José Ortega y Gasset
José Ortega y Gasset (1883–1955) was a prolific and distinguished philosopher of Spain in the twentieth century. In the course of his career as philosopher, social theorist, essayist, cultural and aesthetic critic, educator, politician and editor of the influential journal, Revista de Occidente, he has written on a broad range of themes and issues. Among his many books are: Meditations on Quixote (1914), Invertebrate Spain (1921), The Theme of Our Time (1923), Ideas on the Novel (1924), The Dehumanization of Art (1925), What is Philosophy? (1929), The Revolt of the Masses (1930), En Torno a Galileo (1933), History as a System (1934), Man and People (1939–40), The Origin of Philosophy (1943), The Idea of Principle in Leibnitz and the Evolution of Deductive Theory (1948). In addition to these books, and others, there are hundreds of essays, newspaper and magazine articles, the most important of which are collected in twelve volumes, several of which have been translated into English, French and German. His major writings reveal an intellectual development that traversed the life-world experiences articulated in the perspectives of phenomenology, historicism, and existentialism.
Ortega's perception of human life as fundamental reality and as a “happening,” his analysis of the ontological distinction between “being” and “authentic being,” his description of the intersubjective interaction of the “I” and “Others” in the social world, his concepts of the “generation,” and of “contemporaries” and “co-evals,” and his ideas of “perspectivism,” “vital” and “historical reason,” combine to broaden and to advance his philosophy of human social and historical realities. Through these intellectual orientations, Ortega became concerned with the epistemological status of historical knowledge, and approached the problem of critical philosophy of history as constituting the interpenetration of the philosophical and historical attitudes. Critical philosophy of history thus refers to the position that characterizes the world we know and in which we act as a product of human activity and mind. Accordingly, Ortega represented the “modern” reflective thinker who approached history from philosophy, and whose theories of history as a source of human knowledge have epitomized the tendency to connect concepts of historical temporality and mind. He challenged positivistic approaches to history and contributed an important aspect to the modern concept of history: the tenet that there is a connectedness and a meaning in human history which emanates from a principle of continuity inherent in individual human lives.
- 1. Biography
- 2. Intellectual Development
- 3. Ontological Factors Confronting Transcendental Phenomenology
- 4. “I am I and my Circumstances”: Neither “Biologism” nor “Rationalism”
- 5. Perspectivism: Human Life, Vital Reason and Historicism
- 6. Existential Phenomenology and the Philosophy of Life
- 7. Human Reality and Historical Reason
- 8. Existential Phenomenology, the Social World and Historical Time
- 9. Social Reality, the “Mass Man” and “Mass Society”
- 10. The Concept of Generation, Temporality, Historical Reason, and Critical Philosophy of History
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
José Ortega y Gasset was born 9 May, 1883, in Madrid, the second of four children by José Ortega Munilla and Dolores Gasset Chinchilla. Eduardo Ortega y Gasset was born in April of the preceding year and, after young José, Rafaela in 1884 and Manuel in 1885. His mother was the daughter of Eduardo Gasset y Artime, founder of El Imparcial, the eminent liberal daily newspaper, to which his father, from1900 and 1906, divided his time between creative writing and serving as editor of the family enterprise. From September 1891 to 1897, Ortega and his brother Eduardo were enrolled in the Jesuit Collegio de San Estanislao de Kostka in Miraflores del Palo in Málaga, where he studied Greek and other subjects under the tutelage of Father Gonzalo Colomer, and from where he received his bachillerato. In November, 1897, young Ortega enrolled in the Jesuit University of Deusto, in Bilbao, accompanied by Father Colomer, for the purpose of studying philology and Greek under the renowned scholar Julio Cejador y Frauca. He remained in Deusto, studying philosophy, letters, and law, until 13 May, 1898, when he performed with distinction his first-year examinations at the University of Salamanca. Miguel de Unamuno, an eminent figure in Spanish intellectual circles and dean of the faculty, served on the panel of examiners. The following year, Ortega transferred to the Central University of Madrid, from which he received his licenciatura in philosophy and letters, in June 1902, and his doctorate in December 1904. He wrote his thesis on The Terrors of the Year One Thousand, in which an early interest in a general interpretive approach to history, with a view toward the sociological manifestations of an historical period, became evident. While at the Central University of Madrid, Ortega developed a close friendship with Ramiro de Maeztu, with whom he shared an enthusiasm for Nietzsche's philosophy. In 1904, the year prior to his departure for Germany, Ortega wrote his first article for the El Imparcial, the family newspaper, on the Belgian poet Maurice Maeterlinck.
In late February 1905, Ortega left Spain for Germany “fleeing,” he described later, “the vulgarity of my country to stuff myself with whatever I can get out of it” (El Imparcial, 19 January, 1908, p. 1). This first trip to Germany resulted in an eight-month stay at the University of Leipzig, where he pursued the study of classical philology and philosophy. Ortega's proficiency in German proved inadequate to study philology, however this linguistic deficiency did not deter his enthusiasm: he enrolled in the Indo-European language and linguistic courses of professors Brugmann and Meyer. Although the time devoted to philological studies distracted him somewhat from the philosophical training he sought initially, Ortega was introduced to the writings of Wilhelm von Humboldt, Ernest Renan, Hippolyte Taine, Arthur Schopenhauer, Friedrich Nietzsche, and Charles Darwin, and audited the anatomy, physiology, and psychology courses of Wilhelm Wundt who, despite having been appointed the chair of philosophy, served as professor of physiology and psychology at Leipzig. He returned to Madrid in the summer of 1906, where he received word that he had been granted a state stipend to resume his study in Germany for another year. Within a few weeks, he left for the University of Berlin, where Wilhelm Dilthey, Friedrich Paulsen, Eduard Meyer, Heinrich Wölfflin, Georg Simmel, Carl Stumpf, Max Planck, and Alois Riehl were teaching. However, while at Berlin, Ortega attended only the lectures of Riehl, which, he came to regret later, resulted in missing the opportunity to encounter two thinkers he would subsequently admire: Dilthey and Simmel. Six months later, Ortega left Berlin for the University of Marburg, where he began his philosophical studies, joining Nicolai Hartmann, Paul Scheffer, and Heinz Heimsoeth under the Neo-Kantian philosophers Hermann Cohen and Paul Natorp. Once ensconced in “the citadel of Neo-Kantianism,” Ortega studied Kant and the history of philosophy with Cohen and psychology and pedagogy with Natorp. The University of Marburg, with its approach to an inquiry into the logical foundation of the natural sciences and its emphasis on the epistemological and methodological facets of philosophy, provided Ortega with the kind of philosophical grounding and training he had been seeking.
In February 1908, Ortega returned to Madrid where his appointment to the staff of El Imparcial and his founding Faro, a weekly magazine, became the first of several publishing ventures, and the vehicle by which to convey his critical assessment of Spanish and European cultures. Upon his departure for Germany in 1905, the dominant intellectual issue among the intelligentsia had been the regeneration of Spain and the fundamental question, “what is to be done: ‘Hispanization or Europeanization?’” Upon his return in 1908, the question remained the central theme of protracted discussions, the only difference being the critical ideas of Ortega. In a 1908 issue of Faro, the Conservative historian and politician Gabriel Maura y Gamazo (1879–1963) first coined the designation “Generation of 1898,” which was popularized by the novelist Azorín (José Martínez Ruíz, 1873–1967), a member of the group, in subsequent newspaper articles in 1910 and 1913. On 23 February, 1908, Maura engaged in polemical exchanges with Ortega and referred to “the generation that arrives today; a generation born intellectually at the root of the disaster.” They acquired their names as the events of the Spanish American War unfolded, presenting the perception of national catastrophe and providing a context for their national and social criticisms. Spaniards perceived the war as a national disaster, and the generation of 1898 came together to discuss what they considered to be the degeneration of Spain.
In June 1908 he was appointed professor of ethics, logic and psychology at La Escuela Superior del Magisterio (Normal School), which he had helped found, and in late October, at the Assembly for the Progress of Science, held in Zaragoza, he spoke vehemently in favor of regenerating Spain by broadening her horizons within European thought. Ortega pursued these issues with his former professor of Greek at the University of Salamanca, Unamuno, reproaching the latter for preferring to “Africanize” Europe than to “Europeanize” Spain, a conviction that led to a parting of paths the following year. On October 8, 1910, in open competition, Ortega appeared before a jury established to select a successor to the chair of metaphysics, left vacant after the death of Nicolás Salmerón (1838–1908). A month later, he received the professorship at the Central University of Madrid, at the remarkable age of twenty-seven. Six months earlier, on 7 April 1910, Ortega married his fiancée, Rosa Spottorno y Topete, and from January to October, 1911, the couple passed a delayed honeymoon in Germany, assisted by a grant issued through the Ministry of Public Education for further study and research in Marburg, where his first son, Miguel Germán was born 28 May 1911. The symbolic name reveals the importance of Germany for Ortega. At the end of December 1911, Ortega returned to Madrid to assume his teaching duties, in January of the following year, as professor of metaphysics. A chair he occupied for twenty-four years, with only two brief interruptions: once in 1929, when he resigned to protest the encroachments on academic freedom during the dictatorship of Miguel Primo de Rivera; again, in 1931, when Ortega become one of the first members of the Constituent Cortes at the beginning of the second Spanish Republic, until his exile from Spain in 1936 at the outbreak of the Spanish Civil War.
At the outbreak of the First World War, Ortega began to contribute his share to the “European cultural mission” of Spain through his lectures on some of the major trends within the currents of European thought. Such thinkers as Hans Driesch, August Weissmann, and Jakob von Uexküll in biology, and the philosophical, economic and social thought of Max Scheler, Georg Simmel, and Werner Sombart, were introduced to Spanish university students for the first time. In July 1916 Ortega, his father and several other Spanish intellectuals departed Spain for Argentina where, between August and October, Ortega gave a series of lectures at the University of Buenos Aires on Kant and the currents in contemporary Continental philosophy. These lectures followed the recent arrival of Julio Rey Pastor, a noted Spanish mathematician, who immigrated to Argentina to elevate the mathematical and scientific level of instruction at the University of Buenos Aires. His residence in Buenos Aires kept him away from political affairs, save for an article, in June 1917, in which he criticized the role of the military in politics. The political commentary precipitated his definitive departure from El Imparcial, and prompted his move with his brother, Eduardo, to join a new daily newspaper El Sol, founded by a close friend, Nicolás María de Urgoiti of La Papelera Española. The first issue appeared on 1 December 1917. Five years later, Ortega also assisted in establishing the publishing house Calpe (later named Espasa-Calpe), which immediately made available classic and contemporary literature from Spain and Europe, in reasonably priced paperback editions. Between these activities, Ortega became the founder and director of the monthly Revista de Occidente, publishing the first issue in July 1923. The Revista, which was directed toward an educated readership, quickly became one of Europe's renowned intellectual journals. The organ became a veritable “Review of the West” in that several of the articles, which were translations of works previously published abroad, were important philosophic and scientific trends representative of “our epoch”: Spengler, Huizinga, Simmel, Uexküll, Brentano, Heimoseth, Driesch, Pfänder, Müller, and Russell. The journal also became the principal medium of the intelligentsia and, in company with Ortega's tertulias in the offices on the Avenue Pi y Margall, assisted in fostering the poetic generation of young intellectuals, the “Generation of 1927.” The Generation of 1927 originated as a term to characterize a certain similarity of poets and writers in the Spain of the 1920s. The year signaled the moment when intellectuals and students began to resist the dictatorship of General Miguel Primo de Rivera as a prelude to the Second Republic. As with their predecessors, the Generation of 1898, the perceived national crisis created a spirit of collective mentality, or at least a shared identity, in the years preceding the Spanish Civil War. Several of the younger vanguard poets were first published by Índice, founded and directed by Juan Ramón Jiménez Mantecón (1881–1958), a nineteenth-century follower of Karl Christian Friedrich Krause (1781–1832), who had been one of the first to reintroduce modernist themes in Spanish literature. Other members of the Generation of 1927 found expression through the Revista de Occidente. Ortega, whose major works were published in the 1920s, served as one of the most important links between the two generations by giving editorial assistance to the younger poets and by addressing The Dehumanization of Art (1925) to their concerns. Along with Américo Castro (1885–1972), Ramón Pérez de Ayala (1880–1962), and Eugenio d'Ors y Rovira (1882–1954), he provided an intellectual leadership that inspired the younger Spaniards to develop fully their own creative endeavors.
These young artists and poets were marking their careers on the crest of a new wave that swept intellectual circles in Europe and in Spain. Politics appeared to pursue culture and art. As these young poets and artists matured, and were identified with the Generation of 1927, they became more daring and wiling to experiment with new techniques and media to produce a much wider and more vivid impact. Federico García Lorca's (1898–1936) friendly collaboration with painter Salvador Dalí (1904–1989), film director Luis Buñuel (1900–1983), and composer Manuel de Falla (1876–1946) demonstrated an appreciation for combining new techniques to extract mysterious essences from human experience. Their works offered vivid images of the new abstract aesthetic mysticism and surrealism in the 1920s. These new art forms and novel methods of perceiving hidden essences were immediately associated with the aesthetic expressions that rejected old moralities and traditional values, developed a greater interest in politics, and represented an ever-increasing creative sensitivity. Indeed, this new found freedom in aesthetic expression was extended to the realm of politics. In April 1929, after Ortega resigned his chair of metaphysics at the Central University of Madrid in protest of Primo de Rivera's repressive educational policies, several of these young intellectuals representing diverse political positions turned to him for political counsel and implored him to guide their reform movement on behalf of a “modern” and “intellectual” orientation toward “freedom” in Spain. Ortega declined the leadership role proposed by García Lorca and the group of young intellectuals and offered, instead, his “sympathy, support, and comradeship.”
In February 1931 the government summoned municipal elections, preparatory to the general parliamentary elections. During the same period Ortega, together with the physician and writer Gregorio Marañón (1887–1960), and the novelist and poet Perez de Ayala, published the manifesto of the “Agupación al Servicio de la República (“Group in the Service of the Republic”), appealing for an association of intellectuals and professionals dedicated to the implementation of the goal that would unite all classes and geographical regions under a national banner. The Agrupación proposed to pursue the path between the “dead ends” of Communism and Fascism: a Republic. Ortega's political vision and intellectual style provided the inspiration and leadership sought by La Agrupación and Lorca's intellectual cohort after the sudden abdication of Alfonso XIII and the proclamation of the Republic on 14 April 1931. Though limited through legal restrictions, La Agrupación supported the platform of Socialist Republican candidates. Fourteen members of the group, including Ortega, Marañón, and Ayala, were elected in the parliamentary elections in June. Ortega was elected to the Constituent Cortes in the provinces of León and Jaén; he demitted the latter seat. The election returns revealed that Republican candidates received three times as many votes as the Monarchists. The Constituent Cortes was convened on14 July, a date chosen consciously to symbolize the Second Republic's identity with the French Revolution of 1789. The Second Republic, when observed in the broader context of European history, was the fifteenth and last of a series of republics which had been installed during the first decades of the twentieth century.
