Freedom of Speech

First published Fri Nov 29, 2002; substantive revision Sun Jul 1, 2012

This entry explores the topic of free speech. It starts with a general discussion of freedom in relation to speech and then moves on to examine one of the first and best defenses of free speech, based on the harm principle. This provides a useful starting point for further digressions on the subject. The discussion moves on from the harm principle to assess the argument that speech can be limited because it causes offense rather than direct harm. I then examine arguments that suggest speech can be limited for reasons of democratic equality. I finish with an examination of paternalistic and moralistic reasons against protecting speech, and a reassessment of the harm principle.


1. Introduction: Boundaries of the Debate

The topic of free speech is one of the most contentious issues in liberal societies. If liberty of expression is not highly valued, as has often been the case, there is no problem: freedom of expression is simply curtailed in favor of other values. Free speech becomes a volatile issue when it is highly valued because only then do the limitations placed upon it become controversial. The first thing to note in any sensible discussion of freedom of speech is that it will have to be limited. Every society places some limits on the exercise of speech because speech always takes place within a context of competing values. In this sense, Stanley Fish is correct when he says that there is no such thing as free speech (in the sense of unlimited speech). Free speech is simply a useful term to focus our attention on a particular form of human interaction and the phrase is not meant to suggest that speech should never be interfered with. As Fish puts it, “free speech in short, is not an independent value but a political prize” (1994,102). No society has yet existed where speech has not been limited to some extent. Haworth (1998) makes a similar point when he suggests that a right to freedom of speech is not something we have, not something we own, in the same way as we possess arms and legs. Speech is important because we are socially situated and it makes little sense to say that Robinson Crusoe has a right to free speech. It only becomes necessary to talk of such a right within a social setting, and appeals to an abstract and absolute right to free speech hinder rather than help the debate. At a minimum, speech will have to be limited for the sake of order. If we all speak at once, we end up with an incoherent cacophony. Without some rules and procedures we cannot have a conversation at all and consequently speech has to be limited by protocols of basic civility. It is true that many human rights documents give a prominent place to the right to speech and conscience, but such documents also place limits on what can be said because of the harm and offense that unlimited speech can cause, (I will discuss this in more detail later). Outside of the United States of America speech does not tend to have a specially protected status and it has to compete with other rights claims for our allegiance. John Stuart Mill, one of the great defenders of free speech, summarized these points in On Liberty, where he suggests that a struggle always takes place between the competing demands of authority and liberty. He claimed that we cannot have the latter without the former:

All that makes existence valuable to anyone depends on the enforcement of restraints upon the actions of other people. Some rules of conduct, therefore, must be imposed—by law in the first place, and by opinion on many things which are not fit subjects for the operation of law. (1978, 5)

The task, therefore, is not to argue for an unlimited domain of free speech; such a concept cannot be defended. Instead, we need to decide how much value we place on speech in relation to other important ideals such as privacy, security and democratic equality and there is nothing inherent to speech that suggests it must always win out in competition with these values. Speech is part of a package deal of social goods: “speech, in short, is never a value in and of itself but is always produced within the precincts of some assumed conception of the good” (Fish, 1994, 104). In this essay, we will examine some conceptions of the good that are deemed to be acceptable limitations on speech. We will start with the harm principle and then move on to other more encompassing arguments for limiting speech.

Before we do this, however, the reader might wish to disagree with the above claims and warn of the dangers of the “slippery slope.” Those who support the slippery slope argument claim that the consequence of limiting speech is the inevitable slide into censorship and tyranny. Such arguments assume that we can be on or off the slope. In fact, no such choice exists: we are necessarily on the slope whether we like it or not, and the task is always to decide how far up or down we choose to go, not whether we should step off the slope altogether. It is worth noting that the slippery slope argument can be used to make the opposite point; one could argue with equal force that we should not allow any removal of government interventions because once we do we are on the slippery slope to anarchy, the state of nature, and a life that Hobbes described in Leviathan as “solitary, poore, nasty, brutish, and short” (1968, 186).

It is possible that some limits on speech might, over time, lead to further restrictions—but they might not. And if they do, those limitations might also be justified. The advocate of the slippery-slope has to demonstrate how a restriction here and now will lead to some further (unjustified) restriction in the future. The usual slippery-slope claim is not that the proposed restriction will lead to minor adjustments in the future, but that a small change now will have drastic and tyrannical consequences. The causal mechanisms for how this must necessarily happen are usually unspecified.

Another thing to note before we engage with the harm principle is that we are in fact free to speak as we like. Hence, freedom of speech differs from some other types of free action. If the government wants to prevent citizens engaging in certain actions, riding motor bikes for example, it can limit their freedom to do so by making sure that such vehicles are no longer available; current bikes could be destroyed and a ban can be placed on future imports. Freedom of speech is a different case. A government cannot make it impossible to say certain things. The only thing it can do is punish people after they have said, written or published their thoughts. This means that we are free to speak or write in a way that we are not free to ride outlawed motorbikes. This is an important point; if we insist that legal prohibitions remove freedom then we have to hold the incoherent position that a person was unfree at the very moment she performed an action. The government would have to remove our vocal chords for us to be unfree in the same way as the motorcyclist is unfree.

