Philosophy of History

First published Sun Feb 18, 2007; substantive revision Fri Sep 28, 2012

The concept of history plays a fundamental role in human thought. It invokes notions of human agency, change, the role of material circumstances in human affairs, and the putative meaning of historical events. It raises the possibility of “learning from history.” And it suggests the possibility of better understanding ourselves in the present, by understanding the forces, choices, and circumstances that brought us to our current situation. It is therefore unsurprising that philosophers have sometimes turned their attention to efforts to examine history itself and the nature of historical knowledge. These reflections can be grouped together into a body of work called “philosophy of history.” This work is heterogeneous, comprising analyses and arguments of idealists, positivists, logicians, theologians, and others, and moving back and forth over the divides between European and Anglo-American philosophy, and between hermeneutics and positivism.

Given the plurality of voices within the “philosophy of history,” it is impossible to give one definition of the field that suits all these approaches. In fact, it is misleading to imagine that we refer to a single philosophical tradition when we invoke the phrase, “philosophy of history,” because the strands of research characterized here rarely engage in dialogue with each other. Still, we can usefully think of philosophers' writings about history as clustering around several large questions, involving metaphysics, hermeneutics, epistemology, and historicism: (1) What does history consist of—individual actions, social structures, periods and regions, civilizations, large causal processes, divine intervention? (2) Does history as a whole have meaning, structure, or direction, beyond the individual events and actions that make it up? (3) What is involved in our knowing, representing, and explaining history? (4) To what extent is human history constitutive of the human present?

1. History and its representation

What are the intellectual tasks that define the historian's work? In a sense, this question is best answered on the basis of a careful reading of some good historians. But it will be useful to offer several simple answers to this foundational question as a sort of conceptual map of the nature of historical knowing.

First, historians are interested in providing conceptualizations and factual descriptions of events and circumstances in the past. This effort is an answer to questions like these: “What happened? What was it like? What were some of the circumstances and happenings that took place during this period in the past?” Sometimes this means simply reconstructing a complicated story from scattered historical sources—for example, in constructing a narrative of the Spanish Civil War or attempting to sort out the series of events that culminated in the Detroit race riot / uprising of 1967. But sometimes it means engaging in substantial conceptual work in order to arrive at a vocabulary in terms of which to characterize “what happened.” Concerning the disorders of 1967 in Detroit: was this a riot or an uprising? How did participants and contemporaries think about it?

Second, historians often want to answer “why” questions: “Why did this event occur? What were the conditions and forces that brought it about?” This body of questions invites the historian to provide an explanation of the event or pattern he or she describes: the rise of fascism in Spain, the collapse of the Ottoman Empire, the great global financial crisis of 2008. And providing an explanation requires, most basically, an account of the causal mechanisms, background circumstances, and human choices that brought the outcome about. We explain an historical outcome when we identify the social causes, forces, and actions that brought it about, or made it more likely.

Third, and related to the previous point, historians are sometimes interested in answering a “how” question: “How did this outcome come to pass? What were the processes through which the outcome occurred?” How did the Prussian Army succeed in defeating the superior French Army in 1870? How did Truman manage to defeat Dewey in the 1948 US election? Here the pragmatic interest of the historian's account derives from the antecedent unlikelihood of the event in question: how was this outcome possible? This too is an explanation; but it is an answer to a “how possible” question rather than a “why necessary” question.

Fourth, often historians are interested in piecing together the human meanings and intentions that underlie a given complex series of historical actions. They want to help the reader make sense of the historical events and actions, in terms of the thoughts, motives, and states of mind of the participants. For example: Why did Napoleon III carelessly provoke Prussia into war in 1870? Why has the Burmese junta dictatorship been so intransigent in its treatment of democracy activist Aung San Suu Kyi? Why did northern cities in the United States develop such profound patterns of racial segregation after World War II? Answers to questions like these require interpretation of actions, meanings, and intentions—of individual actors and of cultures that characterize whole populations. This aspect of historical thinking is “hermeneutic,” interpretive, and ethnographic.

And, of course, the historian faces an even more basic intellectual task: that of discovering and making sense of the archival information that exists about a given event or time in the past. Historical data do not speak for themselves; archives are incomplete, ambiguous, contradictory, and confusing. The historian needs to interpret individual pieces of evidence; and he or she needs to be able to somehow fit the mass of evidence into a coherent and truthful story. So complex events like the Spanish Civil War present the historian with an ocean of historical traces in repositories and archives all over the world; these collections sometimes reflect specific efforts at concealment by the powerful (for example, Franco's efforts to conceal all evidence of mass killings of Republicans after the end of fighting); and the historian's task is to find ways of using this body of evidence to discern some of the truth about the past.

In short, historians conceptualize, describe, contextualize, explain, and interpret events and circumstances of the past. They sketch out ways of representing the complex activities and events of the past; they explain and interpret significant outcomes; and they base their findings on evidence in the present that bears upon facts about the past. Their accounts need to be grounded on the evidence of the available historical record; and their explanations and interpretations require that the historian arrive at hypotheses about social causes and cultural meanings. Historians can turn to the best available theories in the social and behavioral sciences to arrive at theories about causal mechanisms and human behavior; so historical statements depend ultimately upon factual inquiry and theoretical reasoning. Ultimately, the historian's task is to shed light on the what, why, and how of the past, based on inferences from the evidence of the present.

1.1 Scale in history

Doing history forces us to make choices about the scale of the history with which we are concerned. Suppose we are interested in Asian history. Are we concerned with Asia as a continent, or China, or Shandong Province? Or in historical terms, are we concerned with the whole of the Chinese Revolution, the base area of Yenan, or the specific experience of a handful of villages in Shandong during the 1940s? And given the fundamental heterogeneity of social life, the choice of scale makes a big difference to the findings.

Historians differ fundamentally around the decisions they make about scale. William Hinton provides what is almost a month-to-month description of the Chinese Revolution in Fanshen village—a collection of a few hundred families (Hinton, 1966). The book covers a few years and the events of a few hundred people. Likewise, Emmanuel Le Roy Ladurie offers a deep treatment of the villagers of Montaillou; once again, a single village and a limited time (Le Roy Ladurie, 1979). William Cronon provides a focused and detailed account of the development of Chicago as a metropolis for the middle of the United States (Cronon, 1991). These histories are limited in time and space, and they can appropriately be called “micro-history.”