As a member of the Cortes, Ortega experienced the practical difficulties and problems inherent in the nature of political leadership. Manuel Azaña y Díaz (1880–1940), a dominant figure in the government at the time, and his political following continually opposed the ideas and leadership of Ortega and his associates of La Agrupación. In the fall of 1932, after incessant arguments and conflicts between the followers of Ortega and Azaña reached the point where communication became virtually impossible, Ortega left active politics. Daunted but not distressed, he returned to his chair of metaphysics at the Central University of Madrid. Between the time of his return to the university and the outbreak of the Spanish Civil War, Ortega continued writing political articles in El Sol, identifying and criticizing politicians he thought were primarily responsible for veering the Republic in the wrong direction.
Ortega's acrid comments failed to shield him from the Republic's political turmoil. Thus, on 31 August 1936, during the early phases of the Spanish Civil War, stricken with serious gall bladder issues, and not knowing what to expect from his political enemies, Ortega, his wife, three children and his brother Eduardo embarked on a French boat, with the assistance of the French Embassy, from Alicante to Marseilles. They settled in La Tronche, near Grenoble, until November, when they moved to Paris where they remained, except for a trip to the Netherlands in 1938, at the invitation of Johann Huizinga, until February 1939, when he traveled to the south of Portugal to recuperate from his gall bladder operation. While in Portugal, his mother died on 21 April 1939 in a small town (Puente Genil) near Córdoba; on 12 November, in the following year, his sister, Rafaela died. Eventually, at the end of August, Ortega left for Argentina accompanied by his wife and daughter. He remained in Argentina during the major part of the Second World War, lecturing at the University of Buenos Aires until late February/early March in 1942, when he, his wife and daughter settled in Estoril, Portugal.
In August, 1945, Ortega returned to Spain for the first time since the outbreak of the Spanish War. He passed the remainder of the summer in Zumaya, before returning to Portugal for the winter. Ortega's return to his native country in 1945 marked the end of nine years in exile. However, to several of his Republican compatriots who remained in exile, a return to Franco Spain called into question his intellectual integrity. The supporters of Franco, on the other hand, considered him a former enemy and untrustworthy. Unable to republish issues of the Revista de Occidente because of governmental intervention, Ortega published extensively in German periodicals. Though his chair in metaphysics was officially restored, Ortega never resumed his teaching at the university. However, in 1948, with the assistance of his former student and disciple, Julián Marías (1914–2005), Ortega established El Instituto de Humanidades (“Institute of Humanities”), at which he lectured and succeeded in attracting many students and liberal intellectuals. Despite its success, the government rarely allowed the Institute to function freely and eventually shut down their activities in 1950.
Between 1949 and 1955, Ortega averted the pressure of the Spanish government by reactivating his cultural interests in conferences and meetings abroad, where he lectured and received honors. In early July 1949 he visited Aspen, Colorado, with his good friend Ernst Curtius, the cultural historian, to attend and participate in the bicentennial commemoration of Goethe's birth under of the auspices and direction of Robert M. Hutchins and the University of Chicago. In September, he visited Hamburg, Berlin, Darmstadt and Munich for similar reasons. In August 1951, he returned to Germany to participate in a conference at Darmstadt, where he met Heidegger, and received an honorary doctorate from the University of Marburg. The conference, which Ortega was invited to attend in Darmstadt, was sponsored by scientists and architects to discuss “Man and Space.” This brief meeting apparently was pleasant, as neither philosopher broached the sensitive issue of originality or of the similarities of certain aspects of their thought during the course of their private conversations. Failing health, which was diagnosed as cancer of the stomach and liver, curtailed his traveling after his last lecture given in May 1955 at Venice. On 18 October, Ortega died in his apartment on the sixth-floor at Calle Monte Esquinza 28.
Ortega dissociated himself from any particular school of thought, yet would have been the first to acknowledge that a philosopher's ideas become linked with previous philosophical traditions. His attitude toward this intrinsic aspect of thought becomes apparent when he remarked: “In our present philosophical posture and in the doctrine that is produced by it, we view and take into account a substantial portion of previous thought and themes relating to our discipline. This is tantamount to saying that past philosophies are our collaborators, which survive and are present in our own philosophy” (Obras, 9: 360). The most important and obvious connection, then, between intellectual currents in Europe and Ortega's thought was the influence, in general, of German philosophy and, in particular, his studies at the University of Marburg. Neo-Kantianism in general and Cohen in particular provided a broad influence on the intellectual development of Ortega. He studied closely with both Cohen and Natorp, and the former served as Ortega's primary mentor. Ortega recalled this relationship in his “Prologue for Germans,” where he referred to Cohen, in retrospect, as “my teacher.” Some of the critical influence of Marburg Neo-Kantianism is discernible in Ortega's writings. An attempt to distinguish philosophy from the assumptions and assertions—whether idealistic or positivistic—of speculative metaphysics characterized his general philosophic position. Ortega rejected speculative metaphysical systems and, like Cohen, repudiated the approach to epistemology of the natural sciences, with its naturalistic and psychophysical explanations of sensible reality of the “subjective” idealists. Although Ortega hesitates to proceed as far as Cohen, that is, to postulate the “facts” of science to be determined completely by thought, a sort of Neo-Kantian metaphysics remains in his fundamental philosophic point of view. For instead of positing pure thought solely as real, Ortega replaced Cohen's logic with his notion of “human life.” That is, Ortega's generalized view of existence contains human life in place of human logic as the underlying unifying principle of reality. Ortega's major writings were concerned with the idea of life as the “dynamic dialogue between the individual and the world”; he was not concerned, as was Cohen, with assigning to external experience a reality that is contingent upon the principles of logic and mathematical physics. “The structure of life is futurition,” he wrote, “is the most persistent leit motif of my writings, inspired certainly by questions—raised by the logic of Cohen—which are very remote from the vital problem to which I apply it” (Obras, 4: 403–4). This distinction drawn by Ortega between his vitalistic perspective and Cohen's all-embracing logic suggests that Ortega's experience at Marburg brought him closer to a critical than to an absolute Neo-Kantianism. The critical approach to philosophical issues became an important factor in influencing Ortega's thought and in the philosophical training that he received. In his “Reflections on Kant's Centenary,” Ortega, in retrospect, referred metaphorically to his struggle with Kant and Neo-Kantian philosophy as having occurred in a “Kantian prison,” And in his “Prologue for Germans,” he acknowledged his experience at the University of Marburg to have been an important factor in influencing his intellectual development. “In this city,” he reflected, “I passed the equinox of my youth; to it I owe half, at least, of my hopes and almost all my discipline” (Obras, 4: 25; 2: 558–59, 8: 20).
Ortega's return to Marburg in 1911 signaled another turn in his intellectual interests and in his philosophical development: and introduction to phenomenology. He recalled in his later writing that, while studying at Marburg during those months, he and his fellow- students of Cohen and Natorp were deeply immersed in Neo-Kantian idealism. Ortega, Hartmann, Heimsoeth, and Scheffer, often discussed amongst themselves their agreements, disagreements, and dissatisfaction with the Neo-Kantianism of their mentors. The critical spirit of their intellectual “spontaneity,” became evident in their reactions to all the reading they had undertaken on Kant, Parmenides, and ancient philosophy in general. In recognizing the limits of the Kantian revival and in reflecting upon the current tendencies in art, literature and philosophy, Ortega and his intellectual cohort proceeded beyond Neo-Kantianism idealism toward “the imaginary coast.” Like any journey along imaginary coasts, the uncertainty of the horizon demands a nautical device for the means of navigation. For Ortega and his intellectual peers, in their quest for a system, the intellectual ambience provided them “the gift of a prodigious instrument: phenomenology” (Obras, 8: 42). This “common awakening” of the young cohort, however, also signaled their separate paths. In 1911, they challenged collectively, as a group of students, the positions of their teachers; on leaving Marburg, they had to pursue as individuals whatever intellectual autonomy they were able to discover in phenomenology, and to put together whichever architectonic of a system was attainable from it.
After 1911, evidence points to how both Ortega and Hartmann pursued particular interests of phenomenology. In 1912, Ortega began to study phenomenology “seriously” and in 1913, he recollected years later, the Jahrbuch für Philosophie und Phänomenologische Forschung, Husserl's Ideen (Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology), and Formalism in Ethics and Non-Formal Ethics of Values of Scheler were published. Later that year, in a series of articles which were published in the Revista de Libros, Ortega wrote a long review of Heinrich Hoffman's dissertation, Studies on the Concept of Sensation, which had been presented to the University of Göttingen during the same year. In the essay, which discussed the descriptive psychology of one the lesser known students of the Götttingen Circle, Ortega remarked that “the influence—each time greater—of ‘phenomenology’ on psychology tends to separate in the latter, in the most fundamental and salubrious manner, description from explanation” (Obras, 8: 43, 47; 1: 244–45). Three of the five sections of the review elaborated on certain aspects of Husserl's phenomenology, in a general sense, as the pure description of essences. In view of this general characterization, Ortega emphasized the importance of distinguishing the essential individual intuition of Husserl's “pure description” of essence in the Ideas from what he termed the mistaken definition of phenomenology as a descriptive psychology that might be interpreted by some philosophers in Husserl's Logische Untersuchungen (Obras, 1: 249, 251). Psychological statements, for Ortega, have to be distinguished from the purely descriptive statements of phenomenology on the grounds that psychology concerns itself with facts and its statements, therefore, are empirical; whereas phenomenology, as formulated in a clearer formula in Husserl'sIdeas, concerns itself with “consciousness,” human consciousness. Through this formulation, he contended, it “is very clear that the new science [phenomenology] is not psychology, if by psychology we understand, according to the use of the term, a descriptive empirical science or a metaphysical science” (Obras, 1: 253). Ortega's dissatisfaction with this psychological understanding of theIdeas anticipated, in part, statements made by Husserl in 1935.In his Crisis for European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, Husserl remarked in passing that several of the paragraphs and locutions of transcendental phenomenology may have misled several readers to understand his thesis in a psychological sense. This becomes as much the case of the mention of consciousness as what remains after all transcendence has been bracketed, as of the thesis of noesis-noema correlation. The transcendental nature of the concept of noema easily could have been misperceived in favor of a psychological understanding, particularly in view of the fact that the radical feature both of the epoché and the “constitution” thesis was not developed fully to his satisfaction. The exposition of the epoché in the Ideas, Husserl recalled in theCrisis, appeared too Cartesian, implying that one may shift suddenly from the natural to the transcendental viewpoint (Crisis, pp. 154–5). According to Ortega, Husserl presented phenomenology as a descriptive manner in which one philosophizes without presuppositions and without empirical statements. The phenomenological reduction, in the Ideas, provided the principal theme of this “new science” as it accounted for the reflexive process of “consciousness,” a consciousness that comprises consciousness of perceptions of the natural world. Thus, for Ortega, Husserl's position reduces phenomena as entities in the natural posture of our world:
There is a ‘natural manner’ of carrying out acts of consciousness, whatever they may be. That natural manner is characterized by the executive value which those acts have. Thus the ‘natural posture’ in the act of perception consists in accepting as existing in truth before us a thing that belongs to a group of things which we consider in fact to be real and which we call ‘world’….
Thus, all the acts of consciousness and all the objects of those acts can be placed in parentheses. The whole ‘natural’ world or science insofar as it is a system of judgments carried out in a ‘natural manner,’ is reduced to phenomenon. And here, a phenomenon does not mean what it does in Kant, for example, something that suggests another substantial something beyond it. Phenomenon here is simply the virtual character that every thing acquires when from its natural executive value one passes to contemplate it in a spectacular and descriptive posture, without giving it a definite character.
That pure description is phenomenology. (Obras, 1: 252–53).
This sympathetic discussion of Husserl's Ideas inspired Ortega to pursue the new science of phenomenology as a method of inquiry. The method of the inquiry became crucial especially in view of his expressed objective to make a distinction between descriptive and explanatory psychology and, thereby, to clarify the concept of the mental status of consciousness. After the paper of 1912 and a paper delivered at the Fourth Congress of the Spanish Association for the Advancement of Science in 1913 on “Sensation, Construction and Intuition,” he presented a series of lectures for the course, “Systematic Psychology,” in 1915. Ortega expanded these lectures into a manuscript entitled Psychological Investigations, which has been published posthumously. These psychological investigations constituted for him a philosophical basis upon which to define mental phenomena, very much in the manner Husserl had set out to perform in his Logical Investigations. At the turn of the twentieth century, the emergence of psychology as an independent discipline, liberated from the traditional tutelage of philosophy, led to intense investigations of human behavior which soon revealed the need for subtler methods of analysis than those provided by the physical sciences. Gradually, a new conception of the individual emerged, as different from the traditional conceptions as new mathematical physics was different from its mechanistic predecessor.
For certain authorities, knowledge attains legitimacy when it has been invested with power of tradition. The need to make an appeal to tradition represents one of the characteristics that grants authority to classical authors. In his quest for a scientific methodology, with the objective of tackling new problems, Ortega sought to establish whether philosophical legitimacy was attainable without appealing to traditional authority. The formal principles for discursive justification provide the procedural basis for distinguishing new science from the classical. For, he writes, “anyone who seriously wants to establish a new science will have to practice the self-denial required in prolonging a long time this periods of schooling, of apprenticeship, of studying the classics” (Obras, 12: 340). To be sure, he contended,
Scientific research, as a way of expanding knowledge, obliges us to overcome classicism. The very process of apprenticeship carries within itself the requirement that it come to an end and yield to independent creation. To study or to learn from a classic ultimately impels us to emulate what its author did: to surpass the previous classical stance, to transform, to extend, and to renew science itself. (Obras, 12: 340–41).
From this stance, Ortega maintained that classical or traditional science possessed an aura of privilege, distance and permanence about it, but the new science, in challenging this privilege and claims of permanence with an alternative perception of reality, disintegrated that aura and allowed the inquirer to encounter reality in terms of his or her time and place. In view of this characterization, Ortega formulated his philosophical objective within the context of the early twentieth century.
My purpose is to study the fundamental problems of psychology with the purpose of making systematic psychology possible. These problems … do not allow for vague treatment; in fact, they demand a most detailed and, if possible, exhaustive inquiry. (Obras, 12: 42).
Once the problem concerning the distinction between mental and physical phenomena have been established, Ortega maintains that other questions will also be resolved: those pertaining to the object and method of psychology and logic; the nature of inner perception and of introspection; the possibility or impossibility of a straightforward descriptive psychology of thinking; the meaning of intuition; and “consequently, whether or not nonnutritive thought is possible” (Obras, 12: 342–43).
