Form vs. Matter

First published Mon Feb 8, 2016

Aristotle famously contends that every physical object is a compound of matter and form. This doctrine has been dubbed “hylomorphism”, a portmanteau of the Greek words for matter (hulê) and form (eidos or morphê). Highly influential in the development of Medieval philosophy, Aristotle’s hylomorphism has also enjoyed something of a renaissance in contemporary metaphysics.

While the basic idea of hylomorphism is easy to grasp, much remains unclear beneath the surface. Aristotle introduces matter and form, in the Physics, to account for changes in the natural world, where he is particularly interested in explaining how substances come into existence even though, as he maintains, there is no generation ex nihilo, that is that nothing comes from nothing. In this connection, he develops a general hylomorphic framework, which he then extends by putting it to work in a variety of contexts. For example, he deploys it in his Metaphysics, where he argues that form is what unifies some matter into a single object, the compound of the two; he appeals to it in his De Anima, by treating soul and body as a special case of form and matter and by analyzing perception as the reception of form without matter; and he suggests in the Politics that a constitution is the form of a polis and the citizens its matter, partly on the grounds that the constitution serves to unify the body politic.

Hylomorphism thus finds a range of applications across Aristotle’s corpus. This entry focuses on its genesis and development in the Physics and Metaphysics, in order to characterize and assess its fundamental features and core commitments. There is in any case already a considerable controversy at this basic level about what Aristotle means by matter and form: what precisely they are, how they are related to one another, how Aristotle intends to marshal arguments in support of them, and how best to deal with reasonable objections to their metaphysical consequences. We will begin by examining how Aristotle introduces his twin notions. Then we will move on to discuss some of the most important interpretative controversies: does Aristotle believe in so-called “prime” matter? Does matter or form serve as the principle of individuation in his metaphysics? Do natural forms include a specification of the kind of matter that anything of that form has to have?

1. Matter and form introduced

Aristotle introduces his notions of matter and form in the first book of his Physics, his work on natural science. Natural science is concerned with things that change, and Aristotle divides changes into two main types: there are accidental changes, which involve concrete particulars, or “substances” (ousiai) in Aristotle’s terminology, gaining or losing a property (see Categories 1–5, Physics i 7). For instance, the changes whereby Socrates falls in a vat of dye and turns blue, or puts on a few pounds from excessive feasting during the Panathenaia, count as accidental changes (in the categories of quality and quantity, respectively). Socrates, a substance, gains the property of being blue, or the property of weighing twelve stone. The other main kind of change is substantial change, whereby a substance comes into, or passes out of, existence. For example, when Socrates dies, or is born (or perhaps conceived, or somewhere in between conception and birth), a substantial change has taken place.

Matter and form are required to account for this second kind of change, if it is to conform to Aristotle’s general conceptual analysis of change. In any change, he contends, there must be three things: (1) something which underlies and persists through the change; (2) a “lack”, which is one of a pair of opposites, the other of which is (3) a form acquired during the course of the change (Physics i 7, 190a13–191a22). Thus, for example, in an accidental change, the underlying thing is the substance which acquires a new accidental property. For instance, when Socrates learns to play the flute, he transitions from a state of being unmusical (the lack) to a state of musicality (the form). But for us to be able to say that there is something which has changed, there must be something which remains the same throughout the change, and in this case the obvious candidate is Socrates, who is one and the same person throughout his musical training.

In accidental changes there is always a substance to underlie the change, but this is not true for substantial changes, since these involve the coming to be or passing away of a substance (see the amusing remark of Irving Copi, quoted at the start of the entry on identity over time ). In these cases, the thing that underlies is the matter of the substance. When someone builds a house, it is the bricks which persist through the change. They transition from a state of not being a house to acquire the property of being a house. Aristotle often uses the example of artefacts like houses, even though he does not regard them as substances properly-speaking (Metaphysics vii 17, 1041b28–30), because their matter is more straightforward to identify. Nevertheless, the same analysis holds in the case of organisms, which are the substances proper: when an organism is created or destroyed, when an acorn becomes an oak tree, or a human dies, there must be some matter which persists through the change. To say otherwise would be to say that things can come to be out of, or vanish into, nothing, and Aristotle understandably agrees with his predecessor Parmenides that this is impossible (Physics i 8, 191a23–b17). Aristotle’s metaphysics takes as its starting points observed phenomena, and seeks to preserve common sense beliefs where possible. We never experience anything simply appearing or disappearing at random.

The word “form” may misleadingly suggest that what is acquired in a case of substantial generation is simply a shape, and this impression is reinforced by some of the examples that Aristotle uses, especially when focusing on artefacts: plausibly the form of a bronze statue just is its shape. When we consider organisms, however, it becomes apparent that having the right shape is not sufficient to possess the form. A thing’s form is its definition or essence—what it is to be a human being, for example. A statue may be human-shaped, but it is not a human, because it cannot perform the functions characteristic of humans: thinking, perceiving, moving, desiring, eating and growing, etc. The connection between a thing’s form and its function emerges in Physics ii 3, where Aristotle distinguishes his four kinds of cause: material, formal, efficient, and final, and suggests a special connection between the formal and final cause.

