concepts (but not the terminology) of his well-known structure of scientific revolutions. On his view a well-conceived thought experiment can bring on a crisis or at least create an anomaly in the reigning theory and so contribute to paradigm change. Thought experiments can teach us something new about the world, even though we have no new empirical data, by helping us to re-conceptualize the world in a new way.
Next we have what we might term experimentalism, encompassing a wide range of different approaches which all assume that thought experiments are a “limiting case” of ordinary experiments. Experimentalism was proposed first by Mach, 1897 and 1905. He defines experimenting in terms of its basic method of variation and its capacity to destroy prejudices about nature. According to Mach, experimenting is innate to higher animals, including humans. The thought experiment just happens on a higher intellectual level but is basically still an experiment. At the centre of thought experimenting is a “Gedankenerfahrung”, an experience in thought. Such an experience is possible because in thought experimenting we draw from “unwillkürliche Abbildungen von Tatsachen”, uncontrollable images of facts — acquired in past experiences with the world. Thought experiments help to prepare real world experiments. Some of them are so convincing in their results that an execution seems unnecessary; others could be conducted in a real-world experiment, which is the most natural trajectory of a scientific thought experiment. In any case thought experiments can result in a revision of belief, thereby demonstrating their significance for scientific progress. Mach also appreciates the didactic value of thought experiments: they help us to realize what can be accomplished in thinking and what cannot.
In the spirit of Mach, Roy A. Sorensen has offered a very aspiring version of experimentalism that accounts for thought experiments in science and philosophy, and tackles many of the central issues of the topic. Sorensen claims thought experiments are “a subset of unexecuted experiments.” (1992, p. 213) By their logical nature they are paradoxes that aim to test modal consequences of propositions. The origin of thought experimenting is explained in terms of Darwinian evolution (as in Genz, 1999, pp. 25–29), though the explanation has been criticized to be only little more than a ‘just so story’ that fails on a posteriori grounds to epistemically underwrite the capacity for thought experimenting (see Maffie, 1997). Others are more optimistic (see Shepard, 2008).
Experimentalism does not have to take a naturalistic turn as it does in Sorensen's case. In a number of contributions (see Buzzoni, 2004, 2007, 2008, 2011b) Marco Buzzoni has defended a Neo-Kantian version of experimentalism (see Buzzoni 2011, 2013, 2013b). Buzzoni (2008) argues for the dialectical unity of thought experiments and real-world experiments. Thought experiments and real-world experiments are claimed to be identical on the “technological-operational” level and at least in science, one is impossible without the other: without thought experiments there wouldn't be real-world experiments because we would not know how to put questions to nature; without real-world experiments there wouldn't be answers to these questions or experience from which they could draw. Given the many scientific thought experiments that cannot be realized in the real-world, Buzzoni might be conflating thought experiments with imagined experiments to be carried out in the real-world (see Fehige, 2012b, 2013b; and Buzzoni 2013b).
This brings us to the mental model account of thought experimenting (see Andreas, 2011; Bishop, 1998; Cooper, 2005; Gendler, 2004; Palmieri, 2003; Nersessian, 1992, 1993, 2007; McMullin, 1985; Miščević, 1992, 2007). In thought experimenting, according to champions of this view, we manipulate a mental model instead of a physical model. As the model is non-propositional, it is most often communicated by means of a polished narrative which functions as a kind of user-manual for building the model. This approach could become the most prolific because it does not seem to be much of a stretch to draw connections to the intuition based account. It also allows to bring an aspect of thought experiments in focus that has been widely neglected in the discussion so far: the bodily component of (thought) experimenting (Gooding, 1993). Work on this aspect will gravitate to those theories of the body that phenomenology has produced and probably lead to a re-assessment of Gooding's naturalistic account of the bodily dimension of thought experiments (see Fehige and Wiltsche, 2013).
Moreover, the mental model account provides the opportunity to make mention of those proposals that place “literary fiction on the level of thought experiments.” (Swirski, 2007, p. 6) Such proposals rest on the assumption that some works of fiction are properly viewed as more fully elaborated thought experiments. That is to say that thought experiments satisfy the two requirements of fictionality: to make-believe that certain circumstances, situations, conditions, etc., hold, and to not constrain the made-belief world by actual events (see Davies, 2007, p. 31-33). The basic idea behind the proposals is relatively simple: the “various ways in which an author’s ideas are tested as a result of being translated into fiction make fiction a form of thought experiment with reference to such ideas. Fiction is an experiment because in order to understand and appreciate it we test the truth of the ideas and the lifelikeness of the methods of the author. Fiction is a thought experiment because this testing takes place in the imagination.” (Davenport, 1983, p. 301) Can we learn something new, as we do in a typical thought experiment? Distopian novels, such as 1984 and Brave New World, make obvious examples. So do novels such as Sophie's Choice. It seems an open question (to be answered by literary critics as well as philosophers) as to the depth and extent of literature's similarity to other thought experiments.