Subsequent to the essay of 1912 and the lectures of 1915, the influence of the language of phenomenology becomes discernible in the works of Ortega through the usage of such terms as “apodictic appearance,” philosophy as “a science,” and philosophy “as a science without supposition” (Obras, 1: 318–19; 7: 335). Since 1914, Ortega remarked in his work The Idea of Principle in Leibnitz and the Evolution of Deductive Theory (1947), which was published posthumously in 1958, a “reflection on the phenomenon ‘human life’ is the basis of all my thought. At that time I formulated it—in order to expound Husserl's phenomenology during various courses—correcting, in an essential manner, the description of the phenomenon ‘consciousness of….’ which, as is known, constituted, at that time, the basis of his doctrine” (Obras, 8: 273, n.2). In 1925, he wrote a short section in his essay, The Dehumanization of Art entitled “A Few Drops of Phenomenology,” in which he discussed the “perspectivism” motif of variegated experiences (Obras, 3: 360–64). The discrepancy between science and experience, though extreme for some of his contemporaries, became one his central concerns during this period. The different perspectives of the perception of an identical event illuminated for us, he maintained, the fact that “one and the same reality may split into many diverse realities when it is beheld from different points of view.” Modern physics, while leaving mechanistic explanations of certain natural phenomena intact, shattered the overall mechanistic conception of nature. It demolished the notion of an objective reality with all that it implied: the unity of nature, both human and physical, the universality of natural laws, the determination of physical processes, and the ability of science to solve all problems of the natural world. The findings of modern physics, therefore, were bound to have had an enormous impact on general culture, even greater than that, according to Ortega, of biology in the mid-nineteenth century. Albert Einstein, he argued, struck the first telling blow against the concept of an objective reality—a concept that assumes the existence of universal time and space into which nature fits, independently of the observer. Einstein demonstrated that there is no single spatial and chronological frame of reference. Every observer is confined to a specific and relative time-space system. Ortega perceived, in this system, the “human point of view” as that reality in which we live: situations, persons, and things. To establish distance between ourselves and reality as a manner of understanding these lived experiences—which are by no means absolute—we have to project ourselves into the place of another person and situation. In doing so, we may come to distinguish between persons, things and situations, and, thereby, come to observe reality more closely (Obras, 3: 361, 363, 362).
During this very year Ortega presented Husserl's phenomenological approach to his students at the University of Madrid, wherein he projected his program to study the “restatement of the problem of Being” for a series of publications. Specifically, Ortega oriented himself to the possible adoption of a systematic method within which the problem of “Being” might have resolved this issue of human reality for him in the development of his thought. “In 1925,” he recounted,
I stated my theme—some of my students would be able to remember—saying literally: 1st, It is necessary to renew, from its roots, the traditional problem of Being; 2nd, this has to be done with the phenomenological method insofar and only insofar as this means synthetic or intuitive thinking, and not merely conceptual-abstract thinking as is the traditional logical way of thinking; 3rd, but it is necessary to integrate the phenomenological method, adapting to it a dimension of systematic thinking which, as is known, it does not posses;4th, and finally, in order that a systematic phenomenological thinking may be possible, it is necessary to start out from a phenomenon which may be a system by and in itself. This systematic phenomenon is human life and from its reflection and analysis one must set out. (Obras, 8: 273).
In this account of his quest for “synthetic thinking,” Ortega proceeded to explain how he “abandoned Phenomenology at the very moment of accepting it. Instead of withdrawing from consciousness, as has been done since Descartes, we become firm in the radical reality which is for every one his [or her life]” (Obras, 8: 273). In this manner, Ortega's ambivalence toward the adoption of the phenomenological method, by 1925, became apparent in his search for a coherent method of analysis. He was willing to retain the “synthetic” (or “intuitive”) function of phenomenological analysis provided that this function becomes, in turn integrated into the systematic phenomenon of “human life.” Through this connection, the phenomenological method of analysis, and the analysis of human life experiences, performed interchangeable functions for Ortega in the systematic apprehension of the traditional problem of being. This explains the positive side of the ambivalence which prompts him to approach and to accept phenomenology. However, on the other side of the ambivalence, he avoided phenomenology where the emphasis appears to be more abstract and in the tradition of idealism. His response to Husserl's Formal and Transcendental Logic (1929) pointed to his criticism of this tendency in phenomenology.
Several European thinkers who were influenced in one way or another by concepts of the phenomenological movement, but who were not necessarily members of the movement, became dissatisfied with the alleged solipsistic standpoint of Husserl's transcendental phenomenology in the Formal and Transcendental Logic. Ortega was one of these thinkers, although he did not express explicitly any dissatisfaction with what he perceived as the solipsistic implications of the transcendental idealism in the latter work until twelve years later. As indicated earlier, Husserl, expressed, as well, in his Crisis, dissatisfaction that his transcendental epoché may have been misread by others. Indeed, Husserl insisted that his efforts attempted to point away from the solipsistic path of the “Cartesian way.” In two lectures delivered at the Sorbonne, in 1929, Husserl introduced ideas which transformed his earlier position on transcendental phenomenology from a world of isolated ideas into a world community of intersubjective individuals. The observations and insights made in the lectures were amplified later in his Cartesian Meditations (1933) and Crisis. In these later writings, Descartes' ego lost its abstract, absolute status as it became correlative to the world of experience (Cartesian Meditations, pp. 1–8, 157; Crisis, pp. 154–55, 188, 257–63). In his Notes on Thinking (1941), Ortega found Husserl's approach to the problem of genesis of reason to be “tantamount to being absolute,” particularly where Husserl expounded his “genetic phenomenology” as “consciousness of” reality, thereby designating “consciousness of itself” as being “immediate to itself.” He criticized further the analysis and definitions of reason given by Husserl in Formal and Transcendental Logic as not incorporating “the themes of humanity, life and the functional character of reason.” Accordingly, “the phenomenological attitude as formulated in Formal and Transcendental Logic is diametrically opposed to the attitude that I call living reason.” He opposed this tendency toward transcendental idealism in Formal and Transcendental Logic but refused to reject, completely, phenomenology (Obras, 5: 545).
To be sure, Ortega's ambivalence toward phenomenology became manifest throughout this section of the article. For, after he learned of Husserl's Crisis of European Sciences, Ortega did not argue that his later general position and that of phenomenology were “diametrically opposed.” Indeed, in a long footnote at the conclusion of Notes on Thinking, Ortega invited a comparison between himself and Husserl. In 1935 Husserl presented a series of four lectures in Prague on “Philosophy in the Crisis of European Mankind,” all of which were incorporated into theCrisis. At the time of his Cartesian Meditations and Crisis of European Sciences, Husserl proclaimed that scientific knowledge can be understood only to the extent that we first understand the notion, Lebenswelt. The Crisis became famous for its thematic treatment of the concept, life-world. The study of that lived world and of our experience of it, of “ego-and-life-relatedness,” becomes the primary consideration of phenomenology. Lebenswelt philosophy is primarily engaged in the elaboration of the broader question posed in Logical Investigations: what is meant by “truth”? Truth has been defined here as lived experience of truth—that is, evidence. Evidence is revealed exclusively in present experience, and thereby truth is always and exclusively tested in present experience as one cannot relive the flux of experience. There is no absolute truth, as postulated by either dogmatism or skepticism. Rather, truth defines itself in process, as revision, correction, and self-surpassing. This dynamic process occurs at the heart of the living present. Consequently, as individuals living in the world, we respond correctly to the question of truth by describing the experience of the true and insisting on the genetic development of the “ego”: truth consists not as an object but as a movement, and exists only insofar as this movement is actually carried out by the ego. Also, in regard to the life-world, the innovative contribution of Crisis lies in Husserl's attempt to provide a thematic account of history and the historicity of the life-world, and of the constituting subjectivity within the overall framework of transcendental phenomenology. History, however, as Husserl came to understand it, consists from the outset, in “nothing other than the living moment of being-with-one-another and in-one-another of original meaning-constitution and meaning-sedimentation.”This has also been referred to as “intentional history.” Furthermore, the concepts of history, the historicity of the life-world, are made possible by the inner historicity of every human being living in it. History thereby exhibits an historical “a priori” itself which, for him, assures objectivity of history. The historical a priori itself presupposes a certain idealization, in that the “insights of principle” are historical. History becomes mastered not by an a-historical apriorism, but by a transcendental stance which demonstrates that the process of constitution developed in history may be, in its essential structure, deciphered in reflective thinking by the reflecting ego, like the constitution of modern science. Thus, the truths of science are founded neither in Divine Providence, as Descartes thought, nor on the a priori conditions of possibility, as Kant thought. Rather, they are grounded in lived experiences on which the truth of the theoretical consciousness is based (Crisis, pp. 349–51, 369–78, 389–95).
Ortega found this kind of reflection on the historical manner of being, and the life-world, compatible with his own notion of “historical reason” presented in History as a System. Upon insisting that he arrived at this position independently of Husserl, Ortega made clear his favorable response to the innovative contribution made by Husserl in the Crisis. “Personally,” Ortega commented concerning his reaction to the 1935 publication, “this leap of the phenomenological doctrine has been extremely satisfactory for me because it consists in nothing less than a resort to ‘historical reason’” (Obras, 5: 546-7, n.1). Therefore, Husserl's later works, particularly Cartesian Meditations and the Crisis, which were attempts to resolve the difficulties inherent in transcendental phenomenology and which were representative as explicit statements of his phenomenological philosophy, were not diametrically opposed to the themes of human life. Nor did they neglect the importance of postulating the epistemological and the ontological function of the experience of human life. The orientation of these later writings, has contributed to the theory that Husserl perceived the Crisis as the “definitive” introduction to phenomenology.
Clearly, Husserl's idea of Lebenswelt was the kind of notion that Ortega discussed in his own philosophy of human life. But this affinity in thought does not negate minor differences between the two thinkers. Husserl's discussion in the Cartesian Meditations of the problem of other people, or intersubjectivity, and of the world as a world essentially inhabited by “others” was conceivably the part of his philosophy which had the profoundest effect on the development of Existential Phenomenology and the thought of Ortega. Ortega took issue with a small point on the role of the notion “analogical transposition” concerning the “Other,” which was made in the fifth meditation, yet this point was not considered by Ortega to be diametrically opposed to his notion of human life. “Husserl,” he remarked at one point in his Man and People (1939-40), “was the first who clearly defined the radical and not merely psychological problem that I call ‘The Appearance of the Other.’ Husserl's development of the problem is, in my opinion, much less successful than his definition of it, although there are many admirable discoveries in his development” (Obras, 7: 160–61).
Man and People constitute essays which Ortega developed and presented in several lectures and courses over a period of approximately twenty years. In The Origin of Philosophy, in a footnote, Ortega referred to the occasion in which he presented for the first time his concept of a “new sociology” under the title, “Man and People” in Valladolid in 1934 (Obras, IX, 355, n.1). The first chapter was published as "Being in and Beside One's Self,"by Espasa-Calpe Argentina, Buenos Aires, 1939 (Obras, V, 291-315; VII, 72-73,79). In a Prologue to his Ideas and Beliefs, in 1940, Ortega announced the forthcoming appearance of two major works: a philosophical exposition, Dawn of Historical Reason, and the corpus of his social doctrine, Man and People. These variegated expositions were complied and published posthumously, 1948-50. In 1929, Ortega wrote an essay titled “The Perception of One's Fellowman” (Obras, VI, 153-163) that may explain his attempt, in Man and People, to distinguish his concept of “the other” from Husserl's notion of the “appearance of the other” in view of the inevitable comparisons made between the two and Heidegger.
This kind of discussion of the differences of opinion on the development of a particular philosophical problem does not suggest that there was not some sharing of viewpoints or that Ortega was not influenced, intellectually, by Husserl. For although Ortega disagreed with Husserl's notion of “analogical transposition,” he did view the latter's phenomenological approach to knowledge as having been “the greatest influence of this last half-century.” The notion of the appearance of the other—that is, the other's presence both as an object (i.e., the physical structure of its body) and as a subject (i.e., as an alter ego that experiences the same world that is experienced by the “I”)—and life experience also were viewed by Ortega as the procedure of analysis to avert solipsism and the enclosure of the “I” within itself. Through this connection, Ortega aligns himself with Husserl's repudiation of the Cartesian distinction between the interior (in the mind) and the exterior (in the world) (Obras, 5: 545). Although Ortega's own independence of thought remains controversial, his intellectual development exhibits a consistent emphasis on discerning the seams drawn between extra-historical and historical coherence in transcendental phenomenology. Ortega discussed, in his later writings, such phenomenological notions as actions which are directed toward objects when the “I” encounters its environment; ego/alter ego interaction in the world of intersubjective communities as the realm of lived experiences; and the position of entering the transcendental attitude of phenomenological reduction in order to apprehend the alter ego, all of which are notions similar to those discussed by Husserl. In these authoritative writings, his criterion of “openness to experience” led him to an acceptance of historical variegation, and to the principle that a human being's relation to the world consists in a total relation of one entity among other entities.
From the viewpoint of this characterization of phenomenology, Ortega reached back to “I am I and my circumstances,” as his starting point of analysis. For Ortega the individual ego's consciousness of self is through the awareness of both its physiological features and behavioral gestures and those of “others” in reciprocal human interaction, a consciousness of self that proceeds through self-analysis of the inner essence of the being of the “I” and the “I's” awareness of other selves as similar beings in the “circumstances” of the world of lived experience. In short, he attempted to characterize the nature of an individual's experience of his world and himself. There is an attempt to distinguish between the facts that one's relationship to an organism is different from one's relation to a person qua being, and that one's actions toward an organism are different from the way that one acts toward a person. “Living,” he said, “is to reach outside of oneself, devoted ontologically, to what is other, be it called world or circumstances” (Obras, 5: 545).
In an edition of his works (1932), Ortega proclaimed: “I am I and my circumstances.” This expression, which appears in my first book and which condenses in final volume my philosophic thought, does not only mean the doctrine that my work expounds and proposes, but means that my work is an executive case of the same doctrine. My work is, by its essence and its presence, circumstantial. This is precisely what the cited phrase declares” (Obras, 6: 347). The first book to which Ortega referred was his Meditations on Quixote (1914), a work of essays which he viewed as propelling philosophical aspirations. According to some commentators, the nucleus of Ortega's basic philosophical principle—the notion that human life is the ultimate reality—is formulated in theMeditations through the instrumentality of his well known expression, “I am I and my circumstances.” A close and critical reading of the Meditations and Ortega's later writings reveals that albeit “I am I and my circumstances” appeared in this early work, we fail to perceive a systematic elaboration of “I am I and my circumstances” as an analytical and ontological statement in his general philosophic point of view before his later works. The psychological interpretation of external and internal excitation, as discussed by Freud in the Outline of Psychoanalysis and The Psychopathology of Everyday Life (1904),arrested Ortega's attention on this new scientific method between 1911 and 1915. Husserl and the phenomenological movement, and Freud and the psychoanalytical movement, presented for Ortega the new “intellectual tendency of our times—subjectivism, or subjectivistic relativism” (Obras, 12: 417). This intellectual tendency became his philosophic concern during the succeeding years. This concern became apparent in his lectures of 1921–22, subsequently published as The Theme of Our Time (1923). The “principal theme of our time,” the essence of which “modernity” had to confront, for him comprised the concept that “human life is in an eminent degree psychological life” (Obras, 3: 152–156).