A more persuasive analysis of freedom of speech suggests that the threat of a sanction makes it more difficult and potentially more costly to exercise our freedom. Such sanctions take two major forms. The first, and most serious, is legal punishment by the state, which usually consists of a financial penalty, but can stretch occasionally to imprisonment. The second threat of sanction comes from social disapprobation. People will often refrain from making public statements because they fear the ridicule and moral outrage of others. For example, one could expect a fair amount of these things if one made racist comments during a public lecture at a university. Usually it is the first type of sanction that catches our attention but, as we will see, John Stuart Mill provides a strong warning about the chilling effect of the latter form of social control.

We seem to have reached a paradoxical position. I started by claiming that there can be no such thing as a pure form of free speech: now I seem to be arguing that we are, in fact, free to say anything we like. The paradox is resolved by thinking of free speech in the following terms. I am, indeed, free to say what I like, but the state and other individuals can sometimes make that freedom more or less costly to exercise. This leads to the conclusion that we can attempt to regulate speech, but we cannot prevent it if a person is undeterred by the threat of sanction. The issue, therefore, boils down to assessing how cumbersome we wish to make it for people to say certain things. The best way to resolve the problem is to ignore the question of whether or not it is legitimate to attach penalties to some forms of speech. I have already suggested that all societies do (correctly) place some limits on free speech. If the reader doubts this, it might be worth reconsidering what life would be like with no prohibitions on libelous statements, child pornography, advertising content, and releasing state secrets. The list could go on. The real problem we face is deciding where to place the limits, and the next sections of the essay look at some possible solutions to this puzzle.

2. The Harm Principle and Free Speech

2.1 John Stuart Mill's Harm Principle

Given that Mill presented one of the first, and still perhaps the most famous liberal defense of free speech, I will focus on his claims in this essay and use them as a springboard for a more general discussion of free expression. In the footnote at the beginning of Chapter II of On Liberty, Mill makes a very bold statement:

If the arguments of the present chapter are of any validity, there ought to exist the fullest liberty of professing and discussing, as a matter of ethical conviction, any doctrine, however immoral it may be considered. (1978, 15)

This is a very strong defense of free speech; Mill tells us that any doctrine should be allowed the light of day no matter how immoral it may seem to everyone else. And Mill does mean everyone:

If all mankind minus one were of one opinion, and only one person were of the contrary opinion, mankind would be no more justified in silencing that one person than he, if he had the power, would be justified in silencing mankind. (1978, 16)

Such liberty should exist with every subject matter so that we have “absolute freedom of opinion and sentiment on all subjects, practical or speculative, scientific, moral or theological” (1978, 11). Mill claims that the fullest liberty of expression is required to push our arguments to their logical limits, rather than the limits of social embarrassment. Such liberty of expression is necessary, he suggests, for the dignity of persons.

These are powerful claims for freedom of speech, but as I noted above, Mill also suggests that we need some rules of conduct to regulate the actions of members of a political community. The limitation he places on free expression is “one very simple principle,” now usually referred to as the Harm Principle, which states that

the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. (1978, 9)

There is a great deal of debate about what Mill had in mind when he referred to harm; for the purposes of this essay he will be taken to mean that an action has to directly and in the first instance invade the rights of a person (Mill himself uses the term rights, despite basing the arguments in the book on the principle of utility). The limits on free speech will be very narrow because it is difficult to support the claim that most speech causes harm to the rights of others. This is the position staked out by Mill in the first two chapters of On Liberty and it is a good starting point for a discussion of free speech because it is hard to imagine a more liberal position. Liberals find it difficult to defend free speech once it can be demonstrated that its practice does actually invade the rights of others.

If we accept the argument based on the harm principle we need to ask “what types of speech, if any, cause harm?” Once we can answer this question, we have found the appropriate limits to free expression. The example Mill uses is in reference to corn dealers: he suggests that it is acceptable to claim that corn dealers starve the poor if such a view is expressed through the medium of the printed page. It is not acceptable to express the same view to an angry mob, ready to explode, that has gathered outside the house of the corn dealer. The difference between the two is that the latter is an expression “such as to constitute…a positive instigation to some mischievous act,” (1978, 53), namely, to place the rights, and possibly the life, of the corn dealer in danger. As Daniel Jacobson (2000) notes, it is important to remember that Mill will not sanction limits to free speech simply because someone is harmed by the statements of others. For example, the corn dealer may suffer severe financial hardship if he is accused of starving the poor. Mill distinguishes between legitimate and illegitimate harm, and it is only when speech causes a direct and clear violation of rights that it can be limited. The fact that Mill does not count accusations of starving the poor as causing illegitimate harm to the rights of corn dealers suggests he wished to apply the harm principle sparingly. Other examples where the harm principle may apply include libel laws, blackmail, advertising blatant untruths about commercial products, advertising dangerous products to children (e.g. cigarettes), and securing truth in contracts. In most of these cases, it is possible to make an argument that harm has been committed and that rights have been violated.

