# The Problem of Evil

First published Mon Sep 16, 2002; substantive revision Tue Mar 3, 2015

The epistemic question posed by evil is whether the world contains undesirable states of affairs that provide the basis for an argument that makes it unreasonable to believe in the existence of God.

This discussion is divided into eights sections. The first is concerned with some preliminary distinctions; the second, with the choice between deductive versions of the argument from evil, and evidential versions; the third, with alternative evidential formulations of the argument from evil; the fourth, with the distinction between three very different types of responses to the argument from evil: attempted total refutations, defenses, and theodicies. The fifth section then focuses upon attempted total refutations, while the sixth is concerned with defenses, and the seventh with some traditional theodicies. The possibility of more modest variants on defenses and theodicies, based on the idea of global properties, is then considered in section eight.

## 1. Some Important Distinctions

### 1.1 Relevant Concepts of God

The term “God” is used with a wide variety of different meanings. These tend to fall, however, into two main groups. On the one hand, there are metaphysical interpretations of the term: God is a prime mover, or a first cause, or a necessary being that has its necessity of itself, or the ground of being, or a being whose essence is identical with its existence. Or God is not one being among other beings—even a supremely great being—but, instead, being itself. Or God is an ultimate reality to which no concepts truly apply.

On the other hand, there are interpretations that connect the term “God” in a clear and relatively straightforward way with religious attitudes, such as those of worship, and with very important human desires, such as the desires that good will triumph, that justice be done, and that the world not be one where death marks the end of the individual’s existence.

What properties must something have if it is to be an appropriate object of worship, and if it is to provide reason for thinking that there is a reasonable chance that the fundamental human desires just mentioned will be fulfilled? A natural answer is that God must be a person who, at the very least, is very powerful, very knowledgeable, and morally very good. But if such a being exists, then it seems initially puzzling why various evils exist. For many of the very undesirable states of affairs that the world contains are such as could be eliminated, or prevented, by a being who was only moderately powerful, while, given that humans are aware of such evils, a being only as knowledgeable as humans would be aware of their existence. Finally, even a moderately good human being, given the power to do so, would eliminate those evils. Why, then, do such undesirable states of affairs exist, if there is a being who is very powerful, very knowledgeable, and very good?

What one has here, however, is not just a puzzle, since the question can, of course, be recast as an argument for the non-existence of God. Thus if, for simplicity, we focus on a conception of God as all-powerful, all-knowing, and perfectly good, one very concise way of formulating such an argument is as follows:

1. If God exists, then God is omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect.
2. If God is omnipotent, then God has the power to eliminate all evil.
3. If God is omniscient, then God knows when evil exists.
4. If God is morally perfect, then God has the desire to eliminate all evil.
5. Evil exists.
6. If evil exists and God exists, then either God doesn’t have the power to eliminate all evil, or doesn’t know when evil exists, or doesn’t have the desire to eliminate all evil.
7. Therefore, God doesn’t exist.

That this argument is valid is perhaps most easily seen by a reductio argument, in which one assumes that the conclusion—(7)—is false, and then shows that the denial of (7), along with premises (1) through (6), leads to a contradiction. Thus if, contrary to (7), God exists, it follows from (1) that God is omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect. This, together with (2), (3), and (4) then entails that God has the power to eliminate all evil, that God knows when evil exists, and that God has the desire to eliminate all evil. But when (5) is conjoined with the reductio assumption that God exists, it then follows via modus ponens from (6) that either God doesn’t have the power to eliminate all evil, or doesn’t know when evil exists, or doesn’t have the desire to eliminate all evil. Thus we have a contradiction, and so premises (1) through (6) do validly imply (7).

Whether the argument is sound is, of course, a further question, for it may be that one or more of the premises is false. The point here, however, is simply that when one conceives of God as unlimited with respect to power, knowledge, and moral goodness, the existence of evil quickly gives rise to potentially serious arguments against the existence of God.

Is the situation different if one shifts to a deity who is not omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect? The answer depends on the details. Thus, if one considers a deity who is omniscient and morally perfect, but not omnipotent, then evil presumably would not pose a problem if such a deity were conceived of as too remote from Earth to prevent the evils we find here. But given a deity who falls considerably short of omnipotence, omniscience, and moral perfection, but who could intervene in our world to prevent many evils, and who knows of those evils, it would seem that an argument rather similar to the above could be formulated by focusing not on the mere existence of evil, but upon the existence of evils that such a deity could have prevented.

But what if God, rather than being characterized in terms of knowledge, power, and goodness, is defined in some more metaphysical way—for example, as the ground of being, or as being itself? The answer will depend on whether, having defined God in such purely metaphysical terms, one can go on to argue that such an entity will also possess at least very great power, knowledge, and moral goodness. If so, evil is once again a problem.

By contrast, if God is conceived of in a purely metaphysical way, and if no connection can be forged between the relevant metaphysical properties and the possession of significant power, knowledge, and goodness, then the problem of evil is irrelevant. But when that is the case, it would seem that God thereby ceases to be a being who is either an appropriate object of religious attitudes, or a ground for believing that fundamental human hopes are not in vain.

### 1.2 Incompatibility Formulations versus Inductive Formulations

The argument from evil focuses upon the fact that the world appears to contain states of affairs that are bad, or undesirable, or that should have been prevented by any being that could have done so, and it asks how the existence of such states of affairs is to be squared with the existence of God. But the argument can be formulated in two very different ways. First, it can be formulated as a purely deductive argument that attempts to show that there are certain facts about the evil in the world that are logically incompatible with the existence of God. One especially ambitious form of this first sort of argument attempts to establish the very strong claim that it is logically impossible for it to be the case both that there is any evil at all, and that God exists. The argument set out in the preceding section is just such an argument.

Alternatively, rather than being formulated as a deductive argument for the very strong claim that it is logically impossible for both God and evil to exist, (or for God and certain types, or instances, or a certain amount of evil to exist), the argument from evil can instead be formulated as an evidential (or inductive/probabilistic) argument for the more modest claim that there are evils that actually exist in the world that make it unlikely—or perhaps very unlikely—that God exists.

The choice between incompatibility formulations and evidential formulations is discussed below, in section 2.

### 1.3 Abstract Versus Concrete Formulations

Any version of the argument from evil claims that there is some fact concerning the evil in the world such that the existence of God—understood as at least a very powerful, very knowledgeable, and morally very good person, and, ideally, as an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person—is either logically precluded, or rendered unlikely, by that fact. But versions of the argument often differ quite significantly with respect to what the relevant fact is. Sometimes, as in premise (5) in the argument set out above, the appeal is to the mere existence of any evil whatever. Sometimes, on the other hand, it is to the existence of a certain amount of evil. And sometimes it is to the existence of evils of a certain specified sort.

To formulate the argument from evil in terms of the mere existence of any evil at all is to abstract to the greatest extent possible from detailed information about the evils that are found in the world, and so one is assuming, in effect, that such information cannot be crucial for the argument. But is it clear that this is right? For might one not feel that while the world would be better off without the vast majority of evils, this is not so for absolutely all evils? Thus some would argue, for example, that the frustration that one experiences in trying to solve a difficult problem is outweighed by the satisfaction of arriving at a solution, and therefore that the world is a better place because it contains such evils. Alternatively, it has been argued that the world is a better place if people develop desirable traits of character—such as patience, and courage—by struggling against obstacles, including suffering. But if either of these things is the case, then the prevention of all evil might well make the world a worse place.

It seems possible, then, that there might be evils that are logically necessary for goods that outweigh them, and this possibility provides a reason, accordingly, for questioning one of the premises in the argument set out earlier—namely, premise (4), where it is claimed that if God is morally perfect, then God has the desire to eliminate all evil.

But there is also another reason why that claim is problematic, which arises out of a particular conception of free will—namely, a libertarian conception. According to this view of free will, and in contrast with what are known as compatibilist approaches, free will is incompatible with determinism, and so it is impossible even for an omnipotent being to make it the case that someone freely chooses to do what is right.

Many people claim, however, that the world is a better place if it contains individuals who possess libertarian free will, rather than individuals who are free only in a sense that is compatible with one’s actions being completely determined. If this claim can be made plausible, one can argue, first, that God would have a good reason for creating a world with individuals who possessed libertarian free will, but secondly, that if he did choose to create such a world, even he could not ensure that no one would ever choose to do something morally wrong. The good of libertarian free will requires, in short, the possibility of moral evil.

Neither of these lines of argument is immune from challenge. As regards the former, one can argue that the examples that are typically advanced of cases where some evil is logically necessary for a greater good that outweighs the evil are not really, upon close examination, convincing, while, as regards the latter, there is a serious problem of making sense of libertarian free will, for although there is no difficulty about the idea of actions that are not causally determined, libertarian free will requires more than the mere absence of determinism, and the difficulty arises when one attempts to say what that something more is.

But although these challenges are important, and may very well turn out to be right, it is fair to say, first, that it has not yet been established that there is no coherent conception of libertarian free will, and, secondly, that it is, at least, very doubtful that one can establish that there cannot be cases where some evil is logically necessary for a greater good that outweighs it without appealing to some substantive, and probably controversial, moral theory.

The upshot is that the idea that either the actuality of certain undesirable states of affairs, or at least the possibility, may be logically necessary for goods that outweigh them, is not without some initial plausibility, and if some such claim can be sustained, it will follow immediately that the mere existence of evil cannot be incompatible with the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect being.

How does this bear upon evidential formulations of the argument from evil? The answer would seem to be that if there can be evils that are logically necessary for goods that outweigh them, then it is hard to see how the mere existence of evil—in the absence of further information—can provide much in the way of evidence against the existence of God.

What if one shifts to a slightly less abstract formulation of the argument from evil that is based upon the premise that the world contains a certain amount of evil, or upon the premise that the world contains at least some natural evil? Then one is including marginally more information. But one is still assuming, in effect, that most of the detailed information about the evils found in the world is completely irrelevant to the argument from evil, and a little reflection brings out how very implausible this assumption is. So, for example, consider a world that contains a billion units of natural evil. Is this a good starting point for an argument from evil? The answer is that, if either a deontological approach to ethics is correct, or a form of consequentialism that takes the distribution of goods and evils into account, rather than, say, simply the total amount of goods and evils, whether this fact is an impressive reason for questioning the existence of God surely depends on further details about the world. If those billion units are uniformly distributed over trillions of people whose lives are otherwise extremely satisfying and ecstatically happy, it is not easy to see a serious problem of evil. But if, on the other hand, the billion units of natural evil fell upon a single innocent person, and produced a life that was, throughout, one of extraordinarily intense pain, then surely there would be a very serious problem of evil.

Details concerning such things as how suffering and other evils are distributed over individuals, and the nature of those who undergo the evils, are, then, of crucial importance. Thus it is relevant, for example, that many innocent children suffer agonizing deaths. It is relevant that animals suffer, and that they did so before there were any persons to observe their suffering, and to feel sympathy for them. It is also relevant that, on the one hand, the suffering that people undergo apparently bears no relation to the moral quality of their lives, and, on the other, that it bears a very clear relation to the wealth and medical knowledge of the societies in which they live.

The prospects for a successful abstract version of the argument from evil would seem, therefore, rather problematic. It is conceivable, of course, that the correct moral principles entail that there cannot be any evils whose actuality or possibility makes for a better world. But to attempt to set out a version of the argument from evil that requires a defense of that thesis is certainly to swim upstream. A much more promising approach, surely, is to focus, instead, simply upon those evils that are thought, by the vast majority of people, to pose at least a prima facie problem for the rationality of belief in an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person.

Given that the preceding observations are rather obvious ones, one might have expected that discussions of the argument from evil would have centered mainly upon concrete formulations of the argument. Rather surprisingly, that has not been so. Indeed, some authors seem to focus almost exclusively upon very abstract versions of the argument.

One of the more striking illustrations of this phenomenon is provided by Alvin Plantinga’s discussions of the problem of evil. In God and Other Minds, in The Nature of Necessity, and in God, Freedom, and Evil, for example, Plantinga, starting out from an examination of John L. Mackie’s essay “Evil and Omnipotence” (1955), in which Mackie had defended an incompatibility version of the argument from evil, focuses mainly on the question of whether the existence of God is compatible with the existence of evil, although there are also short discussions of whether the existence of God is compatible with the existence of a given quantity of evil, and of whether the existence of a certain amount of evil renders the existence of God unlikely. (The latter topic is then the total focus of attention in his long article, “The Probabilistic Argument from Evil”.)

That Plantinga initially focused upon abstract formulations of the argument from evil was not, perhaps, surprising, given that a number of writers—including Mackie, H. J. McCloskey (1960), and H. D. Aiken (1957–58)—had defended incompatibility versions of the argument from evil, and it is natural to formulate such arguments in an abstract way, since although one may wish to distinguish, for example, between natural evils and moral evils, reference to concrete cases of evil would not seem to add anything. But once one shifts to probabilistic formulations of the argument from evil, the situation is very different: details about concrete cases of evil may be evidentially crucial.