At the other end of the scale spectrum, William McNeill provides a history of the world's diseases (McNeill, 1976); Massimo Livi-Bacci offers a history of the world's population (Livi-Bacci, 2007); and De Vries and Goudsblom provide an environmental history of the world (De Vries and Goudsblom, 2002). In each of these cases, the historian has chosen a scale that encompasses virtually the whole of the globe, over millennia of time. These histories can certainly be called “macro-history.”

Both micro- and macro-histories have important shortcomings. Micro-history leaves us with the question, “how does this particular village shed light on anything larger?”. And macro-history leaves us with the question, “how do these large assertions about causality really work out in the context of Canada or Sichuan?”. The first threatens to be so particular as to lose all interest, whereas the second threatens to be so general as to lose all empirical relevance to real historical processes.

There is a third choice available to the historian that addresses both points. This is to choose a scale that encompasses enough time and space to be genuinely interesting and important, but not so much as to defy valid analysis. This level of scale might be regional-for example, G. William Skinner's analysis of the macro-regions of China (Skinner, 1977). It might be national—for example, a social and political history of Indonesia. And it might be supra-national—for example, an economic history of Western Europe or comparative treatment of Eurasian history. The key point is that historians in this middle range are free to choose the scale of analysis that seems to permit the best level of conceptualization of history, given the evidence that is available and the social processes that appear to be at work. And this mid-level scale permits the historian to make substantive judgments about the “reach” of social processes that are likely to play a causal role in the story that needs telling. This level of analysis can be referred to as “meso-history,” and it appears to offer an ideal mix of specificity and generality.

2. Continental philosophy of history

The topic of history has been treated frequently in modern European philosophy. A long, largely German, tradition of thought looks at history as a total and comprehensible process of events, structures, and processes, for which the philosophy of history can serve as an interpretive tool. This approach, speculative and meta-historical, aims to discern large, embracing patterns and directions in the unfolding of human history, persistent notwithstanding the erratic back-and-forth of particular historical developments. Modern philosophers raising this set of questions about the large direction and meaning of history include Vico, Herder, and Hegel. A somewhat different line of thought in the continental tradition that has been very relevant to the philosophy of history is the hermeneutic tradition of the human sciences. Through their emphasis on the “hermeneutic circle” through which humans undertake to understand the meanings created by other humans—in texts, symbols, and actions—hermeneutic philosophers such as Schleiermacher (1838), Dilthey (1860–1903), and Ricoeur (2000) offer philosophical arguments for emphasizing the importance of narrative interpretation within our understanding of history.

2.1 Universal or historical human nature?

Human beings make history; but what is the fundamental nature of the human being? Is there one fundamental “human nature,” or are the most basic features of humanity historically conditioned (Mandelbaum 1971)? Can the study of history shed light on this question? When we study different historical epochs, do we learn something about unchanging human beings—or do we learn about fundamental differences of motivation, reasoning, desire, and collectivity? Is humanity a historical product? Giambattista Vico's New Science (1725) offered an interpretation of history that turned on the idea of a universal human nature and a universal history (1725); (see (Berlin 2000) for commentary). Vico's interpretation of the history of civilization offers the view that there is an underlying uniformity in human nature across historical settings that permits explanation of historical actions and processes. The common features of human nature give rise to a fixed series of stages of development of civil society, law, commerce, and government: universal human beings, faced with recurring civilizational challenges, produce the same set of responses over time. Two things are worth noting about this perspective on history: first, that it simplifies the task of interpreting and explaining history (because we can take it as given that we can understand the actors of the past based on our own experiences and nature); and second, it has an intellectual heir in twentieth-century social science theory in the form of rational choice theory as a basis for comprehensive social explanation.

Johann Gottfried Herder offers a strikingly different view about human nature and human ideas and motivations. Herder argues for the historical contextuality of human nature in his work, Ideas for the Philosophy of History of Humanity (1791). He offers a historicized understanding of human nature, advocating the idea that human nature is itself a historical product and that human beings act differently in different periods of historical development (1800–1877, 1791). Herder's views set the stage for the historicist philosophy of human nature later found in such nineteenth century figures as Hegel and Nietzsche. His perspective too prefigures an important current of thought about the social world in the late twentieth century, the idea of the “social construction” of human nature and social identities (Anderson 1983; Hacking 1999; Foucault 1971).

2.2 Does history possess directionality?

Philosophers have raised questions about the meaning and structure of the totality of human history. Some philosophers have sought to discover a large organizing theme, meaning, or direction in human history. This may take the form of an effort to demonstrate how history enacts a divine order, or reveals a large pattern (cyclical, teleological, progressive), or plays out an important theme (for example, Hegel's conception of history as the unfolding of human freedom discussed below). The ambition in each case is to demonstrate that the apparent contingency and arbitrariness of historical events can be related to a more fundamental underlying purpose or order.

This approach to history may be described as hermeneutic; but it is focused on interpretation of large historical features rather than the interpretation of individual meanings and actions. In effect, it treats the sweep of history as a complicated, tangled text, in which the interpreter assigns meanings to some elements of the story in order to fit these elements into the larger themes and motifs of the story. (Ranke makes this point explicitly (1881).)

A recurring current in this approach to the philosophy of history falls in the area of theodicy or eschatology: religiously inspired attempts to find meaning and structure in history by relating the past and present to some specific, divinely ordained plan. Theologians and religious thinkers have attempted to find meaning in historical events as expressions of divine will. One reason for theological interest in this question is the problem of evil; thus Leibniz's Theodicy attempts to provide a logical interpretation of history that makes the tragedies of history compatible with a benevolent God's will (1709). In the twentieth century, theologians such as Maritain (1957), Rust (1947), and Dawson (1929) offered systematic efforts to provide Christian interpretations of history.