2.2 Mill's Harm Principle and Pornography

There are other instances when the harm principle has been invoked but where it is more difficult to demonstrate that rights have been violated. Perhaps the most obvious example of this is the debate over pornography. As Feinberg notes in Offense to Others: the Moral Limits of the Criminal Law most attacks on pornography up to the 1970's were from social conservatives who found such material to be immoral and obscene: (Feinberg notes that there is no necessary link between pornography and obscenity; pornography is material that is intended to cause sexual arousal, whereas something is obscene when it causes repugnance, revulsion and shock. Pornography can be, but is not necessarily, obscene). This type of argument has died away in recent times and the case has been prosecuted by some feminists who distinguish between erotica, which is acceptable, and pornography, which is not, because it degrades, endangers, and harms the lives of women. If it can be demonstrated that this latter material significantly increases the risk that women's rights will be violated, the harm principle can be legitimately invoked.

When pornography involves young children, most people will accept that it should be prohibited because of the harm that is being done to persons under the age of consent, (although the principle would not necessarily rule out people over the age of consent from portraying minors). It has proved much more difficult to make the same claim for consenting adults. It is hard to show that the actual people who appear in the books, magazines, films, videos and on the internet are being physically harmed. The work might be demeaning and unpleasant but the same can be said for many forms of employment and it is unclear why the harm principle would single out pornography in particular. If conditions in the pornography industry are particularly bad, regulation rather than prohibition might be the best course of action particularly as the latter will not make the industry go away. Catherine MacKinnon's (1987) claim that women who make a living through pornography are sexual slaves seems to exaggerate the case. It is even more difficult to demonstrate that pornography results in harm to women as a whole. Very few people would deny that violence against women is abhorrent and an all too common feature of our society, but how much of this is caused by violent pornography? One would have to show that a person who would not rape, batter or otherwise violate the rights of women was caused to do so through exposure to pornography.

Andrea Dworkin (1981) amongst others has attempted to show that harm is caused to women by pornography, but it has proven very difficult to draw a conclusive causal relationship. If pornographers were exhorting their readers to commit violence and rape, the case for prohibition would be much stronger, but they tend not to do this, just as films that depict murder do not actively incite the audience to mimic what they see on the screen. Even if the consumption of pornography does lead some men to commit acts of violence, this might not prove to be decisive. If only a very small percentage of men are driven to such acts we need a compelling argument why the liberty of all men (and a lot of women) has to be curtailed because of the violent actions of a few. We know that some people (the young, the elderly, the inebriated, the sleepy etc.) will drive cars in a manner that will lead to the death of other road users, but this is not in itself a good enough reason to ban motor vehicles.

MacKinnon argues that pornography does harm women because it undermines their civil rights, including the right to free speech. A permissive policy on pornography has the effect of prioritizing the right to speech of pornographers over the right to speech of women. MacKinnon's claim is that pornography silences women because it presents them as inferior beings and sex objects who are not to be taken seriously. Even if pornography does not lead to an increase in physical violence, it still leads to discrimination, domination and rights violations. She also suggests that because pornography offers a misleading and derogatory view of women, it is libelous. Such arguments have so far not led to the prohibition of pornography. One reason might be that the last twenty years has seen an explosion of pornography on the internet without a concurrent erosion of women's rights. A recent survey in Australia found that pornography (using the term here to include erotica) accounts for 30% of all internet activity. If MacKinnon is right, we should expect to see a significant increase in violence against women and a hefty decrease in their civil rights, employment in the professions, and positions in higher education. The evidence does not seem to show this and it is worth asking whether the social conditions for women today are worse than 30 years ago when pornography was much more difficult to procure. If we take the example of rape, the evidence is difficult to decipher. On the one hand, it seems that a significant number of rapes are not reported. On the other hand, some studies have shown that a number of men reported for rapes have been falsely accused. What does seem to be reasonably clear, at least in the USA, is that the increased consumption of pornography over the last 20 years has coincided with a marked reduction of violent crime against women, including rape. Sexual harrassment in the workplace is another example where the lot of women seems to have improved in the last couple of decades. Such statistics do not settle the issue but they do make it more difficult to use the harm principle as the main reason for limiting pornography.

It is important to remember that we are examining this issue from the perspective of Mill's formulation of the harm principle which suggests only speech that directly harms the rights of others in an illegitimate manner should be banned. Finding such material offensive, obscene or outrageous is not sufficient grounds for prohibition. Overall, it seems very difficult to mount a compelling case for banning pornography (except in the case of minors) based on the concept of harm as formulated by Mill.