Here one needs to proceed cautiously, however, since it is sometimes said that Aristotle’s word “cause” (aitia) would be better translated as “explanation” (or “explanatory factor”, to avoid the implication that they are linguistic items, as opposed to things-in-the-world). Certainly modern philosophers tend to use “cause” in a narrower way, which approximates to Aristotle’s efficient cause. Aristotle’s idea is that there are four kinds of thing that need to be mentioned in order to give a full account of the nature of an object, each corresponding to a particular kind of question. We need to know what the thing is made of, and the answer to this question is the thing’s matter—bricks, in the case of a house; bodily organs in the case of a human being. Next we need to know what the thing is, or how it is defined, and the answer to this is the thing’s form or essence. We also need to know what made the thing come into existence, who or what created it, and this is the thing’s efficient or “moving” cause. Lastly, we need to know what the thing is for, what its purpose or function is—the final cause. Now Aristotle observes that, although these are all distinct questions, in the case of the last three very often the same thing will serve as the answer to all of them (Physics ii 7, 198a24–27). A house is defined as a shelter of a certain sort (De Anima i 1, 403b3–7; Metaphysics viii 3, 1043a29–36). That is what a house is, i.e., its formal cause, but it is also what a house is for, its final cause, since houses, like all artefacts are functionally defined. Similarly, a human being is defined as something which lives a certain kind of rationally-directed life. But, on Aristotle’s view, this is also what a human being is for. The human function is to live such a life (Nicomachean Ethics i 7, 1097b22–1098a20; cf. De Anima ii 1, 412a6–22). As for the efficient cause, it is qualitatively, although not numerically, identical with the formal cause, at least in the organism case, since human beings give birth to human beings, and the same goes for all other living things. Thus, even though Aristotle admits four different kinds of cause, in a sense it is only really matter and form that play any ineliminable explanatory role in his system.

In fact, Aristotle does not simply focus on the case of artefacts because their pre-existing matter is easier to identify. There is a particular issue here with the case of organisms, which arises out of Aristotle’s insistence that a human being, for instance, is composed of a rational soul, which is the form, and an organic body, which is the matter (for further discussion of this problem, see Ackrill 1972/73). It is characteristic of the matter of artefacts that numerically the same stuff which makes up one object can later be used as the matter of another: for instance, when one melts down a bronze statue, and then molds it into some jewelry, it is the same bit of bronze throughout. It is crucial that a thing’s matter can survive such changes, if it is to play the role that Aristotle needs it to play in cases of substantial generation and destruction, as being the thing that underlies such changes. If an artefact’s matter only contingently has the form it has, the same does not obviously seem true of organisms. Unlike in the case of a house built from bricks, it does not seem as though one’s body predates one’s existence, and so can serve as the underlying thing in a case of substantial generation. One might think that at least the body does exist after death, but in fact Aristotle would disagree. Instead, he insists that a dead body is only “homonymously” called a body—that it is only described as “a body” by extension, because it superficially resembles a living body (De Anima ii 1, 412b10–25; Metaphysics vii 10, 1035b9–25). It is not a real body, because it is incapable of performing the functions normally associated with bodies, just as a statue’s eye, or an eye in a painting, is not a real eye, because it is made of stone or paint, and thus cannot serve the function that genuine eyes exist for—seeing (for further discussion, see the supplement to the entry on Aristotle’s psychology on a fundamental problem about hylomorphism).

It might seem that Aristotle is rather going against ordinary linguistic usage here, since we in fact regularly do refer to dead bodies as “bodies”. Whether a dead body is really a body might seem like a trivial linguistic issue, which can simply be decided by fiat. The obvious way to resolve the problem might seem to be simply to drop the insistence that the body cannot exist without being coupled to a living human soul. Allowing that a dead body remains the same body as its living counterpart will not help the difficulty of what to say about the matter that predates the coming to be of the organism, when there is no apparent body, living or dead. What is more, Aristotle is deeply committed to his position that the human body is essentially ensouled, because of his view that things are defined by their functions (Meteorologica iv 12, 390a10–15; Generation of Animals ii 1,734b24–31). It seems as though he believes that a human being’s matter must be contingently alive, so that it can serve as the underlying thing that remains when the human being comes into existence, but also that it must be essentially alive, because it is functionally defined. If so, he contradicts himself.

The best way to resolve this apparent contradiction in Aristotle’s hylomorphism is to point out that an organism can have more than one level of matter. Aristotle believes that all sensible substances can be analyzed into matter and form, but such an analysis is not restricted to the things he calls substances. Matter can itself be divided into matter and form: for instance, bricks are made of clay, shaped into cuboid blocks. Again, clay has its own matter—mud, say—and so on. Eventually, if one pursues this hierarchy of matter far enough downwards, Aristotle believes that one will reach the four elements, earth, air, fire and water. He agrees with Empedocles that everything in the sub-lunar world is ultimately made up of different ratios of these four elements. Matter then should really be understood as a relative notion—it is always the matter of something. Aristotle distinguishes between a thing’s proximate matter, the stuff it is most immediately made of, and its less proximate matter, i.e., the matter of its matter, or even further down the hierarchy, culminating in its ultimate matter, the elements. The organic body which is a human being’s proximate matter is essentially alive, but this need not apply to all of the other matter further down the chain. Aristotle distinguishes between homoiomerous and heteromerous parts (Parts of Animals i 1, 640b25–30). Homoiomerous parts are stuffs, like bronze or flesh, which Aristotle believes have no internal structure. Every part of a homoiomerous stuff is the same as every other part, containing the same ratio of elements. This view of homoiomerous parts is consistent with Aristotle’s denial of atomism; he believes that matter, as well as space and time, are infinitely divisible. The bodily organs, hands, feet, eyes, hearts, etc., are heteromerous, since they do have internal structure, with different parts of them made up of different stuffs. A person’s hand, for instance, is made of flesh, bones, blood and other such biological matter, which in turn are made of earth, air, fire and water. It may be that flesh too is functionally defined, so that dead flesh is only called “flesh” homonymously as well. Even if nothing biological can exist when not alive, it seems clear that the elements at least must be able to do so. Therefore there will be some, low-level matter to serve as the thing that underlies the coming to be and passing away of organisms, even though an organism’s proximate matter exists for precisely as long as it does.