Of significance in this respect is the fact that many thought experiments are conveyed by means of a narrative. The narrative of a thought experiment is not the thought experiment and yet it seems to be more than just the indispensable medium of communication. Consequently, of considerable interest is, for example, “the question of how the narrative aspect of thought experiments have implications for the process whereby one version of a thought experiment can spawn another” (Souder, 2003, pp. 208–209). The missing link could be mental modelling because “more than one instantiation or realization of a situation described in the narrative is possible. The constructed model need only be of the same kind with respect to salient dimensions of target phenomena.” (Nersessian, 2007, p. 148)
The more general issue here in terms of the relationship between literature and thought experiments “is not whether but how the arts function cognitively.” (Elgin, 1993, p. 14) Support for this optimistic view of the cognitive powers of the arts comes from the rejection of yet another dualism that used to have a firm grip on Western thinking: “Even in a much qualified form [the] traditional polarity between nonrational art and rational science is no longer tenable today.” (Davenport, 1983, p. 279) Consequently, among those who study thought experiments at the intersection of “science and literature” we find some who claim that literature is basically a “variety of thought experiments.” (Swirski, 2007, p. 10) The assumption is that thought experiments are of great cognitive power, and that the literary features of many thought experiments reveal a truth about literature as such. This in turn, it is further argued, explains the importance of “fictional components” of scientific practice: “the capacity of literary fictions for generating nonfictional knowledge owes to their capacity for doing what philosophy and science do–generating thought experiments.” (Swirski, 2007, p. 4) To be more precise: in this proposal not all knowledge acquisition through literature is traced to thought experiments. Still, insofar as literature as such is a variety of thought experiments its cognitive power is comparable to what happens in philosophical and scientific thought experiments, “even if in literature the process is more diffuse, instinctive, and incomplete than in philosophy and science, [because] the structure and global strategy of the thought experiments all three employ are not always that different.” (Swirski, 2007, p. 123) As for why thought experiments, and by derivation literature have the astonishing cognitive power of learning new things about the world just by thinking, we are offered an account of the human trait of story telling in terms of evolutionary psychology (see Swirski, 2007, pp. 68–95).
Reaching more philosophical depth, others account for the cognitive power of thought experiments and literature by considering physical experiments as well, and seeing in all three a process called “exemplification” (see Elgin, 2014). This process establishes a relation of a sample, an example, or another exemplar to whatever it is a sample or example of. What obtains as a result is a doubling in referentiality: exemplars refer not only to the pattern or property or relation that they exemplify, but also to other things that instantiate that pattern, have that property, or stand in that relation. A splotch of blue paint on a paint sample card exemplifies the colour blue, if that’s how we choose to use it, and thereby represents all instances of the colour blue. Acquaintance with this paint sample card, leads to the ability to deal with blue things. In this sense literature wields as much cognitive power as thought experiments and physical experiments.
Employing Popper's definition of science, Davenport, 1983, supports such an epistemological assessment, especially insofar as literary fiction can amount to doing social science: “Popper’s view of art and science is nonpolarized in the sense that he believes that art can be and frequently is read as if it were proposing to solve social science problems, and that read this way, art can be treated as if it used the methods and served the ends of science.” (Davenport, 1983, p. 286) We might call this the “literature-as-science view”. It faces at least two challenges: 1. What is unique about doing social science by means of literary fiction? If it is not unique, then the question arises why we have literary fiction and social science doing the same job. One of them would seem superfluous. 2. Do we misuse literature when treating it as a science? In response to the first challenge Davenport responds that science has no monopoly when it comes to originality and creativity in the search for testable hypotheses about sociological matters (see 1983, p. 287). In other words, literary fiction's uniqueness compared to scholarly ways of doing social science is a greater flexibility of the mind in the search for new answers to old problems or new problems with no answers. As for the proper use of literary fiction, the response is threefold: (a) Some writers did intend their literary works to be social science, e.g., the 19th century French writer Émil Zola. (b) Looking at the Rezeptionsgeschichte of many great novels, it is clear that they were treated often as if they not only raised new issues but also provided answers to questions, problems, and challenges that are part of the domain of the social sciences (see Davenport, 1983, pp. 287–288). (c) Literary writing requires good methods of composition, and is not just the reflection of inborn genius. In other words, literary fiction does not only, at times, amount to a thought experiment, but is itself the result of thought experiments insofar as this is among the methods a writer can use to master the challenging process of composing a work in a methodologically guided manner: “Thought experiment is an abstract model, in other words, of the sort of learning which, if it takes place, goes part way to explaining how composition is possible. […] Since an author is his own first reader and critic, it is natural to extend to the author the theory that readers and critics learn about and evaluate works of literature by conducting thought experiments to test these works for plausibility.” (Davenport, 1983, p. 295)
Noteworthy contributions have been made exploring the importance of thought experiments in disciplines other than mathematics, philosophy, or physics. They include history (Tetlock et al. (eds.), 2009, pp. 14–44; Rescher, 2003, pp. 238–238, and 2005, pp. 36–46; Reiss, 2009; Weber; De Mey, 2003), the social sciences (Aligica and Evans, 2009; Belkin; Tetlock (eds.), 1996; Reiss, 2013; Roberts, 1993; Schabas, 2008; Ylikoski, 2003), and Christian theology (Fehige, 2009, 2011b, 2012, 2013, and forthcoming).