The phenomenon of human life thus possesses a “double character”: the physiological and the psychological. In the modern movement of culture each dimension of human character has to find its expression within the “spirit of the time.” (Obras, 3: 165–66, 68, 297–98). The transformation of the modern sense of human life may be understood best from the new art of his time. Ortega perceived the artists of his day as creating a much more radical alteration in the subjective attitude of art. From the point of view of the new sense of art, human reality possesses its inner perception. This shift of emphasis in the realm of aesthetics countervailed the earlier emphasis on “naturalist,” “materialist,” or “realist” factors in human life. The transition in aesthetic sensibility from nineteenth-century “realism,” and its corresponding concern with human reality, to the “new” perceptions of the early twentieth century creativity marked for him the “dehumanization of art.” The “modern” movement culminated in a new aesthetic sensitivity—what Ortega labeled a “pure,” “an artistic art”—which consciously separated its audience into groups: the “specially gifted minority” who comprehended modern art and the majority of those who found it incomprehensible. The new aesthetic sensibility of modernity, which called for the “progressive elimination of the human, all too human elements” predominant in romantic and naturalistic production, resulted in creating an art of figures instead of an art of adventures, an art that refused solely to report the world, but that vowed to create it (Obras, 3: 358, 355–56). This modern group of artists and critics who produced art and who possessed “an organ of comprehension” denied to the majority constituted “a specially gifted minority.” A pronounced emphasis on the “psychic structure of the individual,” thus, became one of the primary consequences of modernity's shift from realism and human representation.
If Ortega's notion that the “psychic” depictions of modern art were only accessible to a gifted minority were extended to incorporate the notion that every individual intellectual activity apprehends reality from a point of view accessible only to itself, his philosophy of “perspectivism” as the synthetic principle which “regulated the world from the point of view of life” becomes intelligible. The “theme of our time” reflected the absolutist tendencies of rationalism and the skeptical inclinations of relativism and, therefore, he proposed his doctrine of “the point of view as a third view of the process of knowledge, which is a perfect synthesis of the two” (Obras, 3: 179, 198).
This doctrine expounds the proposition that all historical epochs participate in contributing an element of truth to reality. That is, each individual and each collection of individuals apprehends reality from the point of view of their respective perceptions of reality. The varying perceptions of reality are legitimate and account for the postulate that different individuals interpret the same “horizon” differently so that “every life is a point of view directed upon the universe” (Obras, 3: 200). Ortega's “perspectivist” postulate thus promised to perform the function of unifying reality. From the assumption that “perspective” comprises both “one of the component parts of reality and its organizing element,” Ortega arrived at the position that “all knowledge is knowledge from a definite point of view” (Obras, 3: 199). Hence every truth connects to a place in space an in time. In locating truth in space and in time, he derived both the mode of perception and the essence of reality.
Ortega perceived in his perspectivist mode of apprehending reality a philosophical analogue to Einstein's physics and, subsequently, invited a comparison of his philosophy of perspectivism to Einstein's Special Theory of Relativity. Ortega's essay on “The Historical Significance of Einstein's Theory” pointed to parallel tendencies in new modes of twentieth century thinking and in Einstein's theory of relativity, which he characterized as “the most important intellectual fact that the present can show.” (Obras, 3: 231).In dissolving the entire edifice of classical mechanics, Einstein's theory ushered in the twentieth century (the “present time”) very much in the manner that Descartes' philosophy prepared thought for the modern era (Obras, 3: 231–34). Ortega's ideas on the historical significance of relativity were derived primarily from Einstein's discussion of the Special Theory. He was drawn to comparing the theory of relativity to his philosophy of “perspectivism” because relativity appeared to furnish scientific “proof” of his own “perspectivist truths,” which were formulated in El Espectador in 1916 (Obras, 3: 235; see also 2: 15–21).
Ortega's perspectivist doctrine, as a synthetic principle, also implied for him a doctrine by which one may “attempt to order the world from the point of view of life” (Obras, 3: 179). The principle of human life, which constituted the reality of human experience, became the philosophical category through which Ortega synthesized the universe. Correspondingly, the “sign of the times” also pointed to the important role played by Nietzsche, Croce, Dilthey, and Heidegger, in addition to Freud and Husserl, in the formation of twentieth-century thought. The emphasis placed upon the vital world of life took Ortega a step beyond the Neo-Kantian transcendental logic of Cohen. Ortega combined his idea of human life with an emphasis on history as constituting the vital dynamics of its expression, and this viewpoint carried him closer to the humanistic side of the Naturwissenschaften-Geisteswissenschaften distinction made by the Southwest German or Baden School and Wilhelm Dilthey than to Cohen's Neo-Kantianism.
The striking similarities in the historicist focus of Windelband, Rickert, and Dilthey, the early historical thought of Croce, and the historical thought of Ortega suggest that the latter was both directly and indirectly influenced by their ideas. Where the historical ideas of Windelband and Rickert reflected those European intellectual currents which were paralleled to Ortega's intellectual development, and where Dilthey had been acknowledged by Ortega as having influenced directly his intellectual focus, Croce's early historical ideas also appeared to have exerted and influence on the historical thought of Ortega.
In his essay, “Wilhelm Dilthey and the Idea of Life,” twenty –seven years after his studies in Berlin, Ortega wrote of Dilthey's importance in his intellectual development and of his misfortune of not having been exposed earlier, as a student, to the ideas of Dilthey: “I became acquainted with Dilthey's work as late as 1929, and it took me four more years before I knew it sufficiently well. This ignorance, I do not hesitate to maintain, has caused me to lose about ten years of my life—ten years, in the first place of intellectual development, but that of course, means an equal loss in all other dimensions of life…. When I studied in Berlin in 1906…Dilthey happened to have given up lecturing in the university building a few years before and admitted to courses he held in home only a few specially prepared students. Thus chance had it that I did not come in touch with him” (Obras, 6: 171–72). By the late 1920s and the early 1930s, however, Ortega did incorporate the idea of human life into his philosophic viewpoint. During these years, he labeled his own philosophy as “the metaphysics of vital reason,” to signify his continuous search for a structure of life that would be transcendent in its relation to every existing reality, and yet itself would be located within the framework of temporal and spatial reality. Like Dilthey, whom he considered as “the most important thinker of the second half of the nineteenth century,” he denied truth to any constant principle that establish itself as superior to the flux of life, including that of the physical and biological sciences. Dilthey's Lebensphilosophie, which emphasizes openness to experience, not only denies the notion of an abstract transcendental reality, but also considers life to be more than mere biological organism. His concept of life is not biological. In this sense, Ortega's notion of human life is quite similar. For Ortega, “my life”—in the “biographical” not in the “biological” sense—is the question of what to do with it and that of what happens to me as I find myself “shipwrecked” in the precarious sea of “circumstances.” The individual, from this point of view, saves himself by sinking into the inner depths of his being as he or she makes an effort to hold on to consciousness and to the very essence of his life. “To live,” he maintained, “is to deal with the world, aim at it, act in it, be occupied with” (Obras, 5: 26, 33–34, 35, 44–45, 7: 103–04). For Dilthey, life is realized empirically within the experiential process of consciousness, as lived experience, which gives the experience of the individual life and reality. Dilthey's position, like Bergson's, contains the vitalist viewpoint that our experience of the life of our own minds is a direct experience of that life, as it exists, and therefore cannot be perceived as some mechanistic physiological explanation of human organism or as some subjective neo-idealistic logical principle. The emphasis on the active, dynamic, and historical dimension of human and social phenomena, as realized within the lived experiences of life, reveals the vitalization of philosophy and the historicization of life perspective that is reflective of historicism and the attitude that historical knowledge is unique to the realm of human affairs.
This historicism comprises the perspective perceived in Ortega's notion of the “dynamic dialogue” in the “drama” of the life-world of the individual. Historicism is not used here in the polemical extreme characterized by Karl Popper's charge that historicism was incompatible with any form, of “genuine science.” In his The Poverty of Historicism, which describes and criticizes both “anti-naturalist” and “pro-naturalist” doctrines of historicism, charging the former doctrine with “theology” and “holism”; the latter doctrine with advancing the notion that “historical prediction” is their principal objective, and with maintaining the position that this objective becomes “attainable in discovering the ‘rhythms’ or the ‘patterns,’ the ‘laws’ or ‘trends’ that underlie the evolution of history” (Poverty of Historicism, pp. 2–4, 39, 128–30). Popper's title alludes to Marx's The Poverty of Philosophy, which in turn, responded to Proudhon's The Philosophy of Poverty and, thereby, signals his intention to formulate a philosophico-methodological criticism of Marxist and, by extension, Hegelian philosophy of history. Rather, the term “historicism”signifies here both “historism” (in the German sense of Historismus in connection with Windelband, Rickert, Dilthey, Meinecke—by way of Herder and Goethe—Mannheim, and Troeltsch), and “historicism” (in the Italian sense of Storicismo as formulated by Benedetto Croce). In tracing the term to both Herder and Goethe, Meinecke perceived their emphasis on the “concrete,” the “unique” and the “individual” as constituting the core of historism. Through this emphasis, historicism, understood as an outlook on the world (Weltanschauung), emphasizes the historical quality of human existence; as an interpretation of history and life, it concerns itself with concepts of individuality and with individual development. Historicism seeks to describe and to interpret the unsystematic variety of the reality of society and history, for the concept of individuality not only embraces individual persons but also includes the variety of historical forms, such as different peoples, customs, cultures, institutions, nation-states, and the like; and the concept of development includes the historical process—at a particular time and place—within which individuality manifest itself not by any abstract, general laws or principles but by the living expressions of the multiplicity of these unique historical forms. Individuality, the “fact of change,” and the historical process, the Weltanschauung of historicism, combine to formulate a sort of historical relativism. This signification of historical phenomena entails the sense in which historical knowledge and reality are explained by Dilthey: “The historical consciousness of the finitude of every historical phenomenon, every human or social state, of the relativity of every sort of belief, is the last step toward the liberation of man. With it, man attains the sovereign power to wring from every experience its content, to surrender wholly to it without prepossession….Every beauty, every sanctity, every sacrifice, re-lived and expounded, opens up perspectives which disclose a reality….And, in contrast with the relativity, the continuity of the creative force makes itself feel as the central historical fact.” (Hodges,Dilthey, pp.31–32)
The historicist orientation of Croce contributed to the shift from the historicization of life to the historicization of philosophy. Ortega aspirations concerning the interpenetration of history and philosophy was conveyed in his 1929 lectures: “I hope, for very concrete reasons, that in our age the curiosity for the eternal and invariable which is philosophy and the curiosity for the inconstant and changeable which is history, for the first time join each other and embrace” (Obras, 7: 285). Ortega's view that “historical thinking proceeds with respect to human phenomena,” which combined with his notion of the vital dimensions of “historical reason,” reveals some of the affinities in their historical thought. Croce and Ortega both viewed human life as embodying an essentially historical process within which the realm of human reality is perceived and understood. Historical knowledge is found in the flow of the historical process and knowledge of this very process provides an essential understanding of human reality. Where history, for Croce, consists in the “inseparable synthesis of individual and universal,” history, for Ortega, embodies the ‘inexorable chain” of human experiences and is constituted by the synthetic function of “historical reason.” Traversing from philosophy to history and then back again to philosophy, Croce presented his systematic “Philosophy of the Spirit” as absolute historicism. He formulated his systematic treatment of the “Philosophy of the Spirit” in four volumes and devoted one volume of this general position to historical thought. (Croce, History, pp. 60–61). History, in this connection, provides the important function of synthesizing the theoretical and the practical levels of human activity, of synthesizing the universal and the particular, thought and action. From the point of view of these levels of human activity historical knowledge provides information about what actually happened on particular occasions, at a particular place and under a clearly specified period of time. History encompasses not only concrete individual developments and concepts of individuality, but also encompasses the “universal.” For Croce, individuality constitutes the historical process within which an advance towards the universal occurs and, in this context, the general is identified with what the individual experiences directly. The historical process becomes the expression of the “inseparable synthesis of individual and universal” and, as such, establishes for Croce the “identity of philosophy with history.” Any philosophical problem, when restored to the historical context that gave rise to the question we attempt to answer, he viewed as identical with historical synthetic judgments. As the synthesis of the individual and the universal, history possesses the most complete form of knowledge. Indeed, for Croce, as well as for Collingwood, “history is thought.” From the theoretical perspective, thought establishes connections between sensory-perception, intuition, and concepts, whereas history synthesizes the aesthetic, logical, and practical levels of human activity. Theoretic activity consists of knowledge while practical activity is characterized by volition, and thereby within this perspective knowledge is the precondition of action. (Croce, History, pp. 60–61; 94–107; Practical, p.33).
Throughout this period Ortega formulated, in a systematic fashion, his general philosophic standpoint—positing human life as the ultimate reality—which contains philosophy within history, in his book En Torno a Galileo (1933), by way of his theory of generations, and in his essay History as a System (1935).The “concept of being” or “human life,” for Ortega, “is the very root of philosophy,” and, therefore “any reform of the idea of being means a radical reform in philosophy.” At this point, he abandoned the “biological organism” content of his earlier notion of life in The Theme of Our Time to incorporate a concept of life—“the life of each one of us”—as a being-that-lives-in-the-world. “Biologists,” he averred, “use the word ‘life’ in order to designate the phenomena of organic beings…but…when we give this word a meaning which is more immediate, broader and more decisive.” In this broader connection, Ortega's concept of human life comprised a dimension which was similar to the Fundamentalontologie of Heidegger's Daseinanalyse. Ortega's analysis of human existence and human life characterized “I am I and my circumstances” as the interchangeable interaction of the “I” and “the world.” That is, “I am always with myself…the world is always linked with me and my being is a being with the world” (Obras, 7: 394, 405, 402). Ortega wanted to liberate the “I” from the “internal prison” of “subjectivism” and proposed that we “save ourselves in the world,” in “that vital horizon.” This sense of being as having been “thrown into” the “world” further characterizes the authentic reality of life as “finding oneself face to face with the world” and “inside the world”(Obras, 7: 411, 416–17, 430; compare Heidegger, Being, pp.236, 399). To “escape from idealism,” then, “life includes both the subject [the conscious self] and the world.” Living is “finding oneself in the world.” Hence: “Life always finds itself in certain circumstances, in an arrangement surrounding it—circum—filled with things and other people. One does not live in a world which is vague, except that the vital world is circumstance [the things and the people around one]; it is this world, here and now” (Obras, 7: 422, 431).