2. Prime matter

One obvious question pertains to how low such underlying levels might go. In fact there is considerable controversy concerning how to conceive the bottom rung of Aristotle’s hierarchy of matter. Aristotle believes that everything is made of earth, air, fire and water. These elements are defined by their possession of one of each of the two fundamental pairs of opposites, hot/cold and wet/dry. Aristotle also thinks that these elements can change into one another (On the Heavens iii 6, 305a14–35). If his analysis of change is correct, when some water changes into some air, there must be something underlying, some substrate, which persists through the change, initially having the essential properties of water (being wet and cold, on Aristotle’s view) and then later those of air (being wet and hot). The thing that underlies this kind of change cannot be any of the elements, since it must be capable of possessing the properties characteristic of each of the elements successively, capable of being first cold and then hot, for example. The traditional interpretation of Aristotle, which goes back as far as Augustine (De Genesi contra Manichaeos i 5–7) and Simplicius (On Aristotle’s Physics i 7), and is accepted by Aquinas (De Principiis Naturae §13), holds that Aristotle believes in something called “prime matter”, which is the matter of the elements, where each element is, then, a compound of this matter and a form. This prime matter is usually described as pure potentiality, just as, on the form side, the unmoved movers are said by Aristotle to be pure actuality, form without any matter (Metaphysics xii 6). What it means to call prime matter “pure potentiality” is that it is capable of taking on any form whatsoever, and thus is completely without any essential properties of its own. It exists eternally, since, if it were capable of being created or destroyed, there would have to be some even lower matter to underlie those changes. Because it is the matter of the elements, which are themselves present in all more complex bodies, it is omnipresent, and underlies not only elemental generation and destruction, but all physical changes. As a completely indeterminate substratum, prime matter bears some similarities to what modern philosophy has called a “bare particular” (see Sider 2006), although, not being a particular, it may have more in common with so-called “gunk” (see Sider 1993).

A similar idea is to be found in Plato’s Timaeus, 49–52, where, in addition to his Forms and the particulars which instantiate them, he argues for the existence of a third category of thing, “a receptacle of all coming to be” (49a5–6):

it must always be called by the same term. For it does not depart from its own character at all. It both continually receives all things, and has never taken on a form similar to any of the things that enter it in any way. For it is laid down by nature as a recipient of impressions for everything, being changed and formed variously by the things that enter it, and because of them it appears different at different times. (50b6–c4)

Plato also motivates his receptacle by appealing to the phenomenon of the elements changing into one another, and, although he refers to it as “space” and not “matter”, the traditional interpretation has it that, as he often does, Aristotle has adopted an idea first developed by his mentor.

More recently, opponents of attributing a doctrine of prime matter to Aristotle have complained that there is insufficient evidence for his holding this kind of view, and that it is so philosophically unappealing that principles of charity militate against it as an interpretation. Such scholars point out that Aristotle actually criticizes Plato’s account from the Timaeus, in On Generation and Corruption ii 1:

what Plato has written in the Timaeus is not based on any precisely-articulated conception. For he has not stated clearly whether his “Omnirecipient” exists in separation from the elements; nor does he make any use of it. (329a13–15)

Although Aristotle is clearly criticizing Plato here, it may be that his point is simply that Plato was not sufficiently clear that prime matter is never to be found existing apart from the elements, and that he did not give good enough reasons for its introduction, not that he was wrong to believe in it.

In this connection it is appropriate to note that Aristotle does in fact use the expressions “prime matter” (prôtê hulê) and “primary underlying thing” (prôton hupokeimenon) several times: Physics i 9, 192a31, ii 1, 193a10 and 193a29; Metaphysics v 4, 1014b32 and 1015a7–10, v 6, 1017a5–6, viii 4, 1044a23, ix 7, 1049a24–7; Generation of Animals i 20, 729a32. The mere fact that he uses the phrase is inconclusive, however, since, he makes it explicit that “prime matter” can refer either to a thing’s proximate matter or to whatever ultimately makes it up:

Nature is prime matter (and this in two ways, either prime in relation to the thing or prime in general; for example, in the case of bronze works the bronze is prime in relation to them, but prime in general would be perhaps water, if everything that can be melted is water). (1015a7–10)

Here Aristotle is referring to his predecessor Thales’ view that everything is ultimately made of water, which he in fact rejects.

In other passages too Aristotle seems to leave the question of whether or not there is prime matter deliberately open. In Metaphysics ix 7, he uses a conditional to talk about the possibility:

it seems that what we call not this, but that-en—for example, we call the box not wood, but wooden, nor do we call the wood earth, but earthen, and again earth, if it is this way, we do not call something else, but that-en—that is always potentially without qualification the next thing…But if there is something primary, which is no longer called that-en with respect to something else, this is prime matter. For example, if earth is airy, and air is not fire but firey, fire is prime matter, being a this. (1049a18–22…24–27)

Here Aristotle uses the generic adjective “that-en” (ekeininon), a word that he coins, to mean made of that material. If a material could not be so described, it would be prime matter. Again, he shows himself aware of prime matter as a possibility, without wanting to commit to it here.

Another key passage where Aristotle has been thought to commit himself more decisively to prime matter is Metaphysics vii 3. Here we are told:

By “matter” I mean that which in itself is not called a substance nor a quantity nor anything else by which being is categorized. For it is something of which each of these things is predicated, whose being is different from each of its predicates (for the others are predicated of substance, and substance is predicated of matter). Therefore this last is in itself neither substance nor quantity nor anything else. Nor is it the denials of any of these; for even denials belong to things accidentally. (1029a20–26)

Although the word “prime” does not occur here, Aristotle is evidently talking about prime matter. A natural way to read this passage is that he is saying there is a wholly indeterminate underlying thing, which he calls “matter”, and it is not a substance. Those who wish to avoid attributing a doctrine of prime matter to Aristotle must offer a different interpretation: that if we were to make the mistake of regarding matter, as opposed to form, as substance, we would be committed (absurdly) to the existence of a wholly indeterminate underlying thing.