Enlightenment thinkers rejected the religious interpretation of history but brought in their own teleology, the idea of progress—the idea that humanity is moving in the direction of better and more perfect civilization, and that this progression can be witnessed through study of the history of civilization (Condorcet 1795; Montesquieu 1748). Vico's philosophy of history seeks to identify a foundational series of stages of human civilization. Different civilizations go through the same stages, because human nature is constant across history (Pompa 1990). Rousseau (1762a; 1762b) and Kant (1784–5; 1784–6) brought some of these assumptions about rationality and progress into their political philosophies, and Adam Smith embodies some of this optimism about the progressive effects of rationality in his account of the unfolding of the modern European economic system (1776). This effort to derive a fixed series of stages as a tool of interpretation of the history of civilization is repeated throughout the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries; it finds expression in Hegel's philosophy (discussed below), as well as Marx's materialist theory of the development of economic modes of production (Marx and Engels 1845–49; Marx and Engels 1848).

The effort to find directionality or stages in history found a new expression in the early twentieth century, in the hands of several “meta-historians” who sought to provide a macro-interpretation that brought order to world history: Spengler (1934), Toynbee (1934), Wittfogel (1935), and Lattimore (1932). These authors offered a reading of world history in terms of the rise and fall of civilizations, races, or cultures. Their writings were not primarily inspired by philosophical or theological theories, but they were also not works of primary historical scholarship. Spengler and Toynbee portrayed human history as a coherent process in which civilizations pass through specific stages of youth, maturity, and senescence. Wittfogel and Lattimore interpreted Asian civilizations in terms of large determining factors. Wittfogel contrasts China's history with that of Europe by characterizing China's civilization as one of “hydraulic despotism”, with the attendant consequence that China's history was cyclical rather than directional. Lattimore applies the key of geographic and ecological determinism to the development of Asian civilization (Rowe 2007).

A legitimate criticism of many efforts to offer an interpretation of the sweep of history is the view that it looks for meaning where none can exist. Interpretation of individual actions and life histories is intelligible, because we can ground our attributions of meaning in a theory of the individual person as possessing and creating meanings. But there is no super-agent lying behind historical events—for example, the French Revolution—and so it is a category mistake to attempt to find the meaning of the features of the event (e.g., the Terror). The theological approach purports to evade this criticism by attributing agency to God as the author of history, but the assumption that there is a divine author of history takes the making of history out of the hands of humanity.

Efforts to discern large stages in history such as those of Vico, Spengler, or Toynbee are vulnerable to a different criticism based on their mono-causal interpretations of the full complexity of human history. These authors single out one factor that is thought to drive history: a universal human nature (Vico), or a common set of civilizational challenges (Spengler, Toynbee). But their hypotheses need to be evaluated on the basis of concrete historical evidence. And the evidence concerning the large features of historical change over the past three millennia offers little support for the idea of one fixed process of civilizational development. Instead, human history, at virtually every scale, appears to embody a large degree of contingency and multiple pathways of development. This is not to say that there are no credible “large historical” interpretations available for human history and society. For example, Michael Mann's sociology of early agrarian civilizations (1986), De Vries and Goudsblom's efforts at global environmental history (2002), and Jared Diamond's treatment of disease and warfare (1997) offer examples of scholars who attempt to explain some large features of human history on the basis of a few common human circumstances: the efforts of states to collect revenues, the need of human communities to exploit resources, or the global transmission of disease. The challenge for macro-history is to preserve the discipline of empirical evaluation for the large hypotheses that are put forward.

2.3 Hegel's philosophy of history

Hegel's philosophy of history is perhaps the most fully developed philosophical theory of history that attempts to discover meaning or direction in history (1824a, 1824b, 1857). Hegel regards history as an intelligible process moving towards a specific condition—the realization of human freedom. “The question at issue is therefore the ultimate end of mankind, the end which the spirit sets itself in the world” (1857: 63). Hegel incorporates a deeper historicism into his philosophical theories than his predecessors or successors. He regards the relationship between “objective” history and the subjective development of the individual consciousness (“spirit”) as an intimate one; this is a central thesis in his Phenomenology of Spirit (1807). And he views it to be a central task for philosophy to comprehend its place in the unfolding of history. “History is the process whereby the spirit discovers itself and its own concept” (1857: 62). Hegel constructs world history into a narrative of stages of human freedom, from the public freedom of the polis and the citizenship of the Roman Republic, to the individual freedom of the Protestant Reformation, to the civic freedom of the modern state. He attempts to incorporate the civilizations of India and China into his understanding of world history, though he regards those civilizations as static and therefore pre-historical (O'Brien 1975). He constructs specific moments as “world-historical” events that were in the process of bringing about the final, full stage of history and human freedom. For example, Napoleon's conquest of much of Europe is portrayed as a world-historical event doing history's work by establishing the terms of the rational bureaucratic state. Hegel finds reason in history; but it is a latent reason, and one that can only be comprehended when the fullness of history's work is finished: “When philosophy paints its grey on grey, then has a shape of life grown old. … The owl of Minerva spreads its wings only with the falling of the dusk” ((Hegel 1821: 13). (See O'Brien (1975), Taylor (1975), and Kojève (1969) for treatments of Hegel's philosophy of history.)

It is worth observing that Hegel's philosophy of history is not the indefensible exercise of speculative philosophical reasoning that analytic philosophers sometimes paint it. His philosophical approach is not based solely on foundational apriori reasoning, and many of his interpretations of concrete historical developments are quite insightful. Instead he proposes an “immanent” encounter between philosophical reason and the historical given. His prescription is that the philosopher should seek to discover the rational within the real—not to impose the rational upon the real. “To comprehend what is, this is the task of philosophy, because what is, is reason” (1821: 11). His approach is neither purely philosophical nor purely empirical; instead, he undertakes to discover within the best historical knowledge of his time, an underlying rational principle that can be philosophically articulated (Avineri 1972).