2.3 Mill's Harm Principle and Hate Speech

Another difficult case is hate speech. Most liberal democracies have limitations on hate speech, but it is debatable whether these can be justified by the harm principle as formulated by Mill. One would have to show that such speech violated rights, directly and in the first instance.(I am interested here in hate speech that does not advocate physical violence against a group or individual. If it does, it would, like the corn dealer example, be captured by Mill's harm principle as speech that can be prohibited). For instance, The Public Order Act 1986 in the U.K. does not require such a stringent barrier to prohibition. The Act states that “A person is guilty of an offence if he ...displays any writing, sign or other visible representation which is threatening, abusive or insulting, within the hearing or sight of a person likely to be caused harassment, alarm or distress.” There have been several prosecutions in the U.K. that would not have happened if the harm principle governed “absolutely the dealings of society with the individual” (Mill p.68). The most recent example of this occured in March 2012 when Fabrice Muamba, a professional football player, collapsed during a televised game. Liam Stacey took to twitter, mocking the stricken player and then hurling racist abuse at people who responded negatively to his tweet. He was sentenced to 56 days in jail. The case provoked significant commentary, most of it taking the form of slippery-slope claims that such a ruling would inevitably lead to a totalitarian state. In Australia the Racial Discrimination Act 1975 states that “It is unlawful for a person to do an act, otherwise than in private, If: (a) the act is reasonably likely in all the circumstances to offend, insult, humiliate or intimidate another person or group of people, and (b) the act is done because of race, colour or national or ethnic origin”. The most recent prominent case was that of Andrew Bolt, a conservative political commentator, who was found guilty of racial vilification in 2011 in a civil case brought by nine aboriginal applicants.

The United States is an outlier amongst liberal democracies when it comes to hate speech. The most famous example of this is the Nazi march through Skokie, Illinois, something that would not be allowed in almost any other democratic society. The actual intention was not to engage in political speech at all, but simply to march through a predominantly Jewish community dressed in storm trooper uniforms and wearing swastikas (although the Illinois Supreme Court interpreted the wearing of swastikas as “symbolic political speech”). It is clear that most people, especially those who lived in Skokie, were outraged and offended by the march, but were they harmed? There was no plan to cause physical injury and the marchers did not intend to damage property.

The main argument for prohibiting the Skokie march, based on the harm principle, was that it would cause harm by inciting opponents of the march to riot. The problem with this claim is that it is the harm that could potentially be done to the people speaking that becomes the focal point and not the harm done to those who are the subject of the hate. To ban speech for this reason, i.e., for the good of the speaker, tends to undermine the basic right to free speech in the first place. If we turn to the local community who were on the wrong end of hate speech we might want to claim that they could be psychologically harmed, but this is more difficult to demonstrate than harm to a person's legal rights. It seems, therefore, that Mill's argument does not allow for state intervention in this case. If we base our defense of speech on the harm principle we are going to have very few sanctions imposed on the spoken and written word. It is only when we can show direct harm to rights, which will almost always mean when an attack is made against a specific individual or a small group of persons, that it is legitimate to impose a sanction. One response is to suggest that the harm principle can be defined in a less stringent manner than Mill's formulation. This is a complicated issue that I cannot delve into here except to say that Mill does not seem to be significantly concerned with the potential dangers of psychological harm. Suffice it to say that if we can expand the harm principle from the physical to the mental realm, more options might become available for prohibiting hate speech and violent pornography.

There are two basic responses to the harm principle as a means of limiting speech. One is that it is too narrow; the other is that it is too broad. This latter view is not often expressed because, as already noted, most people think that free speech should be limited if it does cause illegitimate harm. George Kateb (1996), however, has made an interesting argument that runs as follows. If we want to limit speech because of harm then we will have to ban a lot of political speech. Most of it is useless, a lot of it is offensive, and some of it causes harm because it is deceitful, and because it is aimed at discrediting specific groups. It also undermines democratic citizenship and stirs up nationalism and jingoism, which results in harm to citizens of other countries. Even worse than political discourse, according to Kateb, is religious speech; he claims that a lot of religious speech is hateful, useless, dishonest, and ferments war, bigotry and fundamentalism. It also creates bad self-image and feelings of guilt that can haunt persons throughout their lives. Pornography and hate speech, he claims, cause nowhere near as much harm as political and religious speech. His conclusion is that we do not want to ban these forms of speech and the harm principle, therefore, casts its net too far. Kateb's solution is to abandon the principle in favor of almost unlimited speech.

This is a powerful argument, but there seem to be at least two problems with the analysis. The first is that the harm principle would actually allow religious and political speech for the same reasons that it allows pornography and hate speech, namely that it is not possible to demonstrate that such speech does cause direct harm to rights. I doubt that Mill would support using his arguments about harm to ban political and religious speech. The second problem for Kateb is that if we accept he is right that such speech does cause harm in the sense of violating rights, the correct response is to start limiting political and religious speech. If Kateb's argument is sound he has shown that harm is more extensive than we might have thought; he has not demonstrated that the harm principle is invalid.

3. The Offense Principle and Free Speech

3.1 Joel Feinberg's Offense Principle

The other response to the harm principle is that it does not reach far enough. One of the most impressive arguments for this position comes from Joel Feinberg, who suggests that the harm principle cannot shoulder all of the work necessary for a principle of free speech. In some instances, Feinberg suggests, we also need an offense principle that can act as a guide to public censure. The basic idea is that the harm principle sets the bar too high and that we can legitimately prohibit some forms of expression because they are very offensive. Offending someone is less serious than harming someone, so the penalties imposed should be less severe than those for causing harm. As Feinberg notes, however, this has not always been the case and he cites a number of instances in the U.S. where penalties for sodomy and consensual incest have ranged from twenty years imprisonment to the death penalty. These are victimless crimes and hence the punishment has to have a basis in the supposed offensiveness of the behavior rather than the harm that is caused. Feinberg's principle reads as follows: “it is always a good reason in support of a proposed criminal prohibition that it would probably be an effective way of preventing serious offense...to persons other than the actor, and that it is probably a necessary means to that end...The principle asserts, in effect, that the prevention of offensive conduct is properly the state's business” (1985, 1).