The problem, then, is that Plantinga not only started out by focusing on very abstract versions of the argument from evil, but also maintained this focus throughout. The explanation of this may lie in the fact that Plantinga seems to have believed that if it can be shown that the existence of God is neither incompatible with, nor rendered improbable by, either (1) the mere existence of evil, or (2) the existence of a specified amount of evil, then no philosophical problem remains. People may find, of course, that they are still troubled by the existence of specific evils, but this, Plantinga seems to be believe, is a religious problem, and what is called for, he suggests, is not philosophical argument, but “pastoral care” (1974a, 63–4).[1]

Plantinga’s view here, however, is very implausible. For not only can the argument from evil be formulated in terms of specific evils, but that is the natural way to do so, given that it is only certain types of evils that are generally viewed as raising a serious problem with respect to the rationality of belief in God. To concentrate exclusively on abstract versions of the argument from evil is therefore to ignore the most plausible and challenging versions of the argument.

### 1.4 Axiological Versus Deontological Formulations

Consider, now, the following formulation of the argument from evil, which, in contrast to the abstract version of the argument from evil set out in section 1.1, focuses on quite concrete types of evil:

1. There exist states of affairs in which animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, and that (a) are intrinsically bad or undesirable, and (b) are such that any omnipotent person has the power to prevent them without thereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good.
2. For any state of affairs (that is actual), the existence of that state of affairs is not prevented by anyone.
3. For any state of affairs, and any person, if the state of affairs is intrinsically bad, and the person has the power to prevent that state of affairs without thereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good, but does not do so, then that person is not both omniscient and morally perfect.

Therefore, from (1), (2), and (3):

1. There is no omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person.
2. If God exists, then he is an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person.

Therefore:

1. God does not exist.

As it stands, this argument is deductively valid.[2] (Here is a proof.) However it is likely to be challenged in various ways. In particular, one vulnerable point is the claim, made in the last part of statement (1), that an omnipotent and omniscient person could have prevented those states of affairs without thereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good, and when this is challenged, an inductive step will presumably be introduced, one that moves from what we know about the undesirable states of affairs in question to a conclusion about the overall value of those states of affairs, all things considered—including things that may well lie outside our ken.

But the above argument is subject to a very different sort of criticism, one that is connected with a feature of the above argument which seems to me important, but which is not often commented upon—the fact, namely, that the above argument is formulated in terms of axiological concepts, that is, in terms of the goodness or badness, the desirability or undesirability, of states of affairs. The criticism that arises from this feature centers on statement (3), which asserts that an omniscient and morally perfect being would prevent the existence of any states of affairs that are intrinsically bad or undesirable, and whose prevention he could achieve without either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good. For one can ask how this claim is to be justified. One answer that might be offered would be that some form of consequentialism is true—such as, for example, the view that an action that fails to maximize the balance of good states of affairs over bad states of affairs is morally wrong. But the difficulty then is that any such assumption is likely to be a deeply controversial assumption that many theists would certainly reject.

The problem, in short, is that any axiological formulation of the argument from evil, as it stands, is incomplete in a crucial respect, since it fails to make explicit how a failure to bring about good states of affairs, or a failure to prevent bad states of affairs, entails that one is acting in a morally wrong way. Moreover, the natural way of removing this incompleteness is by appealing to what are in fact controversial ethical claims, such as the claim that the right action is the one that maximizes expected value. The result, in turn, is that discussions may very well become sidetracked on issues that are, in fact, not really crucial—such as, for example, the question of whether God would be morally blameworthy if he failed to create the best world that he could.

The alternative to an axiological formulation is a deontological formulation. Here the idea is that rather than employing concepts that focus upon the value or disvalue of states of affairs, one instead uses concepts that focus upon the rightness and wrongness of actions, and upon the properties—rightmaking properties and wrongmaking properties—that determine whether an action is one that ought to be performed, or ought not to be performed, other things being equal. When the argument is thus formulated, there is no problematic bridge that needs to be introduced connecting the goodness and badness of states of affairs with the rightness and wrongness of actions.

## 2. The Choice between Incompatibility Formulations and Evidential Formulations

How is the argument from evil best formulated? As an incompatibility argument, or as an evidential argument? In section 1.1, an incompatibility formulation of a very abstract sort was set out, which appealed to the mere fact that the world contains at least some evil. That formulation involved the following crucial premise:

1. If God is morally perfect, then God has the desire to eliminate all evil.

The problem with that premise, as we saw, is that it can be argued that some evils are such that their actuality, or at least their possibility, is logically necessary for goods that outweigh them, in which case it is not true that a perfectly good being would want to eliminate such evils.

In section 1.4, a much more concrete version of an incompatibility argument was set out, which, rather than appealing to the mere existence of some evil or other, appealed to specific types of evil—in particular, situations where animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer. The thrust of the argument was then that, first of all, an omniscient and omnipotent person could have prevented the existence of such evils without thereby either allowing equal or greater evils, or preventing equal or greater goods, and, secondly, that any omniscient and morally perfect person will prevent the existence of such evils if that can be done without either allowing equal or greater evils, or preventing equal or greater goods.

The second of these claims avoids the objections that can be directed against the stronger claim that was involved in the argument set out in section 1.1—that is, the claim that if God is morally perfect, then God has the desire to eliminate all evil. But the shift to the more modest claim requires that one move from the very modest claim that evil exists to the stronger claim that there are certain evils that an omniscient and omnipotent person could have prevented the existence of such evils without thereby either allowing equal or greater evils, or preventing equal or greater goods, and the question arises as to how that claim can be supported. In particular, can it be established by means of a purely deductive argument?

Consider, in particular, the relevant premise in the more concrete version of the argument from evil set out in section 1.4, namely:

1. There exist states of affairs in which animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, and that (a) are intrinsically bad or undesirable, and (b) are such that any omnipotent person has the power to prevent them without thereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good.

How would one go about establishing via a purely deductive argument that a deer’s suffering a slow and painful death because of a forest fire, or a child’s undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, is not logically necessary either to achieve a greater good or to avoid a greater evil? If one had knowledge of the totality of morally relevant properties, then it might well be possible to show both that there are no greater evils that can be avoided only at the cost of the evil in question, and that there are no greater goods that are possible only given that evil. Do we have such knowledge? Some moral theorists would claim that we do, and that it is possible to set out a complete and correct moral theory. But this is certainly a highly controversial metaethical claim, and, as a consequence, the prospects for establishing a premise such as (1) via a deductive argument do not appear promising, at least given the present state of moral theory.

But if one cannot establish (1) via a deductive argument from one’s moral theory, cannot it be argued that that will lead to skepticism about whether one can know what human actions are morally right and morally wrong? This is a serious question, and it may well be that such knowledge is ruled out. But as will become clear when we consider evidential versions of the argument from evil, it may well be that one can have justified beliefs about the rightness and wrongness of actions.

If a premise such as (1) cannot, at least at present, be established deductively, then the only possibility, it would seem, is to offer some sort of inductive argument in support of the relevant premise. But if this is right, then it is surely best to get that crucial inductive step out into the open, and thus to formulate the argument from evil not as a deductive argument for the very strong claim that it is logically impossible for both God and evil to exist, (or for God and certain types, or instances, of evil to exist), but as an evidential (inductive/probabilistic) argument for the more modest claim that there are evils that actually exist in the world that make it unlikely that God exists.

## 3. Inductive Versions of the Argument from Evil

### 3.1 Arguments

If the argument from evil is given an evidential formulation, what form should that take? There appear to be four main possibilities that have been suggested in recent discussions. The first, which might be called the direct inductive approach, involves the idea that one can show that theism is unlikely to be true without comparing theism with any alternative hypothesis, other than the mere denial of theism. At the heart of this first approach, which was set out by William Rowe, is the idea that one sound type of inductive inference is what might be referred to as instantial generalization, where this is a matter of projecting a generalization that has been found to hold in all cases that have been so far examined to all cases whatever.

The second, which can be labeled the indirect inductive approach, argues instead that theism can be shown to be unlikely to be true by establishing that there is some alternative hypothesis—other than the mere negation of theism—that is logically incompatible with theism, and more probable than theism. This approach, which was originally used by David Hume in one of his arguments in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, and which has been set out and defended in a detailed way by Paul Draper, can be viewed as involving an inference to the best explanation, a type of inductive inference that was discovered by C. S. Pierce, and which is now very widely accepted.

The third approach, which has been advanced by William Rowe, involves what might be referred to as a Bayesian approach, and it differs from the first two approaches in that it does not involve either instantial generalization or inference to the best explanation, or, indeed, any sort of inductive inference. The idea, instead, is to start out from premises that are themselves substantive probabilistic claims, and then to show that it follows deductively from those premises, via axioms of probability theory, that it is unlikely that God exists.

The fourth and final approach, which has been set out by Michael Tooley, involves the idea of bringing a substantive theory of inductive logic, or logical probability, to bear upon the argument from evil, and then to argue that when this is done, one can derive a formula giving the probability that God does not exist relative to information about the number of apparent evils to be found in the world.

These four approaches will be set out and considered in the sections that follow.

### 3.2 Direct Inductive Versions of the Evidential Argument from Evil

#### 3.2.1 A Concrete, Deontological, and Direct Inductive Formulation

The basic idea behind a direct inductive formulation of the argument from evil is that the argument involves a crucial inductive step that takes the form of an inductive projection or generalization in which one moves from a premise concerning the known moral properties of some state of affairs to a conclusion about the likely overall moral worth of that state of affairs, given all its moral properties, both known and unknown.

Such a direct inductive argument might, for example, take the following form:

1. There are events in our world — such as an animal’s dying an agonizing death in a forest fire, and a child’s undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer — such that the actions of allowing those events, when one could prevent them, both (a) have very serious, known wrongmaking characteristics, and (b) have no rightmaking characteristics of which we are aware that are sufficient to balance out the known wrongmaking properties.

Therefore it is likely that:

1. For any such action, the totality of the wrongmaking properties, both known and unknown, outweighs the totality of the rightmaking properties, both known and unknown.
2. Any action whose wrongmaking properties outweigh its rightmaking properties is morally wrong.

Therefore, from (2) and (3) :

1. Such actions are morally wrong.
2. For any action whatever, an omnipotent and omniscient being is capable of not performing that action.

Therefore, from (4) and (5):

1. If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then that being performs some morally wrong actions.
2. A being that performs morally wrong actions is not morally perfect.

Therefore, from (6) and (7):

1. If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, that being is not morally perfect.
2. God is by definition an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person.

Therefore, from (8) and (9):

1. God does not exist.

When the argument from evil is formulated in this way, it involves five premises, set out at steps (1), (3), (5), (7) and (9). Statement (1) involves both empirical claims, and moral claims, but the empirical claims are surely true, and, setting aside the question of the existence of objective rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, the moral claims are surely also very plausible. The other four premises, set out at steps (3), (5), (7) and (9), are plausibly viewed as analytic truths.

As regards the logic of the argument, all of the steps in the argument, other than the inference from (1) to (2), are deductive, and are either clearly valid as they stand, or could be made so by trivial expansions of the argument at the relevant points. The upshot, accordingly, is that the above argument appears to stand or fall with the defensibility of the inductive inference from (1) to (2). The crucial questions, accordingly, are, first, exactly what the form of that inductive inference is, and, secondly, whether it is sound.

#### 3.2.2 A Natural Account of the Logic of the Inductive Step

A familiar and very common sort of inductive inference involves moving from information to the effect that all observed things of a certain type have a certain property to the conclusion that absolutely all things of the type in question have the relevant property. Could the inductive step in the evidential argument from evil perhaps be of that form?

One philosopher who has suggested that this is the case is William Rowe, in his 1991 article, “Ruminations about Evil”. Let us consider, then, whether that view can be sustained.

In that article, Rowe formulates the premise of the crucial inference as follows:

(P) No good state of affairs that we know of is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being’s obtaining it would morally justify that being’s permitting E1 or E2. (1991, 72)

(Here “E1” refers to a case of a fawn who dies in lingering and terrible fashion as a result of a forest fire, and “E2” to the case of a young girl who is brutally raped, beaten, and murdered.)

Commenting on P, Rowe emphasizes that what proposition P says is not simply that we cannot see how various goods would justify an omnipotent, omniscient being’s permitting E1 or E2, but rather,

The good states of affairs I know of, when I reflect on them, meet one or both of the following conditions: either an omnipotent being could obtain them without having to permit either E1 or E2, or obtaining them wouldn’t morally justify that being in permitting E1 or E2. (1991, 72)

Rowe then goes on to say that:

… if this is so, I have reason to conclude that:
(Q) No good state of affairs is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being’s obtaining it would morally justify that being’s permitting E1 or E2.
(1991, 72)

Rowe uses the letter ‘J’ “to stand for the property a good has just in case obtaining that good would justify an omnipotent, omniscient being in permitting E1 or E2” (1991, 73). When this is done, the above inference can be compactly represented as follows:

• (P) No good that we know of has J.

Therefore, probably:

• (Q) No good has J.