In addition to disputing the correct interpretation of these passages where Aristotle explicitly mentions prime matter, much of the debate has centered around, on the one hand, whether what he says about change really commits him to it, on the other, whether the idea is really absurd. Some opponents of prime matter have argued that Aristotle does not, after all, wish to insist that there is always something which persists through a change (see Charlton 1970, Appendix, and 1983). In particular, when one of the elements changes into another, there is an underlying thing—the initial element—but in this case it does not persist. They point out that in the key passage of Physics i 7, where Aristotle gives his account of change in general, he uses the expressions “underlying thing” and “thing that remains”. While readers have usually supposed that these terms are used interchangeably to refer to the substance, in cases of accidental change, and the matter in substantial changes, this assumption can be challenged. In the elemental generation case, perhaps there is no thing that remains, just an initial elements that underlies. The worry about this interpretation is whether it is consistent with Aristotle’s belief that nothing can come to be out of nothing. If there is no “thing that remains” in a case of elemental generation, how is an instance of water changing into air to be distinguished from the supposedly impossible sort of change whereby some water vanishes into nothing, and is instantly replaced by some air which has materialized out of nothing?

The main philosophical objections to prime matter are that it is, at best, a mysterious entity that we cannot know anything about, since we never perceive it directly, but only the things it underlies. Of course, there can be good theoretical reasons for believing in things that we never actually see. No one has ever seen a quark, but we can still know things about them, based on the kind of theoretical work that they are required to perform. Still, Aristotle’s theory will be more parsimonious, if he can manage without positing such theoretical entities. At worst, prime matter is said to be outright contradictory. It is supposed to be capable of taking on any form whatsoever, and thus to have no essential properties of its own. The idea that it has no essential properties of its own seems to make it difficult for us to characterize it positively in any way: how can it be invisible, or eternal, or the ultimate bearer of properties, if these are not properties that belong to it essentially? Moreover, if it is what ultimately underlies all properties, it seems that it must be able to take on properties that are inconsistent with what we would like to be able to think of as its own nature: when Socrates turns blue, there is also some prime matter that underlies him, which also turns blue. But how can prime matter be simultaneous invisible and blue? To get around these problems, it looks as though proponents of prime matter will have to distinguish between two different kinds of property that prime matter has, or perhaps two different ways in which it has properties. There are its essential properties, which define the kind of entity that it is, and which it has permanently, and then there are its accidental properties, which it gains and loses as it underlies different sorts of thing. A worry about this solution is, if one can distinguish between the prime matter and its essential properties, this might suggest that there is a need for a further entity to act as the underlying thing for those properties, and then this further entity would need to have its own nature, and something to underlie that nature, and so on. It seems best to try to avoid such an infinite regress by insisting that prime matter can underlie its own essential properties, without being a compound of those properties and some further matter.

3. The principle of individuation

Another reason that some scholars have thought that Aristotle needs something like prime matter is to serve as a so-called “principle of individuation”. While the predominant view has been that this role is reserved for matter, other scholars have maintained either that Aristotle means it to be form, or that he does not see the need for a principle of individuation at all. Some of this controversy seems to have resulted from a failure to be clear about what a principle of individuation is, or what problem it is supposed to solve.

To see why this is so, one may focus on a controversy about individuation which Popper sought to dissolve, by pointing out that it derived from a false opposition. This was a controversy begotten by a disagreement between Anscombe and Lukasiewicz regarding the principle of individuation in Aristotle (see Anscombe et al. 1953). Popper points out that their disagreement is only apparent, due to the fact that they are answering different questions: Lukasiewicz insists that form should be counted as the “source of individuality” because it explains how a thing with many parts is a single individual and not a plurality, it accounts for the unity of individuals. He has in mind questions like “How do all these bricks constitute a single house?” or “What makes this collection of flesh and bones Socrates?”, and here Aristotle does indeed appear to make use of form. On the other hand, Anscombe says that it is matter which makes an individual the individual it is, numerically distinct from other individuals of the same (and other) species. Yet this is an issue about numerical distinctness rather than unity. It is perfectly consistent to say that Socrates is one man because of his form, which unifies his matter into a single whole, and he is a numerically distinct individual from Callias because his matter is numerically distinct from Callias’ matter.

It has become conventional to call an answer to Lukasiewicz’s problem a principle of unity, and an answer to Anscombe’s problem a principle of individuation. The traditional view has been that individuation is a metaphysical issue: what is it that makes one individual different from another (of the same kind)? However, some scholars have argued that Aristotle at no point addresses this issue, but is instead concerned with the epistemological question of how we tell one individual from another (see Charlton 1972).

It is worth considering why one might think that the metaphysical issue is not worth pursuing. The obvious reason is if one thought that there was no answer to the question “what makes this individual numerically distinct from that one?”—that nothing makes them distinct, they just are. An advocate of this view might point out that even if we accept that matter is what makes this individual distinct from that one, we still have no answer to the question “what makes this portion of matter numerically distinct from that one?”. There will always be certain of these numerical distinctness facts that remain unexplained on any theory. But if explanation has to stop somewhere, why not stop at the beginning? Why not just say that it is a bare fact that Socrates is numerically distinct from Callias, and leave matter out of it?

One might think that one could respond to this argument by insisting that there is an answer to the question what makes Socrates’ matter numerically distinct from Callias’ matter: it is the matter itself. If matter can explain the distinctness of individual substances, why should it not also explain its own distinctness from other matter? Whether or not this move is legitimate will depend on which facts are and which facts are not in need of explanation but may correctly be assumed to be primitive. The problem is that “this matter is distinct from that matter because it is this matter” seems to be a very similar sort of explanation to “Socrates is distinct from Callias because he is Socrates”—both are cases of x explaining its own distinctness from y. Either both should count as adequate explanations or neither should. But the advocate of matter as principle of individuation adopted this view precisely because she found this sort of explanation unsatisfactory, or not an explanation at all. Therefore this response does not seem to be open to her.