Such a principle is difficult to apply because many people take offense as the result of an overly sensitive disposition, or worse, because of bigotry and unjustified prejudice. A further difficulty is that some people can be deeply offended by statements that others find mildly amusing. The furore over the Danish cartoons brings this starkly to the fore. Despite the difficulty of applying a standard of this kind, something like the offense principle operates widely in liberal democracies where citizens are penalized for a variety of activities, including speech, that would escape prosecution under the harm principle. Wandering around the local shopping mall naked, or engaging in sexual acts in public places are two obvious examples. Given the specific nature of this essay, I will not delve into the issue of offensive behavior in all its manifestations, and I will limit the discussion to offensive forms of speech. Feinberg suggests that a variety of factors need to be taken into account when deciding whether speech can be limited by the offense principle. These include the extent, duration and social value of the speech, the ease with which it can be avoided, the motives of the speaker, the number of people offended, the intensity of the offense, and the general interest of the community at large.

3.2 Pornography and the Offense Principle

How does the offense principle help us deal with the issue of erotica? Given the above criteria, Feinberg argues that books should never be banned because the offensive material is easy to avoid. If one has freely decided to read the book for pleasure, the offense principle obviously does not apply, and if one does not want to read it, it is easily avoidable. And if one is unaware of the content and should become offended in the course of reading the text, the solution is simple-one simply closes the book. A similar argument would be applied to pornographic films. The French film Baise-Moi was in essence banned in Australia in 2002 because of its offensive material (it was denied a rating which meant that it could not be shown in cinemas). It would seem, however, that the offense principle outlined by Feinberg would not permit such prohibition because it is very easy to avoid being offended by the film. It should also be legal to advertise the film, but some limits could be placed on the content of the advertisement so that sexually explicit material is not placed on billboards in public places (because these are not easily avoidable). At first glance it might seem strange to have a more stringent speech code for advertisements than for the thing being advertised; the harm principle would not provide the grounds for such a distinction, but it is a logical conclusion of the offense principle.

What of pornography that is offensive because of its extremely violent or degrading content? In this case the offense is more profound: simply knowing that such films exist is enough to deeply offend many people. The difficulty here is that bare knowledge, i.e., being offended by merely knowing that something exists or is taking place, is not as serious as being offended by something that one does not like and that one cannot escape. If we allow that films should be banned because some people are offended, even when they do not have to view them, logical consistency demands that we allow the possibility of prohibiting many forms of expression. A lot of people find strong attacks on religion, or t.v. shows by religious fundamentalists deeply offensive. Hence, Feinberg argues that even though some forms of pornography are profoundly offensive to many people, they should still be permitted.

3.3 Hate Speech and the Offense Principle

Hate speech causes profound and personal offense. The discomfort that is caused to those who are the object of such attacks cannot easily be shrugged off. As in the case of violent pornography, the offense that is caused by the march through Skokie cannot be avoided simply by staying off the streets because the offense is taken over the bare knowledge that the march is taking place. As we have seen, however, bare knowledge does not seem sufficient grounds for prohibition. If we examine some of the other factors regarding offensive speech mentioned above, Feinberg suggests that the march through Skokie does not do very well: the social value of the speech seems to be marginal, the number of people offended will be large, and it is difficult to see how it is in the interests of the community. These reasons also hold for violent pornography.

A key difference, however, is the intensity of the offense; it is particularly acute with hate speech because it is aimed at a relatively small and specific audience. The motivations of the speakers in the Skokie example seemed to be to incite fear and hatred and to directly insult the members of the community through the use of Nazi symbols. Nor, according to Feinberg, was there any political content to the speech. The distinction between violent pornography and this specific example of hate speech is that a particular group of people were targeted and the message of hate was paraded in such a way that it could not be easily avoided. It is for these reasons that Feinberg suggests hate speech can be limited by the offemse principle.

He also claims that when fighting words are used to provoke people who are prevented by law from using a fighting response, the offense is profound enough to allow for prohibition. If pornographers engaged in the same behavior, parading through neighborhoods where they were likely to meet great resistance and cause profound offense, they too should be prevented from doing so. It is clear, therefore, that the crucial component of the offense principle is the avoidability of the offensive material. For the argument to be consistent, it must follow that many forms of hate speech should still be allowed if the offense is easily avoidable. Nazis can still meet in private places, or even in public ones that are easily bypassed. Advertisements for such meetings can be edited (because they are less easy to avoid) but should not be banned. It seems, therefore, that Feinberg thinks that hate speech does not in and of itself cause direct harm to the rights of the targeted group and he would be troubled by some of the prohibitions on speech found in many liberal-democracies.