2.4 Hermeneutic approaches to history

Another important strand of continental philosophy of history proposes to apply hermeneutics to problems of historical interpretation. This approach focuses on the meaning of the actions and intentions of historical individuals rather than historical wholes. This tradition derives from the tradition of scholarly Biblical interpretation. Hermeneutic scholars emphasized the linguistic and symbolic core of human interactions and maintained that the techniques that had been developed for the purpose of interpreting texts could also be employed to interpret symbolic human actions and products. Wilhelm Dilthey maintained that the human sciences were inherently distinct from the natural sciences in that the former depend on the understanding of meaningful human actions, while the latter depend on causal explanation of non-intensional events (1883, 1860-1903, 1910). Human life is structured and carried out through meaningful action and symbolic expressions. Dilthey maintains that the intellectual tools of hermeneutics—the interpretation of meaningful texts—are suited to the interpretation of human action and history. The method of verstehen (understanding) makes a methodology of this approach; it invites the thinker to engage in an active construction of the meanings and intentions of the actors from their point of view (Outhwaite 1975). This line of interpretation of human history found expression in the twentieth-century philosophical writings of Heidegger, Gadamer, Ricoeur, and Foucault. This tradition approaches the philosophy of history from the perspective of meaning and language. It argues that historical knowledge depends upon interpretation of meaningful human actions and practices. Historians should probe historical events and actions in order to discover the interconnections of meaning and symbolic interaction that human actions have created (Sherratt 2006).

The hermeneutic tradition took an important new turn in the mid-twentieth century, as philosophers attempted to make sense of modern historical developments including war, ethnic and national hatred, and holocaust. Narratives of progress were no longer compelling, following the terrible events of the first half of the twentieth century. The focus of this approach might be labeled “history as remembrance.” Contributors to this strand of thought emerged from twentieth-century European philosophy, including existentialism and Marxism, and were influenced by the search for meaning in the Holocaust. Paul Ricoeur draws out the parallels between personal memory, cultural memory, and history (2000). Dominick LaCapra brings the tools of interpretation theory and critical theory to bear on his treatment of the representation of the trauma of the Holocaust (1994, 1998). Others emphasize the role that folk histories play in the construction and interpretation of “our” past. This is a theme that has been taken up by contemporary historians, for example, by Michael Kammen in his treatment of public remembrance of the American Civil War (1991). Memory and the representation of the past play a key role in the formation of racial and national identities; numerous twentieth-century philosophers have noted the degree of subjectivity and construction that are inherent in the national memories represented in a group's telling of its history.

Although not himself falling within the continental lineage, R. G. Collingwood's philosophy of history falls within the general framework of hermeneutic philosophy of history (1946). Collingwood focuses on the question of how to specify the content of history. He argues that history is constituted by human actions. Actions are the result of intentional deliberation and choice; so historians are able to explain historical processes “from within” as a reconstruction of the thought processes of the agents who bring them about.

3. Anglo-American philosophy of history

The traditions of empiricism and Anglo-American philosophy have also devoted occasional attention to history. Philosophers in this tradition have avoided the questions of speculative philosophy of history and have instead raised questions about the logic and epistemology of historical knowledge. Here the guiding question is, “What are the logical and epistemological characteristics of historical knowledge and historical explanation?”

David Hume's empiricism cast a dominant key for almost all subsequent Anglo-American philosophy, and this influence extends to the interpretation of human behavior and the human sciences. Hume wrote a widely read history of England (1754–1762). His interpretation of history was based on the assumption of ordinary actions, motives, and causes, with no sympathy for theological interpretations of the past. His philosophical view of history was premised on the idea that explanations of the past can be based on the assumption of a fixed human nature.

Anglo-American interest in the philosophy of history was renewed at mid-twentieth century with the emergence of “analytical philosophy of history.” Representative contributors include Dray (1957, 1964, 1966), Danto (1965), and Gardiner (1952, 1974). This approach involves the application of the methods and tools of analytic philosophy to the special problems that arise in the pursuit of historical explanations and historical knowledge (Gardiner 1952). Here the interest is in the characteristics of historical knowledge: how we know facts about the past, what constitutes a good historical explanation, whether explanations in history require general laws, and whether historical knowledge is underdetermined by available historical evidence. Analytic philosophers emphasized the empirical and scientific status of historical knowledge, and attempted to understand this claim along the lines of the scientific standing of the natural sciences (Nagel 1961).

Philosophers in the analytic tradition have deep skepticism about the power of non-empirical reason to arrive at substantive conclusions about the structure of the world—including human history. Philosophical reasoning by itself cannot be a source of substantive knowledge about the natural world, or about the sequence of events, actions, states, classes, empires, plagues, and conquests that we call “history.” Rather, substantive knowledge about the world can only derive from empirical investigation and logical analysis of the consequences of these findings. So analytic philosophers of history have had little interest in the large questions about the meaning and structure of history considered above. The practitioners of speculative philosophy of history, on the other hand, are convinced of the power of philosophical thought to reason through to a foundational understanding of history, and would be impatient with a call for a purely empirical and conceptual approach to the subject.

3.1 General laws in history?

The philosopher of science Carl Hempel stimulated analytic philosophers' interest in historical knowledge in his essay, “The Function of General Laws in History” (1942). Hempel's general theory of scientific explanation held that all scientific explanations require subsumption under general laws. Hempel considered historical explanation as an apparent exception to the covering-law model and attempted to show the suitability of the covering-law model even to this special case. He argued that valid historical explanations too must invoke general laws. The covering-law approach to historical explanation was supported by other analytical philosophers of science, including Ernest Nagel (1961). Hempel's essay provoked a prolonged controversy between supporters who cited generalizations about human behavior as the relevant general laws, and critics who argued that historical explanations are more akin to explanations of individual behavior, based on interpretation that makes the outcome comprehensible. Especially important discussions were offered by William Dray (1957), Michael Scriven (1962), and Alan Donagan (1966). Donagan and others pointed out the difficulty that many social explanations depend on probabilistic regularities rather than universal laws. Others, including Scriven, pointed out the pragmatic features of explanation, suggesting that arguments that fall far short of deductive validity are nonetheless sufficient to “explain” a given historical event in a given context of belief. The most fundamental objections, however, are these: first, that there are virtually no good examples of universal laws in history, whether of human behavior or of historical event succession (Donagan 1966: 143–45); and second, that there are other compelling schemata through which we can understand historical actions and outcomes that do not involve subsumption under general laws (Elster 1989). These include the processes of reasoning through which we understand individual actions—analogous to the methods of verstehen and the interpretation of rational behavior mentioned above (Dray 1966: 131–37); and the processes through which we can trace out chains of causation and specific causal mechanisms without invoking universal laws.