Ortega viewed Dilthey as being one of the “first discoverers” of “the new great Idea of life,” who has “taught us more radically than any of his predecessors—Hegel, Comte—to see historicity as a constitutive feature of the human being” (Obras, 6: 166; 9: 396). After the posthumous publication of Dilthey's Gesammelte Schriften, in 1928, and Ortega's subsequent “acquaintance” with Dilthey's philosophical work, we begin to observe the eventual unfolding of a general systematic statement of human life in Ortega's philosophy and historical thought. The years surrounding Ortega's absorption of Dilthey's writings suggest that he derived from him a sense of historicity, which previously he had never possessed. He assigned, as did Dilthey, history the task of supplying human life's only “fixed, pre-established, and given line,” of converting itself into the “historical reason” which secures the one kind of continuous, empirical progress of which the individual is capable. We also observe that, in addition to the influences of historicism and phenomenology, Ortega also integrated existential philosophy into his general philosophical orientation. During this period, the late 1920s and 1930s, of his intellectual development, Ortega incorporated the idea of human life into his fundamental philosophic outlook, and the discernible transition from “vital reason” to “historical reason” occurred in his thought. That is, once human life was established as the basis of his philosophical standpoint, “vital reason” and “historical reason” became interchangeable terms for Ortega (Obras, 5: 538, 6: 39–41). Though he spoke of a parallelism between the ideas of Dilthey and his own, during the period 1914 and 1929, and although his insistence on the fact that he discussed the notion of “vial reason” prior to the early 1930s remains accurate, there was no such discussion of “historical reason” in the manner in which one has become familiar with its usage in his mature writings of the 1930s. After the publication of his lectures, What Is Philosophy? (1929) and his essay on Dilthey, in these very writings, “life” and “reason” and “vital reason”—or “living reason”—and “historical reason” were central concepts in the fusion of his systematic analysis of man, society and history. Through the influence of the basic idea of Dilthey's Lebensphilosophie, Ortega was able to link his ontological point of view with his existentialist and historicist viewpoints. A perspective within which a connection of common emphasis placed upon the actions and the creations of the individual, the facticity and the uniqueness of individual human existence, becomes perceptible through this sort of connection; “the significance of life,” as Dilthey maintained, “lies in its shaping and its development.”(Dilthey, Patterns, p. 88). Existential philosophy, in a variety of way had been an outgrowth of Lebensphilosophie and phenomenology, and Ortega, with the complement of the historicist viewpoint of the “unique individual” and of “human life” as the ultimate reality, appears to have pursued the path which had been directed by Heidegger. (Misch, Lebensphilosophie, pp.5–197, 216–37).
In the works of the 1930s, Ortega posited “human life” as ultimate reality and, from this standpoint, connected the philosophic point of view of an historicist with that of existential phenomenology. The existentialist perspective of Ortega closely resembles the Fundamentalontologie or existentiale Analytik in Heidegger's Sein und Zeit. (Heidegger, Being, 21–83, Spiegelberg, “Husserl's Phenomenology,” 62–74; Spiegelberg, Phenomenological Move.1: 408-13). Through the epistemological standpoint of “I am I and my circumstances” the individual, in realizing the “vital possibilities” of the essence of his being, engages actively in the human world. The process of the realization of man's “vital possibilities”—through the “circumstances” of his being—as a being-in-the-making and as a being-that-goes-on-being-in-the-world, Ortega characterized as a “drama” which “happens.” Ortega's notion of “life as a happening” and the insecurity of human life in the face of death, his analysis of the ontological distinction between human life and things, between “being” and “authentic being,” are strikingly similar to ideas which had been formulated by Heidegger in 1927. In What Is Philosophy? he aligned his philosophical position with that of Heidegger and the “new philosophy” of being, existence, and human life:
These common words, finding oneself, world, occupying oneself, are now technical words in this new philosophy. One would be able to talk for a long time on each one of them, but I will limit myself to observe that this definition, ‘to live is to find oneself in a world,’ like all the principal ideas in these lectures, is already in my published work. It is important to me to observe this, especially, with regard to the idea of existence, for which I claim chronological priority. For that very reason I am pleased to acknowledge that the person who has gone deepest into the analysis of life is the new German philosopher, Martin Heidegger.
…To live is to find oneself in the world. Heidegger, in a very recent work of genius, has made us take notice of all the enormous significance of these words. (Obras, 6: 40; 7: 415–16).
Ortega was quite sensitive to implications drawn on the affinities between his work and Heidegger's, which, in part, explains his efforts to trace the originality of his formulations to his Meditations. Apart from a general discussion in his Idea of Principle in Leibnitz and the Evolution of Deductive Theory and an essay, “Martin Heidegger and Language of the Philosophers,” Ortega referred to Heidegger only in passing in a long footnote in his essay, “Goethe from Within” (published in 1932) (Obras, 8: 271–84, 296–300; Universitas 7, n.9 (1952): 897–903; Obras, 4: 403,541; 9: 625–44). Whatever the context in which this controversy over Ortega's intellectual indebtedness to Heidegger may have been initiated, it was during this decisive period of the 1930s when he turned to the systematic formulation of the philosophy of Lebensphilosophie, and it was also in this period that Ortega's explicit postulation of the notion “I am I and my circumstances,” as radical reality, reflected the influence of existential and phenomenological points of view in his philosophy of existence, man and society.
Where Ortega's general ontological position does bear some similarities to Heidegger's existentiale Analytik, and his idea of human life some affinities with Dilthey's Lebensphilosophie, there are also some differences between these philosophies and Ortega's fundamental philosophical position. The important difference to point out pertains to the observation that Ortega proceeded beyond the distinctive positions of Daseinanalyse and Lebensanalyse by incorporating the two concepts. For Ortega, that is, analysis of being and the analysis of human life constituted, at once, the systematic analysis of the existence of man in his “lived-relations” and his “being-in-the-world.” Furthermore, Ortega makes explicit the connection between the concept of historical time and the concept of everyday reality, in that temporality constitutes the basic relation between human beings and their activities in the world.
History narrates the actions of individuals in society. In the world of physical objects, things change, in the social world of individuals, events happen. References to historical reality, or to historical time, therefore, are defined in terms of human motives, actions, and reactions and therefore as unique events. What, then, are historical facts? To Ortega, “all knowledge of facts” as “isolated” data, “is, to be precise, incomprehensible and can be justified only when used in the service of theory.” Our capacity to comprehend the connectedness in the external world is served best “in the synthesis of facts,” for “the unity of facts” is “found not in themselves” but is found “in the mind of an individual” (Obras, 1: 316–17). Historical reasoning thus, for Ortega, has a specific form of narration. “In short, the reasoning, the reason, which sheds light here, consists in a narrative reason. In order to comprehend anything human, be it personal, or collective, it is necessary to tell its history….Life only returns a small degree of transparency in the presence of historical reason” (Obras, 6: 40).
These statements were based on the recognition that historical time differs from time in nature. Clearly, any natural phenomenon occurs in time. Nevertheless, references to historical reality or to a historical time often have been defined in terms of human motives, actions and reactions. For this reason historical events have often been characterized as unique events, in contrast to the laws of nature where similar elements meet under similar circumstances. The history of the individual therefore means more than mere change in time. Historical time becomes meaningful through human actions. In connecting historical reasoning to human actions, critical philosophy of history sought to disclose the mind's activity as a tangible process. As with Dilthey, Croce and later, Collingwood, Ortega in his philosophical orientation was affiliated with the tradition which, by way of contrast with classical British empiricism, portrayed the human mind in active terms; in other words, the Neo-Kantian tradition treated mental activity as creative and self-determining, displaying a constructive role in human experience rather than passively responding in mechanical fashion, to the promptings of external stimuli. Kant had already established that all knowledge is a function of the human mind. The mind, by means of its own a priori forms, structures the entire domain of knowledge. This formal extension of the domain of mental activity appealed to Ortega. The particular importance, which Ortega ascribed to history, and his contention that its character had been radically misinterpreted by empiricist philosophers, reflected the presupposition underlying his portrayal of the individual as an autonomous historical agent. He viewed the empirical, or positivistic, objective of formulating a theory of human nature in accordance with principles drawn from the physical sciences as providing faulty findings. In adopting this position one assumes that human behavior becomes subject to invariant, universal regularities, and that in this area of analysis explanations necessarily consist in subsuming what occurs beneath “a general law of nature.” Against such a view Ortega argued that human nature involves a continual process of reflective self-transformation, which reveals individuals to be continually modifying and reformulating their experiences. In this connection, the notion of a fixed human character, conforming to immutable principles which are valid for all individuals during all historical periods, was unacceptable to him.
To explain reality, Ortega continued, the natural sciences, in their concern with the existence of objects in natural phenomena, aim at discovering the general concepts or the natural laws under which these objects may be subsumes. In order to understand the relationship between human life and reality, therefore, the individual must escape from, what he labels, “the terrorism of the laboratory.” Through his various readings of Kant, Ortega learned that the autonomous mind must liberate the self from the enslavement of our empirical existence by nature. To avert compounding the ontological distinctions he thought should be made between a philosophy of physical nature and a philosophy of human nature, Ortega maintained that “man has no nature.” The individual must liberate himself or herself from the shackles of the natural scientists for the latter are too involved with general, abstract, concepts of nature, and “man has no nature.” In this sense, according to Ortega, the generalized interpretations of the natural scientists exclude the most essential element of human reality: the life of the individual. In denaturalizing “man,” a question still remains for us and that is: if the individual has no nature, what does he or she have? “Man has history” Ortega replies. “Man lives,” he continues, and, as a “living being,” the individual relates to other “living beings” so that vital, operative factors are set in motion—the “living experience of man.” Having demonstrated Ortega's departure from the universal perspective of reality, taken by physics and mathematics, we find that his dictum, “man, in word, has no nature; what he has is …history,” completes the alienation of the individual from nature and nature from the individual. This abrupt separation of the individual and nature, in addition to his rejection of rational concepts as producing any valid knowledge of reality, reaffirms Ortega's denial of universal, fundamental principles of reality and, thus aligns him on the humanistic side of the natural sciences—human sciences dichotomy. What is real and what has history comprises what has been disclosed by human beings. History, therefore, “sensu stricto” constitutes “human history.” For history “is the reality of man. He has no other. Through history he has made himself such as he is.” To Ortega human life is “not a thing” but “a drama”; human life “is a gerund, not a participle: a faciendum, not a factum.” Finally, as expressed differently by Collingwood: “what nature is to things, history, as res gestae, is to man….Man finds that he has no nature other than what he has done himself.” For Collingwood, history is the study of “res gestae: actions of human beings done in the past”; and, because it studies human activity, it is the study of purposive activity (Obras, 6: 32–33, 41; Collingwood, Idea of Hist., p. 9; “The Philosophy of Hist.,” p. 15).
The individual, thus, lives in an actively and disclosing way. The disclosure concerns first and foremost the individual himself or herself. The individual basically understands his or her own being, an understanding of which, according Ortega, does not belong to the common life of man in general; rather, it belongs to each unique individual (Obras, 6: 25). For it is only within his or her own factual existence that the individual can fathom: “I am I and my circumstances.” The individuation of the individual's being is that which identifies what he or she may become. If the “circumstances” of the individual connote, for Ortega, any situation toward which an act may be directed by the “I,” then it serves, for the most part, more as a condition than as a denial of the individual's freedom of action. That is to say, once it is established that freedom entails choice, a choice must be made with respect to the variety of possibilities which arise out of the “circumstances” of the individual. To create his destiny so that he may become “the novelist of himself,” Ortega asserted, the individual “must choose among these possibilities.” “Therefore,” he argued, “I am free. But understand it well, I am free by coercion, whether I want to be or not.” The conditions of freedom evolve within given alternatives and freedom of action, and thereby results in the ability to choose and to act under whatever confronting circumstances that may arise. Thus, for Ortega, how an individual constitutes himself or herself becomes determined very much by the way in which he or she allows for the possession of either being. The individual has not chosen freely his or her “circumstances”; nevertheless, each can take over freely the responsibility of his or her being and allow it to disclose itself as uniquely his or hers. “Man's destiny, then,” he posited, “is primarily action. We do not live to think, on the contrary: we think in order that we may succeed in surviving.” (Obras, 6: 34; 5: 304). For once given his life, man's being or essence becomes an ever-changing reality. As man's essence becomes characterized in conjunction with the conditions of his “circumstances,” for Ortega, individual man is placed into and is delivered over to the being which is his and which he has to be. In this manner, the burden of action and of making decisions is placed upon the individual as the very essence of one's being consists in an ever-changing reality, in the making, and one's ability to be this or that being is contingent upon his or her actions and thus conveys how the individual, for Ortega, is fundamentally different from animals and stones:
This life that is given to us is given to us empty, and man has to go on filling it for himself, occupying it. Such is our occupation. This is not the case with the stone, the plant, and the animal. Their being is given already to them predetermined and resolute…But man is given the necessity of having to be doing something always, upon pain of succumbing, yet what he has to do is not present to him from the outset and once and for all. Because the most strange and most confounding thing about this circumstance or world in which we have to live consists in the fact that it always presents to us, within its inexorable circle or horizon, a variety of possibilities for our action, a variety in the face of which we are obliged to choose and, therefore, to exercise our freedom. The circumstance—I repeat—the here and now within which we are inexorably inscribed and imprisoned, does not at each moment impose on us a single act or activity but various possible acts or activities and cruelly leaves us to our own initiative and inspiration, hence to our own responsibility (Obras, 7: 102–03).
Existentialist philosophers are noted for their emphasis on freedom of action and the necessity for the individual to choose what he or she will be; it becomes apparent, from the above statement, that Ortega has absorbed this intellectual tradition into his own philosophy. Clearly, other philosophers have been concerned with the nature of human freedom preceding the philosophical activity in Europe from the late 1920s to the 1950s. However, the central interest which unites Ortega and Existential philosophy concerns not only the issue of human freedom, but also an emphasis on the experience and practice of it. This being the case, the essence of man's being takes on a dual characteristic in Ortega's philosophy of human life, the differentiation between the internal trait of the individual—the “I”—and its external manifestation within the environment of physical entities. He views the “I” both as constituting and as being constituted by the tangible reality of the world. Life as the confrontation of the “I” with its environment—environments in which various possibilities exist—places man outside himself. As we observed, “possibility” connotes, for Ortega, that which possesses potential actuality (from the viewpoint of the individual's “circumstances”). From this point of view of the circumstantialities of life, taking into account the fact that the “I,” as the prime human reality, is not sufficient unto itself, the realization of this factor of life spurs the individual into action and thereby confronts him or her with external reality (Obras, 5: 72–73). Thus, continual confrontation with his “circumstances” demonstrates the essential factor that prevents the individual from being isolated, locked in his or her ego. The individual must act in life and, under such conditions, the living experience becomes a task and the individual becomes what the potential possibilities of his or her finite being exhibit him or her to be.
The essential finitude of the individual is experienced at the very heart of life itself. “Life is anguish,” he remarked, “and enthusiasm and delight and bitterness and innumerable things.” At a certain point during his or her experience, the individual, for Ortega, may plunge into the mood of anxiety—as if he or she were “between the sword and the wall”—when death becomes imminent. “Death,” he continued, “is certain, there is no escaping it! Could there be less choice?” (Obras, 8: 297; 7: 104). Ortega perceived the reality and the fact of death as essential in revealing the very essence and contingency of the individual's being, which resembles similar views expressed by Heidegger. For, in the face of “possible death,” to experience life as being also implies an awareness of the possibility of life as not being. The acceptance of death, therefore, as a possible here-and –now discloses the radical—basic—finitude of human life.