4. Democracy and Free Speech

4.1 Democratic Citizenship and Pornography

Very few liberals take the Millian view that only speech causing direct harm should be prohibited and most support some form of the offense principle. Some are willing to extend the realm of state interference further and argue that hate speech should be banned even if it does not cause harm or unavoidable offense. The reason it should be banned is that it is inconsistent with the underlying values of liberal democracy to brand some citizens as inferior to others on the grounds of race or sexual orientation. The same applies to pornography; it should be prevented because it is incompatible with democratic citizenship to portray women as submissive sexual objects, who are often violently mistreated. Rae Langton, for example, starts from the liberal premise of equal concern and respect and concludes that it is justifiable to remove certain speech protections for pornographers. She avoids basing her argument on harm: “If, for example, there were conclusive evidence linking pornography to violence, one could simply justify a prohibitive strategy on the basis of the harm principle. However, the prohibitive arguments advanced in this article do not require empirical premises as strong as this…they rely instead on the notion of equality” (1990, 313).

Working within the framework of arguments supplied by Ronald Dworkin, who is opposed to prohibitive measures, she tries to demonstrate that egalitarian liberals such as Dworkin, should, in fact, support the prohibition of pornography. She suggests that we have “reason to be concerned about pornography, not because it is morally suspect, but because we care about equality and the rights of women” (1990, 311). This is an approach also taken by Catherine McKinnon (1987). She distinguishes, much like Feinberg, between pornography and erotica. Erotica might be explicit and create sexual arousal, neither of which is grounds for complaint. Pornography would not come under attack if it did the same thing as erotica; the complaint is that it portrays women in a manner that undermines their equal status as citizens: “We define pornography as the graphic sexually explicit subordination of women through pictures or words that also includes women dehumanized as sexual objects, things, or commodities; enjoying pain or humiliation or rape; being tied up, cut up, mutilated, bruised, or physically hurt; in postures of sexual submission or servility or display; reduced to body parts, penetrated by objects or animals, or presented in scenarios of degradation, injury, torture; shown as filthy or inferior; bleeding, bruised or hurt in a context which makes these conditions sexual” (1987, 176).

Langton agrees and concludes that “women as a group have rights against the consumers of pornography, and thereby have rights that are trumps against the policy of permitting pornography…the permissive policy is in conflict with the principle of equal concern and respect, and that women accordingly have rights against it” (1990, 346). Because she is not basing her argument on the harm principle, she does not have to show that women are harmed by pornography. For the argument to be persuasive, however, one has to accept that permitting pornography does mean that women are not treated with equal concern and respect. It also seems that the argument can be applied to non-pornagraphic material that portrays women in a demeaning way that undermines their status as equals. Perusing the front cover of many magazines aimed at young women might lead one to conclude they have no interests and goals other than sex, diets, clothes, hair products and snaring men.

4.2 Democratic Citizenship and Hate Speech

To argue the case above, one has to dilute one's support for freedom of expression in favor of other principles, such as equal respect for all citizens. This is a sensible approach according to Stanley Fish. He suggests that the task we face is not to arrive at hard and fast principles that govern all speech. Instead, we have to find a workable compromise that gives due weight to a variety of values. Supporters of this view will tend to remind us that when we are discussing free speech, we are not dealing with speech in isolation; what we are doing is comparing free speech with some other good. For instance, we have to decide whether it is better to place a higher value on speech than on the value of privacy, security, equality, or the prevention of harm.

I suggested early in this essay that to begin from a principle of unregulated speech is to start from a place that itself needs to be vigorously defended rather than simply assumed. Stanley Fish is of a similar temperament and suggests that we need to find a balance in which “we must consider in every case what is at stake and what are the risks and gains of alternative courses of action” (1994, 111). Is speech promoting or undermining our basic values? “If you don't ask this question, or some version of it, but just say that speech is speech and that's it, you are mystifying—presenting as an arbitrary and untheorized fiat—a policy that will seem whimsical or worse to those whose interests it harms or dismisses” (1994, 123).

In other words, there have to be reasons behind the argument to allow speech; we cannot simply say that the First Amendment says it is so, therefore it must be so. The task is not to come up with a principle that always favors expression, but rather, to decide what is good speech and what is bad speech. A good policy “will not assume that the only relevant sphere of action is the head and larynx of the individual speaker” (Fish, 1994, 126). Is it more in keeping with the values of a democratic society, in which every person is deemed equal, to allow or prohibit speech that singles out specific individuals and groups as less than equal? Fish's answer is that, “it depends. I am not saying that First Amendment principles are inherently bad (they are inherently nothing), only that they are not always the appropriate reference point for situations involving the production of speech” (1994, 113). But, all things considered, “I am persuaded that at the present moment, right now, the risk of not attending to hate speech is greater than the risk that by regulating it we will deprive ourselves of valuable voices and insights or slide down the slippery slope towards tyranny. This is a judgement for which I can offer reasons but no guarantees” (1994, 115).

These kinds of justification for prohibitions on hate speech suggest that the permissive approach undermines free speech properly understood. Even if such speech does not cause harm (in Mill's sense) or offense, it has to be limited because it is incompatible with democracy iteslf. The argument from democracy contends that political speech is essential not only for the legitimacy of the regime, but for providing an environment where people can develop and exercise their goals, talents, and abilities. If hate speech curtails the development of such capacities in certain sections of the community, we have a reason, based on the justification for free speech, for prohibition.