Rowe next refers to Plantinga’s criticism of this inference, and he argues that Plantinga’s criticism now amounts to the claim that

we are justified in inferring Q (No good has J) from P (No good we know of has J) only if we have a good reason to think that if there were a good that has J it would be a good that we are acquainted with and could see to have J. For the question can be raised: How can we have confidence in this inference unless we have a good reason to think that were a good to have J it would likely be a good within our ken? (1991, 73)

Rowe’s response is then as follows:

My answer is that we are justified in making this inference in the same way we are justified in making the many inferences we constantly make from the known to the unknown. All of us are constantly inferring from the $$A$$s we know of to the $$A$$s we don’t know of. If we observe many $$A$$s and note that all of them are $$B$$s we are justified in believing that the As we haven’t observed are also $$B$$s. Of course, these inferences may be defeated. We may find some independent reason to think that if an $$A$$ were a $$B$$ it would likely not be among the $$A$$s we have observed. But to claim that we cannot be justified in making such inferences unless we already know, or have good reason to believe, that were an $$A$$ not to be a $$B$$ it would likely be among the As we’ve observed is simply to encourage radical skepticism concerning inductive reasoning in general. (1991, 73)

Finally, Rowe points out that:

… in considering the inference from P to Q it is very important to distinguish two criticisms:
1. One is entitled to infer Q from P only if she has a good reason to think that if some good had J it would be a good that she knows of.
2. One is entitled to infer Q from P only if she has no reason to think that if some good had J it would likely not be a good that she knows of.

Plantinga’s criticism is of type (A). For the reason given, it is not a cogent criticism. But a criticism of type (B) is entirely proper to advance against any inductive inference of the sort we are considering. (1991, 73–4)

In view of the last point, Rowe concludes that “one important route for the theist to explore is whether there is some reason to think that were a good to have J it either would not be a good within our ken or would be such that although we apprehend this good we are incapable of determining that it has J,” (1991, 74).

#### 3.2.3 An Evaluation of this Account of the Inductive Step

First, Rowe is right that a criticism of type (A) does involve “radical skepticism of inductive reasoning in general”. But, secondly, having granted that point, how satisfactory is Rowe’s account of the reasoning involved? To answer that question, what one needs to notice is that Rowe’s claim that “if we observe many $$A$$s and note that all of them are $$B$$s we are justified in believing that the $$A$$s we haven’t observed are also $$B$$s” is somewhat ambiguous, since while the claim that “we are justified in believing that the $$A$$s we haven’t observed are also $$B$$s” might naturally be interpreted as saying

1. We are justified in believing that all the $$A$$s that we haven’t observed are also $$B$$s

it is possible to construe it as making, instead, the following, much weaker claim

1. We are justified in believing of each of the $$A$$s that we haven’t observed that that $$A$$ is also a $$B$$.

Let us consider, then, the relevance of this distinction. On the one hand, Rowe is certainly right that any criticism that claims that one is not justified in inferring (2) unless one has additional information to the effect that unobserved $$A$$s are not likely to differ from observed $$A$$s with respect to the possession of property $$B$$ entails inductive skepticism. But, by contrast, it is not true that this is so if one rejects, instead, the inference to (1). For one might reject the latter inference on the ground that while, given any particular $$A$$, it is likely that that $$A$$ is a $$B$$, it is not likely that all $$A$$s are $$B$$s. (Compare the situation with a very long conjunction: given any particular conjunct, it may be likely that that conjunct is true, while being very unlikely that every conjunct, and hence the conjunction as a whole, is true.)

This is important, moreover, because it is (1) that Rowe needs, since the conclusion that he is drawing does not concern simply the next morally relevant property that someone might consider: conclusion Q asserts, rather, that all further morally relevant properties will lack property J. Such a conclusion about all further cases is much stronger than a conclusion about the next case, and one might well think that in some circumstances a conclusion of the latter sort is justified, but that a conclusion of the former sort is not.

One way of supporting the latter claim is by introducing the idea of logical probability, where logical probability is a measure of the extent to which one proposition supports another (Carnap, 1962, 19–51, esp. 43–7), and then arguing (Tooley, 1977, 690–3, and 1987, 129–37) that when one is dealing with an accidental generalization, the probability that the regularity in question will obtain gets closer and closer to zero, without limit, as the number of potential instances gets larger and larger, and that this is so regardless of how large one’s evidence base is. Is it impossible, then, to justify universal generalizations? The answer is that if laws are more than mere regularities—and, in particular, if they are second-order relations between universals—then the obtaining of a law, and thus of the corresponding regularity, may have a very high probability upon even quite a small body of evidence. So universal generalizations can be justified, if they obtain in virtue of underlying, governing laws of nature.

The question then becomes whether Q expresses a law—or a consequence of a law. If—as seems plausible—it does not, then, although it is true that one in justified in holding, of any given, not yet observed morally relevant property, that it is unlikely to have property J, it may not be the case that it is probable that no goodmaking (or rightmaking) property has property J. It may, on the contrary, be probable that there is some morally relevant property that does have property J.

This objection could be overcome if one could argue that it is unlikely that there are many unknown goodmaking properties. For if the number is small, then the probability of Q may still be high even if Q does not express a law, or a consequence of a law. Moreover, I am inclined to think that it may well be possible to argue that it is unlikely that there are many unknown, morally relevant properties. But I also think that it is very likely that any attempt to establish this conclusion would involve some very controversial metaethical claims. As a consequence, I think that one is justified in concluding that such a line of argument is not especially promising.

### 3.3 Indirect Inductive Versions of the Evidential Argument from Evil

In his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Hume contended that it was not possible to arrive at the conclusion that the world had a perfectly good cause—or a perfectly evil one—starting out simply from a world that consists of a mixture of good and bad states of affairs:

There may four hypotheses be framed concerning the first causes of the universe: that they are endowed with perfect goodness, that they are endowed with perfect malice, that they are opposite and have both goodness and malice, that they have neither goodness nor malice. Mixed phenomena can never prove the two former unmixed principles. And the uniformity and steadiness of general laws seems to oppose the third. The fourth, therefore, seems by far the most probable. (1779, Part XI, 212)

But if this is right, and the hypothesis that the first cause (or causes) of the universe is neither good nor evil is more probable than the hypothesis that the first cause is perfectly good, then the probability of the latter must be less than one half.

Hume advanced, then, an evidential argument from evil that has a distinctly different logical form from that involved in direct inductive arguments, for the idea is to point to some proposition that is logically incompatible with theism, and then to argue that, given facts about undesirable states of affairs to be found in the world, that hypothesis is more probable than theism, and, therefore, that theism is more likely to be false than to be true.[3]:

More than two centuries later, Paul Draper, inspired by Hume, set out and defended this type of indirect inductive argument in a very detailed way. In doing so, Draper focused upon two alternative hypotheses, the first of which he referred to as “the Hypothesis of Indifference,” and which was as follows (1989, 13)[4]:

• (HI) neither the nature nor the condition of sentient beings on earth is the result of benevolent or malevolent actions performed by nonhuman persons.

Draper then focused upon three sets of propositions about occurrences of pleasure and pain, dealing, respectively, with (a) the experience of pleasure and pain, by moral agents, which is known to be biologically useful, (b) the experience of pleasure and pain, by sentient beings that are not moral agents, which is known to be biologically useful, and (c) the experience of pleasure and pain, by sentient beings, which is not known to be biologically useful, and Draper then argued that, where ‘O’ expresses the conjunction of all those propositions, and ‘T’ expresses the proposition that God exists, the probability that O is the case given HI is greater than the probability of O given T. It then follows, provided that the initial probability of T is no greater than that of HI, that T is more likely to be false than to be true.

To set out Draper’s argument in a little more detail, let us use ‘$$\Pr(P \mid Q)$$ ’ to stand for either the logical probability, or, as Draper (1996, 27) himself does, the epistemic probability, that $$P$$ is true, given that $$Q$$ is true, and then use the following instance of what is known as Bayes’ Theorem

$\tag{1} \Pr(H \mid E) = \frac{\Pr(H) \Pr(E \mid H)}{\Pr(H)\Pr(E \mid H) + \Pr(J)\Pr(E \mid J)}$

This instance of Bayes’ Theorem deals with the simple case where one has two hypotheses H and J that are mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive, and where one is interested in $$\Pr(H \mid E)$$, that is, the probability that H is true given evidence E. What this instance of Bayes’ Theorem does is provide one with a way of calculating that probability, provided that one knows, first of all, $$\Pr(H)$$ and $$\Pr(J)$$—that is, the a priori logical probabilities of $$H$$ and $$J$$—and also, second, $$\Pr(E \mid H)$$ and $$\Pr(E \mid J)$$—that is, the logical probability of $$E$$ given, respectively, only $$H$$ and only $$J$$. By substitution in (1), we have:

$\tag{2} \Pr(HI \mid O) = \frac{\Pr(HI)\Pr(O \mid HI)}{\Pr(HI)\Pr(O \mid HI) + \Pr(T)\Pr(O \mid T)}$

Similarly, by interchanging ‘HI’ and ‘T’, we also have:

$\tag{3} \Pr(T \mid O) = \frac{\Pr(T)\Pr(O \mid T)}{\Pr(T)\Pr(O \mid T) + \Pr(HI)\Pr(O \mid HI)}$

If we then divide (2) by (3) we arrive at the following very useful equation:

$\tag{4} \frac{\Pr(HI \mid O)}{\Pr(T \mid O)} = \frac{\Pr(HI)\Pr(O \mid HI)}{\Pr(T)\Pr(O \mid T)}$

So far, this is simply a matter of probability theory. But now Draper introduces two substantive claims. The first is that the a priori probability of the hypothesis of indifference is not less than the a priori probability of theism, so that we have

$\tag{5} \Pr(HI) \ge \Pr(T)$

Draper’s second substantive claim is that the conjunction of propositions about pleasure and pain to which Draper refers, and which is represented by ‘$$O$$’ is more likely to be true if the hypothesis of indifference is true than if theism is true. So we have

$\tag{6} \Pr(O \mid HI) \gt \Pr(O \mid T)$

But provided that $$\Pr(T)$$ and $$\Pr(O \mid T)$$ are not equal to zero—which is surely very reasonable—(5) and (6) can be rewritten as

$\tag{7} \frac{\Pr(HI)}{\Pr(T)} \ge 1$

and

$\tag{8} \frac{\Pr(O \mid HI)}{\Pr(O \mid T)} \gt 1$

It then follows, by multiplying (7) and (8), that

$\tag{9} \frac{\Pr(HI)\Pr(O \mid HI)}{\Pr(T)\Pr(O \mid T)} \gt 1$

This, together with (4), then entails:

$\tag{10} \frac{\Pr(HI \mid O)}{\Pr(T \mid O)} \gt 1$

Finally, Draper assumes (as a substantive premise) that the hypothesis of indifference is logically incompatible with theism:

$\tag{11} HI \text{ entails } \negt T$

It then follows from (10) and (11) that

$\tag{12} \Pr(\negt T \mid O) \gt \Pr(T \mid O)$

So we have the result that, given the facts about pleasure and pain summarized by ‘$$O$$’, theism is more likely to be false than to be true.

There are various points at which one might respond to this argument. First, it might be argued that the assumption that the hypothesis of indifference is logically incompatible with theism is not obviously true. For might it not be logically possible that there was an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect being who created a neutral environment in which evolution could take place in a chancy way, and who afterwards did not intervene in any way? But, if so, then while $$T$$ would be true, $$HI$$ might also be true—as it would be if there were no other nonhuman persons. So, at the very least, it is not clear that $$HI$$ entails $$\negt T$$.

Secondly, it might also be argued that the substantive premise introduced at (5)—that is, $$\Pr(HI) \ge \Pr(T)$$— is open to question. Draper supports it by arguing that whereas the hypothesis of theism involves some ontological commitment, the Hypothesis of Indifference does not. But, on the other hand, the latter involves a completely universal generalization about the absence of any action upon the earth by any nonhuman persons, of either a benevolent or malevolent sort, and it is far from clear why the prior probability of this being so should be greater than the prior probability of theism.

Both of these objections can be avoided, however, by simply shifting from $$HI$$ to a different alternative hypothesis that Draper also mentions, namely, “The Indifferent Deity Hypothesis”:

There exists an omnipotent and omniscient person who created the Universe and who has no intrinsic concern about the pain or pleasure of other beings. (1989, 26)

Thirdly, it can be objected that the argument does not really move far beyond two of its three crucial assumptions—the assumptions set out, namely, at steps (5) and (11), to the effect that $$\Pr(HI) \ge \Pr(T)$$, and $$HI$$ entails $$\negt T$$. For given those assumptions, it follows immediately that $$\Pr(T) \le 0.5$$, and so the rest of the argument merely moves from that conclusion to the conclusion that $$\Pr(T) \lt 0.5$$.

One response to this objection is that the move from $$\Pr(T) \le 0.5$$ to $$\Pr(T) \lt 0.5$$ is not insignificant, since it is a move from a situation in which acceptance of theism may not be irrational to one where it is certainly is. Nevertheless, the objection does bring out an important point, namely, that the argument as it stands says nothing at all about how much below 0.5 the probability of theism is.

Fourthly, objections can be directed at the arguments that Draper offers in support of a third substantive premise—namely, that introduced at (6). Some of the objections directed against this premise are less than impressive—and some seem very implausible indeed, as in the case, for example, of Peter van Inwagen, who has to appeal to quite an extraordinary claim about the conditions that one must satisfy in order to claim that a world is logically possible:

One should start by describing in some detail the laws of nature that govern that world. (Physicists’ actual formulations of quantum field theories and the general theory of relativity provide the standard of required “detail.”) One should then go on to describe the boundary conditions under which those laws operate; the topology of the world’s space-time, its relativistic mass, the number of particle families, and so on. Then one should tell in convincing detail the story of cosmic evolution in that world: the story of the development of large objects like galaxies and of stars and of small objects like carbon atoms. Finally, one should tell the story of the evolution of life. (1991, 146)

Such objections tend to suggest that any flaws in Draper’s argument in support of the crucial premise are less than obvious. Nevertheless, given that the argument that Draper offers in support of the premise at (6) involves a number of detailed considerations, very careful scrutiny of those arguments would be needed before one could conclude that the premise is justified.

