Notes to The Problem of Evil

1. For additional critical discussion of this, see Conway (1988), p. 35, and Robert Adams (1985), pp. 225 and 240.

2. One feature of the above formulation of the argument should be noted, namely, that the predicate ‘\(x\) prevents the existence of \(y\)’ introduces an intensional context; the fact that \(x\) prevents the existence of \(y\) entails the non-existence of \(y\). Since intensional contexts are rather puzzling from a logical point of view, one might very well prefer to avoid this. This could be done by recasting the argument so that one talks instead of preventing the existence of states of affairs of a given type. See the supplementary document An Alternative Formulation of the Argument

3. For a fuller account and defense of Hume’s argument, see Michael Tooley, (2011) “Hume and the Problem of Evil,” in Philosophy of Religion: The Key Thinkers, edited by Jeffrey J. Jordan, London and New York, Continuum, 159–86.

4. The page references for Paul Draper’s 1989 article are to the reprinting of it in Daniel Howard-Snyder (ed.), The Evidential Argument from Evil, Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1996, pp. 12–29.

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