A careful re-reading of these debates over the covering-law model in history suggests that the debate took place largely because of the erroneous assumption of the unity of science and the postulation of the regulative logical similarity of all areas of scientific reasoning to a few clear examples of explanation in a few natural sciences. This approach was a deeply impoverished one, and handicapped from the start in its ability to pose genuinely important questions about the nature of history and historical knowledge. Explanation of human actions and outcomes should not be understood along the lines of an explanation of why radiators burst when the temperature falls below zero degrees centigrade. As Donagan concludes, “It is harmful to overlook the fundamental identity of the social sciences with history, and to mutilate research into human affairs by remodeling the social sciences into deformed likenesses of physics” (1966: 157). The insistence on naturalistic models for social and historical research leads easily to a presumption in favor of the covering-law model of explanation, but this presumption is misleading.

3.2 Historical objectivity

Another issue that provoked significant attention among analytic philosophers of history is the issue of “objectivity.” Is it possible for historical knowledge to objectively represent the past? Or are forms of bias, omission, selection, and interpretation such as to make all historical representations dependent on the perspective of the individual historian? Does the fact that human actions are value-laden make it impossible for the historian to provide a non-value-laden account of those actions?

This topic divides into several different problems, as noted by John Passmore (1966: 76). The most studied of these within the analytic tradition is that of the value-ladenness of social action. Second is the possibility that the historian's interpretations are themselves value-laden—raising the question of the capacity for objectivity or neutrality of the historian herself. Does the intellectual have the ability to investigate the world without regard to the biases that are built into her political or ethical beliefs, her ideology, or her commitments to a class or a social group? And third is the question of the objectivity of the historical circumstances themselves. Is there a fixed historical reality, independent from later representations of the facts? Or is history intrinsically “constructed,” with no objective reality independent from the ways in which it is constructed? Is there a reality corresponding to the phrase, “the French Revolution,” or is there simply an accumulation of written versions of the French Revolution?

There are solutions to each of these problems that are highly consonant with the philosophical assumptions of the analytic tradition. First, concerning values: There is no fundamental difficulty in reconciling the idea of a researcher with one set of religious values, who nonetheless carefully traces out the religious values of a historical actor possessing radically different values. This research can be done badly, of course; but there is no inherent epistemic barrier that makes it impossible for the researcher to examine the body of statements, behaviors, and contemporary cultural institutions corresponding to the other, and to come to a justified representation of the other. One need not share the values or worldview of a sans-culotte, in order to arrive at a justified appraisal of those values and worldview. This leads us to a resolution of the second issue as well—the possibility of neutrality on the part of the researcher. The set of epistemic values that we impart to scientists and historians include the value of intellectual discipline and a willingness to subject their hypotheses to the test of uncomfortable facts. Once again, review of the history of science and historical writing makes it apparent that this intellectual value has effect. There are plentiful examples of scientists and historians whose conclusions are guided by their interrogation of the evidence rather than their ideological presuppositions. Objectivity in pursuit of truth is itself a value, and one that can be followed.

Finally, on the question of the objectivity of the past: Is there a basis for saying that events or circumstances in the past have objective, fixed characteristics that are independent from our representation of those events? Is there a representation-independent reality underlying the large historical structures to which historians commonly refer (the Roman Empire, the Great Wall of China, the imperial administration of the Qianlong Emperor)? We can work our way carefully through this issue, by recognizing a distinction between the objectivity of past events, actions and circumstances, the objectivity of the contemporary facts that resulted from these past events, and the objectivity and fixity of large historical entities. The past occurred in precisely the way that it did—agents acted, droughts occurred, armies were defeated, new technologies were invented. These occurrences left traces of varying degrees of information richness; and these traces give us a rational basis for arriving at beliefs about the occurrences of the past. So we can offer a non-controversial interpretation of the “objectivity of the past.” However, this objectivity of events and occurrences does not extend very far upward as we consider more abstract historical events: the creation of the Greek city-state, the invention of Enlightenment rationality, the Taiping Rebellion. In each of these instances the noun's referent is an interpretive construction by historical actors and historians, and one that may be undone by future historians. To refer to the “Taiping Rebellion” requires an act of synthesis of a large number of historical facts, along with an interpretive story that draws these facts together in this way rather than that way. The underlying facts of behavior, and their historical traces, remain; but the knitting-together of these facts into a large historical event does not constitute an objective historical entity. Consider research in the past twenty years that questions the existence of the “Industrial Revolution.” In this debate, the same set of historical facts were first constructed into an abrupt episode of qualitative change in technology and output in Western Europe; under the more recent interpretation, these changes were more gradual and less correctly characterized as a “revolution” (O'Brien and Keyder 1978). Or consider Arthur Waldron's sustained and detailed argument to the effect that there was no “Great Wall of China,” as that structure is usually conceptualized (1990).

3.3 Causation in history

A third important set of issues that received attention from analytic philosophers concerned the role of causal ascriptions in historical explanations. What is involved in saying that “The American Civil War was caused by economic conflict between the North and the South”? Does causal ascription require identifying an underlying causal regularity—for example, “periods of rapid inflation cause political instability”? Is causation established by discovering a set of necessary and sufficient conditions? Can we identify causal connections among historical events by tracing a series of causal mechanisms linking one to the next? This topic raises the related problem of determinism in history: are certain events inevitable in the circumstances? Was the fall of the Roman Empire inevitable, given the configuration of military and material circumstances prior to the crucial events?