An interesting, but relatively unexplored issue concerns the relative importance of thought experiments in different disciplines. Physics and philosophy use them extensively. Chemistry, by contrast, has none of note at all. Why is this the case? Perhaps it is merely an historical accident that chemists never developed a culture of doing thought experiments. Perhaps it is tied to some deep feature of the discipline itself (see Snooks, 2006). Economics and history use thought experiments, but apparently not anthropology. A good explanation would likely tell us a lot about the structure of the discipline itself.
Since the interest in simulation is growing among philosophers of science, the relationship between computer simulation and thought experiments has started to attract attention (see Behmel, 2001, pp. 98–108; Di Paolo et al., 2000; El Skaf and Imbert, 2013; Lenhard 2011; Stäudner, 1998). The issue here is whether computer simulations are thought experiments. This is rather unlikely (contrary to Beisbart, 2012) because thought experiments and computer simulations seem to involve different kinds of simulation and have different aims. Still, their relationship is certainly of interest to anyone working on thought experiments, especially if it is true that computer simulations are the new way of doing science that is on a par with science by classical real world experiments (see Morrison, 2009). Accordingly, it has been argued that “computational modeling is largely replacing thought experimenting, and the latter will play only a limited role in future practice of science, especially in the sciences of complex nonlinear, dynamical phenomena” (see Chandrasekharan et al., 2012, p. 239).
Maybe related to this is the proposal of Schulzke (2014) to think of video games philosophically as executable thought experiments.
Tentative steps have been undertaken to relate more general epistemological topics to the primary challenge of thought experiments. As we have seen, this is true for intuitions. Noteworthy is the discussion surrounding the metaphilosophical views of Timothy Williamson (see Malmgren, 2011). To name another example: Conceivability and Possibility (edited by T. S. Gendler and J. Hawthorne, Oxford: Oxford University Press) includes a number of contributions that note the relevance of the discussed topic to thought experiments. According to Bealer, thought experiments seem to involve a conceivability that is too weak to provide reliable modal information because they only exploit “physical intuitions” (p. 74). David Chalmers thinks that good thought experiments can be a guide to possibilities if the entailments of conceivability and possibility that he defends are sound (p. 153). Alan Sidelle's discussion of the metaphysical contingency of the laws of nature explicitly refers to the “importance of traditional imagining, conceiving, and thought experiment to modal inquiry” (p. 310), and can be read as a challenge to any claim that thought experiments would reveal anything more than a “necessity based in analyticity” (p. 329).
To be welcomed is the entry of phenomenology into the discussion on thought experiments (see Hopp, 2014). More exchange between phenomenology and analytic philosophy seems desirable, especially regarding the role of the body in thought experiments (see Fehige and Wiltsche, 2013).
Finally, Kertesz (forthcoming) links conceptual metaphor research to the puzzle thought experiments pose in that they can facilitate knowledge acquisition, and argues that the former provides resources to solve the latter.
The number of papers, anthologies, and monographs has been growing immensely since the beginning of the 1990s. Therefore, it might be useful to highlight that in existing literature Kühne, 2006, is the most substantial historical study on the philosophical exploration of thought experiments; Sorensen, 1992, is the most extensive philosophical study of thought experiments. More than other monographs (see Behmel, 2001; Buschlinger, 1993; Brown, 1991a; Buzzoni, 2008; Cohnitz, 2006; Häggqvist, 1996; Rescher, 2005; Swirski, 2007), both studies well exceed the author's own systematic contribution to what we consider to be the primary epistemological challenge presented by thought experiments. Also, this bibliography does not include the many (we count about eight) popular books on thought experiments (like Wittgenstein's Beetle and Other Classical Thought Experiments by Martin Cohen); nor do we list fiction that is related to the subject (like “The End of Mr. Y” by Scarlett Thomas). Further, for undergraduate teaching purposes one might want to consider Doing Philosophy: An Introduction Through Thought Experiments (edited by Theodore Schick, Jr. and Lewis Vaughn, fourth edition, 2010, Boston: McGraw Hill Higher Education). Moreover, it is noteworthy that a number of philosophical journals have dedicated part or all of an issue to the topic of thought experiments, including the Croatian Journal of Philosophy (19/VII), Deutsche Zeitschrift für Philosophie (1/59), Informal Logic (3/17), Philosophica (1/72), and Perspectives on Science (2/22). Finally, the days are numbered without a concise guide to thought experiments. In preparation is the Routledge Companion to Thought Experiments.
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- Goodies, a collection of intriguing questions in the philosophy of science, some about thought experiments, by John Norton (U. Pittsburgh).
- An interactive version of Thomson's violin thought experiment.
- Six famous thought experiments explained quickly.
The editors would like to thank Gintautas Miliauskas (Vilnius University) for notifying us of a variety of typographical errors in this entry.