It seems that those who are committed to there being something which accounts for the numerical distinctness of individuals must say that there is nothing that accounts for the numerical distinctness of the distinctness-makers. The only alternative would be to introduce some further thing to account for their distinctness, and so on; but this results in an infinite regress, which, as well as being ontologically bloated, appears to be vicious, since we can never grasp the full account of what makes Socrates and Callias distinct. Both sides agree that explanation must stop somewhere, but they differ over where it is appropriate to stop: is it a basic, inexplicable fact that Socrates is numerically distinct from Callias, or that their matter is distinct? (See Markosian 2008, §8, for a contemporary discussion of this question.) At any rate, even if it is difficult to prove that there is an important metaphysical question here, the traditional interpretation of Aristotle is that he thinks there is.

There are two main texts which have been thought to show Aristotle advancing the view that matter is the principle of individuation: Metaphysics v 6, 1016b31–2, and vii 8, 1034a5–8. In the first of these, we are told:

Moreover, some things are one in number, some in form, some in genus, some by analogy; in number those whose matter is one…

According to the traditional interpretation, here we have the claim that x and y are numerically identical (or “one in number”) if, and only if, they have the same matter (or the matter of x is “one” with the matter of y). An alternative reading takes this passage to be about unity rather than individuation: Aristotle would be saying that x is numerically one if and only if x’s matter is one, where a thing’s matter being “one” means that it is one continuous piece (of bone, for example).

The second important passage for detecting Aristotle’s views about individuation comes at vii 8, 1034a5–8:

And when we have the whole, a form of such a kind in this flesh and in these bones, this is Callias or Socrates; and they are different in virtue of their matter (for that is different), but the same in form, for their form is indivisible.

According to the traditional interpretation, these lines are saying that Socrates and Callias are numerically distinct because of their matter, not their form, and on the face of it this is the clearest example of Aristotle affirming that matter is the principle of individuation. We can adopt an alternative reading, however, if we suppose that “different” means not numerically distinct, but qualitatively different. In that case, the passage could be making an epistemological claim about how we discern Socrates and Callias: suppose Callias is pale and Socrates dark; they are different, but not different in form; they differ because of their matter, since pallor and darkness primarily qualify their skin, i.e., part of their body.

There is a difficulty for the idea that matter can act as the principle of individuation, which arises out of the following problem that can be raised for Aristotle’s hylomorphism (see Fine 1994). It seems that two substances, e.g., Socrates and Callias, may have numerically the same matter at different times; that it is possible (however unlikely) for all and only the particular elements that now compose Socrates to end up composing Callias at some later date. In such a case, Socrates and Callias would have the same matter, albeit at different times. Moreover, both being human beings, they would have the same form. But they themselves are compounds of matter and form, so if their matter and form are numerically the same, they must themselves be numerically the same.

Put schematically, the argument looks like this:

  1. It is possible that Socrates and Callias be composed of numerically the same matter (albeit at different times).
  2. Socrates and Callias have the same form.
  3. Socrates and Callias are compounds of matter and form.
  4. Therefore, it is possible that Socrates and Callias are numerically the same.

Of course two different people cannot be numerically the same. So, if the argument is valid, at least one of its premises must be false.

One possible rejoinder to this argument is that it turns on an equivocation in the meaning of “matter”. As we have seen, for Aristotle matter comes in different levels. In the situation envisaged Socrates and Callias would have the same remote or low-level matter (the same elements) but they might still have different proximate matter, since the proximate matter of a human being is his body. Since a substance is a compound of a substantial form and some proximate matter, we are not entitled to conclude that Socrates and Callias are the same. Although this may be an effective way of dealing with the initial problem, it can be restated so as to avoid this objection that the argument equivocates on “matter”. Each level of matter is a compound of the matter at the level immediately below it and a form. If the proximate matter of two things is to be different, despite their lower-level matter being the same, the reason must be that the forms of the proximate matters are different. We can redescribe the situation so that not only are Socrates’ and Callias’ forms the same, but the forms of their bodies are also the same, and the forms of the matter of their bodies, and so on all the way down. Although it is unclear what in general is required for the matter of two things of the same form to have the same form, e.g., for Socrates’ and Callias’ bodies to have the same form, it seems reasonable to suppose that it is sufficient for two things to have the same form that they be qualitatively the same. So we can ensure that Socrates’ and Callias’ matters have the same form, if we suppose that they are qualitatively the same. One might insist that no two things are qualitatively the same, but there is little reason to think that Aristotle is committed to Leibniz’s doctrine of the identity of indiscernibles. What is more, although strict qualitative identity, i.e., having all the same non-relational and relational properties, may require demanding metaphysical assumptions such as an eternally cyclic universe, probably all that is required is that there be no relevant qualitative difference between Socrates and Callias, where “relevant” means such as to result in them or their matter having different forms. While one might insist that two things must be qualitatively the same to have the same form, this also does not seem to be Aristotle’s view. So if we tailor our example to this requirement, we can thwart the charge of equivocation. The argument then is valid, so we must choose one of its premises to reject.

One might try to reject the first premise of the argument, on the grounds that a person’s matter is essential to them. We have seen that Aristotle plausibly does believe this about a person’s proximate matter—their body—since a dead body is only homonymously a “body”. Nevertheless, he is committed to their more remote matter—the elements that make them up, for instance—being capable of existing independently of them. He needs there to be something to underlie the change whereby a substance comes into or goes out of existence, to make it consistent with his account of change in general in Physics i 7. There seems to be no reason to deny that, when a tree, for instance, dies, the earth, air, fire and water that constituted it still exist in the dead stump. But, if so, there seems no reason to think they could not leave the stump, and end up becoming the matter of some new tree. This is all that is needed for the problem to arise. Prime matter, if it exists, will not help: if the elements are allowed to escape the substances that they underlie, it seems that the prime matter that underlies them should also be capable of doing so. It is supposed to be capable of underlying anything; so insisting that it is confined to being the prime matter of a particular sort of thing makes no sense.