Finally, rather than attacking the argument itself, one might instead argue that, while it is sound, the conclusion is not really a significant one. For what matters is not whether there is some evidence relative to which it is unlikely that theism is true. What matters is whether theism is improbable relative to our total evidence. But, then, suppose that we introduce some different observations—$$O^*$$—such that it seems plausible that $$O^*$$ is more likely to be the case if theism is true that if the Hypothesis of Indifference is true. For example, $$O^*$$ might be some proposition about the occurrences of experiences that seem to be experiences of a loving deity. The question then is whether the appropriate revision of the first substantive premise is plausible. That is, do we have good reason for thinking that the following statement is true:

$\tag{$$6^\&$$} \Pr(O \amp O^* \mid HI) \gt \Pr(O \amp O^* \mid T) \, ?$

At the very least, it would seem that $$(6^{\&})$$ is much more problematic than $$(6)$$. But if that is right, then the above, Draper-style argument, even if all of its premises are true, is not as significant as it may initially appear, since if $$(6^{\&})$$ is not true, the conclusion that theism is more likely to be false than to be true can be undercut by introducing additional evidence of a pro-theist sort.

A Draper-style argument is one type of indirect inductive argument from evil. It is important to notice, however, that in formulating an indirect inductive argument from evil, one need not proceed along the route that Draper chooses. This is clear if one focuses upon Hume’s formulation, and then thinks in terms of the idea of an inference to the best explanation of the “mixed phenomena” that one finds. If one explains the fact that the world contains an impressive mixture of desirable and undesirable states of affairs by the hypothesis that the creator of the world was an omnipotent, omniscient, and indifferent deity, then nothing more needs to be added. By contrast, if one wants to explain the mixed state of the world by the hypothesis that the creator of the world was an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect deity, one needs to postulate the existence of additional, morally significant properties that lie beyond our ken, and ones, moreover, that are so distributed that the mixed appearance does not correspond to what is really the case. A theistic explanation is, accordingly, less simple than an indifferent deity explanation, and therefore, provided that one can argue that the a priori probability of the latter hypothesis is not less than that of the former, one can appeal to the greater simplicity of the latter in order to conclude that it has a higher posterior probability than the theistic hypothesis. It then follows, given that the two hypotheses are logically incompatible, that the probability of the theistic hypothesis must be less than one half.

### 3.4 William Rowe’s Bayesian-Style Probabilistic Versions of the Evidential Argument from Evil

We have just considered the Bayesian-style argument offered by Paul Draper. Let us now turn to another.

In his 1996 paper, “The Evidential Argument from Evil: A Second Look”, Rowe set aside the problem of attempting to find a satisfactory account of the inductive step involved in direct, inductive formulations of the argument from evil in favor of a very different, Bayesian formulation of the argument from evil. The latter argument has been vigorously criticized by Plantinga (1998), but Rowe (1998) has remained confident that the new argument is sound.

#### 3.4.1 A Summary of Rowe’s Bayesian Argument

Rowe’s new argument can be summarized as follows. First, its formulation involves only three propositions, one of which is proposition $$k$$, which expresses, roughly, the totality of our background knowledge, while the other two propositions are as follows:

• $$(P)$$ No good that we know of justifies an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being in permitting $$E_1$$ and $$E_2$$;
• $$(G)$$ There is an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being.

Secondly, the object of the argument as a whole is to start out from some probabilistic assumptions, and then to move deductively, using only axioms of probability theory, to the following two conclusions:

\begin{align} \tag{C1} & \Pr(G \mid P \amp k) \lt \Pr(G \mid k) \\ \tag{C2} & \Pr(G \mid P \amp k) \lt 0.5 \,. \end{align}

The first conclusion, then, is that the probability that God exists is lower given the combination of $$P$$ together with our background knowledge than it is given our background knowledge alone. Thus $$P$$ disconfirms $$G$$ in the sense of lowering the probability of $$G$$. The second conclusion is that $$P$$ disconfirms $$G$$ in a different sense—namely, it, together with our background knowledge, makes it more likely than not that $$G$$ is false.

Thirdly, in order to establish the first conclusion, Rowe needs only the following three assumptions:

\begin{align} \tag{1} & \Pr(P \mid \negt G \amp k) = 1 \\ \tag{2} & \Pr(\negt G \mid k) \gt 0 \\ \tag{3} & \Pr(P \mid G \amp k) \lt 1 \end{align}

Fourthly, all three assumptions, interpreted as Rowe does, are surely eminently reasonable. As regards (1), it follows from the fact that for any two propositions $$q$$ and $$r$$, if $$q$$ entails $$r$$ then $$\Pr(r \mid q) = 1$$, together with the fact that Rowe interprets $$P$$ in such a way that $$\negt G$$ entails $$P$$, since he interprets $$P$$ as saying that it is not the case that there is an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good being together with some known good that justifies that being in allowing $$E_1$$ and $$E_2$$.

Then, as regards (2) and (3), it certainly seems plausible, first of all, assuming that the existence of God is not logically necessary, that there is at least some non-zero probability that God does not exist, given our background knowledge, and also that there is some non-zero probability that no good that we know of justifies an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being in permitting $$E_1$$ and $$E_2$$.

Secondly, if the existence of God is neither a logically necessary truth nor entailed by our background knowledge, and if the existence of God together with our background knowledge does not logically entail that no good that we know of justifies an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being in permitting $$E_1$$ and $$E_2$$, then one can support (2) and (3) by appealing to the very plausible principle that the probability of $$r$$ given $$q$$ is equal to one if and only if $$q$$ entails $$r$$.

Finally, to establish the second conclusion—that is, that relative to our background knowledge together with proposition $$P$$ it is more likely than not that God does not exist—Rowe needs only one additional assumption:

$\tag{4} \Pr(G \mid k) \le 0.5$

Given assumptions (1), (2), and (3), how does the argument for the first conclusion go? In outline, one first uses (1), (2), and (3) to prove that

$\notag \Pr(P \mid k) \gt \Pr(P \mid G \amp k) \$

It then follows very quickly that

$\notag \Pr(G \mid k) \gt \Pr(G \mid P \amp k) \$

Assumption (4) then allows one to conclude that

$\notag \Pr(G \mid P \amp k)\lt 0.5\ \$

Here are the details.

The key starting point is with the following theorem of probability theory (Compare Draper, 1996, 268):

$\tag{5} \Pr(P \mid k) = [\Pr(\negt G\mid k)\times \Pr(P \mid \negt G \amp k)] + [\Pr(G\mid k)\times \Pr(P \mid G \amp k)]$

Substituting into (5) using assumption (1) then gives one:

$\tag{6} \Pr(P \mid k) = [\Pr(\negt G\mid k) \times 1] + [\Pr(G\mid k)\times \Pr(P \mid G \amp k)]$

Next, it is a truth of probability theory that

$\tag{7} \Pr(G \mid k) = [1 - \Pr(\negt G \mid k)]$

Using (7) to substitute into (6) one has

\begin{align} \tag{8} &\Pr(P \mid k) \\ \notag &= \Pr(\negt G\mid k) + [[1 - \Pr(\negt G \mid k)]\times \Pr(P \mid G \amp k)] \\ \notag &= \Pr(\negt G\mid k) + \Pr(P \mid G \amp k) - [\Pr(\negt G \mid k)\times \Pr(P \mid G \amp k)] \\ \end{align}

Subtracting $$\Pr(P \mid G \amp k)$$ from each side of (8) then gives one:

\begin{align} \tag{9} &\Pr(P \mid k) - \Pr(P \mid G \amp k) \\ \notag &= \Pr(\negt G\mid k) - [\Pr(\negt G \mid k)\times \Pr(P \mid G \amp k)] \\ \notag &= \Pr(\negt G\mid k)\times [1 - \Pr(P \mid G \amp k)] \end{align}

But then in view of assumption (2) we have that $$\Pr(\negt G \mid k) \gt 0$$, while in view of assumption (3) we have that $$\Pr(P \mid G \amp k) \lt 1$$, and thus that $$[1 - \Pr(P \mid G \amp k)] \gt 0$$, so that it then follows from (9) that

$\tag{10} \Pr(P \mid k) -\Pr(P \mid G \amp k) \gt 0. \$

So one has

$\tag{11} \Pr(P \mid k) \gt \Pr(P \mid G \amp k) \$

The next stage involve showing that it follows from (11) that

$\notag \Pr(G \mid P \amp k) \lt \Pr(G \mid k) \$

This is done as follows.

First, it follows from the definition of conditional probability one has

$\tag{12} \Pr(P \amp G\amp k) = \Pr(G \mid P \amp k)] \times \Pr(P\mid k)$

and

$\tag{13} \Pr(P \amp G\amp k) = \Pr(P \mid G \amp k)] \times \Pr(G\mid k)$

So we have

$\tag{14} \Pr(G \mid P \amp k)] \times \Pr(P\mid k) = \Pr(P \mid G \amp k)] \times \Pr(G\mid k)$

Dividing both sides of (13) by $$\Pr(G \mid k) \times \Pr(P \mid k)$$ then gives one:

$\tag{15} \frac{\Pr(G \mid P \amp k)}{\Pr(G \mid k)} = \frac{\Pr(P \mid G \amp k)}{\Pr(P \mid k)}$

It then follows from (15) together with (11) that

$\tag{16} \Pr(G \mid P \amp k) \lt \Pr(G \mid k)$

Finally, it then follows from (16) together with (4) that

$\tag{17} \Pr(G \mid P \amp k) \lt 0.5$

#### 3.4.2 The Flaw in the Argument

Given the plausibility of assumptions (1), (2), and (3), together with the impeccable logic, the prospects of faulting Rowe’s argument for his first conclusion may not seem at all promising. Nor does the situation seem significantly different in the case of Rowe’s second conclusion, since assumption (4) also seems very plausible, in view of the fact that the property of being an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good being belongs to a family of properties, including the property of being an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly evil being, and the property of being an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly morally indifferent being, and, on the face of it, neither of the latter properties seems less likely to be instantiated in the actual world than the property of being an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good being.

In fact, however, Rowe’s argument is unsound. The reason is connected with the point that while inductive arguments can fail, just as deductive arguments can, either because their logic is faulty, or their premises false, inductive arguments can also fail in a way that deductive arguments cannot, in that they may violate a principle—namely, the Total Evidence Requirement—which I shall be setting out below, and Rowe’s argument is defective in precisely that way.

A good way of approaching the objection that I have in mind is by considering the following, preliminary objection to Rowe’s argument for the conclusion that

$\notag \Pr(G \mid P \amp k) \lt 0.5 \, .$

The objection is based on upon the observation that Rowe’s argument involves, as we saw above, only the following four premises:

\begin{align} \tag{1} & \Pr(P \mid \negt G \amp k) = 1 \\ \tag{2} & \Pr(\negt G \mid k) \gt 0 \\ \tag{3} & \Pr(P \mid G \amp k) \lt 1 \\ \tag{4} & \Pr(G \mid k) \le 0.5 \end{align}

Notice now, first, that the proposition $$P$$ enters only into the first and the third of these premises, and secondly, that the truth of both of these premises is easily secured. Thus, for the first premise to be true, all that is needed is that $$\negt G$$ entails $$P$$, while for the third premise to be true, all that is needed, according to most systems of inductive logic, is that $$P$$ is not entailed by $$G \amp k$$, since according to most systems of inductive logic, $$\Pr(P \mid G \amp k) \lt 1$$ is only false if $$P$$ is entailed by $$G \amp k$$.

Given assumptions (1), (2), and (3), how does the argument for the first conclusion go? In outline, one first uses (1), (2), and (3) to prove that $$\Pr(P \mid G \amp k) \lt 1$$

Consider, now, what happens if, for example, Rowe’s $$P$$ is replaced by:

Either God does not exist, or there is a pen in my pocket.

Statements (1) and (3) will both be true given that replacement, while statements (2) and (4) are unaffected, and one will be able to derive the same conclusions as in Rowe’s Bayesian argument. But if this is so, then the theist can surely claim, it would seem, that the fact that Rowe’s ‘$$P$$’ refers to evil in the world turns out to play no crucial role in Rowe’s new argument!

This objection, however, is open to the following reply. The reason that I am justified in believing the proposition that either God does not exist or there is a pen in my pocket is that I am justified in believing that there is a pen in my pocket. The proposition that either God does not exist or there is a pen in my pocket therefore does not represent the total evidence that I have. But the argument in question cannot be set out in terms of the proposition that, we can suppose, does in this case represent one’s total evidence—namely, the proposition that there is a pen in my pocket—since that proposition is not entailed by $$\negt G$$.

The conclusion, in short, is that the above parody of Rowe’s argument doesn’t work, since the parody violates the following requirement:

The Total Evidence Requirement:
For any proposition that is not non-inferentially justified, the probability that one should assign to that proposition’s being true is the probability that the proposition has relative to one’s total evidence.