Analytic philosophers of history most commonly approached these issues on the basis of a theory of causation drawn from positivist philosophy of science. This theory is ultimately grounded in Humean assumptions about causation: that causation is nothing but constant conjunction. So analytic philosophers were drawn to the covering-law model of explanation, because it appeared to provide a basis for asserting historical causation. As noted above, this approach to causal explanation is fatally flawed in the social sciences, because universal causal regularities among social phenomena are unavailable. So it is necessary either to arrive at other interpretations of causality or to abandon the language of causality. A second approach was to define causes in terms of a set of causally relevant conditions for the occurrence of the event—for example, necessary and/or sufficient conditions, or a set of conditions that enhance or reduce the likelihood of the event. This approach found support in “ordinary language” philosophy and in analysis of the use of causal language in such contexts as the courtroom (Hart and Honoré 1959). Counterfactual reasoning is an important element of discovery of a set of necessary and/or sufficient conditions; to say that C was necessary for the occurrence of E requires that we provide evidence that E would not have occurred if C were not present (Mackie 1965, 1974). And it is evident that there are causal circumstances in which no single factor is necessary for the occurrence of the effect; the outcome may be overdetermined by multiple independent factors.

The convergence of reasons and causes in historical processes is helpful in this context, because historical causes are frequently the effect of deliberate human action (Davidson 1963). So specifying the reason for the action is simultaneously identifying a part of the cause of the consequences of the action. It is often justifiable to identify a concrete action as the cause of a particular event (a circumstance that was sufficient in the existing circumstances to bring about the outcome), and it is feasible to provide a convincing interpretation of the reasons that led the actor to carry out the action.

What analytic philosophers of the 1960s did not come to, but what is crucial for current understanding of historical causality, is the feasibility of tracing causal mechanisms through a complex series of events (causal realism). Historical narratives often take the form of an account of a series of events, each of which was a causal condition or trigger for later events. Subsequent research in the philosophy of the social sciences has provided substantial support for historical explanations that depend on tracing a series of causal mechanisms (Hedström and Swedberg 1998).

3.4 Recent topics in the philosophy of history

English-speaking philosophy of history shifted significantly in the 1970s, beginning with the publication of Hayden White's Metahistory (1973) and Louis Mink's writings of the same period (1966; Mink et al. 1987). The so-called “linguistic turn” that marked many areas of philosophy and literature also influenced the philosophy of history. Whereas analytic philosophy of history had emphasized scientific analogies for historical knowledge and advanced the goals of verifiability and generalizability in historical knowledge, English-speaking philosophers in the 1970s and 1980s were increasingly influenced by hermeneutic philosophy, post-modernism, and French literary theory (Rorty 1979). These philosophers emphasized the rhetoric of historical writing, the non-reducibility of historical narrative to a sequence of “facts”, and the degree of construction that is involved in historical representation. Affinities with literature and anthropology came to eclipse examples from the natural sciences as guides for representing historical knowledge and historical understanding. The richness and texture of the historical narrative came in for greater attention than the attempt to provide causal explanations of historical outcomes. Frank Ankersmit captured many of these themes in his treatment of historical narrative (1995; Ankersmit and Kellner 1995); see also Berkhofer (1995). Another important strand of thinking within analytic philosophy has focused attention on historical ontology (Hacking 2002).

This “new” philosophy of history is distinguished from analytic philosophy of history in several important respects. It emphasizes historical narrative rather than historical causation. It is intellectually closer to the hermeneutic tradition than to the positivism that underlay the analytic philosophy of history of the 1960s. It highlights features of subjectivity and multiple interpretation over those of objectivity, truth, and correspondence to the facts. Another important strand in this approach to the philosophy of history is a clear theoretical preference for the historicist rather than the universalist position on the status of human nature—Herder rather than Vico. The prevalent perspective holds that human consciousness is itself a historical product, and that it is an important part of the historian's work to piece together the mentality and assumptions of actors in the past (Pompa 1990). Significantly, contemporary historians such as Robert Darnton have turned to the tools of ethnography to permit this sort of discovery (1984).

4. Historiography and the philosophy of history

When historians discuss methodological issues in their research they more commonly refer to “historiography” than to “philosophy of history.” What is the relation between these bodies of thought about the writing of history? We should begin by asking the basic question: what is historiography? In its most general sense, the term refers to the study of historians' methods and practices. Any intellectual or creative practice is guided by a set of standards and heuristics about how to proceed, and “experts” evaluate the performances of practitioners based on their judgments of how well the practitioner meets the standards. So one task we always have in considering an expert activity is to attempt to identify these standards and criteria of good performance. This is true for theatre and literature, and it is true for writing history. Historiography is at least in part the effort to do this work for a particular body of historical writing. (Several handbooks contain a wealth of recent writings on various aspects of historiography; Tucker 2009, Bentley 1997, Breisach 2007.)

Historians normally make truth claims, and they ask us to accept those claims based on the reasoning they present. So a major aspect of the study of historiography has to do with defining the ideas of evidence, rigor, and standards of reasoning for historical inquiry. We presume that historians want to discover empirically supported truths about the past, and we presume that they want to offer inferences and interpretations that are somehow regulated by standards of scientific rationality. (Simon Schama challenges some of these ideas in Dead Certainties (Schama 1991).) So the apprentice practitioner seeks to gain knowledge of the practices of his/her elders in the profession: what counts as a compelling argument, how to assess a body of archival evidence, how to offer or criticize an interpretation of complex events that necessarily exceeds the available evidence. The historiographer has a related task: he/she would like to be able to codify the main methods and standards of one historical school or another.

There are other desiderata governing a good historical work, and these criteria may change from culture to culture and epoch to epoch. Discerning the historian's goals is crucial to deciding how well he or she succeeds. So discovering these stylistic and aesthetic standards that guide the historian's work is itself an important task for historiography. This means that the student of historiography will naturally be interested in the conventions of historical writing and rhetoric that are characteristic of a given period or school.

A full historiographic “scan” of a given historian might include questions like these: What methods of discovery does he/she use? What rhetorical and persuasive goals does he/she pursue? What models of explanation? What paradigm of presentation? What standards of style and rhetoric? What interpretive assumptions?