A more promising option is to reject the second premise of the argument, that co-specific or relevantly similar things like Socrates and Callias must have a common form. This one might reject if one were a believer in particular forms. The question of whether Aristotle’s forms are particular or universal has garnered a huge amount of scholarly attention (those in favour of particular forms include Sellars 1957, Frede 1978, and Irwin 1988; those in favour of universal forms include Albritton 1957, Lewis 1991, and Loux 1991). If Aristotle believed in universal forms, he could have constructed particular forms out of some kind of indexed version of the universal (e.g., an ordered pair of the universal form and the thing which had it); but that would make the identity of the particular form dependent on that of the substance that had it. Since it is the substance’s form which is acting as principle of individuation, if the common form premise is rejected, particular forms cannot be individuated by the substances that have them, on pain of circularity: what makes Socrates different from Callias is that they have different forms; and what makes their forms different is that one belongs to Socrates, the other to Callias. To play this role, particular forms would have to be defined independently of the things that have them. It would be a particular form which combines with a thing’s matter to make it the thing that it is. Some scholars find this conception of particular forms problematic.

A final reaction to the argument would be to reject the third premise, the idea that anything enmattered is a compound of its matter and form at a given time. Certainly the most straightforward way of understanding hylomorphism is that the compound is compounded of the thing’s matter and form at a particular time, and the relation between the compound and the thing is identity. This way of understanding composition is not only problematic because it leads to the problem currently under discussion: assuming that things can change their matter, we might well also wonder (a) how just one of the matters, which it has at a particular time, can yield the whole thing, and (b) how different matters at different times can yield the same thing. An alternative way to understand compounding would be to say that a thing is the compound of its form and all the various matters that it has at different times: \(X = F(m_1, m_2, \ldots m_n)\), where \(m_1\ldots m_n\) are \(X\)’s proximate matters in order of temporal occurrence. This would solve worries (a) and (b) above, since now all the different matter-slices are incorporated into the one object. It does not obviously help with the problem at hand, however, since, if it is possible for Socrates and Callias to have the same matter at a time, there seems to be no barrier to them having exactly the same sequence of matter-slices throughout their lives (provided that they are not born at the same time, and live to exactly the same age).

Finally, one could relativize the concept of a compound to a time: enmattered objects are absolutely identical to compounds, but a compound is not absolutely a compound of matter and form, but only relative to a particular time. \(X = F_t(m)\), where m is the proximate matter of X at t; or, combining this idea with the previous one, \(X = F_t(m_1\ldots m_n)\), where t is the period of time for which X exists, and \(m_1\ldots m_n\) are its matters in order of occurrence. This solution does deal with the problem directly, since Socrates and Callias can have the same form and matter, and yet be different compounds because the times are different. There may also be a modal version of the puzzle: Socrates is such that his matter and form could be identical with those of Callias at a certain time. This puzzle might be solved by also relativizing compounds to worlds.

There is an exegetical problem with ascribing this final way of understanding composition to Aristotle, and that is that it apparently conflicts with the view that he expresses in Metaphysics viii 6, 1045a7–10, and vii 17, 1041a26, that a form is what unifies a compound. The problem is how to understand the role of the time in the unification of the compound by the form: it cannot be just another element to be unified, for the time at which the matter exists does not figure as a part of the resulting unity. If we try to make the form unify a given portion of matter into many different things, depending on what time the unifying takes place at, we also run into the difficulty that such a process no longer seems worthy of the title “unification”, since the result is many objects, not just one. Indeed we can reformulate the problem without mentioning composition at all: if a common form must unify common matter into one and the same thing, and Socrates and Callias have the same form and the same matter, they are one and the same. Since Aristotle (and many neo-Aristotelians) would surely be unwilling to give up the unifying role of form, this does not look like a viable solution.

We have seen that there are some textual reasons to think Aristotle makes matter his principle of individuation; but in fact particular forms are better suited to play this role. We need to distinguish between two different questions, one about unification, the other about individuation: (i) what makes this giraffe (or this giraffe-matter) one and the same giraffe (over time)? (ii) what makes this giraffe distinct from that one? The first question seems to be the one which Aristotle addresses in Metaphysics vii 17, and does not obviously require an answer that is unique to the giraffe in question. Giraffeness in general may well suffice. The answer to the second question, however, cannot be the universal species, since it is common to both giraffes, nor can it be their matter, since they could (albeit improbably) be composed of the numerically same stuff at different times. It is not so obvious that Aristotle sees the need to address the second question, but, if his forms are particular, not universal, he is in a good position to do so.

4. Matter-involving forms

As we have seen, Aristotle introduces matter and form as contrasting notions, distinct causes, which together make up every ordinary object. It may come as a surprise, then, to find that he makes comments which suggest that matter and form are more intimately intertwined than is obviously required by the manner of their introduction. It is worth noting in this regard that he is eager to distance himself from Plato’s theory of Forms, which exist quite apart from the material world. He does so in part by insisting that his own forms are somehow enmeshed in matter (Metaphysics vi 1 and vii 11, and De Anima i 1). He also maintains that all natural forms are like something which is snub, where something is snub only if it is concavity-realized-in-a-nose (Physics ii 2; cf. Sophistical Refutations 13 and 31). The purport seems to be that all natural forms are such that they are themselves somehow material beings, or at least that one must mention matter in their specification. Consequently, some scholars have been inclined to suppose that a thing’s form itself contains a specification of the matter which anything with that form has to have (see Balme 1984, Charles 2008, Peramatzis 2011). If so, rather than being contrasted with matter, forms will be themselves somehow intrinsically material. Other scholars have been disinclined to draw this inference, not least because it seems to result in an unhappy conflation of the separate roles that matter and form are meant to play in Aristotle’s metaphysics (see Frede 1990).