But this response to the above objection to the argument for the conclusion that

$\notag \Pr(G \mid P \amp k) \lt 0.5$

now makes it clear that there a decisive objection to the argument as a whole. For notice that if $$P$$—the statement that

No good we know of justifies an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being in permitting $$E_1$$ and $$E_2$$

—is interpreted in such a way that $$\negt G$$ entails $$P$$, it is then logically equivalent to the following disjunctive statement:

$\notag \negt G \text{ or } P^*$

where $$P^*$$ is the proposition that Rowe sets out in footnote 8 of his article, namely:

No good we know of would justify God, (if he exists) in permitting $$E_1$$ and $$E_2$$ (1996, 283)

Once this is noticed, it is clear that Rowe’s argument is open to precisely the same response as that used against the objection to the parody argument just considered, since the justification that one can offer for $$\negt G$$ or $$P^*$$ is in fact just a justification of the second disjunct—that is, $$P^*$$. This means that in appealing to $$P$$ (i.e., to $$(\negt G)$$ or $$P^*$$) one is not making use of one’s total evidence. So Rowe’s argument, if it is to be sound, must instead be formulated in terms of $$P^*$$.

But while $$\negt G$$ entails $$P$$, it does not entail $$P^*$$. So the result of replacing ‘P’ by ‘P*’ in statement (1)—that is

$\tag{$$1^*$$} \Pr(P^* \mid \negt G \amp k) = 1$

—will not be true, and so an argument of the form that Rowe offers will not go through. Rowe’s Bayesian argument is, therefore, unsound.

### 3.5 Inductive Logic and the Evidential Argument from Evil

In section 3.2.1, a concrete, deontological, and direct inductive formulation of the argument from evil was set out. All of the steps in that argument were deductive, except for the following crucial inference:

1. There are events in our world — such as an animal’s dying an agonizing death in a forest fire, and a child’s undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer — such that the actions of allowing those events, when one could prevent them, both (a) have very serious, known wrongmaking characteristics, and (b) have no rightmaking characteristics of which we are aware that are sufficient to balance out the known wrongmaking properties.

Therefore it is likely that:

1. For any such action, the totality of the wrongmaking properties, both known and unknown, outweighs the totality of the rightmaking properties, both known and unknown.

The question, accordingly, is whether this inductive step is correct.

Essentially, there are three ways in which one might attempt to defend this inference. One is by treating it as a case of instantial generalization. But as we saw in effect in section 3.2.3, when we considered a formulation of the evidential argument from evil advanced by William Rowe, it appears that the inductive step in the argument from evil cannot be defended by appealing to instantial generalization.

A second approach is to view that inductive step as a matter of inference to the best explanation, and this is a more promising possibility. That approach would lead to an argument of the general form advanced by David Hume and Paul Draper, considered in section.

There is, however, a third possibility, which is the focus of the present section. Underlying this approach are two general ideas: the first is that both induction via instantial generalization and inference to the best explanation (abduction, the method of hypothesis, hypothetico-deductive method) stand in need of justification; the second idea is that at the heart of such a justification will be the defense of an account of logical probability.

The fundamental idea, accordingly, is that the way to determine whether the inductive step that lies at the heart of the evidential argument from evil is sound is by bringing serious inductive logic—understood as a theory of logical probability—to bear upon the question.

What is the appropriate theory of logical probability? Tooley (2008 and 2012) employs a Carnapian theory in which the basic equiprobability assumption is formulated in terms of what are called ‘structure descriptions’, and the fundamental postulate is that all structure descriptions are equally likely. But if one holds, as Tooley (1977 and 1987) does, that governing laws are logically possible, then it is clear that the fundamental equiprobability assumption needs to be formulated in terms of governing laws of nature. At present, however, no detailed formulation of such an approach to logical probability is available.

#### 3.5.1 An Illustration of the General Underlying Idea

To establish that the inductive step in the version of the evidential argument from evil set out above is sound requires a rather technical argument in inductive logic. But one can gain an intuitive understanding of the underlying idea in the following way. Suppose that there is a rightmaking property of which we have no knowledge. If an action of allowing a child to be brutally killed possessed that property, then it might not be wrong to allow that action, depending upon the weightiness of that unknown rightmaking property. But the existence of unknown rightmaking properties is no more likely, a priori, than of unknown wrongmaking properties. So let us suppose, then, for this illustration, that there are two morally significant properties of which we humans have no knowledge—a rightmaking property $$R$$, and a wrongmaking property $$W$$. Let us suppose, further, that these two properties are equally weighty, since, a priori, there is no reason for supposing that one is more significant than the other. Finally, let $$A$$ be an action of knowingly allowing a child to be brutally killed, and let us suppose that the unknown morally significant rightmaking property $$R$$ is weightier than the wrongmaking property of knowingly allowing a child to be brutally killed. One can then see that there are the following four possibilities:

1. Action $$A$$ has both unknown properties, $$R$$ and $$W$$. In this case, those two unknown properties cancel one another out, and action $$A$$ will be morally wrong, all things considered.
2. Action $$A$$ has the unknown rightmaking property $$R$$, but not the unknown wrongmaking property $$W$$. In this case, action $$A$$ may be morally permissible, all things considered, on the assumption that property $$R$$ is sufficiently strong to outweigh the known wrongmaking property of allowing a child to be brutally killed.
3. Action $$A$$ has the unknown wrongmaking property $$W$$, but not the unknown rightmaking property $$R$$. In this case, action $$A$$ is even more wrong, all things considered, than it initially appeared to be.
4. Action $$A$$ does not have either of the unknown, morally significant properties, $$R$$ and $$W$$. In this case action $$A$$ is morally wrong to precisely the degree that it initially appeared to be.

The upshot is that in this simplified example, at least three of the four possibilities that we have considered are such that action $$A$$ turns out to be morally wrong, all things considered.

The intuitive idea, then, is that if one has an action that, given only its known rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, is an action that it would be morally wrong to perform, then it is more likely than not it is also an action that it would be morally wrong to perform, given the totality of its morally significant properties, both known and unknown.

But what underlies this intuitive idea? The answer is a certain very fundamental and very plausible equiprobability principle, to the effect that if one has a family of mutually exclusive properties, and if $$P$$ and $$Q$$ are any two members of that family, then the a priori probability that something has property $$P$$ is equal to the a priori probability that that thing has property $$Q$$. For then given that principle, one can consider the family of second order properties that contains the second-order property of being a rightmaking property and the second-order property of being a wrongmaking property, and then the equiprobability principle in question entails that the a priori probability that a given property $$P$$ has the second-order property of being a rightmaking property is equal to the a priori probability that property $$P$$ has the second-order property of being a wrongmaking property. Similarly, if one considers instead the family of properties that contains, for example, the second-order property of being a rightmaking property of weight $$W$$ and the second-order property of being a wrongmaking property of weight $$W$$, the a priori probability that a given property $$P$$ has the first of those second-order properties is equal to the a priori probability that property $$P$$ has the second of those properties.

The upshot is that given an action that would be morally wrong if judged only by its known morally significant properties, every possibility of a combination of unknown rightmaking and wrongmaking properties that would make that action morally right all things considered would be precisely counterbalanced by a combination of unknown rightmaking and wrongmaking properties that would make that action morally even more wrong, all things considered. But, in addition, there can be combinations of unknown rightmaking and wrongmaking properties that would move an action in the direction of being morally right all things considered, but not sufficiently far to make it morally right all things considered. Finally, there is the possibility that the action has no unknown morally significant properties.

Consequently, if an action is one that it would be morally wrong to perform, if judged only by its known morally significant properties, then it is more likely than not that it is one that it is morally wrong to perform given the totality of its morally significant properties, both known and unknown.

Then, the probability that, judged in the light of all rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, known and unknown, it would not be morally wrong to allow the event in question must be less than $$\frac{1}{2}$$.

The upshot is that the probabilistic inference that is involved in the move from statement (1) to statement (2) in the argument set out above in section 3.2.1 is inductively sound.

#### 3.5.2 The Formal Result

How is the formal calculation carried out? The answer is somewhat complicated, and there are slightly different ways of doing it, as in (Tooley 2008 and 2012b), with the method used in the latter case being perhaps slightly more perspicuous, but with both methods generating the same result. The key in both cases, moreover, is to make assumptions that increase the probability that an action that is morally wrong as judged only by its known rightmaking and wrongmaking properties is morally right relative to the totality of its morally significant properties, both known and unknown. In the absence of those ‘probability-increasing’ assumptions, it is not at all clear how the calculation could be carried out.

In the case where one focuses only upon a single action whose known wrongmaking properties outweigh its known rightmaking properties, the result is as one would expect, namely, that the probability that the action in question is not morally wrong relative to the totality of its morally significant properties, both known and unknown, must be less than one half.

But what is the general result? Suppose, for example, that there are $$n$$ events, each of which is such that, judged simply by known rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, it would be morally wrong to allow that event. What is the probability that none of those $$n$$ events is such that it would be morally wrong to allow that event, judged in the light of all rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, both known and unknown?

The answer is arrived at by proving the following theorem dealing with the case where there are precisely $$k$$ unknown morally significant properties:

If there are $$k$$ unknown morally significant properties, then given $$n$$ events, each of which is such that, judged simply by known rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, it would be morally wrong to allow that event, the probability that none of those events is such that it is morally wrong to allow that event, judged in the light of all rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, known and unknown, must be less than $\notag \left( \dfrac{k}{k+1} \right) \left( \dfrac{1}{n+1} \right) \,.$

As one can see, this upper bound on the probability that it is not morally wrong to allow any of the $$n$$ events increases as $$k$$, the number of unknown morally significant properties, increases, and as $$k$$ increases without limit, it will tend to the limit of $$\frac{1}{n+1}$$.

One therefore has the following theorem:

Given $$k$$ events, each of which is such that, judged simply by known rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, it would be morally wrong to allow that event, the probability that none of those events is such that it is morally wrong to allow that event, judged in the light of all rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, both known and unknown, must be less than $$\frac{1}{n+1}$$.

#### 3.5.3 The Argument from Evil: A Quantitative Result

This approach arguably has two advantages over alternative accounts of the inductive step that lies at the heart of the argument from evil. One is that in bringing in an equiprobability principle, one is approaching the issue at a more fundamental level than any approach that appeals either to instantial generalization or inference to the best explanation. The other is that this approach generates a result that enables one not just to conclude that it is more likely than not that God does not exist, but also to assign an upper bound to the probability that God exists.

The upper bound, moreover, is surely very low indeed, for of the billions of people and sentient non-persons who have existed, the proportion who have had the good fortune never to have suffered in ways such that the known wrongmaking properties of allowing such suffering outweighed the known rightmaking properties must be small. Accordingly, $$n$$ must be extremely large, and thus the probability that there is an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person must be very low indeed.

## 4. Responses to the Argument from Evil: Refutations, Theodicies, and Defenses

Given an evidential formulation of the evidential argument from evil, what sorts of responses are possible? A natural way of dividing up possible responses is into what may be referred to as total refutations, theodicies, and defenses. So let us begin by considering what is involved in these three different, general types of responses.

This threefold classification can be arrived at by the following line of thought. An advocate of the argument from evil is claiming, in the first place, that there are facts about the evils in the world that make it prima facie unreasonable to believe in the existence of God, and, in the second place, that the situation is not altered when those facts are conjoined with all the other things that one is justified in believing, both inferentially and non-inferentially, so that belief in the existence of God is also unreasonable relative to the total evidence available, together with all relevant basis states. In responding to the argument from evil, then, one might challenge either of these claims. That is to say, one might grant, at least for the sake of argument, that there are facts about evil that, other things being equal, render belief in God unreasonable, but then argue that when those considerations are embedded within one’s total epistemic situation, belief in the existence of God can be seen to be reasonable, all things considered. Alternatively, one might defend the more radical thesis that there are no facts about evil in the world that make it even prima facie unreasonable to believe in the existence of God.

If the latter thesis is correct, the argument from evil does not even get started. Such responses to the argument from evil are naturally classified, therefore, as attempted, total refutations of the argument.

The proposition that relevant facts about evil do not make it even prima facie unreasonable to believe in the existence of God probably strikes most philosophers, of course, as rather implausible. We shall see, however, that a number of philosophical theists have attempted to defend this type of response to the argument from evil.

The alternative course is to grant that there are facts about intrinsically undesirable states of the world that make it prima facie unreasonable to believe that God exists, but then to argue that belief in the existence of God is not unreasonable, all things considered. This response may take, however, two slightly different forms. One possibility is the offering of a complete theodicy. As I shall use that term, this involves the thesis that, for every actual evil found in the world, one can describe some state of affairs that it is reasonable to believe exists, and which is such that, if it exists, will provide an omnipotent and omniscient being with a morally sufficient reason for allowing the evil in question.

It should be noted here that the term “theodicy” is sometimes used in a stronger sense, according to which a person who offers a theodicy is attempting to show not only that such morally sufficient reasons exist, but that the reasons cited are in fact God’s reasons. Alvin Plantinga (1974a, 10; 1985a, 35) and Robert Adams (1985, 242) use the term in that way, but, as has been pointed out by a number of writers, including Richard Swinburne (1988, 298), and William Hasker (1988, 5), that is to saddle the theodicist with an unnecessarily ambitious program.