A historical “school” might be defined as a group of interrelated historians who share a significant number of specific assumptions about evidence, explanation, and narrative. Historiography becomes itself historical when we recognize that these frameworks of assumptions about historical knowledge and reasoning change over time. On this assumption, the history of historical thinking and writing is itself an interesting subject. How did historians of various periods in human history conduct their study and presentation of history? Under this rubric we find books on the historiography of the ancient Greeks; Renaissance historiography; or the historiography of German romanticism. Arnaldo Momigliano's writings on the ancient historians fall in this category (Momigliano 1990). In a nutshell, Momigliano is looking at the several traditions of ancient history-writing as a set of normative practices that can be dissected and understood in their specificity and their cultural contexts.

A second primary use of the concept of historiography is more present-oriented and methodological. It involves the study and analysis of historical methods of research, inquiry, inference, and presentation used by more-or-less contemporary historians. How do contemporary historians go about their tasks of understanding the past? Here we can reflect upon the historiographical challenges that confronted Philip Huang as he investigated the Chinese peasant economy in the 1920s and 1930s (Huang 1990), or the historiographical issues raised in Robert Darnton's telling of the Great Cat Massacre (Darnton 1984). Sometimes these issues have to do with the scarcity or bias in the available bodies of historical records (for example, the fact that much of what Huang refers to about the village economy of North China was gathered by the research teams of the occupying Japanese army). Sometimes they have to do with the difficulty of interpreting historical sources (for example, the unavoidable necessity Darnton faced of providing meaningful interpretation of a range of documented events that appear fundamentally irrational).

An important question that arises in historiography is that of the status of the notion of “global history.” One important reason for thinking globally as an historian is the fact that the history discipline—since the Greeks—has tended to be Eurocentric in its choice of topics, framing assumptions, and methods. Economic and political history, for example, often privileges the industrial revolution in England and the creation of the modern bureaucratic state in France, Britain, and Germany, as being exemplars of “modern” development in economics and politics. This has led to a tendency to look at other countries' development as non-standard or stunted. So global history is, in part, a framework within which the historian avoids privileging one regional center as primary and others as secondary or peripheral. Bin Wong makes this point very strongly in China Transformed (Wong 1997).

Second is the related fact that when Western historical thinkers—for example, Hegel, Malthus, Montesquieu—have turned their attention to Asia, they have often engaged in a high degree of stereotyping without much factual historical knowledge. The ideas of Oriental despotism, Asian overpopulation, and Chinese stagnation have encouraged a cartoonish replacement of the intricate and diverse processes of development of different parts of Asia by a single-dimensional and reductive set of simplifying frameworks of thought. This is one of the points of Edward Said's critique of orientalism (Said 1978). So doing “global” history means paying rigorous attention to the specificities of social, political, and cultural arrangements in other parts of the world besides Europe.

So a historiography that takes global diversity seriously should be expected to be more agnostic about patterns of development, and more open to discovery of surprising patterns, twists, and variations in the experiences of India, China, Indochina, the Arab world, the Ottoman Empire, and Sub-Saharan Africa. Variation and complexity are what we should expect, not stereotyped simplicity. Clifford Geertz's historical reconstruction of the “theatre state” of Bali is a case in point—he uncovers a complex system of governance, symbol, value, and hierarchy that represents a substantially different structure of politics than the models derived from the emergence of bureaucratic states in early modern Europe; (Geertz 1980). A global history needs to free itself from Eurocentrism.

This step away from Eurocentrism in outlook should also be accompanied by a broadening of the geographical range of what is historically interesting. So a global history ought to be global and trans-national in its selection of topics—even while recognizing the fact that all historical research is selective. A globally oriented historian will recognize that the political systems of classical India are as interesting and complex as the organization of the Roman Republic.

An important current underlying much work in global history is the reality of colonialism through the nineteenth and twentieth centuries, and the equally important reality of anti-colonial struggles and nation building in the 1960s and 1970s. “The world” was important in the early-modern capitals of Great Britain, France, Germany, and Belgium because those nations exerted colonial rule in various parts of Africa, Asia, and South America. So there was a specific interest in gaining certain kinds of knowledge about those societies—in order to better govern them and exploit them. And post-colonial states had a symmetrical interest in supporting global historiography in their own universities and knowledge systems, in order to better understand and better critique the forming relations of the past.

A final way in which history needs to become global is to incorporate the perspectives and historical traditions of historians in non-western countries into the mainstream of discussion of major world developments. Indian and Chinese historians have their own intellectual traditions in conducting historical research and explanation; a global history is one that pays attention to the insights and arguments of these traditions. So global historiography has to do with a broadened definition of the arena of historical change to include Europe, Asia, Africa, the Middle East, and the Americas; a recognition of the complexity and sophistication of institutions and systems in many parts of the world; a recognition of the trans-national interrelatedness that has existed among continents for at least four centuries; and a recognition of the complexity and distinctiveness of different national traditions of historiography

Dominic Sachsenmaier provides a significant recent discussion of some of these issues (Sachsenmaier 2011). Sachsenmaier devotes much of his attention to the last point mentioned here, the “multiple global perspectives” point. He wants to take this idea seriously and try to discover some of the implications of different national traditions of academic historiography. He writes, “It will become quite clear that in European societies the question of historiographical traditions tended to be answered in ways that were profoundly different from most academic communities in other parts of the world” (17).

We might ask, finally, what is the relationship between historiography and the philosophy of history. There is a degree of overlap between the two fields in the fact that both are concerned with identifying and evaluating the standards of reasoning that are used in various historical traditions. That said, historiography is generally more descriptive and less evaluative than the philosophy of history. And it is more concerned with the specifics of research and writing than is the philosophy of history.

5. Topics from the historians

There is another current of thinking about the philosophy of history that deserves more attention from philosophers than it has so far received. It is the work of philosophically minded historians and historical social scientists treating familiar but badly understood historical concepts: causation, historical epoch, social structure, human agency, mentality, and the like. These writings represent a middle-level approach to issues having to do with the logic of historical discourse. This approach puts aside the largest questions—“Does history have meaning?”, “Can we have knowledge of the past?”—in favor of questions that are more intimately associated with the actual reasoning and discourse of historians as they attempt to categorize and explain the past.