The passage in the Metaphysics where Aristotle most obviously addresses this question is vii 11. He begins the chapter by asking “what sorts of thing are parts of the form, and which are not, but are parts of the compound” (1036a26–7). He first discusses the case of things which are realized in multiple different sorts of matter: a circle may be realized in bronze or stone; so it is clear that its matter, bronze or stone, is not part of the form of the circle, since it is separate from them (1036a33–4). We are then told that, in the case of things which are not seen to be separate, nothing prevents the same considerations from applying to them, “even if all the circles that had been seen were bronze” (1036b1).

Having considered the case of circles, Aristotle moves on to consider the form of a man, and to ask of flesh and bones, “Are these too parts of the form and definition?” (1036b5). Some interpreters understand the next sentence to contain Aristotle’s answer:

In truth no, they are the matter; but, because ‹the form› is not also in other ‹sorts of matter›, we are unable to separate them. (1036b5–7)

Rendered thus, the text suggests that, as in the circle case, flesh and bones are not part of the form of man. However, other editors, especially those friendly to matter-involving forms, print this sentence as a question, so that it reads

Or are they rather matter; but because ‹the form› is not also in other ‹sorts of matter›, we are unable to separate them?

This second way of understanding the sentence, though it does not require it, leaves open the possibility that Aristotle’s answer will be that, unlike in the circle case, flesh and bones are indeed part of the form of a man. Since punctuation marks are a later invention, it is impossible to be certain which reading Aristotle intended. The sentence, as it stands, is inconclusive.

We might hope that Aristotle’s view about whether flesh and bones are part of the form of man will become clearer later in the chapter. Unfortunately, the relevant passage is also open to multiple interpretations. The chapter goes on to describe how

some people are in doubt even in the case of the circle and the triangle, on the grounds that it is not right to define them in terms of lines and continuity, but that these too should all be spoken of in the same way as flesh and bones of man and bronze and stone of statue. (1036b8–12)

Presumably these thinkers object to lines and continuity being parts of the definitions of circle and triangle on the grounds that they are matter, comparing them to other sorts of matter that are obviously inadmissible in definitions. Aristotle criticizes this line of thought, which suggests that maybe he does think that certain sorts of matter or at least matter-like concepts are admissible in definitions. However, the fact that he groups flesh and bones with bronze and stone as the sort of matter that is obviously inadmissible suggests that he does not think that they are parts of the form of man.

The impression so far is seemingly contradicted a bit later, when we are told:

And therefore to reduce everything in this way and to take away the matter is futile: for surely some things are this ‹form› in this ‹matter› or these things is this state; and the comparison in the case of animal, which Socrates the Younger used to make, is not a good one; for it leads away from the truth, and makes one think that it is possible for man to exist without his parts, as the circle can without bronze. (1036b22–8)

Here Aristotle would seem to be referring back to the earlier comparison between the flesh and bones of a man and the bronze or stone of a statue at 1036b11, and claiming that the comparison misleadingly suggests that flesh and bones are not part of the form of a man, when in fact they are.

That anyway is how those in favour of matter-involving forms take this passage, but there is another possible reading. Instead of failing to realize that human beings, unlike circles, are essentially realized in flesh and bones, and as such these must be included in their form, Socrates the Younger’s mistake might have been his paying insufficient attention to the fact that circles, being mathematical objects, need not be instantiated in any specific kind of matter at all, whereas human beings always are. If this is the mistake that Aristotle is identifying, this passage would not support any sort of matter-involving forms, but only the view that natural forms, like the form of a man, are always instantiated in matter of certain sorts. Even if the forms were necessarily so instantiated, this would not require that the matter be included in the specification of the thing’s form.

There are other texts, which have been used to argue directly for the view that Aristotle embraces matter-involving forms: De Anima i 1, where Aristotle describes anger as desire for retaliation manifested in boiling of the blood around the heart; or Physics ii 2, where he says that natural forms are analogous to snubness, i.e., concavity realized in a nose. Defenders of pure forms can attempt to deal with these passages by distinguishing between a pure form, and a broader “definition” (logos, horos, horismos) which brings in other causes.

As well as purely textual arguments, several more philosophical motivations have been proffered in favour of matter-involving forms. One such argument relies on the fact that natural things, unlike mathematical ones, are subject to change. Only things with matter are capable of change, and, if natural forms are to account for the characteristic changes undergone by natural compounds, the claim is that they must themselves be matter-involving. For example, the property of falling downwards when unsupported is one had by all human beings. Aristotle would explain this propensity as being due to their being made of a preponderance of the heavier elements, earth and water. If the form of a human being is to account for this fact, plausibly it will have to make mention of the material constitution of human beings that results in this sort of characteristic behaviour.

In assessing this argument, a lot seems to depend on how extensive an explanatory role can be assigned to hypothetical necessity (cf. Physics ii 9). All human beings have a tendency to fall, necessarily, at least in a world with laws of physics like ours. However, it is not so clear whether this characteristic sort of change is one which must be explained by the form or essence of a human being, as opposed to his matter. After all, there are lots of other sorts of thing, both living and inanimate, which share this particular characteristic. Supposing there was a characteristic sort of change peculiar to all and only human beings, even then it is not obvious (a) that this fact has to be explained by the essence of a human being, and (b) that its explanation will require the essence to be matter-involving. To be sure, we would like some explanation of why this sort of change is peculiar to this sort of creature, but it might simply be a fact about the world that anything with an essence of this sort has to change in this sort of way, without that change being something that is specified within the essence itself.

In this connection it is important to notice that Aristotle recognizes the existence of idia, that is of properties that apply to all and only instances of a given species, which an instance of that species has necessarily, but which are not part of its essence: e.g., all and only human beings are capable of laughter (cf. Categories 5, 3a21, 4a10; Topics i 5, 102a18–30, and v 5, 134a5–135b6). The essence of a human being is rationality, and the fact that we all (apparently) have a sense of humour follows from the essence together with how the world is. Many characteristic changes of organisms may be best explained in a similar way: all ducks waddle, but waddling is not part of their function. Rather anything that fulfils the functional requirements of a duck must (in a world like ours) walk inelegantly.