The other possibility is that of offering a defense. But what is a defense? In the context of abstract, incompatibility versions of the argument from evil, this term is generally used to refer to attempts to show that there is no logical incompatibility between the existence of evil and the existence of God. Such attempts involve setting out a story that entails the existence of both God and evil, and that is logically consistent. But as soon as one focuses upon evidential formulations of the argument from evil, a different interpretation is needed if the term is to remain a useful one, since the production of a logically consistent story that involves the existence of both God and evil will do nothing to show that evil does not render the existence of God unlikely, or even very unlikely.

So what more is required beyond a logically consistent story of a certain sort? One answer that is suggested by some discussions is that the story needs to be one that is true for all we know. Thus Peter van Inwagen, throughout his book The Problem of Evil, frequently claims that various propositions are “true for all we know,” and in the “Detailed Contents” section at the beginning of his book, he offers the following characterization of the idea of a defense:

The idea of a “defense” is introduced: that is, the idea of a story that contains both God and all the evils that actually exist, a story that is put forward not as true but as “true for all anyone knows”. (2006, xii)

It seems very unlikely, however, that its merely being the case that one does not know that the story is false can suffice, since it may very well be the case that, though one does not know that p is false, one does have very strong evidence that it is. But if one has strong evidence that a story is false, it is hard to see how the story on its own could possibly counter an evidential argument from evil.

It seems, accordingly, that some claim about the probability of the story’s being true is needed. One possibility, suggested by some discussions, is that one might claim that rather than the story’s being a remote possibility that has only a miniscule chance of being true, the story represents “a real possibility”, and so has a substantial chance of being true. Thus, while Peter van Inwagen usually talks about his stories’ being true for all anyone knows, he also introduces the distinction between remote possibilities, and real possibilities (2006, Lecture 4, esp. pp. 66–71).

It is also hard to see, however, how this can be sufficient either. Suppose, for example, that one tells a story about God and the Holocaust, which is such that if it were true, an omnipotent being would have been morally justified in not preventing the Holocaust. Suppose, further, that one claims that there is a twenty percent chance that the story is true. A twenty percent chance is certainly a real possibility, but how would that twenty percent chance undermine a version of the argument from evil whose conclusion was that the probability that an omnipotent being would be justified in allowing the Holocaust was very low?

Given the apparent failure of the previous two suggestions, a natural conclusion is that the story that is involved in a defense must be one that is likely to be true. But if this is right, how does a defense differ from a theodicy? The answer is that while a theodicy must specify reasons that would suffice to justify an omnipotent and omniscient being in allowing all of the evils found in the world, a defense need merely show that it is likely that there are reasons which would justify an omnipotent and omniscient being in not preventing the evils that one finds in the world, even if one does not know what those reasons are. A defense differs from a theodicy, then, in that a defense attempts to show only that some God-justifying reasons probably exist; it does not attempt to specify what they are.

There is, however, one final possibility that needs to be considered. This is the idea that what is needed in a defense is not a story that can be shown to be likely to be true, but, rather, a story that, for all we know, is not unlikely. The thought here is that, even if there is some probability that the story has relative to our evidential base, we may not be able to determine what that probability is, or even any reasonably delimited range in which that probability falls. If so, it cannot be shown that the story is likely to be true, but neither can it be shown that the story is unlikely to be true.

The question that immediately arises is whether a proposition that would undercut an inductive argument from evil if one knew it were true can undercut the argument if one is unable to assign any probability to the proposition’s being true, and if so, how. One thought might be that if one can assign no probability to a proposition, one should treat it as equally likely to be true as to be false. But propositions vary dramatically in logical form: some are such as might naturally be viewed as atomic, others are sweeping generalizations, others are complex conjunctions, and so on. If one treated any proposition to which one could not assign a probability as equally likely to be true as to be false, the result would be an incoherent assignment of probabilities. On the other hand, if one adopts this idea only in the case of atomic propositions, then given that stories that are advanced in defenses and theodicies are typically quite complex, those stories will wind up getting assigned low probabilities, and it is then unclear how they could undercut an inductive argument from evil.

## 5. Attempted Total Refutations

There are at least three main ways in which one might attempt to show that the argument from evil does not succeed in establishing that evil is even prima facie evidence against the existence of God, let alone that the existence of God is improbable relative to our total evidence. The first appeals to human epistemological limitations; the second, to the claim that there is no best of all possible worlds; and the third, to the ontological argument.

### 5.1 Human Epistemological Limitations

The most popular attempt at a total refutation of the argument from evil claims that, because of human cognitive limitations, there is no sound inductive argument that can enable one to move from the premise that there are states of affairs that, taking into account only what we know, it would be morally very wrong for an omnipotent and omniscient person to allow to exist, to the conclusion that there are states of affairs such that it is likely that, all things considered, it would be morally very wrong for an omnipotent and omniscient person to allow those states of affairs to exist.

The appeal to human cognitive limitations does raise a very important issue, and we have seen that one very natural account of the logical form of the inductive step in the case of a direct inductive argument is not satisfactory. But, as we have seen in sections 3.3 and 3.4, there are other accounts of the type of reasoning involved in the crucial inductive step in evidential forms of the argument from evil. First of all, the appeal to human cognitive limitations does not itself show that there is anything wrong either with the reasoning that Draper offers in support of the crucial premise in his indirect inductive version of the argument from evil, or with the inference to the best explanation type of reasoning employed in the updated version of Hume’s indirect inductive formulation of the argument from evil. Secondly, the appeal to human cognitive limitations provides no reason at all for rejecting the version of the argument from evil that appeals to fundamental equiprobability principles of inductive logic, principles that arguably must obtain if any sort of induction is ever justified.

Short of embracing compete inductive skepticism, then, it would seem that an appeal to human cognitive limitations cannot provide an answer to evidential versions of the argument from evil.

### 5.2 The ‘No Best of All Possible Worlds’ Response

A second way of attempting to show that the argument from evil does not even get started is by appealing to the proposition that there is no best of all possible worlds. Here the basic idea is that if for every possible world, however good, there is a better one, then the fact that this world could be improved upon does not give one any reason for concluding that, if there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, that being cannot be morally perfect.

This response to the argument from evil has been around for quite a while. In recent years, however, it has been strongly advocated by George Schlesinger (1964, 1977), and, more recently, by Peter Forrest (1981)—though Forrest, curiously, describes the defense as one that has been “neglected”, and refers neither to Schlesinger’s well-known discussions, nor to the very strong objections that have been directed against this response to the argument from evil.

The natural response to this attempt to refute the argument from evil was set out very clearly some years ago by Nicholas La Para (1965) and Haig Khatchadourian (1966) among others, and it has been developed in an especially forceful and detailed way in an article by Keith Chrzan (1987). The basic thrust of this response is that the argument from evil, when properly formulated in a deontological fashion, does not turn upon the claim that this world could be improved upon, or upon the claim that it is not the best of all possible worlds: it turns instead upon the claim that there are good reasons for holding that the world contains evils, including instances of suffering, that it would be morally wrong, all things considered, for an omnipotent and omniscient being to allow. As a consequence, the proposition that there might be better and better worlds without limit is simply irrelevant to the argument from evil, properly formulated.

If one accepts a deontological approach to ethics, this response seems decisive. Many contemporary philosophers, however, are consequentialists, and so one needs to consider how the ‘no best of all possible worlds’ response looks if one adopts a consequentialist approach.

Initially, it might seem that by combining the ‘no best of all possible worlds’ response with consequentialism, one can construct a successful, total refutation. For assume that the following things are true:

1. An action is, by definition, objectively morally right if and only if it is, among the actions that one could have performed, at least one of the actions that produces at least as much value as every alternative action;
2. An action is objectively morally wrong if and only if it is not objectively morally right;
3. One is morally blameworthy only if one performs some objectively wrong action when one could instead have performed an objectively right action;
4. If one is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then for any action whatever, there is always some other action that produces greater value.

Then it follows that it is impossible for an omnipotent and omniscient being to perform a morally wrong action, and therefore that the failure of such a being to prevent various evils in this world cannot be morally wrong.

Consider an omnipotent and omniscient being that creates a world with zillions of innocent persons, all of whom endure extraordinarily intense suffering forever. If (1), (2), and (3) are right, then such a being does not do anything morally wrong. But this conclusion, surely, is unacceptable, and so if a given version of consequentialism entails this conclusion, then that form of consequentialism must be rejected.

Can consequentialism avoid this conclusion? Can it be formulated in such a way that it entails the conclusion that allowing very great, undeserved suffering is morally very different, and much more serious, than merely refraining from creating as many happy individuals as possible, or merely refraining from creating individuals who are not as ecstatically happy as they might be? If it cannot, then it would seem that the correct conclusion to draw is that consequentialism is unsound. On the other hand, if consequentialism can be so formulated that this distinction is captured, then an appeal to consequentialism, thus formulated in a sound way, will not enable one to avoid the crucial objection to the ‘no best of all possible worlds’ response to the argument from evil.

### 5.3 The Appeal to the Ontological Argument

A final way in which one could attempt to show that facts about evil cannot constitute even prima facie evidence against the existence of God is by appealing to the ontological argument. Relatively few philosophers have held, of course, that the ontological argument is sound. But there have certainly been notable exceptions—such as Anselm and Descartes, and, in the last century, Charles Hartshorne (1962), Norman Malcolm (1960), and Alvin Plantinga (1974a, 1974b)

If the ontological argument were sound, it would provide a rather decisive refutation of the argument from evil. For in showing not merely that there is an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect being, but also that it is necessary that such a being exists, it would entail that the proposition that God does not exist must have probability zero on any body of evidence whatever.

The only question, accordingly, is whether the ontological argument is sound. The vast majority of present-day philosophers believe that it is not, and one way of arguing for that view is by appealing to strengthened Gaunilo-type objections—where the idea behind a strengthened Gaunilo-type objection is that, rather than merely paralleling the ontological argument, as Gaunilo did in responding to Anselm, in order to show that there is an overpopulation problem for reality in the form of perfect islands, perfect unicorns, and so on, one can instead construct versions that lead to mutually incompatible conclusions, such as the conclusion that there is a perfect solvent, together with the conclusion that there is a perfectly insoluble substance (Tooley, 1981). But if the logical form of the ontological argument is such that arguments of precisely the same form generate contradictions, then the ontological argument must be unsound.

A more satisfying response to the ontological argument would, of course, show not merely that the ontological argument is unsound, but also precisely why it is unsound. Such a response, however, requires a satisfactory account of the truth conditions of modal statements—something that lies outside the scope of this article

## 6. Attempted Defenses

In this section, we shall consider three attempts to show that it is reasonable to believe that every evil is such that an omnipotent and omniscient person would have a morally sufficient reason for not preventing its existence, even if one is not able to say, in every case, what that morally sufficient reason might be.

### 6.1 The Appeal to Positive Evidence for the Existence of God

If a given, concrete formulation of the argument from evil appeals to cases of intrinsically undesirable states of affairs that give rise only to evidential considerations, rather than to an incompatibility conclusion, then, although the existence of God may be improbable relative to that evidence, it may not be improbable relative to one’s total evidence. Theists, however, have often contended that there are a variety of arguments that, even if they do not prove that God exists, provide positive evidence. May not this positive evidence outweigh, then, the negative evidence of apparently unjustified evils?

Starting out from this line of thought, a number of philosophers have gone on to claim that in order to be justified in asserting that there are evils in the world that establish that it is unlikely that God exists, one would first have to examine all of the traditional arguments for the existence of God, and show that none of them is sound. Alvin Plantinga, for example, says that in order for the atheologian to show that the existence of God is improbable relative to one’s total evidence, “he would be obliged to consider all the sorts of reasons natural theologians have invoked in favor of theistic belief—the traditional cosmological, teleological and ontological arguments, for example.” (1979, 3) And in a similar vein, Bruce Reichenbach remarks:

With respect to the atheologian’s inductive argument from evil, the theist might reasonably contend that the atheologian’s exclusion of the theistic arguments or proofs for God’s existence advanced by the natural theologian has skewed the results. (1980, 224)

Now it is certainly true that if one is defending a version of the argument from evil that supports only a probabilistic conclusion, one needs to consider what sorts of positive reasons might be offered in support of the existence of God. But Plantinga and Reichenbach are advancing a rather stronger claim here, for they are saying that one needs to look at all of the traditional theistic arguments, such as the cosmological and the teleological. They are claiming, in short, that if one of those arguments turned out to be defensible, then it might well serve to undercut the argument from evil.

But this view seems mistaken. Consider the cosmological argument. In some versions, the conclusion is that there is an unmoved mover. In others, that there is a first cause. In others, that there is a necessary being, having its necessity of itself. None of these conclusions involves any claims about the moral character of the entity in question, let alone the claim that it is a morally perfect person. But in the absence of such a claim, how could such arguments, even if they turned out to be sound, serve to undercut the argument from evil?

The situation is not essentially different in the case of the argument from order, or in the case of the fine-tuning argument. For while those arguments, if they were sound, would provide grounds for drawing some tentative conclusion concerning the moral character of the designer or creator of the universe, the conclusion in question would not be one that could be used to overthrow the argument from evil. For given the mixture of good and evil that one finds in the world, the argument from order can hardly provide support even for the existence of a designer or creator who is very good, let alone one who is morally perfect. So it is very hard to see how any teleological argument, any more than any cosmological, could overturn the argument from evil.