The perceptible factual occurrence of death also characterizes human life as an occurrence of time as well as reality. As the individual becomes aware of the reality of death, through experience, his or her finiteness discloses itself essentially in time:
Our vital knowledge of other men and of ourselves is open knowledge that is never stable….Our vital knowledge is open, floating because the theme for this knowledge, life, Man, is already in itself a being ever open to new possibilities.
Our past undoubtedly weighs on us; it inclined us to be more this than that in the future, but it does not chain us nor drag us….Life is change; it is at every new moment becoming something distinct from what it was, therefore, it never becomes definitely itself. Only death, by preventing any new change, changes man into the definitive and immutable himself…from the moment we begin to be, death may intervene into the very substance of our life, collaborate in it, compress it and densify it, may make it urgency imminence and the need of doing our best at every instant. (Obras, 7: 186–87)
This characterization of human life, then, posits the notion that time is in man, for the events in men's lives are related by their position in time. “I am I and my circumstances,” as the starting point of the human condition, also expresses the fact that the living experience of the individual consists of something that takes place temporally as well as in spatial reality. What does “I am I and my circumstances” imply, then, in this sense? Ortega's emphasis on man as a being-that-lives-in-the-world may suggest something like a purpose, an end; however, a specific end was never his intended purpose. The here-and-now of the individual becomes his primary concern. Indeed, he tended to define individuals' “circumstances” in terms of “certain elemental, basic phenomena that involve human society” and that in actual fact imposes themselves from the outside on the historical process that he theoretically followed from within. As the temporality of man is very much a part of the here-and-now, man's being-in-the-making, for Ortega, constitutes a “happening” toward the future. The future is not-here-yet and the past is no-longer-here and these two features tend to permeate the very center of man's being as their positions are related to each other in time. As death relates to the individual's internal finitude, the past and present relate to his or her finitude in its external, temporal manifestation. The present—the here-and-now—becomes understood as that moment during which the past and future are divided. The life of the present moment—when “some men are born and when some men die”—in its very essence “is boxed in,” Ortega averred, “between other lives which came before or which are to come after…” (Obras, 5: 35–37). Once an individual becomes aware of himself as a being based on the facts of his or her past (such facts as where one was born, or who were one's parents), and also as projected towards the future which he or she chooses, the individual will assume full responsibility for his or her life and choices. Ortega viewed the future as the more important aspect of temporality because it is the “open area” toward which man directs himself and in which man manifests his own being. The individual directs himself toward the future and, accordingly, takes upon himself the inheritance of the past and thereby becomes oriented to his actual and present predicament. In short, the present originates from the past so as to engender the future.
Ortega's schematization of the past, present, and future is sustained in the unity of a temporality that assumes peculiar features in the experience of the individual's vital dimensions. For through living experiences, “man goes on being and un-being.” The temporal experience of living hence is not structured in a one-dimensional progression. Rather, as a continual process of being and not-being, it has to be viewed from the three-dimensional perspective of past, present, and future. The individual reflects upon the past as he or she confronts continually the situation of having to make conscious decisions with respect to the present and the future. As we have learned, life, death, free choice, and finiteness dwell together in the living experiences of individuals. Man's choice and “destiny,” then, are contemporaneous—embedded in the here-and-now. Accordingly, the contemporaneity of man presupposes the authentic temporality of man:
The past is the moment of identity in man, the inexorable and fatal. But, for the same reason, if man's only Eleatic being is what he has been, this means that his authentic being, what, in effect, he is—and not merely ‘has been’—is distinct from the past, and consists precisely and formally in ‘being what one has not been,’ in non-Eleatic being. And since the term ‘being’ is occupied irresistibly by its traditional static signification, one should agree to liberate oneself of it. Man is not, save the he ‘goes on being’ this and that. (Obras, 6: 39)
Authentic being, thus understood, has its essential weight not solely in the past, nor in the future, but in the individual's here-and-now—the present in its reflexive connection with the past. Hence, as an authentic being man is as contemporary as he is historical, and thereby the historicity of man makes explicit the temporal manifestations of his vital dimensions.
Through the “I” and it's “circumstances,” Ortega balanced off the principle of individual variety with his philosophy of human life. However, in considering the individual to be an historical being occasioned by his or her temporality, Ortega began to pursue a line of thought that would eventually position him to establish a principle of coherence for the realities of the individual, society, and history; this theme would be borne out through the phenomenological thrust of Ortega's philosophy of human society and his theory of generations. For life, as the process of happening and the temporality of the individual makes implicit the assumption that “man goes on being” and thus has a discernible principle of coherence.
Once human life has been established as the fundamental standpoint of reality, for Ortega, “we are ipso facto given two terms or factors that are equally primary and, moreover, inseparable: Man, who lives, and the circumstances or world in which man lives.” As a being that lives, the individual relates to other living beings. For Ortega, “all realities must in some way make themselves present, or at least announce themselves within the shaken boundaries of our human life.” Hence, the basic reality of human life constitutes the life of an individual with the lives of other individuals as well as situations that pertain to the confrontation of the individual with the existent realities of physical objects. In accordance with this viewpoint, man—as a being-that-live-in-the-world—does not perceive the world from the isolation of his ego, for the very essence of his being consists in living in an actively disclosing manner. Being-in-the-world, for Ortega, we find, has a dual characteristic: as it relates to “I am I,” being-in-the-world functions as being-for-itself; as it relates to “my circumstances,” being-in-the-world functions as being-for-and-with-others. “Our world,” he explained, “the world of each one of us, is not totum revolutum, but is organized in ‘pragmatic fields.’ Each thing belongs to one or some of these fields, in which it articulates its being-for with that of others, and so on successively” (Obras, 7: 130). Through an approach reminiscent of Kant and Husserl, Ortega posited the fact that “all men live in one and the same world.” “This is the attitude that we may call,” he continued, “the natural, normal, and everyday attitude in which we live; and, because of it, because of living with others in a presumed world—hence our world—our living is co-living, living together” (Obras, 7: 152).
Any meaningful interaction with the other “consists in my relation with becoming active, in my acting on him and his on me. In practice, the former usually follows upon the latter.” In this manner, then, the discovery of the body of the other, as an object in reality, becomes a reverse revelation of the “I” and its being. The being which is subsequently revealed to the “I” is revealed as being-for-and-with-others. This component of being-for-itself-and-others is an integral part of being-in-the-world and being-for-itself and, thereby provided Ortega with the phenomenological perspective through which he developed his idea of individuals interacting in human society. He explains:
This means that the appearance of the Other is a fact that always remains as it were at the back of our life, because on becoming aware for the first time that we are living, we already find ourselves, not only with others and among others, but accustomed to others. Which leads us to formulate this first social theorem: Man is a nativitate open to the other, to the alien being; or, in other words: before each one of us became aware of himself, he had already had the basic experience that there are others who are not ‘I,’ the Others; that is to say, again, Man, on being a nativitate open to the other, to the alter who is not himself is a nativitate, like it or not….Being open to the other, to others, is a permanent and constitutive state of Man, not a definite action in respect to them. … This state is not yet properly a ‘social relation,’ because it is not yet defined in any concrete act. It is simple co-existence, matrix for all possible ‘social relations.’ It is simple presence within the horizon of my life—a presence which is, above all, more compresence of the Other, singular or plural. (Obras, 7: 149–50)
The notion of the social world as a horizon connotes, for Ortega, in a manner quite similar to that of Husserl, the context in which the experience of human interaction (among “I,” and “We,” and “Other”) occurs. The various “I's” constitute the fundamental units of the structure and content of the social world. “Husserl says very well,” Ortega recalled, “the meaning of the term man implies a reciprocal existence of one for the other, hence, a community of men, a society” (Obras, 7: 148). In describing reality, as we saw previously, Ortega postulated the distinction between things (i.e. plants, stones, and animals) and man through the fact that things exist and man lives. By dint of his unique individuality man has an essence that is peculiarly his own, which means that man, for Ortega, is not only split off from nature—plants, stones, minerals, and the like. All individual human acts, for him, are directed toward some object and, as such, the actions of the individual are manifested in accord with the nature of the objects toward which they are directed and in accord with their physical, spatial context. If the object is a stone, the individual's actions would be unilateral; if the object is an animal, on the other hand, the individual discovers that his actions would be manifested toward an anticipated reaction by the animal to which they are directed:
We know that a stone is not aware of our action on it…. But as soon as we begin dealing with an animal; the relation changes…. There is, then, no doubt that, in my relation with the animal, the act of my behavior toward it is not , as it was in the case of the stone, unilateral; rather, my act, before being performed, when I am planning it, already calculates with the probable act of reaction on the animal's part, in such a manner that my act, even in the state of pure project, moves toward the animal but returns to me in an inverted sense, anticipating the animal's reply. (Obras, 7: 133–34)
We find this sort of transcendental reflection—by way of action, responses, and reciprocal responses—to be fundamental in the kind of description made by Ortega of the social world. With an animal as an object toward which an individual my direct his or her acts, one finds more of a reciprocal response than occurs with stones and other inanimate objects, Individual man and an animal, according to Ortega, exist-for-each-other but not to the same degree as between man and man, as the latter relate to one another as being-with-and-for-the-other. Yet the question remains: what kind of behavior can be constituted as being social and what are the contingencies implicit in this behavior? The contingency, for Ortega, relates to the fact that social behavior entails interaction between individuals, in contrast to acts between men and animals—for he views human life as the ultimate reality—and this human interaction has to be reciprocal. It is a kind of reciprocity of action that can only arise and occur amongst individual men:
Does not the word ‘social’ immediately point to a reality consisting in the fact that man conducts himself in confrontation with other beings which, in their turn, conduct themselves with respect to him—therefore, to actions in which, in one way or another, the reciprocity intervenes…in short, to say the same thing in another way, that the two actors mutually respond to each other, that is, they correspond? (Obras, 7: 135–37).
Upon experiencing the others as other men, according to Ortega, the “I” understands and relates to them as units that are analogous to the “I” and that are inextricably connected, as fundamental units of reality, to their “circumstances” as well. This interaction manifests itself in such a manner that the “I,” for Ortega, apprehends the world-about-the-others and the world-about-the-“I” as one and the same world—from an objective, empirical standpoint—that differs in each individual case only insofar as it affects consciousness differently. For we all perceive reality through our sense-perception, albeit our individual perceptions of this very reality are registered differently. For Ortega, as we have seen, I am the only one who is an “I.” All the other “I's” are similar to objects (in the sense that they are perceived solely as physical organisms) and, once viewed as being “an other person” (that is, a being perceived as possessing both a body and an inwardness, an other “I”), are referred to as the “others.” My own place in this world—in time and in space—is related to my “I” and my body. When the “ego” (which is my “I”) encounters an “alien ego,” therefore, it is essential for it (the “ego”) to transcend itself and thereby make possible meaningful attempts to understand and to perceive the existence of other “egos,” or “I's.” The “other,” as “I,” according to Ortega, embodies an “ego” that possesses a similar quality of consciousness, inwardness, and solitude; an ego that will be related to as possessing both primary and secondary qualities and whose fundamental essence and structure also will be encountered as existent within the “I.” Thus, for Ortega, in order to attempt to enter this sphere of the “other's inwardness, it becomes essential to strive toward attaining the transcendental attitude. “In this sense of radical reality,” he explained,
‘human life’ means strictly and exclusively the life of each individual, that is, always and only my life….If, by chance—I added—appears in this my world something that must also be called ‘human life’ in another sense, neither radical nor primary nor patent, but secondary, derivative, and more or less latent and hypothetical…..What is decisive in this step and in this appearance is that when my life and everything in it, on being patent to me, on being mine, have immanent character—hence the truism that my life is immanent to itself, that it is all within itself—the indirect presentation, or compresence, of the alien human life startles and confronts me with something transcendent to my own life…. (Obras, 7: 141)
Through the mediacy of a human world, then, the “I” and the other, as collective human lives, communicate. The radical reality of the ”I,” as the inwardness of human life, is unique to the individual “I” and, in so far as it is possible, relates transcendentally to the “I” of the other. The consciousness of the “I” becomes separated from the consciousness of the other by the very distinction that separates in the first instance the “I's” consciousness of its own body, secondly, the distinction that separates the body of the “I” from the body of the other, and, finally, the distinction that separates the other's body from its consciousness. Alternatively, the bodies of the “I” and the other, as existent physical structures in the common world of “human lives,” are necessary “broadcasting centers,” as Ortega calls it, between the consciousness of the “I” and the others. In this connection, the relations between the bodies of the “I” and the other consists of a relation of transcendental exteriority. “What is certainly patent in my life,” he explained, “is the notification, the signal, that there are other human lives; but since human life in its radicality is only mine, and these will be lives of others like myself, each the life of each, it follows that, because they are others, all their lives will be situated outside of or beyond or trans-mine. Hence they are transcendent” (Obras, 7: 142).
Expressed in this manner, the individual, as a being-who-lives-in-the-world and as a being-for-and-with-others, is an empirically finite being who has to transcend the finitude of his “radical reality.” As we have seen, from the perspective often associated with existential philosophy, Ortega averred that for the individual to transcend the determinacy of his or her being and attain individual consciousness he or she has to make free choices and decisions. From an ontological point of view, Ortega makes a case, like Husserl, for the necessity of entering the transcendental attitude so that the individual may bring himself closer to an understanding and consciousness of the experience of the “other.” The phenomenological and existential philosophies are thus linked together, for the individual remains an empirical, finite, concrete, and unique being in his particular “circumstances,” who has been placed decisively within the spatial-temporal context of the world of his here-and-now, and, from this perspective, man transcends his “radical reality” in its every detail (Obras, 5: 545–47). Although he called into question the “abstract analogical transposition” of Husserl's “transcendental reduction,” Ortega's phenomenological approach to the importance of transcending individual experience—as the fundamentals basis for understanding the very experience of reality— still remains very much within the tradition of Husserl and of his students of the phenomenological method: Heidegger, Sartre, and Merleau-Ponty. When Ortega presented the ontological ramifications of reality, clearly he considered the human body to be connected to the totality of what he called human life or radical reality and, as such, to be the foundation of its vital structure. More specifically: the body is a body of an individual in so far as it exists in the indissoluble unity of its radical reality. But, he questioned, “what do we mean when we say that an Other is before us, that is, an other like myself, another Man?” His answer, “…I, ego, means for us no more than ‘human life,’ and human life…is properly, originally, and radically only the life of each of us, hence, my life” (Obras, 7: 158–59).