Hence, the boundaries of free speech cannot be set in stone by philosophical principles. It is the world of politics that decides what we can and cannot say, guided but not hidebound by the world of abstract philosophy. Fish suggests that free speech is about political victories and defeats. The very guidelines for marking off protected from unprotected speech are the result of this battle rather than truths in their own right: “No such thing as free (nonideologically constrained) speech; no such thing as a public forum purged of ideological pressures of exclusion” (Fish, 1994, 116). Speech always takes place in an environment of convictions, assumptions, and perceptions i.e., within the confines of a structured world. The thing to do, according to Fish, is get out there and argue for one's position.

We should ask three questions according to Fish: “[g]iven that it is speech, what does it do, do we want it to be done, and is more to be gained or lost by moving to curtail it?” (1994, 127). He suggests that the answers we arrive at will vary according to the context. Free speech will be more limited in the military, where the underlying value is hierarchy and authority, than it will be at a university where one of the main values is the expression of ideas. Even on campus, there will be different levels of appropriate speech. Spouting off at the fountain in the center of campus should be less regulated than what a professor can say during a lecture. It might well be acceptable for me to spend an hour of my time explaining to passers-by why Manchester United is such a great football team but it would be completely inappropriate (and open to censure) to do the same thing when I am supposed to be giving a lecture on Thomas Hobbes. A campus is not simply a “free speech forum but a workplace where people have contractual obligations, assigned duties, pedagogical and administrative responsibilities” (1994,129). Almost all places in which we interact are governed by underlying values and speech will have to fit in with these principles: “[r]egulation of free speech is a defining feature of everyday life” (Fish, 1994,129). Thinking of speech in this way removes a lot of the mystique. Whether we should ban hate speech is just another problem along the lines of whether we should allow university professors to talk about football in lectures.

4.3 Paternalistic Justification for Limiting Speech

Although Stanley Fish takes some of the mystique away from the value of speech, he still thinks of limitations largely in terms of other regarding consequences. There are arguments, however, that suggest speech can be limited to prevent harm being done to the speaker. The argument here is that the agent might not have a full grasp of the consequences of the action involved (whether it be speech or some other form of behavior) and hence can be prevented from engaging in the act. Arguments used in the Skokie case would fit into this category. Most liberals are wary of such arguments because we are now entering the realm of paternalistic intervention where it is assumed that the state knows better than the individual what is in his or her best interests.

Mill, for example, is an opponent of paternalism generally, but he does believe there are certain instances when intervention is warranted. He suggests that if a public official is certain that a bridge will collapse, he can prevent a person crossing. If, however, there is only a danger that it will collapse the person can be warned but not coerced. The decision here seems to depend on the likelihood of personal injury; the more certain injury becomes, the more legitimate the intervention. Prohibiting freedom of speech on these grounds is very questionable in all but extreme cases (it was not persuasive in the Skokie case) because it is very rare that speech would produce such a clear danger to the individual.

Hence we have exhausted the options that are open to the liberal regarding limitations on free speech and one cannot be classed as a liberal if one is willing to stray further into the arena of state intervention than already discussed. Liberals tend to be united in opposing paternalistic and moralistic justifications for limiting free expression. They have a strong presumption in favor of individual liberty because, it is argued, this is the only way that the autonomy of the individual can be respected. To prohibit speech for reasons other than those already mentioned means that one has to argue that it is permissible to limit speech because of its unsavory content, or as Feinberg puts it, one has to be willing to say that

[i]t can be morally legitimate for the state, by means of the criminal law, to prohibit certain types of action that cause neither harm nor offense to any one, on the grounds that such actions constitute or cause evils of other kinds. (Harmless Wrongdoing, p. 3)

Acts can be “evil” if they are dangerous to a traditional way of life, because they are immoral, or because they hinder the perfectibility of the human race. Many arguments against pornography take the form that such material is wrong because of the moral harm it does to the consumer. Liberals oppose such views because they are not overly interested in trying to mold the moral character of citizens.

5. Back to the Harm Principle

We began this examination of free speech with the harm principle; let us end with it and assess whether it helps us determine the proper limits of free expression. The principle suggests that we need to distinguish between legal sanction and social disapprobation as means of limiting speech. As already noted, the latter does not ban speech but it makes it more uncomfortable to utter unpopular statements. J.S. Mill does not seem to support the imposition of legal penalties unless they are sanctioned by the harm principle. As one would expect, Mill also seems to be worried by the use of social pressure as a means of limiting speech. Chapter III of On Liberty is an incredible assault on social censorship, expressed through the tyranny of the majority, because it produces stunted, pinched, hidebound and withered individuals: “everyone lives as under the eye of a hostile and dreaded censorship…[i]t does not occur to them to have any inclination except what is customary” (1978, 58). He continues:

the general tendency of things throughout the world is to render mediocrity the ascendant power among mankind…at present individuals are lost in the crowd…the only power deserving the name is that of masses…[i]t does seem, however, that when the opinions of masses of merely average men are everywhere become or becoming the dominant power, the counterpoise and corrective to that tendency would be the more and more pronounced individuality of those who stand on the higher eminences of thought. (1978, 63–4)

With these comments, and many of a similar ilk, Mill demonstrates his distaste of the apathetic, fickle, tedious, frightened and dangerous majority.