A similar conclusion can be defended with respect to other arguments, such as those that appeal to purported miracles, or religious experiences. For while in the case of religious experiences it might be argued that personal contact with a being may provide additional evidence concerning the person’s character, it is clear that the primary evidence concerning a person’s character must consist of information concerning what the person does and does not do. So, contrary to the claim advanced by Robert Adams (1985, 245), even if there were veridical religious experiences, they would not provide one with a satisfactory defense against the argument from evil.

A good way of underlining the basic point here is by setting out an alternative formulation of the argument from evil in which it is granted, for the sake of argument, that there is an omnipotent and omniscient person. The result of doing this is that the conclusion at which one initially arrives is not that there is no omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person, but rather that, although there is an omnipotent and omniscient person, that person is not morally perfect, from which it then follows that that there is no omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person.

When the argument from evil is reformulated in that way, it becomes clear that the vast majority of considerations that have been offered as reasons for believing in God can be of little assistance to the person who is trying to resist the argument from evil. For most of them provide, at best, very tenuous grounds for any conclusion concerning the moral character of any omnipotent and omniscient being who may happen to exist, and almost none of them provides any support for the hypothesis that there is an omnipotent and omniscient being who is also morally perfect.

The ontological argument is, of course, a notable exception, and, consequently, the advocate of the argument from evil certainly needs to be able to show that it is unsound. But almost all of the other standard arguments are simply not to the point.

### 6.2 Belief in the Existence of God as Non-Inferentially Justified

What if, rather than holding that there is positive evidence that lends support to the existence of God, one holds instead that the belief that God exists is non-inferentially justified? The claim in question is an interesting one, and a thorough evaluation of it would involve consideration of some deep issues in epistemology. Fortunately, it does not seem to make any real difference in the present context whether or not the claim is true.

The reason emerges if one considers the epistemology of perception. Some philosophers hold that some beliefs about physical objects are non-inferentially justified, while others hold that this is never so, and that justified beliefs about physical states of affairs are always justified via an inference to the best explanation that starts out from beliefs about one’s experiences. But direct realists as much as indirect realists admit that there can be cases where a person would be justified in believing that a certain physical state of affairs obtained were it not for the fact that he has good evidence that he is hallucinating, or else subject to perceptual illusion. Moreover, given evidence of the relevant sort, it makes no difference whether direct realism is true, or indirect realism: the belief in question is undermined to precisely the same extent in either case.

The situation is the same in the case of religious experience. If, as was argued in the previous section, the primary evidence concerning a person’s character consists of what the person does or fails to do in various circumstances, and if, as a consequence, conclusions concerning the character of a deity based upon religious experience can be undercut by the argument from evil, then nothing is changed if one holds that the having of religious experiences, rather than providing one with evidence for the existence of God, makes it the case that one is non-inferentially justified in believing in the existence of God. The non-inferential justification is merely a prima facie justification, and one that is undercut by evidence bearing upon a person’s character that deals with what the person does and does not do.

### 6.3 Induction Based on Partial Success

Swinburne (1988, 297–8) argued in support of the conclusion that theism does need a theodicy. In doing so, however, he noted one minor qualification—namely, that if one could show, for a sufficiently impressive range of evils that initially seemed problematic, that it was likely that an omnipotent and omniscient person would be morally justified in not having prevented them, then one might very well be justified in believing that the same would be true of other evils, even if one could not specify, in those other cases, what the morally sufficient reason for allowing them might be.

What Swinburne says here is surely very reasonable, and I can see no objection in principle to a defense of this sort. The problem with it is that no theodicy that has ever been proposed has been successful in the relevant way—that is, there is no impressive range of undesirable states of affairs where people initially think that the wrongmaking properties of allowing such states of affairs to exist greatly outweigh any rightmaking properties associated with doing so, but where, confronted with some proposed theodicy, people come to believe that it would be morally permissible to allow such states of affairs to exist. Indeed, it is hard to find any such cases, let alone an impressive range.

## 7. Theodicies

What are the prospects for a complete, or nearly complete theodicy? Some philosophers, such as Swinburne, are optimistic, and believe that “the required theodicy can be provided” (1988, 311). Others, including many theists, are much less hopeful. Plantinga, for example remarks:

… we cannot see why our world, with all its ills, would be better than others we think we can imagine, or what, in any detail, is God’s reason for permitting a given specific and appalling evil. Not only can we not see this, we can’t think of any very good possibilities. And here I must say that most attempts to explain why God permits evil—theodicies, as we may call them—strike me as tepid, shallow and ultimately frivolous. (1985a, 35)

What types of theodicies that have been proposed? An exhaustive survey is not possible here, but among the most important are theodicies that appeal, first, to the value of acquiring desirable traits of character in the face of suffering; secondly, to the value of libertarian free will; thirdly, to the value of the freedom to inflict horrendous evils upon others; and fourthly, to the value of a world that is governed by natural laws.

### 7.1 A Soul-Making Theodicy

One very important type of theodicy, championed especially by John Hick, involves the idea that the evils that the world contains can be seen to be justified if one views the world as designed by God to be an environment in which people, through their free choices, can undergo spiritual growth that will ultimately fit them for communion with God:

The value-judgement that is implicitly being invoked here is that one who has attained to goodness by meeting and eventually mastering temptation, and thus by rightly making responsibly choices in concrete situations, is good in a richer and more valuable sense than would be one created ab initio in a state either of innocence or of virtue. In the former case, which is that of the actual moral achievements of mankind, the individual’s goodness has within it the strength of temptations overcome, a stability based upon an accumulation of right choices, and a positive and responsible character that comes from the investment of costly personal effort. (1977, 255–6)

Hick’s basic suggestion, then, is that soul-making is a great good, that God would therefore be justified in designing a world with that purpose in mind, that our world is very well designed in that regard, and thus that, if one views evil as a problem, it is because one mistakenly thinks that the world ought, instead, to be a hedonistic paradise.

Is this theodicy satisfactory? There are a number of reasons for holding that it is not. First, what about the horrendous suffering that people undergo, either at the hands of others—as in the Holocaust—or because of terminal illnesses such as cancer? One writer—Eleonore Stump—has suggested that the terrible suffering that many people undergo at the ends of their lives, in cases where it cannot be alleviated, is to be viewed as suffering that has been ordained by God for the spiritual health of the individual in question (1993b, 349). But given that it does not seem to be true that terrible terminal illnesses more commonly fall upon those in bad spiritual health than upon those of good character, let alone that they fall only upon the former, this ‘spiritual chemotherapy’ view seems quite hopeless. More generally, there seems to be no reason at all why a world must contain horrendous suffering if it is to provide a good environment for the development of character in response to challenges and temptations.

Secondly, and is illustrated by the weakness of Hick’s own discussion (1977, 309–17), a soul-making theodicy provides no justification for the existence of any animal pain, let alone for a world where predation is not only present but a major feature of non-human animal life, and has been so for millions of years. The world could perfectly well have contained only human persons, or only human persons plus herbivores.

Thirdly, the soul-making theodicy also provides no account of the suffering that young, innocent children endure, either because of terrible diseases, or at the hands of adults. For here, as in the case of animals, there is no soul-making purpose that is served.

Finally, if one’s purpose were to create a world that would be a good place for soul-making, would our earth count as a job well done? It is very hard to see that it would. Some people die young, before they have had any chance at all to master temptations, to respond to challenges, and to develop morally. Others endure suffering so great that it is virtually impossible for them to develop those moral traits that involve relationships with others. Still others enjoy lives of ease and luxury where there is virtually nothing that challenges them to undergo moral growth.

### 7.2 Free Will

A second important approach to theodicy involves the following ideas: first, that libertarian free will is of great value; secondly, that because it is part of the definition of libertarian free will that an action that is free in that sense cannot be caused by anything outside of the agent, not even God can cause a person to freely do what is right; and thirdly, that because of the great value of libertarian free will, it is better that God create a world in which agents possess libertarian free will, even though they may misuse it, and do what is wrong, than that God create a world where agents lack libertarian free will.

One problem with an appeal to libertarian free will is that no satisfactory account of the concept of libertarian free will is yet available. Thus, while the requirement that, in order to be free in the libertarian sense, an action not have any cause that lies outside the agent is unproblematic, this is obviously not a sufficient condition, since this condition would be satisfied if the behavior in question were caused by random events within the agent. So one needs to add that the agent is, in some sense, the cause of the action. But how is the causation in question to be understood? Present accounts of the metaphysics of causation typically treat causes as states of affairs. If, however, one adopts such an approach, then it seems that all that one has when an action is freely done, in the libertarian sense, is that there is some uncaused mental state of the agent that causally gives rise to the relevant behavior, and why freedom, thus understood, should be thought valuable, is far from clear.

The alternative is to shift from event-causation to what is referred to as ‘agent-causation’. But then the question is whether there is any satisfactory account of causation where causation is not a relation between states of affairs. Some philosophers, such as Timothy O’Connor (1995, 1996, 2000a, 2000b, and 2002) and Randolph Clarke (1993, 1996, and 2003) have claimed that such an account can be given, but their suggestions have not been widely accepted.

But even if the difficulty concerning the nature of libertarian free will is set aside, there are still very strong objections to the free-will approach. First, and most important, the fact that libertarian free will is valuable does not entail that one should never intervene in the exercise of libertarian free will. Indeed, very few people think that one should not intervene to prevent someone from committing rape or murder. On the contrary, almost everyone would hold that a failure to prevent heinously evil actions when one can do so would be seriously wrong.

Secondly, the proposition that libertarian free will is valuable does not entail that it is a good thing for people to have the power to inflict great harm upon others. So individuals could, for example, have libertarian free will, but not have the power to torture and murder others.

Thirdly, many evils are caused by natural processes, such as earthquakes, hurricanes, and other weather conditions, and by a wide variety of diseases. Such evils certainly do not appear to result from morally wrong actions. If that is right, then an appeal to free will provides no answer to an argument from evil that focuses upon such evils.

Some writers, such as C. S. Lewis and Alvin Plantinga, have suggested that such evils may ultimately be due to the immoral actions of supernatural beings (Lewis, 1957, 122–3; Plantinga, 1974a, 58). If that were so, then the first two objections mentioned above would apply: one would have many more cases where individuals were being given the power—much greater than the power that any human has—to inflict great harm on others, and then were being allowed by God to use that power to perform horrendously evil actions leading to enormous suffering and many deaths. In addition, however, it can plausibly be argued that, though it is possible that earthquakes, hurricanes, cancer, and the predation of animals are all caused by malevolent supernatural beings, the probability that this is so is extremely low.

### 7.3 The Freedom to Do Great Evil

The fact that agents could be free in a libertarian sense even if they did not have the power to inflict great harm upon others has led at least one philosopher—namely, Richard Swinburne—to argue that, while free will is valuable, precisely how valuable it is depends upon the range of actions open to one. Swinburne’s idea is that if the possible actions that are open to one vary enormously in moral worth, then libertarian free will is very valuable indeed, whereas if the variation in the moral status of what one can do is very limited, then libertarian free will adds much less to the world: one has what has been characterized as a ‘toy world’, where one has very little responsibility for the well-being of others.

This variant on the appeal to libertarian free will is also open to a number of objections. First, as with free will theodicies in general, this line of thought provides no justification for the existence of occurrences that not only appear, upon cursory inspection, to be natural evils, uncaused by any agents, but where, in addition, the very closest scientific examination supports the conclusion that there are no grounds for postulating anything beyond purely physical events as the causes of the occurrences in question.

Secondly, if what matters is simply the existence of alternative actions that differ greatly in moral value, this can be the case even in a world where one lacks the power to inflict great harm on others, since there can be actions that, rather than inflicting great suffering on others, would instead benefit others enormously, and which one could either perform or intentionally refrain from performing.

Thirdly, what exactly is the underlying line of thought here? In the case of human actions, Swinburne surely holds that one should prevent someone from doing something that would be morally horrendous, if one can do so. Is the idea, then, that while occasional prevention of such evils does not significantly reduce the extent of the moral responsibility of others, if one’s power were to increase, a point would be reached where one should sometimes refrain from preventing people from performing morally horrendous actions? But why should this be so? One answer might be that if one intervened too frequently, people would come to believe that they did not have the ability to perform such actions. But, in the first place, it is not clear why that would be undesirable. People could still, for example, be thoroughly evil, for they could still very much wish that they had the power to perform such terrible actions, and be disposed to perform such actions if they ever came to have the power. In the second place, prevention of deeply evil actions could take quite different forms. People could, for example, be given a conscience that led them, when they had decided to cause great injury to others, and were about to do so, to feel that what they were about to do was too terrible a thing, so that they would not carry through on the action. In such a world, people could surely still feel that they themselves were capable of performing heinously evil actions, and they would contemplate performing such actions, but in the end their sense of the great wrongness of the actions would triumph over their selfish reasons for wanting to perform the actions in question.

### 7.4 The Need for Natural Laws

A final important theodicy involves the following ideas: first, it is important that events in the world take place in a regular way, since otherwise effective action would be impossible; secondly, events will exhibit regular patterns only if they are governed by natural laws; thirdly, if events are governed by natural laws, the operation of those laws will give rise to events that harm individuals; so, fourthly, God’s allowing natural evils is justified because the existence of natural evils is entailed by natural laws, and a world without natural laws would be a much worse world.

This type of theodicy is also exposed to serious objections. First of all, the occasional occurrence of miraculous intervention, including events that clearly appeared contrary to natural laws, would not render effective human action impossible, since humans would see that such miraculous occurrences were extremely rare.