To some minds it would appear to be an obvious fact that man is able to understand others, in their being and essence, both as like himself and as other than himself. From a phenomenological standpoint, however, this fact is a problem which is neither obvious nor easy to explain and it is a problem whose solution was viewed differently by both Ortega and Husserl. The solution to this problem, for Husserl was found in his notion of Einfühlung (“empathy,” or literally, “feeling oneself into another”). Husserl's concept of the Einfühlung in Lebenswelt resembles Hume's idea of “sympathy,” and its philosophical function (as a propensity “to sympathize with others,” and as a “transcendental theory of experiencing someone else”) was to establish, as thoroughly as possible, a way of presenting the “other” to us. (see Hume, Treatise of Human Nature, pp. 367–69). Ortega renounced the supposition inherent in this solution to the problem because the notion of Einfühlung assumes that the “other” is “analogous” to my “I”; it is assumed, for him, that it is a double of my “I” and still does not serve the function of explaining the most difficult question—namely, how is it possible that this “double” of myself continues to appear to me as constituting the other? The main thrust of Ortega's argument is directed against Husserl's formulation, in his Cartesian Meditations, of the alter ego as “an analogue” of the ego. The solution of “an analogical transposition or projection,” therefore proved inadequate for Ortega, and the notion of the “appearance of the Other” became the problem to which he extended his existential phenomenological position of being-for-itself and being-for-and-with-others. Ortega replaced Husserl's notion of “in [my] every intentionality,” in order to clarify the problem somewhat, with his own idea of “my life as radical reality.” ( see especially Husserl, Cartesian, pp. 89–100, 104–11; Phänomenologie der Intersubjektivität, 14: 3–11, 429–33; 15: 40–50; see also, Scheler, Nature of Sympathy, pp. 6–50;Obras, 7: 161–63). As man is never a wordless “I”—for, as radical reality his life is being-in-the-world—also he is never an isolated (other-less) “I.” For Ortega this manifestation of “radical realty” constitutes the fundamental feature of being-for-and-with-others and consequently cannot be explained as an isolated “I” that somehow discovers a way of confronting another equally isolated “I.” Man does not have to find his way to another man for, with the disclosure of his own being as being-for-and-with-others, the being of other “I's” becomes disclosed to him as possessing this identical feature:
Observe then: being the other does not represent an accident or adventure that may or may not befall Man, but is an original attribute. I, in my solitude, could not call myself by a generic name like ‘man.’ The reality represented by this name appears to me only when there is another being who responds or reciprocates to me. Husserl says very well: “The meaning of the term ‘man’ implies a reciprocal existence of one for the other, hence a community of men, a society.” And conversely: “It is equally clear that men cannot be apprehended unless there are (really or potentially) other men around them.” Hence—I add—to speak of man outside and apart from a society is to say something that is self-contradictory and meaningless….Man does not appear in solitude—although his ultimate truth is solitude; man appears in sociality as the Other, frequenting the One, as the reciprocator. (Obras, 7: 148)
The “I” and the other, then, are constituted by their appearance before each other, in the common world of society, and as each engages in reciprocal interaction. In this connection, Ortega was in basic agreement with Husserl as he attempted to reconcile the realms of “I” and other, solitude and society, by establishing the fact that a referral to the other (on the part of the “I”) is an indispensable condition for the constitution of being-in-the-world.
In the social world of being-for-and-with-others, thus, an individual directs himself away from the possibilities that may be viewed as being exclusively his own and attempts to broaden his understanding of himself by relating to the common world possibilities of others. The social world in which the individual lives—as one who remains linked with other individuals through manifold relations—becomes a realm that he apprehends and interprets to be meaningful for his possibilities, his “circumstances,” and his here-and-now. Adopting this standpoint, Ortega contended that, as individuals who are rooted in our radical realities, we must “make an attempt at interpenetration, at de-solitudinizing ourselves…” (Obras, 7: 140). This being the case, as the spatial-temporal dimension of man's radical reality become part and parcel of his here-and-now, the reality of the social world (as the context and mediacy through which groups of individuals interact) is also enmeshed in his here-and-now. Through his own finitude, the individual's temporality revealed itself as the consciousness of the intrasubjective structure of his life. The reality of the social world, conversely, reveals itself to the individual as an intersubjectively structured world which the “I” shared with the others. The spatial-temporal manifestations of this intersubjectivity connect the “I” to the others and, at the same time, that sharply differentiate the world of the “I” from the social world of the others. “The first thing,” he explained, “I fall foul of in my proper and radical world is Other Men, the Other singular and plural, among whom I am born and begin to live. From the beginning, then, I find myself in a human world or society” (Obras, 7: 177).
In the context of social reality, thus, the individual measures his “I” by what constitutes the Others and by what they have achieved and failed to achieve in the social world. The experience of the social world by the “I” thereby justifies and corroborates itself (as a being-in-the-world) through the experience of the others with whom the “I” interacts. The possibilities of the individual and his subsequent understanding of himself can be broadened after his encounter with the “others” in the social world that is common to all “I's.” However, Ortega also views the social world, in several aspects, as constricting in lieu of expanding man's possibilities. As an empirically finite being whose radical reality continually confronts the possibility of death, man, for Ortega, can make efforts to transcend the determinacy of his being on making, existentially, free choices and decisions, Conversely, man, as a social, empirically finite being who interrelated with other individuals, finds it difficult to transcend and to recoil from the process of the reciprocity of human interaction in the context of social reality and, hence, becomes conditioned (by society) to act with a view toward what others have done and what they are currently doing. Once given this social world that may be interpreted to signify the possible realm of action for all of us (as “all men find themselves among men”), in Ortega's view, the individual must discriminate between what constitutes the possibilities of the others—men in general in the social world—and what constitutes the possibilities inherent in the uniqueness of his own finite being. “What is yours,” he said, “does not exist for me—your ideas and convictions do not exist for me. I see them as alien and something as opposed to me….All Yous are such—because they are different from me—and when I say I, I am only a minute portion of the world, the tiny part of it that I now begin accurately to call ‘I’” (Obras, 7: 178, 189–90).
In this connection, the individual must live neither as an isolated “I” nor as a conformist to the common social world of the others. Rather, the individual must live the existence of a unique “I.” That is to say, the unique individual consists of he who lives in an actively disclosing manner and who has the ability both to come out of and to withdraw into the possibilities which are permitted within the realm of the “yous” and “wes” that he confronts in the reality of the social world. “It is in the world of the yous, and by virtue of them,” he exclaimed, “that the thing I am, my I, gradually takes shape for me. I discover myself, then, as one of countless yous, but as different from them all, with gifts and defects of my own, with a unique character and conduct, that together draw my authentic and correct profile for me—hence as another and particular you, as alter tu” (Obras, 7: 196). At this point of our analysis, it is apparent that the term “social world,” or society, for Ortega, connotes merely the term which is used to describe the phenomenological interaction between individual “I's” both as unique individuals and as social individuals. In other words, the social world entails the realm in which the interactive process of the “I” and its “circumstances” becomes extended to the inclusion of other “I's.” From this perspective, Ortega became concerned with the fundamental patterns of human interaction that underlie the larger context of social reality. The reduction of the whole of what constitutes social reality into its component elements discloses the phenomenological basis of Ortega's analysis of human society. Hence, the social relation of individuals identifies the distinctive unity which is defined by the reciprocal interaction of its unique individual components. As he explained:
…the basic structure that is social relation, in which man moves appearing and defining himself in front of the other man, and from being the pure other, the unknown man, the not-yet-identified individual, becomes the unique individual—the You and I. But now we have become aware of something that is a constituent factor in all that we have called ‘social relation’…namely, that all these actions of ours and all these reactions of others in which the so-called ‘social relation’ consists, originate in an individual as such, I [myself] for example, and are directed to another individual as such. Therefore, the ‘social relation,’ as it has so far appeared to us, is always explicitly a reality between individuals, a reality formally inter-individual. (Obras, 7: 202–3)
The behavior and interaction of individuals in the social world, for Ortega, comprises a reality which becomes tangible and which remains open to an objective analysis. This analysis reflects the perspective of social reality as the realm in which we may perceive and interpret the concrete functions of human interactions. The substance of Ortega's objective analysis of social relations was structured around his theories of “creative, select minorities,” “mass man,” and “mass society.” For Ortega, “mass man” and “mass society” are manifestations of social and historical phenomena that are perceptible, in part, through the objective factor of their vast numbers and magnitude in the social world. But, he points out immediately, the argument of sheer quantity hardly explains accurately or adequately the fact that “we see the multitude, as such, in possession of the places and instruments created buy civilization.” More importantly, he averred, a sharp focus on the intrinsic features of mass man and mass society would bring us much closer to discerning the essence of this concept than its external manifestations of agglomeration and plentitude (Obras, 7: 144, 143). The philosophical dimensions of mass man and mass society, and select minorities, as a theory of social relations and human interaction and as an analysis of social reality, must focus attention more on its qualitative than on its quantitative characteristics. That is, while making references to the quantitative factor of the concepts of masses, and select minorities as descriptive indicators of the coherence of one group of individuals vis-à-vis another group remains important and useful, references to the qualitative features of identifying what constitute masses and select minorities becomes even more essential, for Ortega, toward an understanding not solely of unique individuals in society but also of how these unique persons remain together as a dynamic unity.
The concept of the multitude is quantitative and visual. Let us translate it without changing its character, into sociological terminology. Then we find the idea of social mass. Society is always a dynamic unity of two components factors: minorities and masses. The minorities are individuals or groups of individuals which are specially qualified. The mass is an aggregate of persons not especially qualified. By masses, then, it is not to be understood, solely nor principally, ‘the working masses.’ The mass is ‘the average man.’ In this manner what was mere quantity—the multitude—is converted into a qualitative determination: it becomes the common social quality, it is man as undifferentiated from other men, but as repeating in himself a generic type…To form a minority, whatever it may be, it is necessary beforehand that each member separate himself from the multitude for special, relatively individual reasons….This coming together of the minority precisely in order to separate themselves from the majority is always introduced into the formation of every minority. (Obras, 4: 145–46)
For Ortega, the “specially qualified,” “select man,” must separate himself from the common values of everyone by placing greater demands on himself and by drawing upon the uniqueness of his radical reality. To realize one's possibilities as a unique individual, as we saw, occasionally man's withdrawal from the social reality of others to the radical reality of his “I” becomes essential. In such circumstances, the individual has to ignore momentarily the objective values of the social world, according to Ortega, and must create increasingly the subjective values derived from the uniqueness of his being. This subjective withdrawal into the “solitude” of one's radical reality provides the necessary retreat of the select minorities whenever confronted with the constraints of the masses, a process which resembles Nietzsche's concept of the übermensch. For Nietzsche, the übermensch (over man) must liberate himself from the ressentiment of “slave morality” by setting his own standards and by creating his own values. (Nietzsche, On the Genealogy of Morals, pp.36–43) Previously we observed that in order to attempt to develop individual consciousness and to realize the vital possibilities of his being, the individual, for Ortega, has to become absorbed within the circumstances of the social world and interact actively with other individuals in this very world. The development of individual consciousness and the realization of one's vital possibilities also entail an occasional withdrawal from social reality into the solitude of one's self (without remaining “hermetically enclosed” and locked in the ego), with the purpose of possessing both the unique individuality of the “I” (against the constraints of society) and the positive process of reciprocal human interaction. Although Ortega opined that “there is no creation without withdrawal into one's self,” he also maintained that the “I” has to confront actively the others and collide in the strife he designates as “social relations.” The dynamics of “de-solitudinizing,” through the actions and the creations of the individual in the social world, then, project the realm of possibilities not only from the “I” to the other, and vice-versa, but also from our social world (in the here-and-now) to their social world (in the future)—in short, from one generation to the next. The individual, for Ortega, must withdraw from the social world not solely to realize the vital possibilities of his own being but also to attempt to create and to actualize the vital possibilities of the social world through which the circumstances of his very being (and the being of the others) are defined. In this context, the individual, by engaging actively in the social reality surrounding his circumstances, contributes substantively to the making of the essence of society and history as well as to the essence of his own being (Obras, 5: 79–80). The spatial-temporality of man and his circumstances—by way of his life, society, consciousness of time, and history—will take us into Ortega's concept of the “generation” and its role in his philosophy of history.
The social world and the consciousness process of the individual, however, disclose more than the experiences of other individuals that are given directly in the common, vivid present of the here-and-now. The social world, for Ortega, also contains an implicit feature of social reality that remains inexperienced directly (in the broader sense of immediate confrontation) by the individual—in the here-and-now—but becomes contemporaneous with the life of the individual and subsequently may be made available to him as an experience in the future. Hence, the here-and-now of the individual, as an immediate direct experience, extends itself (both as a process of consciousness and as a perceptible factual occurrence in space) into the broader social context of living and interacting as “contemporaries” (Obras, 5: 36–42). In this context, the explicit features of the social reality of “contemporaries” reveal the consciousness process of a generation of individuals as a temporal process.
The temporality of the lives of individuals (as “contemporaries” and also as what Ortega called “coevals”) is central to the concept of the generation. In this sense, ultimate reality as the reality of human life, for Ortega, also signifies the explicit manifestation of time (for time is in man as the events of his life are connected to their placement in time) and thus provides him with the basic structure of his concept of generation and with the basis of historic changes. The life of man, as being-in-the-making, is life as a happening; life as a changing structure. With each fleeting moment of the here-and-now, man's inner stream of consciousness of the flow of time relates to the fact that his life changes, as he grow older, and ages with each reference to the no-longer-here and the not-yet-here. “The most elemental fact of human life,” he said,
is that some men die and others are born—that lives succeed each other. All human life, in its very essence, is enclosed in between other lives which came before or which are to come after—it proceeds out of one life and goes into one which is to follow. Well then, it is on this most fundamental fact that I establish the inevitable necessity of change in the structure of the world….This is not to say, heedlessly, that the youth of today—that is, his soul and his body—is different from the youth of yesterday; but it is inevitable that his life should have a different framework than that of yesterday.
Well then, this is nothing but to find the reason and the period for historical changes in the fact joined essentially to human life, that this human life always has an age [a period of time]. Life is time—as Dilthey already made us see and Heidegger repeats to us today; and not imaginary cosmic time because imaginary time is infinite, but limited time, time which grows toward an end, which is the true time, the irreparable time. For this reason man has age. Age is man's being always in a certain part of his limited time-span—whether it is to be the beginning of his vital life's time, to be the ascension toward the middle, to be its center, or to be approaching toward its end—or, as one is accustomed to say, whether he is a child, a youth, a mature man, or an old man. (Obras, 5: 37)
After having established this principle of change, Ortega's concept of generation becomes the principle through which the no-longer-here, the here-and-now, and the not-yet-here converge in the temporal reality of the social world. Thus, when Ortega referred to one's “life time” as consisting of youth, maturity, and old age, we are able to discern that: in the first instance, his concept of generation entails a horizontal reference to living individuals as being “contemporaries”; and, secondly, it refers to the vertical differentiation, in age, between youth, maturity, and old age—in short, as being “coevals.” Ortega's view of three distinct life times, as manifestations of the concept of generation, resides in his notions of “coevals” (which refers to the interaction of individuals of approximately the same age) and of “contemporaries” (which indicates a reference to the interaction between all individuals of whatever age) and their appositeness with regard to time and to space (Obras, 5: 37–38). As the active engagement in the social world persists in importance for both the development of the individual and society, the inner dynamics of vital human interaction, for Ortega, are also important insofar as the concept of generation has any significance in illuminating the human condition. Yet we ask ourselves: how do we characterize those individuals who do engage actively in the “circumstances” of their reality but whose social worlds differ from those of other groups of individuals? They may possess the same age as these other groups of individuals and their activities are contemporaneous, but the “vital contact” of one group of individuals who belong to a particular social setting does not necessarily interact with that of another social group, as their social worlds are different in space though not in time. This question takes us into the broader historical implications of Ortega's concept of generation.