It is quite a surprise, therefore, to find that he also seems to embrace a fairly encompassing offense principle when the sanction does involve social disapprobation:

Again, there are many acts which, being directly injurious only to the agents themselves, ought not to be legally interdicted, but which, if done publicly, are a violation of good manners and, coming thus within the category of offenses against others, may rightly be prohibited. (1978, 97 [author's emphasis]

Similarly, he states that “The liberty of the individual must be thus far limited; he must not make himself a nuisance” (1978, 53). In the latter parts of On Liberty Mill also suggests that distasteful persons can be held in contempt, that we can avoid such persons (as long as we do not parade it), that we can warn others against these persons, and that we can persuade, cajole and remonstrate with those we deem offensive. These actions are legitimate as the free expression of those who happen to be offended as long as they are done as a spontaneous response to the person's faults and not as a form of punishment.

But those who exhibit cruelty, malice, envy, insincerity, resentment and crass egoism are open to the greater sanction of disapprobation as a form of punishment, because these faults are wicked and other-regarding. It may be true that these faults have an impact on others, but it is difficult to see how acting according to malice,envy or resentment necessarily violates the rights of others. The only way that Mill can make such claims is by expanding his argument to include an offense principle and hence give up on the harm principle as the only legitimate grounds for interference with behavior. Overall, Mill[special-character:#146s arguments about ostracism and disapprobation seem to provide little protection for the individual who may have spoken in a non-harmful manner but who has nevertheless offended the sensibilities of the masses.

Hence we see that one of the great defenders of the harm principle seems to shy away from it at certain crucial points and it is unlikely that a defense of free speech can rest on the principle alone. It does, however, remain an elementary part of the liberal defense of individual freedom.

Liberals tend to defend freedom generally, and free speech in particular, for a variety of reasons beyond the harm principle; speech fosters authenticity, genius, creativity, individuality and human flourishing. Mill tells us specifically that if we ban speech the silenced opinion may be true, or contain a portion of the truth, and that unchallenged opinions become mere prejudices and dead dogmas that are inherited rather than adopted. These are empirical claims that require evidence. Is it likely that we enhance the cause of truth by allowing hate speech or violent and degrading forms of pornography? It is worth pondering the relationship between speech and truth. If we had a graph where one axis was truth and the other was free speech, would we get one extra unit of truth for every extra unit of free speech? How can such a thing even be measured? It is certainly questionable whether arguments degenerate into prejudice if they are not constantly challenged. Devil's advocates are often tedious rather than useful interlocutors. None of this is meant to suggest that free speech is not vitally important; this is, in fact, precisely the reason we need to find good arguments in its favor. But sometimes supporters of free speech, like its detractors, have a tendency to make assertions without providing compelling evidence to back them up.

6. Conclusion

In a liberal society, we have found that the harm principle provides reasons for limiting free speech when doing so prevents direct harm to rights. This means that very few speech acts should be prohibited. The offense principle has a wider reach than the harm principle, but it still recommends very limited intervention in the realm of free speech. All forms of speech that are found to be offensive but easily avoidable should go unpunished. This means that all forms of pornography and most forms of hate speech will escape punishment. If this argument is acceptable, it seems only logical that we should extend it to other forms of behavior. Public nudity, for example, causes offense to some people, but most of us find it at most a bit embarrassing, and it is avoided by a simple turn of the head. The same goes with nudity, sex, and coarse language on television. Neither the harm or the offense principles as outlined by Mill support criminalizing bigamy or drug use, nor the enforcement of seat belts, crash helmets and the like.

Some argue that speech can be limited for the sake of other liberal values, particularly the concern for democratic equality; the claim is not that speech should always lose out when it clashes with other fundamental principles that underpin modern liberal democracies, but that it should not be automatically privileged. To extend prohibitions on speech and other actions beyond this point requires an argument for a form of legal paternalism that suggests the state should decide what is acceptable for the safety and moral instruction of citizens, even if it means limiting actions that do not cause harm or unavoidable offense to others. It is up to the reader to decide if one of these positions is persuasive. It has certainly been the practice of most societies, even liberal-democratic ones, to impose some paternalistic restrictions on behavior and to limit speech because it causes offense. As we have seen, even Mill seems to back away somewhat from the harm principle. Hence the freedom of expression supported by the harm principle as outlined in Chapter One of On Liberty and by Feinberg's offense principle is still a possibility rather than a reality. It is also up to the reader to decide if it is an appealing possibility.

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[As of January 2008, typing “free speech” on Google will net millions of entries. Hence it is best to simply jump in and see what one can find. It is worth noting that almost all of them are devoted to the promotion of speech in the face of censorship. This reflects a strong bias on the internet in favor of the “slippery slope” view of free speech. There are not many entries where an argument is made for placing limitations on free expression. Wikipedia has a quite a few entries dealing with censorship, free speech, pornography, and crime statistics. Here are a few other sites to get you going.]

Related Entries

democracy | equality | Mill, John Stuart | paternalism | pornography: and censorship

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