Secondly, and relatedly, consider a world where the laws of physics, rather than being laws that admit of no exceptions, are instead probabilistic laws. Effective human action would still be possible in such a world, provided that the relevant probabilities were sufficiently high. But if so, then effective human action would be no less possible in a world with non-statistical laws where there were occasional miraculous interventions.

Thirdly, many of the greatest evils could have been prevented by miraculous interventions that would not have been detected. Consider, for example, interventions to prevent natural disasters such as volcanic eruptions, or earthquakes, including the earthquake in China in 1556 that killed around 800,000 people, or tsunamis, such as the one in 2004 that hit 12 Asian countries, and killed over 200,000 people. Or consider the interventions that would be needed to prevent pandemics, such as the Black Death in the Middle Ages, which is estimated to have killed between 75 million and 200 million people, or the 1918 flu pandemic, which killed between 50 million and 100 million people. Similarly, consider great moral evils, such as the Holocaust. A small intervention by an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good being could have allowed one of the many failed attempts to assassinate Hitler to succeed, or a small mental nudge could have resulted in Hitler’s realizing the error in his virulent anti-Semitism.

Fourthly, what natural evils a world contains depends not just on the laws, but also on the initial, or boundary conditions. Thus, for example, an omnipotent being could create ex nihilo a world which had the same laws of nature as our world, and which contained human beings, but which was devoid of non-human carnivores. Or the world could be such that there was unlimited room for populations to expand, and ample natural resources to support such populations.

Fifthly, many evils depend upon precisely what laws the world contains. An omnipotent being could, for example, easily create a world with the same laws of physics as our world, but with slightly different laws linking neurophysiological states with qualities of experiences, so that extremely intense pains either did not arise, or could be turned off by the sufferer when they served no purpose. Or additional physical laws of a rather specialized sort could be introduced that would either cause very harmful viruses to self-destruct, or prevent a virus such as the avian flu virus from evolving into an air-born form that has the capacity to kill hundreds of million people.

Finally, this theodicy provides no account of moral evil. If other theodicies could provide a justification for God’s allowing moral evil, then, of course, moral evil would not be a problem. But, as we have seen, no satisfactory justification appears to be available.

### 7.5 Religious Theodicies

The four types of theodicies considered so far all appeal to beliefs and evaluative claims that the theodicist thinks should be acceptable, upon careful reflection, to anyone, including those who are not religious. But if one thinks that one’s religious beliefs are ones that it is reasonable to accept, what is wrong with a theodicy that appeals to some of one’s religious beliefs? Of course, if the religious beliefs to which one appeals, taken together, entail the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person, such a theodicy would be question-begging. But one can choose a subset that, even if it entails the existence of a very powerful and knowledgeable creator—or even an omnipotent and omniscient one—does not entail the existence of God.

There are many religions, and even within a given religion, very significant differences in the religious beliefs of people, and very different beliefs to which one might appeal, so there are many different religious theodicies that can be constructed. Here I shall focus only on one general type. I think, however, that it will illustrate the kinds of objections that arise.

The religious theodicy in question is as follows. First, human beings, rather than having arisen through a process of natural evolution, were brought into existence by the creator of the universe. He placed the first two human beings in a perfect world, free of suffering and death. Those human beings, however, freely chose to disobey a command of the creator, and the result was the Fall of mankind, which meant not only that the first two humans became subject to suffering and death, but that all of their descendants did so as well. The creator, however, lovingly engaged, several generations later, in a rescue operation, in which he, in the person of his son, became incarnated as a human being, and by undergoing a sacrificial death, made it possible for the creator to forgive every human who accepted this sacrifice, and who would then enjoy eternal beatitude living in the presence of the creator.

This type of religious theodicy has been advanced by a number of Christians, with a variant of it being found, for example, in Peter van Inwagen’s book, The Problem of Evil (2006, 85ff.). It is not, of course, a full theodicy, since it does not account for the suffering of non-human animals, at least before the Fall. So let us focus on it simply as offering an account of God’s justification for allowing human suffering. Thus viewed, how successful is it?

To be successful, a theodicy must appeal only to beliefs that it is reasonable to accept. Do the beliefs involved in the above story qualify? It would seem not. First of all, among the crucial beliefs is the belief that human beings, rather than coming into being via a natural process of evolution, were specially created. In setting out the story, I have not specified how that was done. Traditionally Christians believed, either that Adam and Eve were created ex nihilo, as the story of creation in Genesis 1 seems to say, or else, as the creation story in Genesis 2 says, that Adam was created out of the dust of the earth, and then Eve was formed, sometime later, out of one of Adam’s ribs.

There are very good reasons for rejecting both of these accounts, since the evidence that humans are descended from earlier primates is extremely strong indeed. Especially impressive is the evidence provided by DNA studies, described by Daniel J. Fairbanks his book Relics of Eden, and which includes such as things as the evidence that human chromosome number two resulted by fusion from two primate chromosomes, together with facts about (1) transposable elements, including retroelements, (2) pseudogenes, and (3) mitochondrial DNA.

In the light of such evidence, it is not surprising that many Christian philosophers have accepted the hypothesis of common descent, and have adopted some form of theistic evolution, in which the creator intervened at some point to transform some earlier primates into members of a new species, Homo sapiens. But while this version of special creation is an improvement, given the very close relations between human and chimpanzee DNA, and the fact that known mechanisms of chromosome rearrangement render the transition from some non-human species to Homo sapiens not at all improbable, the postulation of divine intervention at that particular point does not seem plausible.

It would be a different matter, of course, if humans had immaterial minds, but there is very strong empirical evidence against that view, including such things as the effects of a blow to the head and brain damage of different sorts, the effects of diseases such as Alzheimer’s, the decline of mental capacities with aging, the relations between the mental development of children and the growth of neural circuitry, the inheritance of personality traits, the different correlations in the case of identical twins versus fraternal twins with regard to such traits as intelligence, the effects of psychotropic drugs, such as Prozac, and so on (Tooley, 2012, 42–4).

Secondly, the story postulates not just a special creation, but also a special creation in which humans, initially, were not subject to suffering or death. Given, among other things, that that period was a very short one, one cannot offer positive historical evidence again the existence of such a short period that involved only two humans. But the belief is surely a remarkable one that can be viewed as likely only if it is supported by evidence. The evidence that can be offered, however, consists entirely of the creation story in Genesis, so that question is, how reliable is such evidence? To answer that question, one can see what other stories one finds in Genesis. One striking story is that of Noah—who apparently lived around 4500 years ago—according to which there was a worldwide flood that killed all animals on Earth, except for those that were on the ark. But there are excellent reasons for believing that such a story is very unlikely to be true, both in the light of the number of animal species that currently exist, and in the light of the evidence—attempts by authors such as Whitcomb and Morris in their book The Genesis Flood: The Biblical Record and its Scientific Implications (1966) to argue otherwise notwithstanding—that there has not been any world-wide flood in the past 5000 years.

In addition, those who view Genesis as a source of important truths do so because it is part of the Bible. So one can also ask about the reliability of the Bible when it testifies to remarkable events. In many cases, of course, there is no way of checking whether those remarkable events actually took place, but when there is, one finds that there is good reason to believe that the event in question did not take place. Thus, for example, there is the story of the sun’s standing still for about a day during Joshua’s battle at Jericho, the story of the slaughter of all of the Egyptian first-born children, and the story of the graves being opened and the dead walking around the city at the time of Jesus’s death (Matthew 27: 52–53). One would surely expect non-Biblical records of such events if they had really taken place, but there are none.

Finally, the religious theodicy that we are considering also involves a number of very problematic moral claims. First, we are asked to believe that there is nothing morally problematic about a morally good deity making it the case that if one of the first two humans disobeys some command, all of the many billions of descendants of that human will, as a consequence, be subject to suffering and death to which they would not otherwise be exposed. Secondly, we are also asked to believe that a morally good deity is unable to forgive people their misdeeds unless he becomes incarnate in the form of his son and suffers a sacrificial death. Thirdly, while, according to this story, those who accept the sacrifice made on their behalf have all their tears wiped away and enjoy eternal happiness in the presence of God, those who do not accept the sacrifice fare considerably less well, and suffer eternal torment in hell. So we are being asked to believe that such eternal punishment is not morally problematic.

In short, the religious theodicy that we have been considering in this section is very implausible, not only on scientific and historical grounds, but on moral grounds as well. The question, accordingly, is whether there is some religious theodicy that is not exposed to scientific, or historical, or moral objections.

## 8. More Modest Variants on Defenses and Theodicies

In section 1.3, it was argued that concrete formulations of the argument from evil, which focus upon specific evils, or else upon narrowly defined types of evils, are superior to abstract formulations of the argument from evil, which start out from very general statements concerning evil—such as that there is evil in the world, or that there are natural evils, or that there is an enormous amount of evil, and so on. Consider, then, an evidential argument from evil that focuses upon Rowe’s famous case of Sue—a young girl who was brutally beaten, raped, and murdered. Confronted with such a case, it is natural to think that a satisfactory response will involve arguing that it is plausible that the terrible occurrence in question itself has some hidden property that makes it the case that allowing it to happen is not morally wrong all things considered.

But as Peter van Inwagen has argued—most recently in The Problem of Evil—there is a very different possibility, and one that he thinks is much more promising. The basic idea is as follows. First of all, one begins by focusing upon abstract formulations of the argument from evil, and one attempts to put forward a story that makes it plausible that the existence of, say, a great amount of horrendous suffering in the world, is actually desirable because there is some great good that outweighs that suffering, and that can only be achieved if that amount of suffering is present, or some greater evil that can only be avoided if that amount of suffering is present. (This story might either be a theodicy-style story that specifies the great good in question, or a defense-style story, which does not do so.) Secondly, if that story provides a satisfactory answer to an abstract version of the argument from evil that focuses upon the existence of horrendous suffering, one can then turn to concrete versions of the argument from evil, and there the idea will be that God had good reason to allow a certain amount of horrendous suffering, and the terrible case of Sue is simply one of the cases that he allowed. It is not that Sue’s suffering itself had some property that made its occurrence good all things considered. God could very well have prevented it, and had he done so, he would have eliminated an occurrence that was bad in itself, all things considered. But had he done so, he would have had to have allowed some other horrendous evil that, as things stand, he prevented, and the reason that he would have had to do that would be to ensure that the global property of there being a certain amount of horrendous evil in the world was instantiated—something that was necessary to achieve a greater good, or to avoid a greater evil.

In short, defenses and theodicies that are based upon this idea, rather than appealing to the idea that apparent evils are not evils in themselves, all things considered, once all local properties—all properties that those events themselves have—are taken into account, appeal, instead, to the idea that there are global properties whose instantiation is important, and that can only be instantiated if there are events that are evil in themselves.

Does this shift from local properties to global properties help? It would seem that it cannot. Consider against the case of Sue. An advocate of the evidential argument from evil claims that no matter how carefully one examines the case, and thinks about it, considering, as one does, all of the rightmaking and wrongmaking properties of which one has any knowledge, the conclusion is that the wrongmaking properties of allowing what happened to Sue clearly outweigh any rightmaking properties of allowing that event. The advocate of a global property approach then suggests the possibility that there is some global rightmaking property that involves the world’s having a certain amount of evil, or a certain amount of a certain kind of evil, and that if someone had intervened to prevent the rape and murder of Sue, this would have changed the world from one that did have the desired amount of evil, or evil of the type in question, to one that does not, and that when this property is taken into account, it turns out that it would have been wrong to prevent Sue’s being raped and murdered—unless one was going to allow some compensating evil elsewhere.

But what exactly is the global wrongmaking property in question? Does one know, or even have any reason at all for believing, that bringing it about that the amount of evil of kind $$K$$ is less than some specific amount $$T$$ is a wrongmaking property of actions? The answer, surely, is that no one has knowledge of any such wrongmaking property. Moreover, anyone who claimed to have such knowledge would also have to claim also to know that if an omnipotent and omniscient being had prevented the rape and murder of Sue, without also allowing some other, compensating evil action, that would have caused the amount of evil of type $$K$$ to dip below level $$T$$.

One need not, of course, advance a principle involving some specific value of $$T$$. One could, instead, make the existential claim that there is some level $$T$$ such that, first, it is a wrongmaking property of an action to cause the amount of evil of type $$K$$ to dip below level $$T$$, and, second, that if an omnipotent and omniscient being had intervened to prevent the rape and murder of Sue, that would, in the absence of some compensating action, have caused the amount of evil of type $$K$$ to dip below level $$T$$. But surely no one knows, or even has any reason for believing, that this is the case.

The situation as regards an appeal to global properties is, in short, as follows. An advocate of the argument from evil points to various events, such as the rape and murder of Sue, and claims that no matter how carefully one considers the case, one’s conclusion is that the known wrongmaking properties of not preventing that occurrence outweigh any rightmaking properties that not preventing the occurrence is known to have had. In response, the possibility of a relevant, morally significant global property is introduced. But this is a mere possibility, since there is no relevant morally significant global property of which one has knowledge, let alone which one has good reason to believe is present in the case in question. So the possibility of a relevant global property is simply that: a mere possibility, and as such it gets dealt with in the way that all unknown morally significant properties, both rightmaking and wrongmaking, and both local and global, are dealt with in, for example, the logical probability version of the evidential argument from evil set out above in section 3.5.

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