The historical nature of human reality and social thought sheds light upon Ortega's notion that “there is no spontaneous generation,” for the “series of the generations” function through the continuity of the historical process. Social thought and the ideas of individuals reflect “the minds of men” together with the particular generations within which they develop and, if constituted as “coming from” and “going toward,” they become part and parcel of the “happening” of the historical process (Obras, 6: 202–4). As we have seen, man's being-in-the-making, for Ortega, is a “happening toward the future, the present evolves out of the past and, as the reality exigent to man, veers toward the future. This historical sense of continuity, between the minds of men and the succession of generations, recalls for us Ortega's assertion that the individual cannot lively solely within the isolation of his ego (whether he is a “mass or a ‘select” man). Social thought in general and the ideas of individuals in particular, by their very essence, fail to develop and expand within the solipsistic vacuum of the “I.” As a being of the social world, the individual and his ideas are influenced very much by the historical context and the very social world within which they emerged, and, similarly, are formed by the past. From this perspective, man, time, thought, and society are disclosed in reality as being essentially historical. The individual is not born at some place and moment in general, for Ortega; rather he or she is born at a particular moment in time and at a particular place in space. Human life has a beginning and an end and, on entering the world, man enters a social world that is given to him in conjunction with the historical process of its time dimension. As we saw, for Ortega, “man has no nature…what he has is history.” For, he says, “man is the entity that makes itself…the causa sui.” (Obras, 6: 33). History, then, provides the process through which the essence of man becomes manifest both as an individual and as a social being. For as an individual being, man undergoes the stream of consciousness of an internal occurrence as an historical process; as a being-that –lives-in-the-world, man experiences the succession of generations as an external occurrence within the historical process. Ortega posited the “theme of history” and “historical thought” as proceeding “with respect to the human phenomena” through the prisms of these internal and external occurrences. History, through the succession of generations, not only provides us with the basic features of the individual at a particular time and at a particular place, but also provides us with “a regulative principle” of coherence for human phenomena. The unity of the past and the present in history, for Ortega, constitutes a reality which becomes identified with the experiences of individuals. Like Croce, Ortega perceived history qua history as being “contemporary” and “living,” whereas mere facts are relegated to the realm of “dead chronicle.” Through the relationship of history to life, he defined history, as contrasted with chronicle, by its vitality and present-mindedness rather than by connectedness as such, though he did acknowledge that those who defined it by the latter quality pursued the correct path. The contemporaneity of history, then, proffers a dynamic process that is ever changing and that is continuously absorbed by the past. The relations that past events bear to other events and to the present are significant in that they are continually changing and, according to Ortega, the function of the philosopher becomes not only to describe and analyze the past but also to attempt to understand these relations in conjunction with human life. The underlying concept of the individual ultimately determines the critical character of historical interpretations, which results from both a reading of the past, and simultaneously self-analysis by the observer. In this critical revival of the past, the contemporary generation achieves a higher historical consciousness of its own being. Internal consciousness of temporal change within the individual coupled with an awareness of the external manifestations of change in the social world of human reality disposes one to see how Ortega's concept of the generation constitutes a concept of historical methodology:
The concept of the generations, converted into a method of historical investigation, consists in nothing more than projecting that structure across the past. Anything other than this is to renounce discovering the authentic reality of human life in every period of time—that is the mission of history. The method of the generations permits us to see that life from within itself, in its actuality. History is virtually to convert that which has already passed into that which is present. For this reason—and not only metaphorically—history is to relive the past. And as living is nothing else but actuality and the present, we have to transmigrate from the actuality and the present which are ours to those of the past, looking at them not from without, not as living experiences which have been, but as those which persist in being. (Obras, 5: 40)
Historical study, thus, constitutes a humanistic enterprise. Currently, history can be our approach to knowledge of the individual and of humanity and through history we acquire the wealth and wisdom of past cultures. The critical awareness of the potentialities of the individual enables us to act in our own historical time with deeper insights and with an active commitment. History depends on what the consciousness of the historian brings to it, and thereby, the humanistic aspects of historical consciousness stems from the realization that our lives constitute time. For the “past is past,” Ortega remarked, “not because it happened to others but because it forms part of our present, of what we are in the form of having been: in short, because it is our past. Life as reality is absolute presence: one cannot say that there is anything if it is not present, of this moment. If, then, there is a past, it must be as something present, something active in us now” (Obras, 5: 40, 55; 6: 33). In this connection, Ortega was in accord with Croce's notion that “we know that history is in all of us and that its sources are in our breasts.” According to this notion, the recordings of “chronicle's dead data” of the past fail to register the reality of history and human life, which is the “vital,” living action of the present, and is one with the past and the future. History characterizes what we are, instead of something that we possess. Through history we learn who we are by examining what we have done. In view of this position, that we are what we have done, history shapes itself in and through ourselves (Obras, 7: 178–79).
Hence historical time carves the essence of individual configurations. For Ortega “historical reason” perceives and registers the tangible facts of historical reality through the demonstrative process of how the present originated from the past in order to engender the future. By the term “historical reason,” Ortega intended to make a clearer distinction between the “cultural sciences” and the “natural sciences.” Namely, to posit the notion that history has it “autochthonous” reason; history remains in a realm entirely its own. Ortega's notion of history's “autochthonous” reason establishes for history its autonomy from both the abstract concepts of philosophy, and the logic of “physico-mathematical reason.” His invocation of history as humanity's appropriate science, and his overt emphasis on the “original, autochthonous” basis of “historical reason,” point to his insistence on the systematic quality of history and on the “transcendent” character of physical and mathematical reason. History becomes autonomous in that history alone consists of the essence of human reality and historical knowledge provides us with the essential understanding of this human reality. Every concept “claiming to represent human reality,” he explains, “every concept referring to human life, specifically, is a function of historical time” (Obras, 6: 40–41). In conjunction with the historicization of the individual, historical reason became the medium that circumscribed and eventually supplanted physical and mathematical reason as the unitary principle of ultimate reality: human life, and thereby “historical reason” was now viewed as possessing, at once, the principle of diversity and unity. Hence, history was rationalized and reason was historicized, as with the individual:
…Man alienated from himself encounters himself as reality, as history. And, for the first time, he sees himself compelled to occupy himself with his past, not from curiosity nor in order to find normative examples, but because he has no other thing. Things are never done seriously but when, truly, they are absolutely necessary. For this reason, the present hour is the time for history to re-establish itself as historical reason.
Until now history has been contrary to reason. In Greece the two terms ‘reason’ and ‘history’ were opposed. And until now, in effect, hardly anyone has been concerned to search in history for its rational substance….Hence the expression ‘historical reason’ must be understood in all the rigor of the term. Not an extrahistorical reason which appears to fulfill itself in history but, literally, a substantive reason constituted by what has happened to man, the revelation of reality transcending man's theories and which is himself, the self underlying his theories. (Obras, 6: 49–50)
In one of his essays on Hegel, Ortega remarked on the change in European intellectual sensitivity that “the ‘modern’ spirit has experienced in the last years…. The ‘modern’ [spirit] does not believe as naively in the final age any more” (Obras, 2: 565–66). This modern stance epitomized what Ortega had come to understand as one of the distinctive characteristics of modernity: the consciousness of human life's increasing depreciation and the subsequent reaffirmation of life through the expression of creative freedom. Ortega perceived the early twentieth century as a world emptied of meaning and sought to elude the despair provoked by its meaninglessness. To transform this sense of despair, he affirmed “our life, human life,” as the “radical reality.” Human life thus constitutes constancy and change or, as Ortega proclaimed, “historical reality” (Obras, 7: 99–100; 2: 540–41). Through the discussion of historical reality, and historical reason, the ground upon which historical knowledge has been based for Ortega becomes apparent. For speculative philosophies of history, the “owl of Minerva” began its flight at dusk; for Ortega, and certain twentieth-century philosophers of history, “historical reason” proclaims the dawn of human history.
Individual lives are historical. Where human life has a beginning and an end, in view of Ortega's reading of Hegel, history has neither a new beginning nor a final ending. It can only be conceived of as the realization of the potentialities of the individual in historic time. In retracing the individual's struggle to control nature and in reviving the thoughts and conscious life of the past, historical study offers any contemporary generation the challenge of making its own vital decisions on the basis of a critical knowledge of the full scope of former human experiences and achievements. History is understood here in its dual meaning as a factual world of phenomena and as a discipline concerned with only its relevance of life in the present.
Starting from the premise that consciousness, in the sense of cognitive awareness, always should be consciousness of something, Ortega and modern thinkers have perplexed themselves with such questions as what is consciousness in itself and how it is related to the thing, or the facts, which are its objects. It does not appear to be identical with its objects, yet, neither does perception. Historical consciousness constitutes a concern with the past as being relevant to our understanding and apprehending of the human condition. Its key attribute consists of our awareness of ourselves as “being-in-time.” It implies that the temporal ordering of events refers to the very nature of human existence. Historical consciousness thus enables the individual, a civilization, and the philosopher of history, to expand their experiences beyond their actual historic time frame to absorb the results of events in which they had no part. The study of history thereby opens the horizon to participation in the completeness of human history.
This participation in human history has to be understood as being direct and active. Where the physical scientist perceives phenomena which have a reality independent from the observer, history has the character of being real in the consciousness of the historian. The word “history” means both history as actuality—the res gestae of Ortega and Collingwood—and written history; history as what has happened in the past. Clearly, any attempt to distinguish between historical reality and historical accounts of reality implies the interpreter knows what constitutes historical reality. The past is present only insofar as it is relived by the historian through sympathy and understating. The central problems of an historical epistemology and methodology revolve around the understanding that an objective knowledge of the past can be attained solely through the subjective experiences of the investigator. Thus to understand an action, or past actions, implies comprehending it as an expression or process of meaning whereby action has been connected conceptually to some underlying pattern of thought or intention, rather than as a completely contingent relation. Moreover, such an underlying pattern presupposes a background structure of established rules or practices of the sort that may prove to be integral to human life and experience as we apprehend them. For to claim, as does Collingwood, that such an account of historical understanding requires the re-enactment of past thinking merely directs attention to the method, admittedly familiar among historians, of imaginatively projecting oneself into another's position for the purpose of arriving at an explanatory hypothesis. Ortega, as well, claims that,
man invents for himself a program of life, a static form of being, that responds satisfactorily to the difficulties planned for him by circumstance. He essays this figure of life, attempts to realize this imaginary character he has resolved to be. He embarks on this essay illusioned and creates, completely, the experience of it…. But on experimenting with it, the limits of this vital program make apparent its insufficiencies. It does not resolve all the difficulties, and it creates new ones. (Obras, 6: 41)
The claim was to demonstrate that the explanations historians actually provide are similar in their structural analysis to those put forward in other areas of investigation in the social sciences; this demonstrates that an explanation of past historical actions, by reference to motivational factors, is possible in presupposing the validity of pertinent cognitive generalizations. Ortega, together with Croce, Dilthey, Collingwood and others who associated with the tradition of historicism, expressed sympathy with those who claimed that the interpretation of human actions raised difficulties for standard empiricist accounts and explanations of the human and social world. For the most part, they were wholly committed to universal human objectives and placed a very high value on the uniqueness of the individual. They were concerned with the philosophical implications of historical knowledge and made attempts to develop systematically the problem of relating presuppositions to the problem of historical knowledge. They sought to identify their specialty, philosophy and the philosophy of history, with historical knowledge. “History,” Ortega averred, “is perfect continuity. Every idea of mine comes from another idea of mine or from the ideas of some other man… [Therefore] historical thinking proceeds with respect to human phenomena—philosophy, law, society, arts and letters, language, religion—the same thing began with the natural sciences, as established in the works of Kepler and Galileo, when they proceeded to bring together empirically the simple facts of material phenomena” (Obras, 6: 167, 184).
Ortega's contribution to this area of study has been to emphasize what he considered the epistemological implications of historical knowledge. In the company of such phenomenologists as Husserl, Heidegger, and Scheler, Ortega was challenged to a continual emphasis on a strict and accurate observation of the various elements of human experience. Ortega was persuaded by the argument that isolated empirical facts, apart from any understanding of their interior meaning, their inner connection to human life and the meaning of the social and the historical process were limited, if not futile. In adopting these orientations, philosophers, historians, and philosophers of history may learn from philosophical and cultural anthropology that constructive comparisons can be made between understanding what individuals do and understanding what they say. Through this connection the philosopher of history may reconstruct historical time as a form of human understanding and, if so inclined, as the process through which self-analysis may be attempted. As we saw, for Ortega, the interpretation of human actions raises difficulties for standard empiricist accounts of explanation of the human and social world. The results of Ortega's studies in existential phenomenology, historicism, and the philosophy of history allured him to the approach of choice, to knowledge of the individual and of humanity. This approach advances the notion that, through history, the epistemological break occurs not with the past but with empirical accounts of the past. The philosophical historian's approach and attitudes toward the past, when honed successfully, can result in his or her ability to comprehend and communicate with the past on its own terms. The historical approach thus serves as a communicative link between the past and the present and the philosopher, in making such communication possible, serves as a mediator between the worlds of the past and present. The historical lines connecting the past and the present also connect temporal reality and the observer. To attain this end, Ortega eventually grounded historical knowledge in a thorough knowledge of the individual. “History,” he explained, “is the systematic science of that radical reality which is my life….There is no actio in distans. The past is not there, at the date when it happened, but here, in me. The past is I—by which I understand, my life” (Obras, 6: 40–41).
The historical act of reconstructing past human creations, and of projecting oneself into the thoughts of others, makes salient critical philosophy of history's synthetic function of connecting temporal reality and mind through the process and consciousness of time. Through this form of communication with the past and present, the phenomenological aspect of Ortega's thought thereby combines with his existential and historicist perspectives. The synthetic function of these perspectives becomes actualized in individual behavior, in social relations and in history. It is the fusion of these approaches that mark Ortega's contribution to philosophy. “Very deep is the well in the past,” Thomas Mann wrote at the beginning of his novel, Joseph and His Brothers. In bringing human connectedness and meaning to historical time and mind, Ortega's critical philosophy of history has provided a synthesis that serves to prevent the deep well of the past from becoming bottomless.
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- José Ortega y Gasset, by Pelayo García Sierra, Proyecto filosofía en español.
- José Ortega y Gasset, by Pedro José Chamizo Domínguez, Proyecto Ensayo Hispánico.
Collingwood, Robin George | Collingwood, Robin George: aesthetics | Croce, Benedetto: aesthetics | Dilthey, Wilhelm | existentialism | Heidegger, Martin | historicism | history, philosophy of | Husserl, Edmund | Mannheim, Karl | Merleau-Ponty, Maurice | phenomenology | Sartre, Jean-Paul | Scheler, Max | Schutz, Alfred