Contributions at this level might be referred to as “middle-level historical ontology”. This aspect of current philosophy of history brings the discipline into close relation to the philosophy of the special sciences (biology, sociology, archaeology). Philosophically reflective historians ask critical questions about the concepts and assumptions that are often brought into historical thinking, and they attempt to provide more adequate explication of these concepts given their own encounters with the challenges of historical research and historical explanation. William Sewell provides an example in his treatment of the concept of a “historical event” and the associated assumptions that social scientists make about the temporality of historical events (2005). Andrew Abbott questions the assumptions that historians make about the ontological status of “historical things” (for example, the Chicago school of sociology), arguing that historical things are inherently malleable and plastic over time (1999). Charles Tilly challenges a common assumption that causal reasoning depends on identifying background causal regularities; he argues instead for an approach to causal reasoning that emphasizes the role of concrete causal mechanisms (McAdam, Tarrow, and Tilly 2001). E. P. Thompson offers an analysis of the concept of “class consciousness” that forces historians to avoid the error of reification when considering such social constructs as consciousness or political movements (1966). Simon Schama questions the concept of an objective historical narrative that serves to capture the true state of affairs about even fairly simple historical occurrences (1991). Charles Sabel casts doubt on the idea of fixed patterns of historical development, arguing that there were alternative pathways available even within the classic case of economic development in western Europe (Sabel and Zeitlin 1997). Marshall Sahlins underlines the essential role that the interpretation of culture should play in our ability to read history—whether of the Peloponnesian War or the Polynesian War, and sheds important new light on the question of the “historical subject” or agent of history (2004). And the literary critic and advocate of the “new historicism” in literary studies, Stephen Greenblatt, demonstrates the historical insights that can result from a close literary reading of some of the primary documents of history—for example, the journals of Christopher Columbus (Greenblatt 1991). As these examples illustrate, there is ample room for productive exchange between philosophers with an interest in the nature of history and the historians and social scientists who have reflected deeply on the complexities of the concepts and assumptions we use in historical analysis.

6. Rethinking the philosophy of history

It may be useful to close with a sketch of a possible framework for an updated philosophy of history. Any area of philosophy is driven by a few central puzzles. In the area of the philosophy of history, the most fundamental questions remain unresolved: (1) What is the nature of the reality of historical structures and entities (states, empires, religious movements, social classes)?  Can we provide a conception of historical and social entities that avoids the error of reification but gives some credible reality to the entities that are postulated? (2) What is the nature of causal influence among historical events or structures that underwrites historical explanations? Historical causation is not analogous to natural necessity in the domain of physical causation, because there are no fixed laws that govern historical events. So we need to provide an account of the nature of the causal powers that historical factors are postulated to have. (3) What role does the interpretation of the “lived experience” of past actors play in historical understanding, and how does the historian arrive at justified statements about this lived experience? Is it possible to arrive at justified interpretations of long-dead actors, their mentalities and their actions? How does this phenomenological reality play into the account of historical causation? (4) Can we give an estimate of the overall confidence we can have about statements about the past, about the features of past institutions, structures, and actors, and about the explanatory relations among them? Or does all historical knowledge remain permanently questionable?

A new philosophy of history will shed light on these fundamental issues. It will engage with the hermeneutic and narrativist currents that have been important in the continental tradition and have arisen in recent years in Anglo-American philosophy. It will incorporate the rigorous epistemic emphasis that is associated with analytic philosophy of history, but will separate itself from the restrictive assumptions of positivism. A new philosophy of history will grapple with issues of social explanation that have been so important for the current generation of social-science historians and will incorporate the best current understandings of the philosophy of social science about social ontology and explanation.

A handful of ontological assumptions can be offered. History consists of human actions within humanly embodied institutions and structures. There is no super-human agency in history. There is no super-human meaning or progress in history; there is only a series of events and processes driven by concrete causal processes and individual actions. Following Davidson (1963) and Taylor (1985), there is no inconsistency between reasons and causes, understanding and explanation. Historical explanation depends on both causal-structural reasoning and interpretation of actions and intentions; so it is both causal and hermeneutic. There are no causal laws or universal generalizations within human affairs. However, there is such a thing as social causation, proceeding through the workings of human agency and the constraints of institutions and structures. A legitimate historiographical goal is to identify causal mechanisms within historical processes, and these mechanisms invariably depend on the actions of historical actors situated within concrete social relations.

Likewise, a basic epistemology of historical knowledge can be described. Historical knowledge depends on ordinary procedures of empirical investigation, and the justification of historical claims depends on providing convincing demonstration of the empirical evidence that exists to support or invalidate the claim. There is such a thing as historical objectivity, in the sense that historians are capable of engaging in good-faith interrogation of the evidence in constructing their theories of the past. But this should not be understood to imply that there is one uniquely true interpretation of historical processes and events. Rather, there is a perfectly ordinary sense in which historical interpretations are underdetermined by the facts, and there are multiple legitimate historical questions to pose about the same body of evidence. Historical narratives have a substantial interpretive component, and involve substantial construction of the past.

Finally, a new philosophy of history will be sensitive to the variety of forms of presentation of historical knowledge. The discipline of history consists of many threads, including causal explanation, material description, and narrative interpretation of human action. Historical narrative itself has several aspects: a hermeneutic story that makes sense of a complicated set of actions by different actors, but also a causal story conveying a set of causal mechanisms that came together to bring about an outcome. But even more importantly, not all historical knowledge is expressed in narratives. Rather, there is a range of cognitive structures through which historical knowledge is expressed, from detailed measurement of historical standards of living, to causal arguments about population change, to comparative historical accounts of similar processes in different historical settings. A new philosophy of history will take the measure of synchronous historical writing; historical writing that conveys a changing set of economic or structural circumstances; writing that observes the changing characteristics of a set of institutions; writing that records and analyzes a changing set of beliefs and attitudes in a population; and many other varieties as well. These are important features of the structure of historical knowledge, not simply aspects of the rhetoric of historical writing.

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