The question of whether or not Aristotelian forms are “essentially matter-involving” is further complicated by some unclarity about what this description precisely amounts to. In particular, it is unclear whether it is supposed to be a thing’s form, which is also its essence, which is matter-involving, or the essence of the form (or both). Aristotle identifies a thing’s form with its essence at Metaphysics vii 7, 1032b1–2: “by form I mean the essence of each thing and ‹its› primary substance”. (He makes the same identity claim at vii 10, 1035b32, cf. also viii 4, 1044a36.) With this in mind, we can divide the possible views about matter-involving forms into the following four positions, with ascending degrees of matter-involvement:

  1. Pure forms: natural compounds (and their forms) have forms or essences that are not matter-involving.
  2. Compounds have forms or essences that involve matter, i.e., matter is part of the compound’s essence or form. The form that is part of the compound’s form, however, itself has a further form or essence that is not matter-involving.
  3. As in (2), compounds have forms or essences that involve matter; but forms themselves have no essences or forms.
  4. As in (2) and (3), compounds have forms or essences that involve matter; and so do forms, i.e., not only are the forms or essences of compounds themselves in some sense compounds of matter and form, as in (2) and (3), but they themselves have further essences or forms that are compounds of matter and form.

A serious objection to position (4) is that it apparently leads to a vicious infinite regress: if a compound’s essence or form is itself a compound of matter and form, and this second form has an essence or form which is also a hylomorphic compound, etc., every compound will have an infinite series of essences or forms associated with it. Socrates is (essentially) a compound of matter and form, so is his form, so is its form, etc. Note that this regress only applies if all forms are held to be matter-involving. It does not afflict the more moderate matter-involving position, (2), since it holds that the form of the compound is matter-involving, and hence has both material and formal parts, but that this second form, the form of the form, is pure, and has itself as a form, e.g., the form of a computer may be computing functions in certain suitable matter, but the formal part of that form (computing functions) would be pure. The regress is not merely unattractively bloated and otiose. If a full explanation of what something is requires one to list an infinite series of forms, such explanations will not be viable for finite beings like us.

A different way to avoid the regress which plagues (4) would be to deny the assumption that anything that is matter-involving must be a compound of matter and form. Form is matter-involving, but that is not to say that it has its own form or essence and its own matter. Form and matter are introduced to explain certain facts about ordinary objects of perception, such as this man or this horse. Once those facts have been accounted for, there is no need to look for the same explanations of the theoretical entities which have been introduced to provide the original explanation. This way out of the regress involves denying that forms have essences, i.e., it reverts to position (3). This position faces a number of textual obstacles. For instance, at the beginning of De Anima i 1, Aristotle announces that “our aim is to grasp and understand [the soul’s] nature and essence, and secondly its properties” (402a7–8). In Metaphysics vii 11, he refers to the account (logos) of the essence (1037a22–3), and claims that “the account of the soul is [the account] of the man” (1037a28–9) (cf. also Physics ii 2, 194a13). For these textual reasons it would be preferable for a proponent of (3) to be able to say that forms do have essences or definitions in a sense, but they are identical with these (as snubness = concavity in a nose). Their essences are not some further thing, distinct from them.

The difficulty with this is that it is not clear that the defender of (3) can claim that forms have definitions of any sort and still maintain a doctrine that is distinct from both (2), on the one hand, and (4) on the other. Given that forms are definitions, they must have a structure that approximates to that of a linguistic entity. Whatever else one says about them then, it seems clear that they must be divisible (in thought) into component parts, as complex predicates are divisible into words. We may ask of these component parts whether or not they are matter-involving, i.e., the question which the proponent of (3) answers in the affirmative with respect to the form or essence of the compound—does it have parts which correspond to material terms like “flesh” or “hand” or “matter”? If some parts of the form’s definition are matter-involving, and others are not, this seems to make the definition in some sense a compound of material and formal parts. We can then identify the formal parts, and ask if there is a definition of them, and, if the answer is “yes, a matter-involving one”, we are stuck once again with the regress which afflicted (4). On the other hand, if no part of the form’s definition is matter-involving, the proponent of (3) must hold that, while compounds have essences which are matter-involving, these essences have definitions which are not, and this seems to make his view intolerably similar to (2).

It might seem as though it does not make much difference whether Aristotle subscribes to position (1) or (2). According to (2), every physical object has two forms associated with it: a matter-involving one, which combines with the proximate matter to make up the compound, and a second form or essence of this matter-involving form, which is not matter-involving. On position (1), a thing has only one form, which is “pure” in the sense that it contains no matter. However, the defender of pure forms must admit that there is also a broader definition of a thing, which does include its matter, as well as its other causes. Superficially, the only difference seems to be whether or not this “definition” gets to be classified as a form, and this might appear to be a merely verbal disagreement. In fact, more is at stake here: although, “definition”, “form” and “essence” are often treated as though they were interchangeable, a definition is strictly-speaking something linguistic, whereas an essence or form may have a structure that corresponds to something linguistic, but it is still a thing in the world. For example, the essence or form of a human being is a soul. A commitment to two essences or forms per compound substance is an additional metaphysical commitment in a way that a broader linguistic definition of a thing that mentions both its form and its matter need not be. If important theoretical work cannot be found for matter-involving forms, then, pure forms are the more ontologically parsimonious choice.

In any event, one can see that Aristotle’s initial contrast between matter and form grows quickly complex once hylomorphism leaves the domain of change. Although introduced as contrastive notions suited to explicate change and substantial generation in the absence of generation ex nihilo, any easy contrast between form and matter turns out to be difficult to sustain once it finds employment in its further applications. Even so, as Aristotle implies, and as many of his followers have affirmed, hylomorphism proves no less elastic than explanatorily powerful across a wide range of explanatory roles.


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